Notes to Ancient Political Philosophy

1. I will use both “city” and “city-state” to refer to the polis, though neither of these nor any English word fully captures its meaning; unlike our “city,” the polis encompassed both an urban area and a rural hinterland, while unlike our “state,” its political identity was not conceived as distinct from the body of active citizens which comprised it.

2. This is roughly translatable by the British ‘the great and the good’, but with those two terms synonymous rather than disjunctive: not a separate group of ‘the good’ such as the bishops still sitting in the House of Lords, but rather ‘the good’ as precisely the wealthy and well-born.

3. Free women had a passive citizen status, and only a very few manumitted slaves and aliens were, exceptionally, granted citizenship in any city.

4. On the fundamental difference between democracy and oligarchy, see Aristotle: ‘…what is authoritative everywhere is the governing body of the polis, and the governing body is the politeia. I mean, for example, that in democracies the dēmos is authoritative, while by contrast it is the few (hoi oligoi) in oligarchies; we say that the politeia too is different in these [two] cases,’ (Politics III.1278b8–12, as trans. in Ober 1998a, 164). Herodotus’ ‘Persian debate’ in his Histories 3.80–82 contrasted spokesmen for monarchy, aristocracy (the honorific form of oligarchy: ‘rule of the best’), and a regime of equals that corresponds broadly to democracy. Monarchy and tyranny (originally not necessarily pejorative) were also important political regimes, but the major civic conflicts of the mid-fifth to late-fourth centuries were contests between partisans of democracy and of oligarchy.

5. It is worth noting that while Plato is most often credited with inventing ‘political philosophy’ as a genre, he did not qualify philosophia with politikê. While he postulated a politikê technê or epistêmê, he saw the philosopher’s knowledge as encompassing a comprehensive rather than narrowly political field. Likewise, while he wrote in the first half of the fourth century, those of his dialogues with historical settings are all set in the fifth century: he appears to see this period as the distinctive crucible of Athenian politics.

6. The relation between the principles advanced in his own name, and those advanced by the “Laws”, is controversial; it would be attractive, with Weiss 1998, to be able to find sufficient grounds for Socrates’ obedience in the “never commit injustice” principle, though this requires an account to be given of why escape would constitute injustice, which is difficult to make out in the early part of the dialogue alone, in which Socrates speaks in his own voice, before invoking and ventriloquizing a speech in the name of the Laws of Athens.

7. In giving these dates for Plato’s life, contrary to those offered in certain other SEP articles, I follow Nails (2002).

8. See however Laks 2000: 258, who reserves that distinction for Plato’s Laws. For an overview of the political and philosophical import of the Republic, see Höffe (ed.) 1997.

9. This may help to explain a striking contrast. In the Kallipolis of the Republic, the producers, who are free farmers and artisans and may range from rich to poor, are presented as being citizens, but they are not accorded any formal political role, let alone holding any offices; only the philosopher-kings and their assistant guardians seem to play a formal political role that could potentially count as an office (though the text is ambiguous as to whether it does). In the Magnesia of the Laws, all citizens hold offices (including certain educational offices reserved for female citizens), but the citizen body is defined much more narrowly, similarly to that of Aristotle’s ideal virtuous regime in the Politics, in which artisans, tradesmen, and farmers are explicitly excluded from citizenship.

10. An interesting resolution of this controversy has been proposed by David J. Riesbeck (2016), who argues that one can participate in a political community without necessarily being eligible to hold the highest offices within it.

11. For his part, Plutarch himself went so far in the same discussion as to take the aim of Zeno’s treatise to have been fulfilled by the world-conquests of Alexander the Great, though this claim seems to have been a willful misunderstanding for his own purposes (Schofield 1991: 24, 104–11).

12. The ambassadors were the Academic [skeptic] Carneades, the Stoic Diogenes, and the Peripatetic [Aristotelian] Critolaus. The Romans had sent emissaries of their own about three centuries earlier to study Greek constitutions, in the course of drawing up their own first set of law codes.

13. Compare the acronym U.S.A., which refers to the states as the components of the federation rather than referring to the Senate and the people as the joint sources of its governance.

14. See Kempshall 2001 for an analysis of these divergent possibilities and their significance for later political thought.

15. The drafting of this section is indebted to René de Nicolay and Ian Walling.

16. Much of this section is adapted from Lane 2012: 94–7.

17. To be sure, this generalization, like many about ancient philosophy, leaves the ancient skeptics and Cynics aside.

Copyright © 2018 by
Melissa Lane <>

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