Supplement to Aristotle and Mathematics

Place and continuity of Magnitudes in Physics iv and v

In Physics iv.1-5 Aristotle distinguishes four notions as candidates for place. Each is understood in terms of a contained or containing body and in terms of either the limit (shape or form) of a magnitude or the extension within the limit of the magnitude:

  1. the extension of the magnitude of the contained body (this is the matter of the magnitude);
  2. the extension between the inner limit of the containing body (Aristotle argues that this is a fiction);
  3. the limit of the contained body (this is the form, i.e., shape, of the contained body);
  4. the inner limit of the containing body (Aristotle argues that this is place).

Since Aristotle only is thinking here of the place of a body, he needs to expand the notion or at least to treat it more cavalierly than he does in this discussion. In fact, any magnitude will have place when he turns to the discussion of continuity.

From Physics v.3 (a discussion of perceptible quantities), cf. also Categories 6, we have the following central notions:

  1. Together or in contact (hama) and Apart (khôris)
    1. Two magnitudes are together if they occupy the same place.
    2. Two magnitudes are apart or separate if they occupy two distinct places.
  2. Touching (haptesthai) and Between (metaxu): Two magnitudes touch (are in contact) if their limits (akra) are together.
  3. Between (metaxu) pertains to continuous change: what is between is that which a continuous changer arrives at before it arrives at the end of the change.
  4. Succession (ephexês): X is in succession to Y with regard to position or something else, if there is nothing of the same kind between X and Y, and X comes after Y. A pair comes after a unit.
  5. Contiguous or held (ekhomenon): X is connected to Y if X is in succession to Y and X is in contact with Y.
  6. Continuous or held together (synekhes): X is continuous with Y if X is contiguous with Y and their limits at which they are in contact are one and ‘held together’.

Copyright © 2004 by
Henry Mendell <>

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