Alexander von Humboldt

First published Mon Jan 16, 2023

Alexander (Friedrich Wilhelm Heinrich Alexander) von Humboldt (1769–1859) was a scientific explorer and natural philosopher, who achieved fame following his return from South America in 1804. Already during his lifetime, biographies celebrating Humboldt began to appear (Rupke 2008), and upon his death in 1859, Humboldt was commemorated across the world—from Alexandria to New York City, from Paris and Moscow to Adelaide and Melbourne (Wulf 2015). An ocean current was named after him, as were numerous national parks, regions, and a penguin species. He has been described as the first ecologist (Bertaux 1985), the “father of American environmentalism” (Sachs 2004), the inspiration behind the National Parks Movement in the United States and Great Britain, and a major influence on environmentalism in India (Grove 1990).

The younger brother of the linguist, Wilhelm von Humboldt, Alexander was personally acquainted with some of the leading thinkers of his time, including Goethe, Schiller, and Schelling. His distinctive synthesizing approach to knowledge, which has been described as “Humboldtian Science” (Cannon 1978), and his view that artistic insights and practices support and facilitate empirical research, can be seen as a realization of what Friedrich Schlegel called the “romantic imperative” to unite science and art. Humboldt influenced a generation of researchers after him, including Charles Darwin (Richards 2002), as well as artists, writers, philosophers, and activists (Bunkse 1981; Sachs 2004; Walls 2009). Though Humboldt’s fame waned in the twentieth century, in the last two decades he has once again become a household name—first through Daniel Kehlmann’s comedic novel, Die Vermessung der Welt (2004), and more recently through Andrea Wulf’s The Invention of Nature (2015).

While Kehlmann situates Humboldt squarely within the Enlightenment tradition—the book’s title, “measuring the world”, makes jest of Humboldt’s desire to measure everything with the most sophisticated instruments—the majority of scholars regard Humboldt’s legacy as lying between Enlightenment and romanticism (Nicholson 1990, Dettelbach 2001; Reill 2002; Steigerwald 2000; Tang 2008; Ette 2009; Millán 2011). Humboldt’s emphasis on careful measurements and detailed observations was always wedded to an aesthetic approach to nature—an approach that regards feeling as integral to understanding, and art as furnishing crucial tools for expanding empirical knowledge. For this reason, Humboldt criticized the fragmentation of knowledge, and argued that the history of science cannot be divorced from the history of art. Furthermore, and in contrast to the increasingly strong foothold of the ideal of objectivity in science, Humboldt highlighted both the situatedness and responsibility of the knowing subject.

Humboldt’s view that science and art should not be separated goes hand in hand with his understanding of nature and culture as deeply intertwined. To conceive of them as distinct entities, he argued, was not only false, but also dangerous. In his research in South America, Humboldt witnessed first-hand the devastating consequences of colonial practices on both land and people, and concluded that the destruction of nature will lead to the destruction of culture, and in particular Indigenous cultures. His critique of imperialism, and the ways in which colonial powers thoughtlessly destroyed the homes of the Indigenous peoples, was not disconnected from his critique of slavery, the institution that he described as “the greatest of all evils that afflict humanity” (L’ile de Cuba 1: 309; DA 3: 156; PN 7: 263).

1. Life and Works

1.1 Early Life and Education

Alexander von Humboldt—the son of Alexander Georg Humboldt, a Prussian army officer, and the widow Marie-Elisabeth von Holwede (née Colomb)—was born in Berlin on 14 September 1769. His brother, Wilhelm, was born two years earlier, and both children were raised at the Tegel Castle, in the east of Berlin. The later King Friedrich Wilhelm II was Humboldt’s godfather.

As was common for aristocratic families at the time, the Humboldt brothers received their education from private tutors, including Joachim Heinrich Campe and Gottlob Johann Christian Kunth, and had lessons with Kant’s former student, Markus Herz. Herz introduced them to physical geography, and to his wife’s salon. The two brothers were regular attendees at Henriette Herz’s salon, and Alexander exchanged a significant set of letters with Herz (Hey’l 2007). In addition, the brothers were tutored by the botanist, Karl Ludwig Willdenow (1765–1812), whose writing on Berlin’s flora influenced Humboldt.

Following his mother’s wishes, Humboldt (alongside his brother) matriculated at the University of Frankfurt an der Oder in 1787 to study law, with the goal of becoming a Prussian government servant. In 1789, the two brothers moved to the University of Göttingen, where Humboldt studied under (among others) Blumenbach. In Göttingen, he met August Wilhelm Schlegel, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, and Georg Forster, the explorer and radical thinker who had travelled with Captain Cook on his second world trip (1772) and authored (with his father) Reise um die Welt [Voyage Around the World] (1777). From March to July 1790, Humboldt travelled with Forster across western Europe, and went on to dedicate his first publication, Beobachtungen über einige Basalte am Rhein [Observations of some Basalt at the Rhine] (1790), to Forster. Like Forster, Humboldt sought to detail both the environmental and the cultural landscapes, and describe their mutual influence.

In 1791, Humboldt began training at the Freiberg School of Mines (where Friedrich von Hardenberg [i.e., Novalis] also trained), under the geologist Abraham Werner. Following successful completion, he assumed a post in the Prussian Department of Mines.

1.2 Jena Connections

Humboldt began to visit Jena and Weimar in the mind 1790s, after his brother Wilhelm assumed a position at the University of Jena. Though he had met Schiller some two years earlier (in 1792), it was at this time that he met Goethe and Herder and over the years became acquainted with Friedrich Schlegel and Schelling as well. While Humboldt mentions Kant, Schelling, Herder, and Schiller in his writings, it was Goethe to whom he felt the greatest affinity, both in terms of personality and interests. As he put it in a letter composed soon after their first encounter in March 1794, “he is in fact my favorite here” (JB 254, letter no. 388).

During one of his visits, Humboldt undertook a number of experiments with Goethe, which resulted in what has been touted as Humboldt’s “major work” in morphology, Versuche über die gereizte Muskel- und Nervenfaser [Essays on the Irritability of Muscle and Nerve Fibers] (1797–8) (Meyer-Abich 1970: 121). Following Goethe, Humboldt employs the notion of “type” to explicate the structure of animal bodies and relations among animal species.

Humboldt went on to dedicate the German edition of Géographie des Plantes (1805), Ideen zu einer Geographie der Pflanzen (1807), to Goethe. The dedication appears in a frontispiece based on a sculpture by the Danish artist Bertel Thorvaldsen. It depicts Orpheus holding a lyre while unveiling the statue of the Egyptian goddess, Isis: the goddess of fertility, symbolizing nature. Sitting at the feet of Isis is Goethe’s 1790 essay Metamorphose der Pflanzen [The Metamorphosis of Plants]. The implication is clear: through his creative imagination Goethe, the poet-scientist, was able to reveal nature.

Another important figure in Humboldt’s development during this period is Friedrich Schiller. In 1794 Schiller invited Humboldt to submit to his journal, Die Horen. The result was Humboldt’s essay, “Die Lebenskraft oder der Rhodische Genius: eine Erzählung” (Life Force or the Rhodian Genius: A Tale; 1795). Though Humboldt went on to recant the idea of a life force (by 1797, as he claims [DA 5: 325; VN: 265]), he republishes the essay some thirty years later in the second edition of Ansichten der Natur—an indication of his admiration for Schiller and his desire to celebrate their connection (DA 5: xi). Indeed, it appears that Humboldt had originally planned to dedicate Ideen zu einer Geographie der Pflanzen not to Goethe, but to Schiller, and only changed his mind after learning of Schiller’s death (Ette 2018: 225).

Humboldt’s affinity to Schiller’s ideas is perhaps most evident in his response to Schiller invitation to write for Die Horen. Following a long list of tasks he aims to accomplish, Humboldt writes to Schiller, “You sense with me that there is something higher to look for, and to find”. This something higher, Humboldt continues, is “aesthetic sense and education”, which he connects to “a more expansive perspective than that of our contemporary archivers of nature [Registratoren der natur]” (JB: 346–347, letter no. 238).

1.3 Travel to the Americas

Following his mother’s death in 1797, Humboldt received a sizable inheritance that allowed him to leave his post at the mines and begin to think seriously about travelling beyond Europe. In that same year, he moved to Paris, with the aim of securing travel to one of the French colonies. After a number of failed attempts in France—largely on account of political events—Humboldt, alongside his scientific companion, the French botanist Aimé Bonpland (1773–1858), travelled to Spain. There they were granted permission from the Spanish Crown to visit South America. On 5 June 1799, they set sail on the Pizarro, stopping in Tenerife on the way, and arriving some six weeks later in Cumana, in present-day Venezuela.

Humboldt took with him a significant number of expensive instruments—many of which were difficult to transport—for measuring altitude, latitude, air pressure, the blueness of the sky, atmospheric composition, and magnetism. As Humboldt explains in a letter to the Spanish King from 22 March 1799, his desire to travel to South America has to do with his interest in “analyzing the atmosphere”, and “recognizing the general relationships that bind organized beings” (quoted in Puig-Samper 1999).

Over the next five years, Humboldt and Bonpland explored the northern and western parts of South America, canoed down the Orinoco River, trekked in the Andes, visited scientific luminaries in Quito, Bogota, and Havana, and travelled through Mexico and Cuba. During their time in Cuba (from December 1800 to March 1801), Humboldt observed the situation of the slave laborers in the plantations. From there they sailed to Columbia, and then to Ecuador. On 23 June 1802, with the help of an Indigenous guide, the two companions, alongside their new friend, Carlos Montufár (1780–1816), climbed Chimborazo, which at the time was considered to be the highest peak. Though they did not reach its summit, they achieved a record that was not surpassed until 1838.

In 1804, Humboldt and Bonpland travelled to the United States of America, where Humboldt met with Thomas Jefferson in the spring of that year. A key topic of discussion was the American economic dependence on slavery, which Humboldt challenged on moral grounds.

1.4 Paris

Upon returning to Europe, Humboldt spent a short time in Berlin, but quickly decided to move to Paris, which he made his home from the end of 1807 until 1827. It was in Paris that he compiled and published his works on the Americas, which were mainly in French. But he also published in German during this period, most notably the work he later described as his “favorite”, Ansichten der Natur (BVE: 244). Ansichten der Natur, a collection of essays, originally contained only three essays (1808) but in its final iteration (1846) included eight essays. In each new edition, Humboldt also added annotations, which in some instances became longer than the original text. The annotations sought to updated readers with new findings, draw on Humboldt’s later expeditions, or, in the case of the “Rhodische Genius”, recant earlier views.

In 1811, Humboldt published Essai politique sur le royaume de la Nouvelle-Espagne [Political Essay on the Kingdom of New Spain](2 vols, 1811), in which he criticizes the Spanish colonial administration for its mismanagement of the natural world, points to the variety of injustices faced by the Indigenous peoples of Mexico (Nouvelle-Espagne 2: 128–9; KNS 1: 328), and argues that the destruction of nature will inevitably result in the destruction of culture. It was around the same time that he published Vues des Cordillères, et monumens des peuples indigènes de l’Amérique (1810–1813), which includes sixty-nine expensive artistic plates that present artifacts of the Indigenous peoples of the Americas, and thereby challenges the view that the Americas are a “realm of nature” with neither culture, nor agriculture. As in the Essai politique sur le royaume de la Nouvelle-Espagne, so also in this text, Humboldt criticizes claims concerning the inferiority of Indigenous American cultures.

Between 1805 and 1834 Humboldt published Voyage aux regions équinoxiales du nouveau continent, fait en 1799, 1800, 1802, 1803 et 1804 [Voyage to the Equinoctial Regions of the New Continent, from the years 1799–1804], which includes thirty folio and quarto volumes. This work is a compilation of some of Humboldt’s major writings alongside his unfinished narrative of the American journey, Relation historique du voyage aux regions équinoxiales du Nouveau Continent (3 volumes: 1814) [Personal Narrative of Travels to the Equinoctial Regions of the New Continent during the Years 1799–1804].

In 1826, Humboldt published Essai politique sur l’ile de Cuba [Political Essay on the Island of Cuba]. In Chapter 6 Humboldt highlights Cuba’s growing dependency on slavery, and argues for the need to change the policy:

To remedy evil, to avoid public danger, to console the misfortunes of a race who suffer, and who are feared more than is acknowledged, the wound must be probed. (L’ile de Cuba 1: 123; DA 3: 66; PN 7: 106)

Importantly, Humboldt did not simply call for the end of slavery, but also provided insights into how this can be brought about (L’ile de Cuba 1: 317–8, 333; DA 3: 157–8, 167–9; see also Walls 2009–5).

1.5 Berlin

Humboldt moved to Berlin in 1827 at the behest of the Prussian King. It was at the University of Berlin that Humboldt delivered his famous Kosmos lectures (seventy-seven in total), between 3 November 1827, and 27 April 1828. Although Humboldt planned to publish the lectures soon after delivering them, it took another two decades before he began publishing his five-volume Kosmos: eine physische Wetlbeschreibung [Cosmos: A Physical Description of the World] (1845–1862). The final volume was published posthumously.

As both the title and subtitle indicate, Humboldt’s goals are distinctive. The dual significance of the term cosmos—which in ancient Greek means elegance and world—implies that Humboldt’s goal is to understand nature and capture its beauty. As he puts it, the word “Kosmos” signifies both the “order of the world, and adornment [Schmuck] of this universal order…” (Kosmos 1: 33; CO 1 69n). This goes hand in hand with Humboldt’s larger vision of the world as a dynamic and harmonious unity of interrelated parts.

In Berlin, Humboldt assumed the role of court advisor, and often travelled on diplomatic missions. Despite his proximity to the King, Humboldt was supportive of the King’s critics, including Bettina Brentano von Arnim (1785–1859), who had been sentenced to prison on account of her evasion of publication laws. Humboldt helped to absolve her of the sentence. Furthermore, Humboldt used his connection to help American slaves. With Humboldt’s prodding, the Prussian King enacted a law in 1857 that any slave would become free once on Prussian soil.

1.6 Siberian Expedition

In 1829 Humboldt undertook a six-month journey through Siberia, supported by Emperor Nicholas I. The trip, which began in St. Petersburg, took Humboldt through the Ural Mountains, the West Siberian Plains, and across to the Central Asian Altai Mountains. On the way back, the party passed through the Caspian Sea. In total, Humboldt and his travel companions covered some 9,000 miles. As with his trip to South America, so here, Humboldt took with him the most advanced instruments for measurement. He surveyed the geography, climate, and geomagnetic features of the regions through which he travelled. Later editions of his writings—in particular Ansichten der Natur—reflect observations and measurements made during this time, and include comparisons between these regions and the ones he had observed in Europe and South America.

2. Humboldt’s Writings: Scope, Genre, and Translations

Humboldt lived a long life, during which he published amply. In his writings, Humboldt brings together scientific, historical, philosophical, and aesthetic perspectives, while also drawing on personal experience. His aims were to convey nature and culture as interconnected, articulate a vision of nature as an interrelated unity, and enable his readers to imaginatively experience the natural world that he had witnessed. To realize these aims, Humboldt used a number of means—careful measurements, detailed observations, and artistic approaches—all of which are intended to support one another. Humboldt composed essays which he described as Naturgemälde (nature-paintings), modelled on landscape paintings, and which can themselves be regarded as “scientific works of art”, in that they at once deepen scientific knowledge and heighten aesthetic experience. As Humboldt sees it, the essays move in a “dual direction”, joining “a literary with a purely scientific goal” (DA 5: xi; VN: 27).

Whether Humboldt successfully realized his aims remains, however, a matter of dispute. Some argue that Humboldt did indeed achieve this goal—and, in so doing, developed an entirely new genre, which Ottmar Ette has described as “Humboldtian Writing” on analogy with Humboldtian science (Ette 2001). Others, however, see in Humboldt’s writings more confusion than seamless cohesion (Böhme 2001). As an early reviewer put it:

Examples and comparisons… by their number and variety, impair the unity … of the descriptions, and present collateral objects without a sufficient subordination of the principle. (Edinburgh Review 1815: 111)

Humboldt’s joining of genres is also evident in the multi-mediality of other works—above all, in Géographie des plantes and the Tableau physique included in the essay. The French tableau, which Humboldt translates as Naturgemäldein the German edition, refers ambiguously to both text and image. This ambiguity, as Sylvie Romanowski writes,

suggests that the words and the picture are inseparable—the two work together to form one work, and only combined into one work can they convey Humboldt’s knowledge. (Romanowski 2009: 161)

Humboldt’s works were translated into many languages, with English translations often appearing in the same year as the original French (or German). Humboldt often played a role in seeking out competent translators, and at times may have aided with the translations. Many of his translators were women: Helen Maria Williams translated Relation historique soon after it was published, while Thomasina Ross translated it some fifty years later. Elizabeth Sabine translated Ansichten der Natur in 1849, and with her husband, Edward, she translated Kosmosbetween 1846 and 1858. Elise C. Otté translated both Ansichten der Natur (1850) and Kosmos (1848–1858). The translations were often diverging, with the most explicit difference being between Williams’ seven-volume translation of Relation historique (1814–1829) and Ross’s three-volume rendition (1852–3). As Alison Martin notes, the differences are not only in size, but also in language, and in the way in which the scientist is portrayed (Martin 2018). Ross, for instance, eliminates sections in which Humboldt acknowledges a debt to his predecessors—thereby furnishing an image of Humboldt as a lone genius-scientist. Humboldt’s advice was often sought by his translators—in particular the Sabines—who in some cases made significant changes or additions to the original (Martin 2018: 206, 221).

Humboldt was deeply dissatisfied with the first English translation of Kosmos, by Augustin Prichard. Pritchard had translated Beschreibungin the work’s subtitle as “history” rather than “description”. Humboldt practically begged Edward and Elizabeth Sabine to undertake a second translation, writing to Edward that

I have striven to demonstrate that Weltbeschreibung is not Weltgeschichte, that the history of the revolutions which our planet has undergone, as exemplified by the Milky Way, should not be confused with the description of the earth and of the celestial spaces…. (quoted in Martin 2018: 203)

A far more egregious translation of Humboldt’s works is Sidney Thrasher’s 1856 The Island of Cuba, by Alexander Humboldt—a significantly censored version of Humboldt’s Essai Politique sur l’ile de Cuba. Thrasher, an American who lived in Cuba for many years, was of the view—along with President Polk—that Cuba should be part of the United States. He was also pro-slavery. His edition of Humboldt’s work not only excluded the chapter on slavery, but also included an essay by Thrasher, in which slavery is defended. Upon reading an advance copy of Thrasher’s translation, Humboldt’s was furious. In an open letter to a Berlin newspaper published in July 1856, Humboldt complained that while the Spanish and British translations of his work did not censor him, the American translation did. He adds that the censored portions of the work are the ones to which he attaches greatest significance. This open letter was quickly translated into English and published in the New York Times, the New York Tribune and the New York Herald (Foner 1983). As Laura Dassow Walls observes, Humboldt was aware that Americans would read his letter, and took the opportunity to summarize his main arguments in it (Walls 2009).

3. Methodology

In Kosmos, Humboldt refers to Schelling’s dynamic account of nature—of nature not as a set of finished and fixed products, but as productivity—as an inspiration for his own work. “To the enthusiastic researcher”, Humboldt writes citing Schelling, nature appears as “the holy primordial power [Urkraft] of the world, which brings forth all things from itself…” (Kosmos 1: 25; CO 1: 55; see also Kosmos 1: 38). This reiterates earlier expressions of enthusiasm toward Schelling’s Naturphilosophie (Werner 2000; Pinsdorf 2020). In a letter from January 1805, Humboldt describes Schelling’s Naturphilosophie as having brought about “a revolution” in the empirical sciences—a revolution which, Humboldt continues, has ushered in “one of the most beautiful periods in these crazy times” (Fuhrmans 1975: 180). A year later, in the introduction to Ideen zu einer Geographie der Pflanzen, Humboldt writes,

I am not wholly unfamiliar with Schelling’s system, and far from the view that the true nature-philosophical system can be destructive for the advance of empirical science. (DA 1: 45)

These statements can be regarded as an indication of Humboldt’s openness to certain forms of idealism (Pinsdorf 2020). But Humboldt was also clear that his own methodology differed from that of the idealists—whether Schelling, Hegel, or Kant—in that he did not seek to “construct” nature on the basis of an a priori principle. As he elaborates in the Introduction to Kosmos, his is not a “rational science of nature”, which aims to “derive” nature from “a few rational principles”. And in a letter to his friend Varnhagen, Humboldt complains about speculative philosophies of nature, writing that it is like “a chemistry, in which one cannot wet his hands” (BVE: 90).

Humboldt, however, also distinguishes his methodology from what he calls “a raw and incomplete empiricism”. While the idealist position remains one-sidedly abstract and empirically deficient, the empiricist position, he maintains, fails to deliver any insight, or discern necessity (Kosmos 1: 13; CO 1: 38). In contrast to both, Humboldt describes his approach as a “thinking observation [denkende Betrachtung]”, which involves

a meaningful ordering [sinnvolle Anordnung]of the appearances of nature … [that is] deeply penetrated with the belief in an ancient internal necessity [eine alte innere Notwendigkeit] …. (Kosmos 1: 22; CO 1: 50)

Humboldt’s methodology bears a clear affinity to the approach that Schiller dubbed “rational empiricism” and which he identified with Goethe’s methodology. In fact, in E. C. Otté’s English translation of Kosmos, Humboldt’s approach is described as a form of “rational empiricism” (CO 1, 39). Furthermore, scholars have noted, Humboldt’s notion of “thinking observation” echoes Goethe’s idea of “intuitive judgment” and his “gentle empiricism [zarte Empirie]” (Böhme 2016; Millán 2011; Nassar 2022). Indeed, Humboldt himself acknowledged his deep debt to Goethe’s methodology, in a letter to Caroline von Wolzogen from May 1806. It was Goethe’s “views of nature [Ansichten der Natur]”, he relates to Wolzogen, that transformed his own approach and most influenced his observations in South America. By working alongside Goethe, Humboldt continues, he was “granted new organs [mit neuen Organen ausgerüstet]” of perception, through which he was able to discern relations and connections between the most varied living and non-living beings (AML: 180).

Like Goethe, Humboldt’s form of empiricism aims to grasp the phenomenon and, as Goethe puts it, “remain” with it. This means resisting the move to abstraction, and locating necessity—meaning, order—in the phenomenon itself. It also means, as Goethe explains, that the knower must become “flexible and plastic” like the natural phenomena (MA 12: 13).

To achieve these ends, Goethe developed the notion of metamorphosis—which aims to describe the transforming forms of living beings, and discern how these forms are meaningfully (rather than contingently or randomly) related to one another. In Kosmos Humboldt maintains that Goethe’s greatest contribution to science amounts to the “solution” he offered to the “problem of metamorphosis”. This solution, he continues, is nothing other than the notion of “an ideal form that corresponds to certain fundamental types [auf gewisse Grundtypen entspricht]” (Kosmos 1: 22; CO 1: 41).

As Humboldt explains in the remarks preceding his mention of Goethe, the “problem of metamorphosis” has to do with the dual difficulties of the proliferation of organic forms (the infinite diversity of nature) and the relation between the currently existing organic forms and those long extinct. These two difficulties map onto the ancient problem of the one and the many—of discerning unity, relation, connection, in diversity. It is a problem that many had tried to resolve. But, according to Humboldt, it was Goethe and his notion of metamorphosis that offered a solution.

For Goethe, the study of metamorphosis involves discerning how the parts that make up a living being (e.g., a plant) transform in relation to one another and their larger context (the plant, and also their surrounding). This involves a focus on form—on the leaf form, for instance—and seeing how this form reappears differently at various stages of the plant’s development (e.g., how the leaf form is reiterated in the petal, or how the congregating tendency of the cotyledons reappears in the calyx and again in the corolla). This allows the observer to discern unity (continuity, relation) in and through the transforming forms.

While for Goethe metamorphosis primarily (though not exclusively) describes the relations between the various parts of a living being (e.g., the parts of a plant), for Humboldt the concept was extended to describe the ways in which the same “fundamental forms [Urformen]” reappear across the earth (DA 1: 53; EGP: 67; translation altered). Like Herder before him, Humboldt’s aim was not simply to discern necessity in the structure of individual beings, but also in the relations between beings—and between beings and their contexts.

Humboldt introduces the idea of a “physiognomy of nature” to explicate his approach. Just as we discern a person’s character through their gestures, body language and expressions, so the physiognomist of nature discerns the character of a landscape through the expressions and gestures of plant and animal life. Thus, the physiognomist of plants focuses on the “form” of the plant—those aspect of a plant that make the greatest impression on the viewer: whether it attains to great heights (like palms) or twists and turns (like lianas), whether its leaves are broad like those of the banana tree or narrow like conifer needles. The emphasis is on visibility and expressiveness, with the goal of discerning reappearing forms across regions and in different contexts. By studying the Urformen of plants, and discerning how they reappear across regions, Humboldt elaborates, we begin to develop a physiognomy of nature—that is, an understanding of the environments, in which the plants grow. In this way, we begin to grasp where and when plants appear, how they influence their contexts and how their context influences them. This, Humboldt contends, is the goal of the student of nature—and forms the foundations of the geography of plants and bio-geography more generally.

The emphasis on visibility, expressiveness, and remaining with the empirical phenomenon in order to discern meaning and necessity therein, clearly underpins Humboldt’s philosophy of nature. But it also underpins his philosophy of culture, widely construed.

4. The Philosophy of Nature

4.1 Ecology

Although it was Ernst Haeckel who coined the term “ecology [Oecologie]” some seven years after Humboldt’s death, it was Humboldt’s way of thinking and his understanding of the natural world that made Haeckel’s coinage of the term possible. In fact, some scholars (Pausas & Bond 2019) have argued that Haeckel had Humboldt in mind when he wrote that

by ecology, we understand the whole science of the relationships between organisms and their surrounding external world, which we could count as their “conditions of existence” in a wider sense. (Haeckel 1866 (Volume 2), 286, translation by author)

Thus, while Haeckel gave us the term ecology, it was Humboldt who elaborated the idea of nature as a “household (oikos)” in which living beings mutually influence and support one another (Kosmos 1: 33 n. 27; CO 1: 69n).

Humboldt’s first concrete ecological observations have been traced back to his research at Lake Valencia (Lake Tacarigua) in present-day Venezuela. Humboldt and Bonpland arrived in Lake Valencia in March 1800. In contrast to their expectations, they encountered a region suffering from drought. Through conversations with Indigenous locals, Creole farmers and his own investigations, Humboldt came to a surprising conclusion: the felling of trees, and the replacement of forests by farms, had fundamentally transformed the climate and soil. What was once a verdant region, with regular rain, had become a desert. The trees, Humboldt realized, were crucial to maintaining the integrity of the soil and bringing the rain. While a number of thinkers before Humboldt—including Buffon, Kant and Herder—had acknowledged the influence of the environment on living beings, none had realized that the influence was mutual. Living beings transform their environment just as they are transformed by it. The trees determine the soil and the seasons, as much as they are determined by them. Accordingly, the felling of the trees fundamentally altered both. This is how Humboldt put it:

When forests are destroyed … as they are everywhere in America by the European colonists, the springs … dry up, or become less abundant. The beds of the rivers, remaining dry during a part of the year, become torrents whenever heavy rain falls on the heights. With the disappearance of sward and moss from the sides of the mountains, the waters falling in rain are no longer impeded in their course: and, during heavy showers, instead of slowly augmenting the level of the rivers by progressive filtrations, they furrow the sides of the hills, bear down the loosened soil, and form those sudden inundations that devastate the country. And so it results that the destruction of the forests, the want of permanent springs, and the existence of torrents are three phenomena closely connected to one another. (Voyage 2: 71; PN 4: 143–4; translation altered)

Humboldt’s statement, which had a profound impact on environmental policy across the world (Grove 1990; Sachs 2004), points to two fundamental (but at that point hardly recognized) facts: the influence of trees (forests) on the environment and the influence of human beings on the environment. The implication is that environments are not stable backdrops of animal and human activity, but dynamic entities, themselves the outcome of ongoing activity, transformation, and collaboration.

4.2 The Physiognomy of Plants and the Physiognomy of Nature

Humboldt first introduced the notion of a physiognomy of nature in a lecture delivered at the Prussian Academy of the Sciences in Berlin in January 1805. Titled “Ideen zu einer Physiognomik der Gewächse [Ideas for a Physiognomy of Plants]”, the lecture was later published in the first edition of Ansichten der Natur. Its aim is to introduce Humboldt’s audience to a new way of looking at the natural world: physiognomy.

Humboldt is clear that the work of the physiognomist of nature contrasts with that of the botanist, who generally focuses on small, almost hidden parts of the plant—the sexual organs or, at times, the fruit. This goes hand in hand with the fact that the physiognomist aims to discern the “fundamental forms” of plants. These forms do not align with taxonomic categories.

Though Humboldt offers different fundamental forms in his writings (at times adding, at times subtracting a form), he is clear that his list is incomplete, given that it is based on his knowledge and research, and that new plants will be discovered and perhaps also new forms. When he distinguishes a form, Humboldt describes both its individual characteristics—detailing, for instance, the shape of its leaves, its usual size (height and width), its overall gesture—and its growth patterns—where and when it grows, under which conditions, next to which other plants, and so on.

By focusing on forms, Humboldt recognizes that certain plant forms—whether tall grasses, or conifers, myrtles, or mosses—reappear across the earth. This leads him to conclude that there are fundamental forms which are “repeated” or “replaced”, even though they are “separated by oceans or broad expanses of land” (DA 5: 266; VN: 219). Humboldt’s insight paved the way for Carl Troll’s later research on “convergent evolution” (Beck 1989: 266–7; Troll 1959). It also allowed Humboldt to discern a deep connection between plants and their contexts: certain forms only appear next to certain neighbors, while others only appear at certain altitudes, and so on. Humboldt was not, however, an environmental determinist. For, he emphasized, plant forms persist across the earth, and although they are sensitive to their contexts, they are not entirely determined by them. The form of the willow, for instance, persists despite the fact that a willow growing on a windy and cold mountainside will never achieve the shape and size of a willow growing near a river (DA 5: 287; VN: 234).

4.3 The Trees and the Forest

To elucidate the task of the physiognomist of nature, Humboldt looks to the landscape painter. Like the landscape painter, the physiognomist is interested in the overall impression that a landscape makes—in those aspects, which give the landscape its unique character. Furthermore, in contrast to a botanist, who aims to categorize, distinguish, and separate plants, the physiognomist, like the landscape painter, binds them together. This means that the physiognomist’s aims is not to focus on separating trees or distinguishing species, but rather seeing trees in relation to one another, seeing them as members of a forest, and seeing the forest in them.

To give his audience a concrete sense of what he means, Humboldt considers the diverging ways that a painter and a botanist treat leafy hardwoods. While the botanist distinguishes different hardwoods (oak, beech, walnut), the landscape painter allows them, as Humboldt puts it, “to run one into the other”, portraying them as members of a forest (DA 5: 184; VN: 162). This is because the painter is interested in capturing the overall impression that hardwoods make on the viewer—an impression that is connected to the fact that different hardwoods grow in relation to one another and together form a distinctive forest.

Just as a willow on the mountainside looks different to a willow by the river, so also an oak (a hardwood) growing in a forest of hardwoods looks different from a solitary oak on a hill. The crown of a solitary oak spreads out in all directions, eventually achieving a dome shape. By contrast, the forest oak develops a small crown, and its growth is patterned on the growth of the other trees in the forest. An oak in a hardwood forest is an expression not only of the individual tree or the genus oak, but also of the forest itself. The forest is not “outside” the individual oak tree, but literally inscribed in it its very form.

The same, Humboldt maintains, holds for the forest. The kind of forest it is—whether it is cool and humid, or temperate and dry, whether its soil is nutrient rich or poor, and how much rain it receives—depends on its particular trees. The forest environment, in other words, is realized in and maintained through the activities of its trees. The forest is an expression of its trees as much as the trees are an expression of the forest.

By working with form, expression, and gesture, the landscape painter captures this relationship, and thereby presents trees and forest, organism and environment, as interdependent realities—as beings that emerge with and through one another. Thus, by invoking the landscape painter, Humboldt’s goal was to introduce a new approach to the study of nature—one that regards nature as an ongoing and dynamic collaboration between beings that are internally dependent on one another.

It was this ecological insight, and this way of observing nature, that underpinned Humboldt’s research at Lake Valencia. For what he saw there was that the climate cannot exist without the trees, and the trees cannot exist without this climate. This means that the one does not pre-exist the other, because both—tree and climate—mutually influence and determine one another.

5. Philosophy of Art

Humboldt is hardly known as a philosopher or historian of art and aesthetics. Yet, the second volume of Kosmosoffers a lengthy exploration of the relationship between the history of art and the history of science. As Humboldt explains in volume three of Kosmos, while the first volume examines “the pure objectiveness of external phenomena”, in the second his aim is to consider nature “as the reflection of the image impressed by the senses upon the inner human being, that is, upon his ideas and feelings” (Kosmos 3: 386; CO 3: 1; translation altered). The goal, in other words, is to see nature through human ideas and feelings about nature, which are most clearly and eloquently expressed in art.

Though some scholars have expressed confusion about Humboldt’s sudden shift to art and feeling in this second volume (Dettelbach 1997), in light of Humboldt’s use of the arts (e.g., landscape painting), it is clear that, for Humboldt, art does not only carry aesthetic value but also cognitive value. Indeed, Humboldt took issue with philosophers who—like Edmund Burke and Kant—argued that aesthetic experience and intellectual interest occupy two different (and unrelated) spheres in the human mind (Kosmos 1: 18; CO 1: 40). As he saw it, aesthetic presentation has the potential to transform the very way we know nature. By furnishing a historical exposition of the relation between artistic expression and empirical investigation, and showing how the arts aided in the expansion of knowledge, Humboldt’s goal is to furnish a historical justification of this view.

5.1 Humboldt’s History of Art and the Study of Nature

Humboldt begins volume two of Kosmosby drawing on Schiller’s distinction between “naïve” and “sentimental” poetry, as articulated in his 1795–6 work Über naive und sentimentalische Dichtung [On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry]. Although Humboldt agrees with Schiller’s historicization of art as a development from a more immediate or naïve unity of humanity and nature to a more abstracted and self-reflexive (sentimental) human consciousness, he is aware of its limits. It only holds for European art, and says nothing about the human relation to the natural world outside of Europe (Kosmos 2: 191; CO 2: 21–22). Examining poetry from the Hindu Vedas, for instance, Humboldt remarks on their vastly different interest in nature, which contrasts not only to Greek and Roman poetry, but also to Hebrew poetry. While the Greeks expressed little—if any—interest in direct depictions of the natural world, Humboldt notes that in certain Vedas, the “main subject…is the veneration and praise of nature” (Kosmos 2: 206; CO 2: 50). Accordingly, a more sensitive approach to the history of art would also be comparative.

Humboldt goes on to distinguish crucial moments in the history of art and situates them in their larger historic and geographic context. In so doing, he connects transformations in artistic depictions of nature to transformations in our knowledge about nature. Speaking of the emergence of landscape painting in the seventeenth century, for instance, he writes that landscape painting is indebted to the new instruments and tools of observation that became available in the seventeenth century, just as these instruments are themselves indebted to discoveries in perspective in art in earlier periods (Kosmos 2: 228; CO 2: 89).

5.2 “Truth to Nature”: The Epistemic Significance of Art

In addition to a historical account, Humboldt articulates the idea of “truth to nature [Naturwahrheit]” (Kosmos 2: 207; CO 2: 51) to describe art’s potential to present the natural world in a “living” (Kosmos 2: 216–217; CO 2: 68) rather than “dead” way (DA 5: 142; VN: 159; see also Kosmos 1: 55). This presentation, Humboldt emphasized, must be imbued with aesthetic feeling—which includes the feeling of pleasure, but also feelings of awe and wonder, fear and shock, loneliness, sadness, the sense of constraint and bewilderment.

As Humboldt saw it, art had a twofold significance. On the one hand, by presenting the natural world in an aesthetic way, art has the potential to transport the reader or viewer to a place she may not otherwise visit (DA 1: 61–62; EGP: 75). On the other hand, the aesthetic presentation of nature can reveal the extent to which we are ourselves part of nature, and can thus shift the way we think about and engage with nature. Accordingly, an aesthetic presentation of nature offers an alternative mode of knowledge—one that is not objective, distanced, or pure, but embodied and embedded, and, in the words of Caroline Schaumann “dirty” (Schaumann 2011).

Humboldt introduces the idea of “truth to nature” in his examination of the poem “The Messenger of Clouds [Megaduta]”. Composed by the fourth-century Sanskrit poet, Kalidasa, the poem, Humboldt writes,

describes with admirable truth to nature [Naturwahrheit] the joy which, after long drought, the first appearance of a rising cloud is hailed as the harbinger of the approaching season of rain. (Kosmos 2: 207; CO 2: 51)

What Humboldt describes as “truth to nature” is not only a portrait of a natural event but also the “joy” associated with it. To this he adds a reference to the Sanskrit scholar, Theodor Goldstücker. According to Goldstücker, the poem depicts “the influence of external nature on human feelings” (Kosmos 2: 209; CO 2: 53).

Not all writing, Humboldt emphasizes, achieves “truth to nature”. He criticizes Buffon’s works, for instance, on account of their “style and rhetorical pomp”, which inspire a feeling of the “sublime” in the reader that has less to do with what is presented, and more to do with Buffon’s style. By contrast, the works of Rousseau, Bernardin de St. Pierre, and Chateaubriand express a “depth of feeling” through “individualizing true depictions [individualisirend wahr]” (Kosmos 2: 220; CO 2: 75–6).

In the works of these authors, the feelings depicted are inspired by the landscape and thus speak of and about the landscape. They are thus neither subjective and interior feelings (having only to do with the specific individual experiencing them) nor arbitrary (random associations, for instance). Rather, they reveal something about the landscape. Furthermore, as feelings for the landscape, they heighten one’s interest in the landscape. They draw the observer’s attention to the landscape, leading her to become aware of aspects of the landscape she may have otherwise missed.

Humboldt’s notion of “truth to nature” involves a form of presentation in which thinking and feeling mutually support one another—where thinking is imbued by and anchored in feeling, and feeling inspires thinking. Both feeling and thinking reflect and refer to a natural landscape or a natural process and are connected to careful observations. Yet, as feeling and thinking, they also belong to a human subject. Thus, “truth to nature” occupies a space between inner and outer, subjective and objective. It is truth that emerges in the embodied encounter with a living world—and, as Humboldt sees it, it is truth that has cognitive and moral value. It can transform the way we think about nature and the way we relate to nature.

While Humboldt described a number of works as achieving truth to nature, the question remains as to whether Humboldt himself was successful in realizing truth to nature in his own works. In other words, do Humboldt’s Naturgemälde achieve the “dual direction” he set out for them?

6. Naturgemälde

Humboldt coined the term Naturgemäldeto describe the works of authors he regards as having achieved truth to nature, and his own works, including the essays he published in Ansichten der Natur. He also used it to translate the French tableau, which he had originally applied to describe his drawing of Chimborazo. In that context, and as noted above, tableau refers to two different media—the plate and the text, each of which supports and illuminates the other. The plate offers a visual presentation of a particular landscape and its inhabitants through a cross-sectional profile of the Andes from the Atlantic to the Pacific at the latitude of Chimborazo. It also includes information about animals and plants at different altitudes. The text provides further information about the landscape, draws analogies, and makes connections more explicit. The aim, Humboldt writes, is

to gather in one single tableau the sum of the physical phenomena present in equinoctial regions, from the sea level of the South Sea to the very highest peak of the Andes.

By integrating the two media, Humboldt’s aim is to enliven “both our imagination and our spirit at the same time”, and in this way “stimulate people to study” (DA 1: 71; EGP: 79–80).

Similarly, Humboldt’s essays employ different modes of presentation—the personal, the scientific, the literary and the philosophical—with the goal of, as he puts it, “occupy[ing] the imagination and at the same time, through the increase of knowledge, enrich[ing] life with ideas…” (DA 5: xi; VN: 27). In both instances, the outcome is a new genre, which interweaves science and art, and draws on aesthetic pleasure and experience to incite reflection and careful observation, and vice versa.

Humboldt opens Ansichten der Natur with the essay that he later described as his most “daring” (DA 5: 128; VN: 117). Titled “Über die Steppen und Wüsten [Concerning the Steppes and Deserts]”, it begins by situating the reader, imaginatively placing her in a particular spot: the foot of a high granite mountain—or as Humboldt describes it, a granite spine. Immediately, the reader is invited not only to picture the mountain, but also to stand at its foot. From there her gaze turns southward, and rests on “a broad, immeasurable plain”, the steppes or llanos. What the reader sees is not a God’s eye-view of the landscape, but the steppes as they appear from a particular angle. This angle colors her impression. The steppes seem to “climb and dwindle into the horizon”. Having walked to the steppes from the lush valleys of Caracas, the reader is also struck by the sudden change in landscape from the “luxuriant fullness of organic life” to “the barren edge of a sparse and treeless desert…” and feels astonished (DA 5: 3; VN: 29).

In this opening paragraph, Humboldt makes no mention of himself. The reader presumes, however, that what is being described is the path that Humboldt had trodden, and the view he had seen. However, by the end of the paragraph, any evidence of Humboldt, the explorer, disappears and in his place stands the “astonished wanderer”. That Humboldt invokes the astonished wanderer—rather than himself—allows the reader to take on the perspective of the wanderer, to imaginatively become the wanderer. In turn, by appealing to all of the reader’s senses, her feelings and imagination, as well as her body, Humboldt’s essay invites the reader to imaginatively walk from the verdant valleys to the strikingly barren steppes; to watch the clouds thickening overhead, portending months of rain, and sense the constriction in the atmosphere; to smell the oncoming deluge, and observe with wonder the changed behavior of the animals. In reading these descriptions, the reader does not only think about a particular aspect of nature, nor does she simply see it from a specific standpoint. She also imagines herself in the landscape, experiencing it in an embodied and emotive way.

Interwoven with vivid descriptions of embodied experience are careful observations and detailed measurements of various natural phenomena, as well as comparative, historical and geographical analyses. The technical details and scientific explanations are not separated from the embodied experiences, but emerge from them. This is particularly clear in Humboldt’s description of an internal sense of “constriction” in relation to a shift in atmospheric pressure preceding an electric storm. In this passage, which Humboldt includes in other works—and which is mentioned in reference works on electrical storms[1]—he offers both a detailed account of the atmosphere prior to an electrical storm, pointing to the various elements that contribute to the physical transformations, and the experience of witnessing the transformation in the atmosphere. Humboldt begins by taking note of the low-hanging clouds, the narrowing of the horizon, the thickening of the air, and the smothering heat and dust. He proceeds to describe the experience of witnessing these events, highlighting the ways in which the shifts in the atmosphere are connected to a shift in the wanderer’s mood. By the end of the analysis, Humboldt writes that the wanderer experiences a sense of “constriction” which, while felt internally, has its source in the atmosphere itself, and is thus an expression of (a human way of presenting) the atmospheric event. As Humboldt puts it, “It constricts the steppe and the mood of the wanderer as well” (DA 5: 14; VN: 37).

Humboldt’s detailed description of the shift in the atmosphere allows the reader to imaginatively experience what it is like to stand in the midst of an oncoming electrical storm. Thus, by the time that the reader is told about the feeling of constriction, she is already gripped by this feeling. In this way, the reader recognizes that there is nothing random about the internally felt sense of constriction: it is inspired by the natural process and reveals something—via the medium of feeling—about it.

For this reason, critics have argued that Humboldt’s description of the electric storm realizes the goal he set out, achieving “truth to nature” (Nassar 2022). While this passage is not unique in Humboldt’s writings, it is the most explicit and concise demonstration of Humboldt’s “dual direction”: it conveys aesthetic feeling and enriches our understanding of a natural phenomenon—seamlessly moving from one to the other.

7. Social and Political Thought

As Laura Dassow Walls has noted, Humboldt’s political analysis and critique of imperialism and slavery, “however valuable, did not lie at the core of his thinking on race”. This is because, Walls explicates, Humboldt “thought of himself above all as a natural scientist…” (Walls 2009: 181). Thus, despite his ardent critique of slavery and of the colonial project more generally, he did not articulate this critique in a systematic way, nor did he write any one work that directly deals with political and social questions. Instead, we find statements concerning slavery strewn throughout his works, without a detailed analysis or critique of the practice, or of the European treatment of Indigenous peoples.

While Humboldt may have not systematically addressed social and political questions, it is clear that these questions were deeply important to him. As he puts it in an 1858 letter to the German intellectual Julius Fröbel (1805–1893), the future of American slavery is “nearer my heart” than the elevations of mountains. In the same letter, Humboldt describes his Essai politique sur l’ile de Cuba as a “book against slavery”, deploring the fact that while the book is widely accessible in Madrid, it remains censored in the United States (Foner 1984: 23–24).

Humboldt’s understanding of the idea of a “race” and his critique of slavery were well-established prior to his arrival in the Americas (L’ile de Cuba 1: 307; DA 3: 155; PN 7: 260). His view, which contrasts with Kant’s but coheres with Herder’s and Forster’s, was that there are no different races, but, as he puts it in Kosmos, that all human beings are of “one species”, and all “are alike designed for freedom” (Kosmos 1: 187; CO 1: 368). For this reason, Humboldt criticizes those philosophers who used philosophical means to support the idea that human beings belong to different and unequal races, writing that

the very cheerless and in recent times too often discussed doctrine of unequal human rights to freedom, and of slavery as an institution in conformity with nature, is unhappily found most systematically developed in Aristotle’s Politica. (Kosmos 1: 187 n. 442; CO 1: 368n)

From this one might suspect that Humboldt’s views on slavery and his critique of the colonial social system may be connected to his larger project: to his understanding of nature as an integrated whole, to his view that nature and culture are interconnected, and to his aesthetic approach to the study of both.

This is evident, for instance, in his caution towards ethnographic research that is often hasty in drawing conclusions, and tends to essentialize race without adequately recognizing differences within cultures—or the connections among cultures. Both differences within cultures and connections across cultures are evident, Humboldt writes, as soon as one pays close attention to languages, which reveals that

totally different linguistic families have been found to exist in one and the same race [and] the same idioms can be found among people of very different descent. (Kosmos 1: 187; CO 1: 368)

The diversity within languages, in other words, points to a diversity within cultures—such that speaking of cultures as monolithic and isolated entities, and, on that basis, essentializing and hierarchizing cultures and races, is nothing other than a false abstraction based on overhasty (or simply bad) research.

In the same volume in which Humboldt describes slavery as the greatest evil humanity has wrought upon itself, he notes the significance not only of our natural environment on our sensibility, but also of our social-political environment, and the ways in which certain political contexts can inhibit moral concerns. “In climates where slavery exists”, he writes, “the mind is familiarized with suffering, and that instinct of pity is stifled which characterizes and ennobles our nature” (PN 7: 464). Just as the natural environment affects sensibility, so also does our social and political environment. In a context where slavery is accepted and widely practiced, Humboldt claims, moral instincts are disturbed and suppressed. This is because, as Humboldt repeatedly argues in relation to the natural environment, how one perceives and thinks cannot be separated from the world of which one is part. Sensibility and understanding are enmeshed in the world, even as they also construct it. A world in which slavery is practiced is a world that disturbs our moral compass.

Furthermore, by placing human cultures squarely within the natural world, and showing how “nature” and “culture” cannot be conceptually separated from one another, Humboldt arrives at the conclusion that the destruction of nature will lead to the destruction of culture. Though he notes that these effects are most acutely felt by Indigenous cultures, he is clear that it is human culture at large that will suffer from the destruction of nature. Whether it is the mass deforestation connected to the Spanish desire to transform the South American landscape to resemble “in every way the soil of Castile, arid and devoid of vegetation”, or the thoughtless construction of new cities, dams and underground tunnels, the destruction of nature has been catastrophic for all cultures (Nouvelle-Espagne 2: 128–9; KNS 1: 328). Or, as he puts it in Voyage,

The changes which the destruction of forests, the clearing of plants and the cultivation of indigo have produced within half a century—in the quantity of water flowing in, on the one hand, and on the other, the evaporation from the soil and the dryness of the atmosphere—present causes sufficiently powerful to explain the successive diminution of the lake of Valencia. I am not of the opinion of a scientific traveller [M. Depons] (who was in these countries after I was there) “that to set the mind at rest, and for the honour of science [l’honneur de la physique]”, a subterranean issue must be admitted. By felling the trees which cover the tops and the sides of mountains, men in every climate prepare at once two calamities for future generations: want of fuel and scarcity of water. (Voyage 2: 71–2; PN 4: 142–3; translation altered)

In contrast to Depons, who claims that significant changes to the natural landscape have nothing to do with the colonial project and instead points to “subterranean issues”, Humboldt contends—some two-hundred years before the coinage of the term Anthropocene—that the European transformation of the landscape directly resulted in the decrease of Lake Valencia, and, as he concludes with some horror, will result in further future calamities.

8. Controversies

Humboldt’s cross-sectional profile of Chimborazo—the Tableau physique—shows the zone occurrence of plant life at different altitudes. It thus served as the foundation for Humboldt’s law of vegetational distribution, which claims that changes in plants in relation to latitude match those by altitude. Some have argued that Humboldt learned this practice of depicting vegetation at different altitudes from the South American scientists he met—in particular, the Colombian Francisco José de Caldas (1768–1816).

Caldas joined Humboldt’s party in 1801 for several weeks, and it appears that this period was fruitful for Humboldt and Bonpland, as well as for Caldas. From Humboldt and Bonpland, Caldas learned the formal elements of botany (Appel 1994). Caldas, in turn, taught Humboldt about the novel method he developed to measure air-pressure in relation to vegetation, and it is likely that he also shared with Humboldt maps he made in order to depict visually the distribution of vegetation.

While Humboldt acknowledges Caldas’s innovative method of measuring air-pressure, he does not discuss Caldas’s maps. This, as some have contended, may have to do with Humboldt’s desire to present his own maps—in particular, the Tableau physique—as entirely original (Serje 2005). Accordingly, the question has arisen concerning Humboldt’s originality. In other words, the question, in Jorge Cañizares-Esguerra’s words, is: “how derivative was Humboldt?” (Cañizares-Esguerra 2006).

One answer to this question, given by Cañizares-Esguerra, considers the extent to which Caldas himself was original. For it appears that Caldas’ way of presenting the relation between vegetation, climate, and altitude, and depicting it on maps, was a widespread practice in late eighteenth-century South America, particularly in the Andes, which were regarded as a “microcosm” of the universe. The assumption was that studying Andean vegetation in relation to latitude would yield knowledge about other similar environments (Cañizares-Esguerra 2006). Thus, while the fact that Humboldt does not acknowledge his debts is problematic, these debts may not be specifically to Caldas—but to South American researchers and mapmakers more generally, whose practices most likely provided inspiration for Humboldt’s own.

Another questionable aspect of Humboldt’s thinking came to the fore following the publication of Mary Louise Pratt’s influential study on imperialistic modes of knowing, seeing, and presenting. As Pratt sees it, Humboldt’s vision of South America, as presented in Ansichten der Natur, problematically erases the peoples living in South America by focusing entirely on a presentation of nature. Accordingly, Pratt contends, Humboldt’s writing directly or indirectly supported an imperialist agenda of terra nullius. Pratt writes:

Three images in particular, all canonized by Humboldt’s Views, combined to form the standard metonymic presentation of the “new continent”: superabundant tropical forests…snow-capped mountains…and vast interior plains.

To this she adds:

What is shared with scientific travel writing is the erasure of the human… The human inhabitants of the Llanos are absent. (Pratt 1992: 125)

Pratt’s analysis has, however, come under criticism, above all for its failure to consider Humboldt’s other works. Most relevant in this regard are the Essai politique sur le royaume de Nouvelle-Espagne, which, as Nicolaas Rukpe notes, was the work that brought Humboldt to prominence and made him a household name (Rupke 1999), and the Essai politique sur l’ile de Cuba. The latter includes a chapter on slavery, which details the situation of slaves on Cuban plantations, and decries their treatment, while the Essai politique sur le royaume de Nouvelle-Espagne includes detailed descriptions of the cultures of the Indigenous peoples of South America, and seeks to reconstruct these cultures prior to contact. Humboldt’s presentation of pre-contact Indigenous Americans, as Lee Schweninger has shown, reveals them to be deeply cultured, possessing a clear sense of their own history, with sophisticated writing systems and arts comparable to the best European works (Schweninger 2016). Or, in Humboldt’s words, Indigenous American pre-contact arts and writing systems “are strikingly similar to many monuments of the most civilized nations” (Nouvelle-Espagne 1: 82; KNS 1: 235).

Furthermore, while Pratt is right to note that Ansichten der Natur does not offer a detailed examination of the human inhabitants, strewn throughout the text are remarks that—like the one above—emphasize the creativity of Indigenous Americans and compare their cultures favorably to European culture (Schweninger 2016).

9. Conclusion: Humboldt’s Influence

Humboldt is perhaps the most famous scientist of the nineteenth century, and has been described as the second most famous person in Europe after Napoleon. His Kosmos-lectures drew thousands of Berliners, as well as international visitors, who had come especially to listen to Humboldt. These lectures were decisive for the popularization of science, as was Kosmos, the first volume of which (over 1000 pages long) sold out in two months and was translated into almost every major language. But already earlier in the century Humboldt had become a household name, thanks to his political works, especially his essay on Cuba, and the Relation Historique (Personal Narrative ), which had been a favorite by the likes of Charles Darwin and Russell Alfred Wallace.

Darwin, who described Humboldt as “the greatest traveler who ever lived”, boarded the Beagle in imitation of Humboldt’s travels to South America, and wrote in his diary that it was Humboldt’s Personal Narrative that he repeatedly read while on the Beagle (Sloan 2009). Wallace, in turn, wrote that among all the works he read, the one which most influenced his future “were Humboldt’s ‘Personal Narrative of Travels in South America’” (Wallace 1905: vol. 1, 232). Indeed, Robert Richards has argued that the origins of the theory of evolution can be traced back to Humboldt and the German romantic tradition of which he was part (Richards 2002).

Humboldt’s synthesizing approach to science—“Humboldtian Science”—was, as Susan Cannon put it, “the great new thing in professional science in the first half of the 19th century” (Cannon 1978). Humboldtian scientists travelled across the world, founding botanical gardens or leading expeditions. In a speech commemorating Humboldt, Ferdinand von Müller, founder of the Melbourne Botanical Gardens, explains that for the Humboldtian scientist the most important goal is not to perfect individual disciplines, but

to explore the inner connections of the sciences, to discover their reciprocal relations, and thereby to extend the whole empire of knowledge simultaneously. (Müller 1859: 20)

US Congressman George Perkins Marsh read Humboldt’s writings before the US Congress in 1847, to provide evidence of the negative impact of human activity on the environment, and three years later, in 1850, the US Commissioner of Patents Thomas Ewbank cited Humboldt’s observations at Lake Valencia in support of the campaign for national parks. Yellowstone National Park was established in 1872—the first in the world—though the campaign for designating it a national park had begun in the 1860s (Lindstrom 2011: 836). In 1890 Yosemite became a national park, thanks to the efforts of John Muir, who was also influenced by Humboldt—however, as Aaron Sachs has noted, by the later stage of his life, Muir had moved away from his Humbolditan origins, in that he came to prioritize nature over the human cultures that inhabited it (Sachs 2004: 28; see also Wulf 2015).

Humboldt’s descriptions of Latin and South American landscapes supported the development of national identities independent of Spain. The Mexican historian and politician Lucas Ignacio Alamán y Escalada invited Humboldt to work with him to bring about an independent Mexico and regarded Humboldt’s Essai Politique sur le royaume de la Nouvelle-Espagne as furnishing a compelling presentation of a liberal Mexican constitution (Ortega y Medina 1960: 25–26). Furthermore, and as Juan Ortega y Medina has argued, Humboldt’s work encouraged Mexican mapmakers and geographers to draw maps of an independent Mexico (Ortega y Medina 1960). In turn, it appears to have been after a meeting with Humboldt at a Paris salon in 1804 that Simón Bolívar was inspired to carry out an independence movement in South America (Walls 2009: 17). Bolívar led the Venezuelan revolution, and went on to lead revolutions in Colombia, Ecuador, Peru, and Bolivia.

Many artists, in particular visual artists, followed in Humboldt’s footsteps, travelling to South American to depict visually and with exactness the landscape that Humboldt described in his writings. These include the American Frederic Edwin Church, a member of the Hudson River school of art (Harvey 2020), and the German, Johann Moritz Rugendas. Rugendas met Humboldt in Paris in 1825 and in 1830 travelled to Mexico with Humboldt’s assistance (Bunkse 1981). This was followed by trips to Chile and Argentina. Church, in turn, retraced Humboldt’s footsteps in Ecuador and Mexico (Baron 2005). Like Humboldt, Church and Rugendas—among others—sought to combine precision with artistic feeling and thereby realize Humboldt’s ideal in the visual arts.

Humboldt’s works and ideas were, however, also censored—and not only in Sidney Thrasher’s translation of the Cuba essay. Humboldt tried to travel to India on a number of occasions but was repeatedly denied permission on account of his critique of colonialism (Grove 1995: 375). Furthermore, Americans who respected Humboldt for his scientific works either ignored or intentionally misrepresented his social and political views. In a meeting held in Boston to honor Humboldt, the Harvard anthropologist, Louis Aggasiz—who had argued in his 1850 essay, “The Diversity of the Origin of the Human Race”, that Africans are an inferior race—provided an overview of Humboldt’s ideas, but failed to mention Humboldt’s views on slavery. In a eulogy following Humboldt’s death, the American diplomat George Bancroft falsely claimed that Humboldt was in favor of American expansion into Cuba (Foner 1983). Nonetheless—and in large part thanks to his open letter—Humboldt became known as an abolitionist in the United States, and became an important voice supporting the cause (Harvey 2020).

While Humboldt’s influence on philosophers has been less studied, it is evident that he played a significant role in the development of American Transcendentalism. Emerson claims to have understood nature’s “unity in variety” by reading Humboldt, while Thoreau began classifying New England’s climate zones using Humboldt’s model (Walls 1995; Worster 1977). Furthermore, Humboldt’s use of analogy seems to have influenced Charles Sanders Pierce’s semiotics (Walls 2009).

In Germany, Humboldt inspired Goethe, Schelling, and even Hegel. Goethe describes Humboldt as

a fountain with many ducts, under which one need only hold a vessel and from which refreshing and inexhaustible streams are ever flowing. (MA 19: 168; dated 13 December 1826)

Importantly, Goethe felt encouraged by Humboldt’s interest in his work. It was, for instance, following the Humboldt brothers’ visit to Weimar 1795, during which Goethe had discussed his notion of the animal “type [Typus]”, that Goethe began to write down his ideas. As Goethe reflects on this moment years later, it was the Humboldt brothers’ prodding that led him to pursue the matter further (MA 12, 181).

Schelling, in turn, saw in Humboldt the exemplary natural scientist—not despite his empirical research, but because of it (Pinsdorf 2020). In fact, Schelling regarded Humboldt’s research as providing empirical foundations for Naturphilosophie, and saw him as playing a crucial spiritual role in European culture. As he put it in a letter to Humboldt composed soon after the latter’s return to Europe, Humboldt’s work will “restore to the human spirit its ancient possession, nature” (quoted in Dettelbach 2001: 18). Hegel, though dismayed by Humboldt’s critical remarks on Naturphilosophie in his Kosmos lectures, sought to determine—along Humboldtian lines—the “geographic foundations of world history” (Bond 2014).

Furthermore, Humboldt paved new paths for the study and estimation of Indigenous American culture and language—not only by helping his brother acquire one of the largest collections of languages in Europe, including the Kawi language, but also by inspiring US Treasury Secretary, Albert Gallatin, to write his major work in American ethnology, A Synopsis of the Indian Tribes within the United States (1836) (Sachs 2004).

All in all, it is difficult to imagine the nineteenth century without Humboldt, and the scientific, artistic, and philosophical traditions that he founded and supported.


I have provided references to English translations of Humboldt’s works following reference to the French and (or) German original. As noted above, however, translators were often liberal with their translations. Thus, although I reference English translations, the translations of passages provided here are my largely my own. Accordingly, exact replicas of the English renditions provided here may not be found in the translations referred to (this is especially the case with Otté’s Cosmos [CO] which remains the most easily accessible version of the work). Furthermore, in cases where a passage only appears in the German edition, I have only referred to the German.

Humboldt Primary Literature and Abbreviations

Original German

  • [AN] 1808, Ansichten der Natur mit wissenschaftlichen Erläuterungen, Tübingen: Cotta.
  • [AML] Aus meinem Leben, edited by Kurt-R. Biermann, Leipzig: Urania Verlag, 1987.
  • [BVE] Briefe von Alexander von Humboldt an Varnhagen von Ense, edited by Ludmilla Assing, Leipzig: Brockhaus, 1870.
  • [JB] Die Jugendbriefe Alexander von Humboldts. 1787–1799, edited by Ilse Jahn and Fritz Lange, Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1973.
  • [Kosmos] 1845–1862, Kosmos: eine physische Wetlbeschreibung, 5 volumes, Stüttgart: Johann Georg Cotta.
  • [VMN] 1797–8, Versuche über die gereizte Muskel- und Nervenfaser nebst Vermuthungen über den chemischen Process des Lebens in der Thier- und Pflanzenwelt, 2 volumes, Posen: Decker und Compagnie/Berlin: Heinrich August Rottman.
  • 1790, Beobachtungen über einige Basalte am Rhein [Observations of some Basalt at the Rhine], Braunschweig: Schulbuchhandlung.
  • 1795, “Die Lebenskraft oder der Rhodische Genius: eine Erzählung” [Life Force or the Rhodian Genius: A Tale], Die Horen. Eine Monatsschrift (Tübingen), 1: 90–96.
  • 1830, Über die Haupt-Ursachen der Temperatur-Verschiedenheit auf dem Erdkörper, Berlin: Preussische Akademie der Wissenschaften.

Original French

  • [Nouvelle-Espagne] 1811, Essai Politique sur le royaume de la Nouvelle-Espagne, 2 volumes, Paris: Schoell.
  • [L’ile de Cuba] 1826, Essai Politique sur l’ile de Cuba, 2 volumes, Paris: Gide Fils.
  • [Relation historique] 1814, Relation historique du voyage aux regions équinoxiales du Nouveau Continent, 3 volumes. Part of Voyage.
  • [Voyage] 1814–1831, Voyage aux régions équinoxiales du Nouveau Continent par Al. de Humboldt et A. Bonpland, with Aimé Bonpland, 7 volumes, Paris: F. Schoell.
  • 1810–1813, Vues des Cordillères, et monumens des peuples indigènes de l’Amérique, Paris: F. Schoell.

New German Edition

  • [DA] Darmstädter Ausgabe, edited with commentary by Hanno Beck, 7 volumes, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1989–.
    • Bd. 1: Schriften zur Geographie der Pflanzen
    • Bd. 2: Die Forschungsreise in den Tropen Amerika, 3 books
    • Bd. 3: Cuba-Werk,
    • Bd. 4: Mexico-Werk
    • Bd. 5: Ansichten der natur
    • Bd. 6: Schriften zur Physikalischen Geographie
    • Bd. 7: Kosmos, Entwurf einer physischen Weltbeschreibung, 2 books

English Translations

  • [CO 1] Cosmos, Volume 1, edited and translated by E. C. Otté, London: Bohn, 1849. Reprinted 1858–59, New York: Harper & Brothers. Reprint of the latter with introduction by Nicolaas A. Rupke, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997].
  • [CO 2] Cosmos, Volume 2, edited and translated by E. C. Otté, London: Bohn, 1850. New printing with introduction by Michael Dettelbach, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997].
  • [CO 3] Cosmos, Volume 3, edited and translated by E. C. Otté, London: Bohn, 1851.
  • [KNS] Essay on the Kingdom of New Spain, Volume 1: A Critical Edition, edited with an Introduction by Vera M. Kutzinski and Ottmar Ette, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2019.
  • [VN] Views of Nature, edited by Stephen T. Jackson and Laura Dassow Walls; translated by Mark W. Person, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2014.
  • [EGP] Essay on the Geography of Plants, with Aimé Bonpland, edited with an introduction by Stephen T. Jackson, translated (from French) by Sylvie Romanowski, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2009.
  • [PN] Personal Narrative of Travels to the Equionoctial Regions of America, During the Years 1799–1804, with Aimé Bonpland, edited and translated by Helen Maria Williams, 7 volumes, London: Longman, Hurst, Rees, Orme, and Brown, 1814–1829.

Other Primary Literature and Abbreviations

  • [MA] Goethe, Johann Wolfgang von, Sämtliche Werke nach Epochen seines Schaffens (Münchner Ausgabe), edited by K. Richter et al., Munich: Carl Hanser, 1985–1998.
  • [NA] Schiller, Friedrich, Schillers Werke. Nationalausgabe, edited by Julius Petersen et al. 43 volumes, Weimar: Hermann Böhlaus Nachfolger, 1943–.

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