Aristotle’s Rhetoric has had an unparalleled influence on the development of the art of rhetoric. In addition to Aristotle’s disciples and followers, the so-called Peripatetic philosophers (see Fortenbaugh/Mirhady 1994), famous Roman teachers of rhetoric, such as Cicero and Quintilian, frequently used elements stemming from Aristotle’s rhetorical theory. These latter authors, however, were not primarily interested in a meticulous interpretation of Aristotle’s writings, but were rather looking for a conceptual framework for their own manuals of rhetoric. This is one of the reasons why for two millennia the interpretation of Aristotelian rhetoric has been pursued by those concerned primarily with the history of rhetoric rather than philosophy. This association with the rhetorical rather than with the philosophical tradition is also mirrored in the fact that in the most influential manuscripts and editions, the text of Aristotle’s Rhetoric (for its transmission see Kassel 1971) was surrounded by rhetorical works and speeches written by other Greek and Latin authors, and was thus seldom interpreted in the context of Aristotle’s philosophical works. It was not until the last few decades that the philosophically salient features of the Aristotelian rhetoric have been acknowledged (e.g. in the collections Furley/Nehamas 1994 and Rorty 1996; for a more general survey of scholarship in the 20th century see Natali 1994). Most notably, scholars became aware of the fact that Aristotle’s rhetorical analysis of persuasion draws on many concepts and ideas that are also treated in his logical, ethical, political and psychological writings, so that the Rhetoric became increasingly perceived as well-integrated part of the Aristotelian oeuvre. For example, Aristotle’s Rhetoric is inextricably connected with the history of ancient logic (see Allen 2008 and, more generally, ancient logic) and is often taken as an important inspiration for modern argumentation theory (see van Eemeren 2013 and, more generally, dialogical logic). Some authors have stressed the Rhetoric’s affinity to Aristotle’s ethical theory (see e.g. Woerner 1990), while others were attracted by Aristotle’s rhetorical account of metaphor (see e.g. Ricoeur 1996 and, more generally, metaphor). Most significantly, philosophers and scholars began to turn their attention to the Rhetoric’s account of the passions or emotions, which is not only richer than in any other Aristotelian treatise, but was also seen as manifesting an early example of cognitive, judgement-based accounts of emotions (see e.g. Nussbaum 1996, Konstan 2006 and, more generally, §5 of emotion).
- 1. Aristotle’s Works on Rhetoric
- 2. The Structure of the Rhetoric
- 3. Rhetoric as a Counterpart to Dialectic
- 4. The Nature and Purpose of Rhetoric
- 5. The Three Means of Persuasion
- 6. The Enthymeme
- 7. The Topoi
- 8. Style: How to Say Things with Words
- Glossary of Selected Terms
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Aristotle’s Works on Rhetoric
The work that has come down to us as Aristotle’s Rhetoric or Art of Rhetoric consists of three books, while the ancient catalogue of the Aristotelian works, reported e.g. by Diogenes Laertius, mentions only two books on rhetoric (probably our Rhetoric I & II), plus two further books on style (perhaps our Rhetoric III?). Whereas most modern authors agree that at least the core of Rhetoric I & II presents a coherent rhetorical theory, the two themes of Rhetoric III (style/diction and the partition of speeches) are not mentioned in the original agenda of Rhetoric I & II. The conceptual link between Rhetoric I & II and Rhetoric III is not given until the very last sentence of the second book, so the authenticity of this seeming ad hoc connection is slightly suspicious; we cannot rule out the possibility that these two parts of the Rhetoric were not put together until the first complete edition of Aristotle’s works was accomplished by Andronicus of Rhodes in the first century. In Aristotle’s Poetics (1456a33) we find a cross-reference to a work called ‘Rhetoric’ which obviously refers only to Rhetoric I & II, but does not seem to include the agenda of Rhetoric III, suggesting that Aristotle at this time regards Rhetoric I & II as the complete work. Regardless of such doubts, the systematic idea that links the two heterogeneous parts of the Rhetoric — Rhetoric I & II on the one hand and Rhetoric III on the other— does make good sense: it is not enough, or so the linking passage says, to have a supply of things to say (the so-called ‘thought’); one should also know how to express or formulate those things (the so-called ‘style’), so that the project of Rhetoric I & II concerning what we say (or the ‘thought’) needs to be complemented by the peculiar project of Rhetoric III (i.e. a treatise on ‘style’).
The chronological fixing of the Rhetoric has turned out to be a delicate and controversial matter. At least the core of Rhetoric I & II seems to be an early work (see e.g. Düring 1966, 118–125, Rist 1989, 85–86, Rapp 2002 I, 178–184), written during Aristotle’s first stay in Athens (it is unclear, however, which chapters belong to that core; regularly mentioned are the chapters I.4–15 and II.1–17). It is true that the Rhetoric also refers to historical events that fall in the time of Aristotle’s exile and his second stay in Athens (see § 1 of Aristotle), but most of them can be found in just two chapters, namely chapters II.23–24, and moreover such examples could have been updated, which is especially plausible if we assume that the Rhetoric formed the basis of a lecture course held several times. However, what is most striking are its affinities to the early work Topics (for the idea that the Topics is early see e.g. Solmsen 1929, 191–195; for a discussion of Solmsen’s theses in English see Stocks 1933); if, as is widely agreed nowadays, the Topics represents a pre-syllogistic stage of Aristotelian logic, the same is likely to be true of the Rhetoric, as we actually find only few or even no hints to syllogistic inventory in it. (Indeed, the Rhetoric includes two short passages that explicitly refer to the Analytics, which presents Aristotle’s syllogistic theory: I.2, 1357a22–1358a2, II.25, 1402b13–1403a16. Some authors — e.g. Solmsen 1929, 13–31, Burnyeat 1994, 31, Allen 2001, 20–40 — take this as evidence that at least in these two passages the Rhetoric makes use of the syllogistic theory, while others — e.g. Rapp 2002, II 202–204 — object to this inference.)
It seems that Aristotle was the author not only of the Rhetoric as we know it today, but of several treatises dealing with rhetoric. According to ancient testimonies, Aristotle wrote an early dialogue on rhetoric entitled ‘Grullos’, in which he put forward arguments for why rhetoric cannot be an art (technê); and since this is precisely the position of Plato’s Gorgias (see §4 of Plato: rhetoric and poetry), the lost dialogue Grullos has traditionally been regarded as a sign of Aristotle’s (alleged) early Platonism (see Solmsen 1929, 196–208). But the evidence for the position defended in this dialogue is too tenuous to support such strong conclusions: it also could have been a ‘dialectical’ dialogue, simply listing the pros and cons of the thesis that rhetoric is an art (see Lossau 1974). We are in a similar situation concerning another lost work on rhetoric, the so-called ‘Technê Sunagogê’, a collection of previous theories of rhetoric that is also ascribed to Aristotle. Cicero seems to use this collection, or at least a secondary source relying on it, as his main historical source when he gives a short survey of the history of pre-Aristotelian rhetoric in his Brutus 46–48. Finally, Aristotle once mentions a work called ‘Theodecteia’ which has also been supposed to be Aristotelian; but more probably he refers to the rhetorical handbook of his follower Theodectes, who was also a former pupil of Isocrates. From these lost works on rhetoric we only have a meagre collection of scattered fragments (frg. 68–69 R3, 114 R3, 125–141 R3: see Rose 1886).
2. The Structure of the Rhetoric
The structure of Rhetoric I & II is determined by two tripartite divisions. The first division consists in the distinction between the three pisteis, i.e. ‘persuaders’ or ‘means of persuasion’, that are technical in the sense that they are based on the rhetorical method and are provided by the speech alone. And speech can produce persuasion either through the character (êthos) of the speaker, the emotional state (pathos) of the listener, or the argument (logos) itself (see below § 5). The second tripartite division concerns the three species or genres of public speech (see de Brauw 2008 and Pepe 2013). A speech that takes place in the assembly is defined as a deliberative speech. In this rhetorical genre, the speaker either advises the audience to do something or warns against doing something. Accordingly, the audience has to judge things that are going to happen in the future, and they have to decide whether these future events are good or bad for the city or city-state (polis), whether they will cause advantage or harm. A speech that takes place before a court is defined as a judicial speech. The speaker either accuses somebody or defends herself or someone else. Naturally, this kind of speech treats things that happened in the past. The audience, or rather the jury, has to judge whether a past event actually happened or not and whether it was just or unjust, i.e., whether it was in accordance with the law or contrary to the law. While the deliberative and judicial genres have their context in controversial situations in which the listener has to decide in favour of one of two opposing parties, the third genre does not aim at such a decision: an epideictic speech (e.g. funeral speeches, celebratory speeches) praises or blames somebody, and tries to describe the affairs or deeds of its subject as honourable or shameful.
The first book of the Rhetoric treats these three genres in succession. Rhetoric I.4–8 deals with the deliberative, I.9 with the epideictic, I.10–14 with the judicial genre. These chapters are understood as contributing to the argumentative mode of persuasion (logos) or — more precisely — to that part of argumentative persuasion that is specific to the respective genre of speech. The second part of the treatment of argumentative persuasion (logos) that is common to all three genres of rhetorical speech is treated in chapters II.19–26. The second means of persuasion, the one that works by evoking the emotions of the audience (pathos), is described in chapters II.2–11. Although the following chapters II.12–17 treat different types of character (êthos), these chapters do not, as one might infer, develop the first means of persuasion, i.e. the one that depends on the character of the speaker. The underlying theory of this means of persuasion is rather unfolded in a few lines of chapter II.1. The aforementioned chapters II.12–17 rather account for different types of character and their disposition to emotional response, which can be useful for speakers who want to arouse the emotions of the audience. Why the chapters on the specific (in the first book) and the common (in the second book) argumentative means of persuasion (logos) are separated by the treatment of emotions and character (in II.2–17) remains a riddle, especially since the chapter II.18 tries to give a link between the specific and the common aspects of argumentative persuasion — as though this chapter follows directly upon the end of Rhetoric I. Rhetoric III.1–12 discusses several questions of style (see below § 8.1) while Rhetoric III.13–19 is dedicated to the various parts of a speech and their arrangement.
Owing to ambiguities like these, the structuring of the Rhetoric has always been somewhat controversial, since different attempts to structure the work manifest different interpretative decisions. By and large, though, the following structure seems to capture its main topics and divisions:
- Ch. 1: Rhetoric as a counterpart to dialectic — dialectically conceived rhetoric is centred on proofs — rhetorical proofs are ‘enthymemes’ — this is neglected by previous manuals of rhetoric that focus instead on emotions, slandering and on other techniques for speaking outside the subject — “speaking outside the subject” is forbidden in states with good legislation — the benefits of rhetoric.
- Ch. 2: Rhetoric is the capacity to discern the available
persuasive potential in any given case — means of persuasion
(pisteis) based on the art (technê) of
rhetoric vs. artless means of persuasion — of the art-based
means of persuasion (pisteis) there are three types:
- Through the speaker: credibility of the speaker (êthos)
- Through the hearer: the emotional state of the audience (pathos)
- Through the argument: proving or seemingly proving what is true (logos)
- Ch. 3: There are three genres of public speech:
- Judicial (or forensic) speech deals with accusation and defence about past events — aiming at the just/unjust.
- Deliberative (or political) speech deals with exhortation and dissuasion about future events — aiming at the advantageous/harmful.
- Epideictic speech deals with praise and blame primarily with regard to the present time — aiming at the honourable/shameful.
- Ch. 4–8: Premises or topoi specific to the deliberative speech: Types of advantageous/harmful things the speaker should be familiar with (Ch. 4) — Happiness (eudaimonia) (Ch. 5) — what is good/advantageous (Ch. 6) — what is better/more advantageous (Ch. 7) — the various constitutions (Ch. 8).
- Ch. 9: Premises or topoi specific to the epideictic speech: virtue and vice — the honourable and the blameworthy.
- Ch. 10–14: Premises or topoi specific to the judicial speech: wrong-doing and motives for wrong-doing (Ch. 10) — pleasure (Ch. 11) — the state of mind of the wrong-doers and characteristics of their victims (Ch. 12) — kinds of just and unjust deeds, unwritten laws (Ch. 13) — degrees of wrong-doing (Ch. 14).
- Ch. 15: Artless means of persuasion (i.e. means that cannot be invented by the art, but are just given — such as contracts, laws, witnesses, oaths, torture — and need to be used in one way or the other), mostly connected with judicial speech.
- Ch. 1: Why persuasion through logos is insufficient — how persuasion through êthos and pathos is supposed to work.
- Ch. 2–11: Particular types of emotions (pathê) and their counterparts: anger (Ch. 2) — mildness (Ch. 3) — loving/friendly affection (philia) and hating (Ch. 4) — fear and confidence (Ch. 5) — shame and lack of shame (Ch. 6) — gratefulness and lack of gratefulness (Ch. 7) — pity (Ch. 8) — indignation plus two nameless emotions (Ch. 9) — envy (Ch. 10) — emulation or ambition (Ch.11).
- Ch. 12–17: Different types of character (êthos): the character of young people (Ch. 12), of elderly people (Ch. 13), of people in the prime of their life (Ch. 14), of people of noble birth (Ch. 15), of wealthy people (Ch. 16) and of powerful people (Ch. 18).
- Ch. 18: Transition to generally applicable aspects of persuasion through logos:
- Ch. 19–25: Generally applicable aspects of persuasion through logos: topoi about the possible/impossible, past and future facts, significance and insignificance (Ch. 19) — examples: factual (report) and fictitious (the parable and the fable) (Ch. 20) — maxims (Ch. 21) — the enthymeme (Ch. 22) — topoi for the construction of enthymemes (Ch. 23) — topoi for the construction of merely apparent (i.e. fallacious) enthymemes (Ch. 24) — refutation (Ch. 25).
- Ch. 26: Amplification — transition to Rhetoric III.
Rhetoric III, Ch. 1–12: Style (lexis):
- Ch. 1: Delivery of a speech and why style/diction should be considered.
- Ch. 2–3: The virtue and the vices of prose style: the excellent prose style is neither too banal nor above the due dignity, but appropriate — the choice of words — the role of metaphors (Ch. 2) — Four deterrent factors (or vices) of style (Ch. 3).
- Ch. 4–11: Particular ingredients of prose style: the simile (Ch. 4) — linguistic correctness (Ch. 5) — stylistic voluminousness and its contrary (Ch. 6) — appropriateness in style (Ch. 7) — periodic style (Ch. 8) — rhythm (Ch. 9) — urbanity, bringing before the eyes, metaphors (Ch. 10–11).
- Ch. 12: Written and oral style.
Rhetoric III, Ch. 13–19: Arrangement (taxis):
- Ch. 13: Only two parts of the speech are necessary, namely the statement and the proof of the main claim — contemporary authors of rhetorical manuals make futile subdivisions of the parts of speech — introduction of a quadripartite scheme of the speech: (1) proem, (2) statement of the main claim, (3) proof of the stated claim (pistis), (4) epilogue.
- Ch. 14–19: Particular parts of the speech: the proem in the three genres of speech (Ch. 14) — topoi for slandering (Ch. 15) — narration (Ch. 16) — proof (pistis) (Ch. 17) — interrogation (Ch. 18) — epilogue/conclusion (Ch. 19).
3. Rhetoric as a Counterpart to Dialectic
Aristotle stresses right from the beginning of his Rhetoric that rhetoric is closely related to dialectic. He offers several formulations to describe the affinity between these two disciplines: in the first line of the book Rhetoric rhetoric is said to be a ‘counterpart’ (antistrophos) to dialectic (Rhet. I.1, 1354a1); in the second chapter of the first book it is also called an ‘outgrowth’ or ‘offshoot’ (paraphues ti) of dialectic and the study of character (Rhet. I.2, 1356a25f.); finally, Aristotle says that rhetoric is part of dialectic and resembles it (Rhet. I.2, 1356a30f.).
In saying that rhetoric is a counterpart to dialectic, Aristotle obviously wants to allude to Plato’s Gorgias (464bff.), where rhetoric is ironically defined as a counterpart to cookery in the soul. Since, in this passage, Plato uses the word ‘antistrophos’ to indicate an analogy, it is likely that Aristotle wants to express a kind of analogy too: what dialectic is for the (private or academic) practice of attacking and maintaining an argument, rhetoric is for the (public) practice of defending oneself or accusing an opponent.
The notion of ‘dialectic’ is prominent in the work of Aristotle’s teacher, Plato; Plato often labels his philosophical method, or certain parts of it, as dialectic. In his dialogue Gorgias (see §4 of Plato: rhetoric and poetry), dialectic seems to be strictly opposed to rhetoric, the former aiming at the disclosure of truth, the latter allegedly aiming at ‘persuasion without knowledge’. In his Phaedrus Plato pictures the relation between dialectic and rhetoric in a different way (see §5.1 of Plato: rhetoric and poetry); here he entertains the idea of a new philosophical rhetoric, quite different from the then contemporary style of speech writing, which rests upon dialectic, the genuine philosophical method, for acquiring genuine knowledge both of the subject matter of a speech and of the soul of the audience. When Aristotle speaks of dialectic, he certainly has his book Topics in mind, where he develops at some length an argumentative method for attacking and defending theses of any content (see §8 of Aristotle: logic). Clearly, Aristotle’s dialectical method was inspired by Plato and by the debates in Plato’s Academy; however, while Plato often presents dialectic as a method for discovering and conveying truth, Aristotelian dialectic is strictly confined to examining particular claims or testing the consistency of a set of propositions (which in his view is different from establishing or proving the truth of a proposition). This is, in a nutshell, the context that must be kept in mind, when Aristotle presents — quite allusively — a new art of rhetoric by stressing its affinity to dialectic; obviously he plays upon his readers’ expectations concerning the meaning of dialectic and the relation between dialectic and rhetoric, as described by Plato. Those students of Plato’s Academy who were still suspicious about any engagement with rhetoric and public speech possibly received the opening of Aristotle’s Rhetoric with its postulated affinity between rhetoric and dialectic either as a provoction or as some sort of joke.
This purported analogy between rhetoric and dialectic (as conceived by Aristotle) can be substantiated by several common features of both disciplines:
- Both rhetoric and dialectic are concerned with things that do not belong to a definite genus or are not the object of a specific science.
- Both rhetoric and dialectic are not dependent on the established principles of specific sciences.
- Both rhetoric and dialectic have the function of providing arguments.
- Both rhetorical and dialectical arguments rely on assumptions or premises that are not established as true, but are only reputable or accepted by one group or the other (endoxa).
- Both rhetoric and dialectic are concerned with both sides of an opposition, dialectic by constructing arguments for and against any thesis, rhetoric by considering what is possibly persuasive in any given case.
This analogy to dialectic has extremely significant ramifications for the status of Aristotle’s supposedly new art of rhetoric. Plato argued in his Gorgias that rhetoric could not be an art (technê), since it is not related to a definite subject, while real arts are defined by their specific subjects, as e.g. medicine or shoemaking are defined by their products (health and shoes). By claiming that rhetoric and dialectic are similar or analogous, Aristotle suggests a quite different picture. The analogy is even meant to flesh out the thought that neither rhetoric nor dialectic are like ordinary arts (technai) or sciences with a limited, well-defined subject matter. However, this should not be seen as a drawback, or so the analogy suggests, since the alleged shortcoming, i.e. that they do not have such a definite subject matter, can be turned into a virtue, by entrusting to dialectic and rhetoric the practices that are common to all fields of rationality, namely the various practices of argumentation. For even though dialectic has no definite subject, it is easy to see that it nevertheless employs a consistent method (both in Plato’s and Aristotle’s understanding of dialectic), because dialectic has to grasp the ultimate reason why some arguments are valid and others are not. Now, if rhetoric is nothing but the counterpart to dialectic within the domain of public speech, it must be similarly grounded in an investigation of what is persuasive and what is not, and this, in turn, qualifies rhetoric as an art or, after all, as a discipline that is methodologically not inferior to dialectic.
As already indicated, it is crucial for both disciplines, dialectic and rhetoric, that they deal with arguments from accepted premises (endoxa). Dialecticians do not argue on the basis of established, scientific principles, but on the basis of only reputable assumptions, i.e. of what is accepted either by all or the many or the few experts. In a similar vein, rhetoricians or orators try to hit assumptions that are already accepted by their audience, because they want to persuade the addressees on the basis of their own convictions. Of course, owing to the different fields of application — philosophical–academic debates in the case of dialectic, mostly public speeches in the case of rhetoric — the situation is not quite the same. While e.g. the dialectician tries to test the consistency of a set of propositions, the rhetorician tries to achieve the persuasion of a given audience, and while dialectic proceeds by questioning and answering, rhetoric for the most part proceeds in continuous–monologic form. Still, and in spite of these differences, the method of both dialectic and rhetoric share the same core idea that they have to hit certain, accepted assumptions of their addressees — the dialectical disputant in order to get the explicit assent of the dialectical opponent, the rhetorician in order to base the rhetorical proofs on views the audience already finds convincing. Furthermore, just as the dialectician is interested in deductions and inductions for refuting the opponent’s claims, the rhetorician is interested in deductions and inductions that logically connect (or seem to connect) the audience’s existing convictions with certain other views that the rhetorician wishes to establish (see below § 6). For, indeed, Aristotle seems to think that arguments or proofs are central to any process of persuasion, for people are most or most easily persuaded, he says (Rhet. I.1, 1355a3f.), when they suppose something to have been proven.
Hence the rhetorician who is willing to give a central place to arguments or (rhetorical) proofs — and this seems to be the peculiar approach to rhetoric that Aristotle suggests at the beginning of his Rhetoric — can base his or her method of persuasion to a significant extent on the method of dialectical argumentation, as expounded in Aristotle’s Topics (see Rapp 2016 and 2018). And since the notion of ‘dialectic’ is inextricably linked with a genuinely philosophical method, the implied message of this dialectical turn of rhetoric seems to be that philosophers, properly understood, have access to a method that is superior not only for internal academic discussions between philosophers, but also for the so-called ‘encounter with the many’ (Rhet. I.1, 1355a29, Topics I.2, 101a35), i.e. for the purpose of addressing a mass audience with little or no education. As already indicated, Aristotle does not seem to have been the first to come up with the idea that ‘true’ rhetoric should become dialectical; however, while in Plato’s Phaedrus the dialectical turn of rhetoric remains a mere sketch, Aristotle’s Rhetoric does not hesitate to set this idea into operation, most notably by adapting most of the dialectical equipment developed elsewhere, especially in his Topics. In many particular instances he just imports technical vocabulary from his dialectic (e.g. protasis, sullogismos, topos, endoxon); in many other instances he redefines traditional rhetorical notions by his dialectical inventory, e.g. the enthymeme is redefined as a deduction, the example is redefined as an induction, etc. Above all, the Rhetoric introduces the use of the so-called topoi (see below § 7) that is typical for the dialectical method and is otherwise only treated in Aristotle’s works on dialectic, i.e. in Topics and Sophistical Refutations.
4. The Nature and Purpose of Rhetoric
There are widely divergent views on the purpose of Aristotle’s Rhetoric. Ultimately, it is certainly meant to support those who are going to address a public audience in court, at assemblies of the people, or at certain festive events and who, to that end, have to compose speeches. But does this in itself render the Rhetoric a mere ‘manual’ or ‘handbook’ aiming at the persuasion of a given audience? Or does it rather aim at a specifically qualified type of persuasion (bringing about, e.g., conviction based on the best available grounds and without misunderstanding)? Influenced by the debate in the 20th century about ‘old and new rhetoric’ and by the work of authors such as I.A. Richards, Kenneth Burke and Wayne C. Booth on the one hand and Hans-Georg Gadamer and Paul Ricoeur on the other, Aristotle scholars began to wonder whether his Rhetoric is an instruction manual offering guidance about how to change other people’s minds or has, rather, a philosophically more ambitious scope, such as e.g. human communication and discourse in general. This second approach is reflected in the statements of those contending that the “object of Aristotle’s treatise on rhetoric is ultimately an analysis of the nature of human discourse in all areas of knowledge.” (Grimaldi 1972, 1) or of those suggesting that it can be read as “a piece of philosophic inquiry, and judged by philosophic standards” (Garver 1994, 3). Others have diagnosed a most notable ambivalence in the Rhetoric (see Oates 1963, 335), as between its role as a practical handbook on the one hand and Aristotle’s attempt to connect it to his logic, ethics and politics on the other. Likewise, interpreters are divided on the questions of whether Aristotle’s Rhetoric is meant to be used for good and bad purposes alike or whether it is specifically tailored to implementing the good and virtuous goals delineated in Aristotle’s ethical and political writings; and whether, to that latter end, the speaker is entitled to deploy the whole range of persuasive devices, even manipulative and deceptive ones. In many instances, the text of Aristotle’s Rhetoric is open to several interpretations; however, it seems possible to restrict the range of plausible readings, e.g. by considering Aristotle’s definition of rhetoric and what he says about the internal and external ends of rhetoric.
4.1 The Definition of Rhetoric
Assuming that Aristotle’s Poetics gives instructions for how to compose good tragedies, shouldn’t we expect, then, that Aristotle’s Rhetoric is similarly meant to give instructions for how to compose good speeches? And does this, by the same token, render the art of rhetoric a sort of productive knowledge aiming at the fabrication of a speech (similar to the way the art of shoemaking aims at the fabrication of shoes)? This sounds plausible, as far as it goes (for a discussion of this issue see Leff 1993), and in a few passages (especially in Rhet. III: e.g. 1415b35, 1417a2, 1417a34f. and 36, 1418a10 and 12 and 39, 1420b1) Aristotle actually seems to directly address and instruct a speechwriter in the second person. However, these are rather exceptions to a broader tendency and it is striking that Aristotle never defines the art of rhetoric through the supposed product, the speech, nor the full command of the art of rhetoric through the perfection of the product, i.e. the excellent speech. Instead, Aristotle defines the rhetorician as someone who is always able to see what is persuasive (Topics VI.12, 149b25); correspondingly, rhetoric is defined as the ability to see what is possibly persuasive in every given case (Rhet. I.2, 1355b26f.). Indeed there are passages (Rhet. I.1, 1355b15–17) in which the persuasive plays the same role in rhetoric as the conclusive plays in dialectic or logic. This is not to say that it is the defining function (ergon) of rhetoric to persuade, for the rhetoricians (the ones who possess the art of rhetoric) will not be able to convince people under all circumstances (Rhet. I.1, 1355b10–14). Rather they are in a situation similar to that of physicians: the latter have a complete grasp of their art if and only if they neglect nothing that might heal their patients, although they are not expected to heal each and every patient. Similarly, rhetoricians have a complete grasp of their method, if and only if they are capable of seeing the available means of persuasion, although they are certainly not able to convince each and every audience — owing to factors that the art of rhetoric cannot alter (e.g. biases, partisanship, stubbornness or corruption of the audience). In light of this definition, it seems that the art (technê) of rhetoric is primarily concerned with the nature and the ingredients of persuasiveness and that the book Rhetoric is primarily concerned with elaborating the various ingredients of this art. It goes without saying that possessing such an art is useful for the composition of speeches, but might also be useful for other purposes, e.g. for assessing other people’s speeches, for analysing the persuasive potential of competing cases, etc.
4.2 What Rhetoric Is Useful for
For Aristotle, who defines rhetoric in terms of considering what is persuasive (see above § 4.1) and sees it as a branch of dialectic (see above § 3), rhetoric is clearly not a matter of finding or conveying knowledge. For Plato (see §4 of Plato: rhetoric and poetry), by contrast, this would have been reason enough to become suspicious about the intentions of those who use rhetorical techniques. Isn’t any technique of persuasion that is negligent of knowledge useful only for those who want to outwit their audience and conceal their real aims? For, after all, someone who just wants to communicate the naked truth could be straightforward and would not need to employ rhetorical gimmicks. This, however, is not Aristotle’s point of view: Even those who are simply trying to establish what is just and true need the help of rhetoric when they are faced with a public audience. Aristotle points out that it is impossible to teach such an audience, even if the speaker has the most exact knowledge of the subject (Rhet. I.1, 1355a24–29). Perhaps he is thinking of ordinary people attending a public speech who are not able to follow the kind of argument that, according to Aristotle’s theory of knowledge (see §6 of Aristotle: logic), is apt to establish genuine knowledge. Moreover, he seems to doubt that the controversial, sometimes partisan and hostile, setting of political or judicial speeches is suitable for teaching and learning at all, since whoever wishes to learn has to presuppose that he or she won’t be cheated or deceived by the teacher. But why should one trust the intentions of the opposing party? This is why rhetorical arguments addressing public audiences should be taken from premises that are likely to be accepted by the given audience, from assumptions the audience is already convinced of, and not from the kind of principles (accepted mostly or only by the experts) through which one conveys and establishes knowledge.
More than that, one might wonder whether the typical subject of public speeches really allows of genuine knowledge. In court for example, the judges have to form a reasoned view about whether the accused person is guilty or not and whether the crime committed is minor or major; in political speeches the parties might contend about whether it is advantageous or not to invade the neighbour’s territory or to build a border wall (Aristotle’s examples), but none of these questions allow of precise knowledge. Aristotle says that in some questions treated in public speeches there is only amphidoxein, i.e. room for doubt and only divided opinions (Rhet. I.2, 1356a8). From this perspective, rhetoric seems useful especially for controversies about contingent matters that cannot be fixed by appealing to what we unmistakably know, but only by appealing to widely shared convictions, to what happens (not necessarily, but) only for the most part and to what is likely to be the case (but not necessarily so). For all those reasons, affecting the decisions of juries and assemblies is a matter of persuasiveness, not of knowledge. It is true that some people manage to be persuasive either at random or by habit, but it is rhetoric that gives us a method to systematically disclose all available means of persuasion on any topic whatsoever.
When Aristotle speaks about the benefits of the art of rhetoric he also mentions that it is not only disgraceful when one is unable to defend oneself physically, but also when one is unable to defend oneself through rational speech, for rationality and speech are more peculiar to human beings than physical strength (Rhet. I.1, 1355a38–b2). A certain familiarity with rhetoric is therefore required for sheer self-defence — in general and, perhaps, especially under the conditions of the extreme Athenian form of democracy with its huge courts of lay assessors (one of which sentenced Socrates to death) and with demagogues who would abuse the democratic rules for a coup d’état. Perhaps Aristotle is addressing fellow philosophers who find it beneath their dignity to engage with rhetoric: it is not sublime but naive and embarrassing if they do not gear up for political and legal battles. For those who are defeated in court when they try to defend what is true and just (due to the failure to speak persuasively) are to be blamed (Rhet. I.1, 1355a20–24).
4.3 Can Aristotle’s Rhetoric Be Misused?
Possessing the art of rhetoric is useful then even for those whose sole intent is to defend what they take to be true and just. Still, can’t the same art of rhetoric be misused, e.g. when practised by people with malicious intentions? The short answer is: Yes, of course. Rhetoric in general and even Aristotle’s dialectic-based rhetoric can be misused depending on what people use it for what purposes. (And Aristotle himself is actually aware of the fact that demagogues of his time use a certain style of rhetoric for overthrowing the democratic order: Politics V.5, 1304b21–1305a15). The more elaborate answer that he gives is this. The art of rhetoric (if based on dialectic: see above § 3) is useful partly because it facilitates persuasive argument for the opposites, i.e. on either side of a question. This is first of all seen as an advantage in competence, for people who have full command of this art won’t miss any persuasive aspect of a given question, and this is also seen as a practical advantage, for it helps to detect what goes wrong in the opponent’s arguments (1355a29–38), especially if those opponents use it for objectionable purposes. That this peculiar feature of dialectic-based rhetoric opens the door for misuse is true, but this cannot be held against the art of rhetoric, since the same ambivalence (that something can be used for the better or for the worse) applies to most goods (e.g. wealth, beauty — the only non-ambivalent good is, on Aristotle’s view, virtue). Also, Aristotle downplays the risk of misuse by stressing that it is easier to convince someone of the just and good than of their opposites (especially when using the Aristotelian style of rhetoric).
Still, for many interpreters of Aristotle, from the times of the great Roman rhetoricians on, it is hard to embrace the thought that Aristotle — the famous author of the Nicomachean Ethics and the Politics — who in his ethical work praises the life in accordance with human virtue, could ever endorse a rhetorical project that is not meant to promote virtue and happiness in the city-state (polis). Is it, in other words, possible or likely that Aristotle, whose name in the history of moral philosophy stands for an ethics based on the sustainable development of moral virtues, endorses a technique of rhetoric that does not serve the purpose of promoting virtuous goals? This is a legitimate worry. It can be addressed by distinguishing internal from external ends of rhetoric (which is, to be sure, not Aristotle’s distinction; however, he uses a similar distinction between a thing’s proper function, corresponding to the internal end, and the question what something is useful for, corresponding to the external end). The internal end, i.e. the function that defines the art of rhetoric, is to consider what is persuasive (see above § 4.1), and since there might be persuasive aspects on both sides of a question, the art of rhetoric as such — i.e. according to its internal end — is neutral with regard to true and false, just and unjust, noble and wicked points of view. It can be equally used for promoting good or bad positions (even though, as Aristotle says, it is easier to promote the good ones). All this follows from the dialectical character of Aristotle’s art of rhetoric (see above § 3). If we are interested, by contrast, in the external ends of rhetoric, i.e. the question of what it is useful for (see above § 4.2) or the question of how Aristotle himself wants this art to be used, then it is easy to contrive a plausible story either based on Aristotle’s ethico-political writings or on hints given in the Rhetoric itself (see e.g. Dow 2015, 64–75, for such an attempt) about the morally desirable uses of a style of rhetoric that is based on arguments (sanctioning convicted offenders, defending innocent culprits, averting political decisions that are likely to do harm to the city-state, voicing the point of view of the decent citizens, defending the rule of law, standing up to insurrectionists and demagogues, etc.).
4.4 Is Aristotle’s Conception of Rhetoric Normative?
Obviously, Aristotle’s rhetoric is not thought to be normative in the moral sense that it would only provide the means for persuading people of what is true, just and noble (but not of their opposites; see section § 4.3 above). There is however the widespread intuition that Aristotle’s rhetoric crucially differs from manuals of rhetoric that recommend doing whatever it takes to win a case. This becomes clear already in the beginning of Rhet. I.1, where Aristotle criticizes his predecessors among other things for presenting techniques that are not derived from any art (technê), such as slander and the arousal of pity and anger. He accuses them of dwelling on methods that instruct how to speak “outside the subject” and to distract the attention of the hearers from the subject, while good legislation, he says, requires not speaking outside the subject at all (indeed, “speaking outside the subject” was a legal term in Athenian law of Aristotle’s time). This immediately suggests two senses in which Aristotle’s rhetoric is normative and does not advocate an ‘anything goes’-approach to persuasion: first, the rhetorical devices are required to flow from the art or method of rhetoric and, second, they must not be “outside the subject”. As for the first criterion, Aristotle requires that art-based means of persuasion must be provided by the speech alone and must rely on the systematic analysis of what is persuasive in a given case (see the definition of rhetoric in § 4.1 above). As for the second criterion, it is striking that Aristotle refers to judges or jurors who just “surrender to one of the litigants without really judging” (Rhet. I.1, 1354b34–1355a1), which might be taken to mean that those people cast their votes in favour of the party they side with, but that their votes are not based on a judgement that really considers the case at hand. This formulates a minimally normative criterion for what the rhetorical art aims at, namely the formation of a judgement in the audience that deserves to be called a ‘judgement’, i.e. that it judges something, namely what the judges or jurors are asked to judge. And it seems that in rhetorical persuasion the use of rhetorical devices that are based on the art and are related to the case at hand are more apt to bring about judgements in this genuine sense of the word.
By all appearances, it seems then that Aristotle’s rhetoric is not indifferent with regard to the persuasive means deployed. The effect that speakers using the Aristotelian style of rhetoric can bring about in the audience is thus qualified by the limited range of techniques (based on the art of rhetoric) they use, which means that they do not try to bring the audience over to their side at any cost, but only on the basis of an argumentation that actually addresses the point at issue. In this sense one might say that Aristotle’s rhetorical method aims at something like ‘persuasion based on arguments’, ‘reasonable persuasion’ or a ‘reasoned judgment’ on the audience’s part.
Even if this much is agreed upon, there remains a lot of room for scholarly disagreement on what exactly this normative approach to rhetoric is meant to imply. Is this normativity grounded in the requirements of the art (technê) alone, e.g. what can and what cannot be achieved in a methodical way, or does it hinge on an envisaged effect, e.g. the best possible judgement on the hearer’s part? And which methods are approved by this normative approach and which definitely excluded? Does Aristotle’s art of rhetoric require, above all, that persuasion be centred on arguments and proofs (that are related to the thing at issue and are, thus, pertinent), while other art-based means of persuasion (see below § 5) are mostly thought to offer support to get one’s arguments through (see e.g. Rapp 2012)? Or does the art aim at enhancing only “well-founded” judgements or judgements that are “formed on the basis of good grounds for conviction”, requiring that each particular means of persuasion provide such a good ground for conviction (see Dow 2014 and Dow 2015)?
5. The Three Means of Persuasion
The methodical core of Aristotle’s Rhetoric is the theorem that there are three ‘technical’ pisteis, i.e. ‘persuaders’ or ‘means of persuasion’. Persuasion comes about either through the character (êthos) of the speaker, the emotional state (pathos) of the hearer, or the argument (logos) itself. The structure of Rhetoric I & II & is determined by this tripartition (see § 2 above). The attribute ‘technical’ seems to imply several things: (i) Technical persuasion must rest on a method or art (technê), and this, in turn, is to say that we must know the reason why some things are persuasive and some are not. (ii) Further, technical persuasion must rest on a complete analysis of what is possibly persuasive (see above § 4.1), and not on the random use of scattered persuasive factors. (iii) Technical means of persuasion must be provided by the speakers themselves and through the speech, whereas pre-existing facts, such as oaths, witnesses, testimonies, etc. are non-technical, since they cannot be brought about by the speaker. (iv) Given that Aristotle criticizes his predecessors, because they deal with non-technical persuasive devices instructing how to speak “outside the subject” (see section § 4.4 above), one might speculate whether the technical means of persuasion are required, vice versa, to actually address the things at issue.
Why just these three? And why only these three? Aristotle does not give an elaborate defence of this tripartition. However, he says in a different context that a speech consists of three things: the speaker, the subject that is treated in the speech, and the listener to whom the speech is addressed (Rhet. I.3, 1358a37ff.). Probably, he thinks that each of these three ingredients of a speech contributes to persuasion in a specific way, in that persuasion either flows from the person of speaker, namely that he or she comes across as credible, or from the condition of the hearer, i.e. whether they are in an emotional state and which emotional state they are in or from the subject that is treated in the speech, i.e. from the arguments or proofs that are meant to support a suggested point of view. Summarizing the account of the three pisteis in a later section of the book, Aristotle actually insists that there can be no other technical means of persuasion:
It has already been spoken about the means of persuasion (pisteis), from how many things they are, namely that they are from three things, and what kind of things these are, and why there are only these three; for all people who are casting judgements are persuaded either because they themselves are affected, or because they assume that the speakers are a certain kind of person or because something has been proven. (Rhet. III.1, 1403b10–13)
5.1 Persuasion Through the Character of the Speaker
With regard to the speaker, persuasion is accomplished whenever the speech is held in such a way as to render the speaker worthy of credence. How is it exactly that the credibility of the speaker contributes to persuasion? Aristotle is not overly explicit on this issue. However, he says that people follow the trustworthy speaker more easily and more quickly on almost all subjects and completely so in affairs in which there are not exact criteria (to decide the case), but only wavering opinions (Rhet. I.2, 1356a6–8). This might be taken to mean that in the absence of other criteria to decide a case, the audience will form the second-order judgment that suggestions put forward by a credible speaker are themselves received as trustworthy and acceptable. Also, according to this remark, the impact of what seems to be the speaker’s character comes in degrees; it is most important, if the point of issue is such that it leaves room for doubt and cannot be decided by conclusive proofs.
But how does the speaker manage to appear a credible person? Even though Aristotle says that the speaker’s character can have the greatest impact on the hearers’ judgement (especially in deliberative speeches that are about future states of affairs), he dedicates only fifteen lines to this question. (Rhet. II.1, 1378a6–20). Speakers, he says, must display (i) practical intelligence, prudence or competence (phronêsis), (ii) a virtuous character, and (iii) good will; for, if they displayed none of them, the audience would doubt that they are able to give good advice at all. Again, if they displayed (i) without (ii) and (iii), the audience could doubt whether their aims or intentions are good. Finally, if he displayed (i) and (ii) without (iii), the audience could still doubt whether they are giving the best suggestion or whether they keep the best available suggestion for themselves due to their lack of benevolence. However, if they display all of them, Aristotle concludes, it cannot rationally be doubted that their suggestions are trustworthy. It should be stressed that the speakers must accomplish these effects by what they say in the speech; it is not necessary that they are actually virtuous persons: on the contrary, a pre-existing good character cannot be part of the technical means of persuasion. Also, even a person with outstandingly virtuous character would have to present herself as virtuous by what she says in the speech.
5.2 Persuasion Through the Emotions of the Hearer
With regard to the hearer, persuasion comes about whenever the hearers are led by the speech to feel a certain emotion or passion that, in turn, has an impact on the judgement they are going to make. The underlying assumption of this persuasive technique is that people’s emotional states broadly conceived — i.e. whether they actually undergo an episode of emotion or not and what kind of emotion they feel — makes a difference for the formation of the judgement they are about to pass. Indeed, Aristotle even introduces the emotions or passions (pathê) in an important passage (Rhet. II.1, 1378a20–30) by saying that they are “those things due to which people, by undergoing a change, differ in their judgements ...”. He illustrates this general assumption by pointing out that we do not judge in the same way when we grieve and rejoice or when we are friendly and hostile. It therefore seems that the speaker has to arouse emotions exactly because emotions have the power to modify our judgments: e.g. to a juror or judge who is in a friendly mood, the person about whom he or she is going to judge seems not to do wrong or only in a small way; but to the juror or judge who is in an angry mood, the same person will seem to do the opposite (see Rhet. II.1, 1378a1ff.). Since rhetoric aims at steering the hearers’ judgement and since emotions, thus, have a significant impact on the formation of judgements (on the various ways how emotions, according to Aristotle, can alter our judgements see Leighton 1982), the rhetorical method requires to address the emotional states of the hearers, if only in order to calm down adverse feelings or emotions that are likely to prevent the jurors or judges from forming their judgement in accordance with the presented evidence and arguments.
Some scholars writing on the rhetorical use of emotions take it to be significant that emotions also play a crucial role in Aristotle’s moral philosophy, for Aristotle defines the virtuous person not only by performing the right actions, but also by having and by being motivated through the appropriate sort of emotions. Applying this to the rhetorical situation, one might wonder whether in Aristotle’s art of rhetoric the speaker tries to arouse emotions, in order (i) to motivate the audience (e.g. motivate them to act in accordance with the judgement they pass) or (ii) to turn them into better persons (e.g. by providing and making them familiar with the appropriate emotions that are definitory of the virtuous persons). However, both options are not backed by the evidence given in the text of the Rhetoric. With regard to (i), it seems crucial to note that the aim of rhetorical persuasion is a certain judgement (krisis), not an action or practical decision (prohairesis), which would intrinsically involve a specific sort of desire and motivation (see e.g. Kontos 2021, 20–31). While the practical decision that Aristotle discusses in his ethical writings is always about things the agents themselves are able to do, the judgements of the hearers of a public speech are often about things to be done by other agents or about actions that took place in the past. With regard to (ii), one might be reluctant to accept that moral education might be the direct purpose of the kind of public speeches Aristotle has in mind. At least, no such moral purpose is mentioned when Aristotle addresses the purpose and use of rhetoric (see above § 4). It is also significant that the appropriateness of the aroused emotions (in accordance with Aristotle’s doctrine of the mean) is nowhere discussed in the Rhetoric. More than that, Aristotle seems to think that moral education requires individual habituation and habituation is a matter of gradually adjusting a person’s attitudes and hedonic responses, while the uneducated ones are not really responsive to disciplinary allocutions. For all these reasons, he is not too optimistic with regard to the pedagogical effect of public speeches: “Now if speeches were in themselves enough to make men good, they would justly, as Theognis says, have won very great rewards, and such rewards should have been provided; but as things are … they are not able to encourage the many to nobility and goodness” (EN X.9, 1179b4–10).
But how is it possible for the orator, in the first place, to lead the audience to feel a certain emotion? After all, the technical means of persuasion are restricted to what the speakers say in a speech. It is remarkable that Aristotle’s treatment of several types of emotions in Chapters 2–11 of Rhet. II is based on the definition of each type of emotion. Even though Aristotle mostly leaves it to the reader to infer how these definitions are useful for arousing a particular type of emotion, it seems safe to conclude that these definitions are meant to offer the key to the methodical arousal of emotions in the audience. Let, for example, anger be defined as “desire, accompanied with pain, for conspicuous revenge for a conspicuous slight that was directed against oneself or those near to one, when such a slight is undeserved.” (Rhet. II.2 1378a31–33). According to such a definition, someone who takes it to be the case that he or she has suffered a slight from a person who is not entitled to do so, etc., will, all other things being equal, become angry. Obviously, this presupposes an account of emotions according to which emotions are closely related to what people think or take to be the case. Unfortunately and owing to the overall nature of Aristotle’s Rhetoric, this underlying account of emotion is nowhere explicitly unfolded and defended. What we can infer though is that Aristotle assumes at least a covariance between someone’s thought or opinion that she has been slighted undeservedly and her feeling of anger. If that much is granted and if the speakers have access to such definitions of each type of emotions, it is possible to deduce conditions under which a person is likely to feel this particular type of emotion. And if the speakers manage to make the hearers think — by what they say — that these conditions are given, it is likely, as far as this method goes, that the hearers will feel the corresponding emotion. Aristotle himself suggests the following example. If we take the above-mentioned definition of anger for granted, it is possible to deduce circumstances in which a person will become angry; most notably, we can deduce (i) in what state of mind people are angry and (ii) against whom they are angry and (iii) for what sorts of reason. If we want to make an audience angry, we have to address all three factors, making the hearers think (ii) that there are people who deserve their anger, (iii) that there is a reason for being angry (a slight, an insult, a belittlement, etc.) and (i) by bringing them into a state of mind in which they are prone to anger. Aristotle himself shows how to deduce these three factors for each particular type of emotion throughout chapters II.2–11. With this equipment, the speaker will be able, for example, to highlight such characteristics of a case as are likely to provoke anger in the audience. In comparison with the tricks of former rhetoricians (which, Aristotle thinks, are bound to speak “outside the subject”), this method of arousing emotions has a striking advantage: The speaker who wants to arouse emotions need not even speak “outside the subject” or distract from the thing at issue; it is sufficient to detect aspects of a given subject that are connected with the intended emotion and to make the addressee think that certain emotion-provoking aspects, in accordance with the three factors mentioned above, are given.
5.3 Persuasion Through the Argument Itself
With regard to the subject the speech is about, persuasion comes about through arguments, i.e. by proving (or seemingly proving) that something is the case. Most probably, this is meant to take up the idea mentioned above, i.e. that people are most or most easily persuaded, when they suppose something to have been proven (Rhet. I.1, 1355a3f.). This third means of persuasion (pistis) is distinguished from the other two means of persuasion through being the only probative (apodeiktikos) device of persuasion; due to its argument-like structure, involving premises and a conclusion, it can directly argue for the point of view that the speaker wishes to establish. It does so by inferentially connecting the suggested conclusion with facts that are evident or with convictions already held by the audience. Probative persuasion is essential, since, at the end of the day, each speech necessarily involves a claim (i.e. the point of view the speaker suggests) plus the proofs that are given in support of this claim (Rhet. III.13, 1414a30–36). For Aristotle, there are two species of arguments: inductions and deductions (Posterior Analytics I.1, 71a5ff.). Induction (epagôgê) is defined as the proceeding from particulars up to a universal (Topics I.12, 105a13ff.). A deduction (sullogismos) is an argument in which, certain things having been supposed, something different from the suppositions results of necessity through them (Topics I.1, 100a25ff.) or because of their being true (Prior Analytics I.2, 24b18–20). The inductive argument in rhetoric is the example (paradeigma); unlike other inductive arguments, it does not proceed from many particular cases to one universal case, but from one particular to a similar particular if both particulars fall under the same genus (Rhet. I.2, 1357b25ff.). The deductive argument in rhetoric is the enthymeme (see below § 6). Indeed, most of Rhet. I & II is dedicated to the treatment of this third probative means of persuasion: After the second part of the long chapter Rhet. I.2 has introduced basic distinctions within the probative mode of persuasion, chapters Rhet. I.4–15 unfold argumentative devices that are specific to the three genres of speech, while chapters Rhet. II.4–26 discuss generally applicable aspects of proofs or arguments (see above § 2).
Aristotle repeatedly says that these rhetorical arguments persuade people either by proving or by (merely) seeming to prove (Rhet. I.2, 1356a3–4 and I.2, 1356a19–20); accordingly, he lists topoi for real (Rhet. II.23) and merely apparent enthymemes (Rhet. II.24) (see below § 7). Obviously, Aristotle refers here to fallacious or deceptive arguments, for these arguments have a similar persuasive effect, if the fallacy or deception goes unnoticed by the audience (for people will think, i.e. take it to be the case, that something has been proven). One might wonder whether the inclusion of only seemingly probative arguments is compatible with Aristotle’s general tendency to base rhetorical persuasion on (real) proofs. However, the treatment of fallacious rhetorical arguments is strictly parallel to what happens in the case of dialectic. For dialectic too, includes a part dealing with sound or valid arguments (namely in Topics II–VII) and a part that analyses fallacious arguments (namely in the Sophistical Refutations). It is part of the rhetorician’s competence also to know about fallacious arguments, if only in order to detect them, when they are used by opponents.
5.4 Is There an Inconsistency in Aristotle’s Rhetorical Theory?
One of the most notorious debates about Aristotle’s Rhetoric concerns the second means of persuasion (pistis) that is said to proceed through the emotions of the hearer (see above §5.2), for it seems to involve a major inconsistency in Aristotle’s approach to rhetorical persuasion: While in Rhetoric I.2 Aristotle is happy to accept emotions or the arousal of emotions as one of the three ‘technical’ pisteis, it seems that he has a much more reserved or even repudiating attitude to the rhetorical use of emotions in Rhetoric I.1. There, in the very first chapter of the book, Aristotle claims that the previous authors of rhetorical manuals have only covered a small part of the art of persuasion, for while only the proofs or means of persuasion (pisteis), such as the enthymeme, are a matter of technê, those authors mostly dealt with rhetorical devices that are merely supplementary and involve “speaking outside the subject”. Aristotle exemplifies this alleged tendency of his predecessors by adding that “slander, pity, anger and suchlike passions of the soul” are not about the things at issue, but are directed at the person of the juror or judge (1354a11–18). Briefly afterwards he adds that one “should not distort the juror or judge by arousing anger, fear or pity in him”, which, he says, would be like making the standard or yardstick crooked before using it (1354a24–26). Apart from the fact that Rhetoric I.2 endorses the rhetorical use of emotions, while Rhetoric I.1 seems to dismiss them, the remarks in Rhetoric I.1 seems to imply that the arousal of emotions is not or cannot be ‘technical’, while Rhetoric I.2 unequivocally introduces persuasion through the emotions of the hearer as one of three ‘technical’ means of persuasion.
Various strategies have been contrived to deal with this seeming inconsistency. In the early 20th century there was the tendency to think that the two chapters are simply incompatible and that either one of these two chapters was written by a different author (Marx 1900) or that the two chapters were put together by an inept editor (Kantelhardt 1911; in a similar vein, Barnes (1995, 262) argues that the two chapters are doublets, one of them originally written to supplant the other) or that the two chapters represent different stages in Aristotle’s philosophical development (Solmsen 1929). Even though Solmen’s developmental account has gone out of fashion, there are more recent authors who emphasize the alleged ‘Platonic’ character of Rhetoric I.1 (see e.g. Fortenbaugh 1986, 248 and Schuetrumpf 1994, 106f.), thus implying that Aristotle, when writing this chapter, was still under the influence of Plato, from which he gradually emancipated himself. However, one might wonder whether some of the strategies mentioned tend to exaggerate the alleged inconsistency of the two chapters, since, after all, it is obvious that the two chapters have different agendas (see above § 2) and that some of the differences might be due to these different agendas. Also, in the later chapter Aristotle is happy to refer back to the treatment of emotions in the previous chapter (1356a16–17), which indicates (provided that this back-reference is authentic) that he himself was not aware of any inconsistency. It has hence been suggested e.g. that the seeming inconsistency can be fixed just by identifying different meanings of the word pistis for the two chapters (Grimaldi 1957), which would solve the problem that in one chapter emotions are said to be a pistis in the ‘technical’ sense, while in the other chapter they are opposed to ‘technical’ pisteis. Sprute 1994 and, similarly, Schuetrumpf 1994 argue that the chapters are not inconsistent, but envisage different settings, in that Rhetoric I.1 considers the kind of rhetoric that is apt for a well-ordered city, while Rhetoric I.2 moves on to the style of rhetoric that is required and practiced under less ideal political circumstances. Rapp 2002 (I 364, II 32f., 109, 112) proposes that what Aristotle primarily criticizes in Rhetoric I.1 is not that those predecessors deal with emotions at all, but that they mostly deal with emotions and the like, which are merely supplementary, instead of dealing with the main point, i.e. the enthymeme, and that they use pre-fabricated formulae for the arousal of emotions, by which they are bound to speak outside the things at issue. Dow 2007 uses a similar idea of set-piece rhetorical devices, going however beyond the previous suggestion by saying that the critique of Rhetoric I.1 does not, as it may seem, refer to emotions strictly speaking, but only to such set-piece rhetorical devices aimed at manipulating emotions. On these accounts it is possible, at least, to reconcile the claims that there is a ‘technical’ and innocent (or, perhaps, even beneficial) use of emotions within the art-based process of persuasion, as maintained in Rhetoric I.2, and that there are non-‘technical’ uses of emotions in rhetoric with the potential to distort the judgement, as emphasized in Rhetoric I.1.
6. The Enthymeme
6.1 The Concept of Enthymeme
For Aristotle, an enthymeme is what has the function of a proof or demonstration in the domain of public speech. Since a demonstration is a kind of sullogismos, the enthymeme is said to be a sullogismos too (on the enthymeme and its relation to syllogistic theory see also Raphael 1974). The word ‘enthymeme’ (from ‘enthumeisthai—to consider’) had already been coined by Aristotle’s predecessors and originally designated clever sayings, bon mots, and short arguments involving a paradox or contradiction. The concepts ‘proof’ (apodeixis) and ‘sullogismos’ play a crucial role in Aristotle’s logical-dialectical theory. In applying them to a term of conventional rhetoric, Aristotle appeals to a well-known rhetorical technique, but, at the same time, codifies and redefines the original meaning of ‘enthymeme’: properly understood, what people call ‘enthymeme’ should have the form of a sullogismos, i.e., a deductive argument.
A major scholarly debate concerns the question of whether the enthymeme is actually meant to be a genuine sullogismos, i.e. a deductive argument, or whether it is only a ‘sullogismos of a kind’, i.e. a sullogismos in an attenuated sense, which would amount to saying that Aristotelian enthymemes, even though they are introduced as sullogismoi, are or include ‘relaxed inferences’, i.e. inferences that are not logically valid (see Burnyeat 1994, 1996). This suggestion has been widely accepted, presumably because it helps to solve the alleged paradox that, although Aristotle defines the enthymeme as a sullogismos, the logical form of the enthymemes that are actually given as examples in the Rhetoric does not seem to conform to that of the categorical syllogisms that we know from his Prior Analytics (a problem that, by the way, might also be addressed by assuming that the enthymeme corresponds to the form of deductive arguments we find in the Topics, not to the ones familiar from the Prior Analytics). Others accepted this suggestion primarily in order to accommodate the non-necessary sign arguments from Rhetoric I.2 (see § 6.5), which are treated as a type of enthymeme (without being flagged as merely ‘seeming enthymeme’), but are said not to yield a sullogismos (see e.g. Allen 2001).
6.2 Formal Requirements
In general, Aristotle regards deductive arguments as a set of propositions in which some sentences are premises and one is the conclusion, and the inference from the premises to the conclusion is guaranteed by the premises alone. Since enthymemes in the proper sense are expected to be deductive arguments, the minimal requirement for the formulation of enthymemes is that they have to display the premise-conclusion structure of deductive arguments. This is why enthymemes have to include a statement as well as a kind of reason for the given statement. Typically this reason is given in a conditional ‘if’-clause or a causal ‘since’- or ‘for’-clause. Examples of the former, conditional type are: “If not even the gods know everything, human beings can hardly do so.” “If the war is the cause of present evils, things should be set right by making peace.” Examples of the latter, causal type are: “One should not be educated, for one ought not be envied (and educated people are usually envied).” “She has given birth, for she has milk.” Aristotle stresses that the proposition “There is no man among us who is free” taken by itself is a maxim, but becomes an enthymeme as soon as it is used together with a reason such as “for all are slaves of money or of chance (and no slave of money or chance is free).” Sometimes the required reason may even be implicit, as e.g. in the proposition “As a mortal, do not cherish immortal anger” the reason why one should not cherish mortal anger is implicitly given in the term “immortal,” which alludes to the rule that it is not appropriate for mortal beings to have such an attitude.
6.3 Enthymemes as Dialectical Arguments
Aristotle calls the enthymeme the “body of persuasion”, implying that everything else is only an addition or accident to the core of the persuasive process. The reason why the enthymeme, as the rhetorical kind of proof or demonstration, should be regarded as central to the rhetorical process of persuasion is that we are most easily persuaded when we think that something has been demonstrated. Hence, the basic idea of a rhetorical demonstration seems to be this: In order to make a target group believe that q, the orator must first select a proposition p or some propositions p1 … pn that are already accepted by the target group; secondly he has to show that q can be derived from p or p1 … pn, using p or p1 … pn as premises. Given that the target persons form their beliefs in accordance with rational standards, they will accept q as soon as they understand that q can be demonstrated on the basis of their own opinions.
Consequently, the construction of enthymemes is primarily a matter of deducing from accepted opinions (endoxa). Of course, it is also possible to use premises that are not commonly accepted by themselves, but can be derived from commonly accepted opinions; other premises are only accepted since the speaker is held to be credible; still other enthymemes are built from signs: see §6.5. That a deduction is made from accepted opinions—as opposed to deductions from first and true sentences or principles—is the defining feature of dialectical argumentation in the Aristotelian sense. Thus, the formulation of enthymemes is a matter of dialectic, and the dialectician has the competence that is needed for the construction of enthymemes. If enthymemes are a subclass of dialectical arguments, then it is natural to expect a specific difference by which one can tell enthymemes apart from all other kinds of dialectical arguments (traditionally, commentators regarded logical incompleteness as such a difference; for some objections against the traditional view, see §6.4). Nevertheless, this expectation is somehow misguided: The enthymeme is different from other kinds of dialectical arguments insofar as it is used in the rhetorical context of public speech (and rhetorical arguments are called ‘enthymemes’); thus, no further formal or qualitative differences are needed.
However, in the rhetorical context there are two factors that the dialectician has to keep in mind if she wants to become a rhetorician too, and if the dialectical argument is to become a successful enthymeme. First, the typical subjects of public speech do not—like the subjects of dialectic and theoretical philosophy—belong to the things that are necessarily the case, but are among those things that are the goal of practical deliberation and can also be otherwise. Second, as opposed to well-trained dialecticians, the audience of a public speech is characterized by an intellectual insufficiency; above all, the members of a jury or assembly are not accustomed to following a longer chain of inferences. Therefore, enthymemes must not be as precise as a scientific demonstration and should be shorter than ordinary dialectical arguments. This, however, is not to say that the enthymeme is defined by incompleteness and brevity. Rather, it is a sign of a well-executed enthymeme that the content and the number of its premises are adjusted to the intellectual capacities of the public audience; but even an enthymeme that failed to incorporate these qualities would still be an enthymeme.
6.4 The Brevity of the Enthymeme
In a well-known passage (Rhet. I.2, 1357a7–18; similar: Rhet. II.22, 1395b24–26), Aristotle says that the enthymeme often has few or even fewer premises than some other deductions (sullogismoi). Since most interpreters refer the word ‘sullogismos’ to the syllogistic theory (see the entry on Aristotle: logic), according to which a proper deduction has exactly two premises, those lines have led to the widespread understanding that Aristotle defines the enthymeme as a sullogismos in which one of two premises has been suppressed, i.e., as an abbreviated, incomplete syllogism. But certainly the passages mentioned do not attempt to give a definition of the enthymeme, nor does the word ‘sullogismos’ necessarily refer to deductions with exactly two premises. Properly understood, both passages are about the selection of appropriate premises, not about logical incompleteness. The remark that enthymemes often have few or fewer premises concludes the discussion of two possible mistakes the orator could make (Rhet. I.2, 1357a7–10): One can draw conclusions from things that have previously been deduced or from things that have not been deduced yet. The latter method is unpersuasive, for the premises are not accepted, nor have they been introduced. The former method is problematic, too: if the orator has to introduce the needed premises by another deduction, and the premises of this pre-deduction too, etc., one will end up with a long chain of deductions. Arguments with several deductive steps are common in dialectical practice, but one cannot expect the audience of a public speech to follow such long arguments. This is why Aristotle says that the enthymeme is and should be from fewer premises.
6.5 Different Types of Enthymemes
Just as there is a difference between real and apparent or fallacious deductions in dialectic, we have to distinguish between real and apparent or fallacious enthymemes in rhetoric. The topoi for real enthymemes are given in chapter II.23, for fallacious enthymemes in chapter II.24. The fallacious enthymeme pretends to include a valid deduction, while it actually rests on a fallacious inference.
Further, Aristotle distinguishes between enthymemes taken from probable (eikos) premises and enthymemes taken from signs (sêmeia). (Rhet. I.2, 1357a32–33). In a different context, he says that enthymemes are based on probabilities, examples, tekmêria (i.e., proofs, evidences), and signs (Rhet. II.25, 1402b12–14). Since the so-called tekmêria are a subclass of signs and the examples are used to establish general premises, this is only an extension of the former classification. (Note that neither classification interferes with the idea that premises have to be accepted opinions: with respect to the signs, the audience must believe that they exist and accept that they indicate the existence of something else, and with respect to the probabilities, people must accept that something is likely to happen.) However, it is not clear whether this is meant to be an exhaustive typology. That most of the rhetorical arguments are taken from probable premises (“For the most part it is true that …” “It is likely that …”) is due to the typical subjects of public speech, which are rarely necessary. When using a sign-argument or sign-enthymeme we do not try to explain a given fact; we just indicate that something exists or is the case: “… anything such that when it is another thing is, or when it has come into being, the other has come into being before or after, is a sign of the other’s being or having come into being.” (Prior Analytics II.27, 70a7ff.). But there are several types of sign-arguments too; Aristotle offers the following examples:
|Rhetoric I.2||Prior Analytics II.27|
|(i)||Wise men are just, since Socrates is just.||Wise men are good, since Pittacus is good.|
|(ii)||He is ill, since he has fever. / She has given birth, since she has milk.||This woman has a child, since she has milk.|
|(iii)||This man has fever, since he breathes rapidly.||She is pregnant, since she is pale.|
Sign-arguments of type (i) and (iii) can always be refuted, even if the premises are true; that is to say that they do not include a valid deduction (sullogismos); Aristotle calls them asullogistos (non-deductive). Sign-arguments of type (ii) can never be refuted if the premise is true, since, for example, it is not possible that someone has fever without being ill, or that someone has milk without having given birth, etc. This latter type of sign-enthymemes is necessary and is also called tekmêrion (proof, evidence). Now, if some sign-enthymemes are valid deductions and some are not, it is tempting to ask whether Aristotle regarded the non-necessary sign-enthymemes as apparent or fallacious arguments. However, there seems to be a more attractive reading: We accept a fallacious argument only if we are deceived about its logical form. But we could regard, for example, the inference “She is pregnant, since she is pale” as a good and informative argument, even if we know that it does not include a logically necessary inference. So it seems as if Aristotle didn’t regard all non-necessary sign-arguments as fallacious or deceptive; but even if this is true, it is difficult for Aristotle to determine the sense in which non-necessary sign-enthymemes are valid arguments, since he is bound to the alternatives of deduction and induction, and neither class seems appropriate for non-necessary sign-arguments.
7. The Topoi
Generally speaking, an Aristotelian topos (‘place’, ‘location’) is an argumentative scheme that enables a dialectician or rhetorician to construe an argument for a given conclusion. The first comprehensive and systematic collection of topoi is given in Aristotle’s treatise Topics. Still, the use of so-called topoi or ‘loci communes’ can be traced back to early rhetoricians such as Protagoras, Gorgias (cp. Cicero, Brutus, 46–48) and Isocrates. But while in earlier rhetoric a topos was mostly understood as a complete, pre-fabricated pattern or formula that can be mentioned at a certain stage of the speech to produce a certain effect, most of the Aristotelian topoi, in particular most of the dialectical topoi of the Topics, are general instructions saying that a conclusion of a certain form can be derived from premises of a certain form; and because of this ‘formal’, ‘semi-formal’ or, at least topic-neutral character of Aristotle’s dialectical topoi, one topos can be used to construe several different arguments or arguments about different contents. Aristotle’s treatise Topics lists some hundred topoi for the construction of dialectical arguments. These lists of topoi form the core of the method by which the dialectician should be able to formulate deductions on any problem that could be proposed. Most of the instructions that the Rhetoric gives for the composition of enthymemes are also organized as lists of topoi; especially the first book of the Rhetoric essentially consists of topoi concerning the subjects of the three genres of public speech (See Rhet. I.5–14), while chapters 23–24 of the second book of the Rhetoric provide lists of generally applicable topoi.
7.1 The (Lacking) Definition of ‘Topos’
It is striking that the work that is almost exclusively dedicated to the collection of topoi, the book Topics, does not even make an attempt to define the concept of topos. At any rate the Rhetoric gives a sort of defining characterization: “I call the same thing element and topos; for an element or a topos is a heading under which many enthymemes fall” (Rhet. 1403a18–19). By ‘element’ Aristotle does not mean a proper part of the enthymeme, but rather a general scheme under which many concrete enthymemes of the same type can be subsumed. According to this definition, the topos is a general argumentative scheme or pattern, and the concrete arguments are instantiations of the general topos. That the topos is a general instruction from which several arguments can be derived is crucial for Aristotle’s understanding of an artful method of argumentation; for a teacher of rhetoric who makes his pupils learn ready samples of arguments would not be imparting the art itself to them, but only the products of this art, just as if someone pretending to teach the art of shoe-making only gave samples of already made shoes to his pupils (see Sophistical Refutations 183b36ff.).
7.2 The Word ‘Topos’ and the Technique of Places
The word ‘topos’ (place, location) most probably is derived from an ancient method of memorizing a great number of items on a list by associating them with successive places one is acquainted with, say the houses along a street. By recalling the houses along the street we can also remember the associated items (on this mnemonic technique see Sorabji 2004, 22–34). Full descriptions of this technique from antiquity can be found in Cicero, De Oratore II 86–88, 351–360, Auctor ad Herennium III 16–24, 29–40 and in Quintilian, Institutio XI 2, 11–33. In Topics 163b28–32, Aristotle seems to allude to this technique: “For just as in the art of remembering, the mere mention of the places instantly makes us recall the things, so these will make us more apt at deductions through looking to these defined premises in order of enumeration.” Aristotle also alludes to this technique in On the soul 427b18–20, On Memory 452a12–16, and On Dreams 458b20–22.
But although the name ‘topos’ may be derived from this mnemotechnical context, Aristotle’s use of topoi does not rely on the technique of places. At least within the system of the book Topics, every given problem must be analyzed in terms of certain linguistic, semantic or logical criteria: Does the predicate of the sentence in question ascribe a genus or a definition or peculiar or accidental properties to the subject? Does the sentence express a sort of opposition, either contradiction or contrariety, etc.? Does the sentence express that something is more or less the case? Does it maintain identity or diversity? Are the words used linguistically derived from words that are part of an accepted premise? Depending on such criteria of the analyzed sentence one has to refer to a fitting topos. For this reason, the succession of topoi in the book Topics is organized in accordance with their salient linguistic, semantic or logical criteria; above all topoi presented in Books II–VII of this treatise are structured in accordance with the four so-called ‘predicables’, i.e. whether a predicate signifies the genus, an accident, a proprium (peculiar attribute) or the definition of the subject. This structure suggests that no additional mnemotechnique is essentially involved. Besides all this, there is at least one passage in which the use of the word ‘topos’ can be explained without referring to the previously mentioned mnemotechnique: In Topics VIII.1, 155b4–5 Aristotle says: “we must find the location (topos) from which to attack”, where the word ‘topos’ is obviously used to mean a starting point for attacking the theses of the opponents.
More or less the same might apply to the Rhetoric—except that most of its lists of topoi are structured by certain contents and not by linguistic, semantic or logical criteria; moreover, the system of the four ‘predicables’ that structured the topoi in the Topics is absent from the Rhetoric (see below § 7.4).
7.3 The Ingredients and the Function of Topoi
A typical topos in Aristotle’s dialectic runs as follows: “Again, if the accident of a thing has a contrary, see whether it belongs to the subject to which the accident in question has been declared to belong: for if the latter belongs, the former could not belong; for it is impossible that contrary predicates should belong at the same time to the same thing” (Topics 113a20–24). Like most topoi, it includes (i) a sort of general instruction (“see, whether …”); further it mentions (ii) an argumentative scheme—in the given example, the scheme ‘if the accidental predicate p belongs to the subject s, then the opposed P* cannot belong to s too’. Finally, the topos refers to (iii) a general rule or principle (“for it is impossible, …”) which justifies the given scheme. Other topoi often include the discussion of (iv) examples; still other topoi suggest (v) how to apply the given schemes.—Though these are elements that regularly occur in Aristotelian topoi, there is nothing like a standard form with which all topoi conform. Often Aristotle is very brief and leaves it to the reader to add the missing elements.
In a nutshell, the function of a topos can be explained as follows. First of all, one has to select an apt topos for a given conclusion. The conclusion is either a thesis of the opponent that someone wishes to refute, or it is the assertion someone wishes to establish or defend. Accordingly, there are two uses of topoi: they can either prove or disprove a given sentence; some can be used for both purposes, others for only one of them. In Aristotle’s dialectic, most topoi are topic-neutral and need hence be selected by certain linguistic, semantic or logical features of the given conclusion; if, for example, the conclusion maintains a definition, one has to select a topos from a list of topoi pertaining to definitions, etc. Once the dialectician or rhetorician has selected a topos that is appropriate for a given conclusion, the topos can be used to construe a premise from which the given conclusion can be derived. If for example the argumentative scheme is ‘If a predicate is generally true of a genus, then the predicate is also true of any species of that genus’, we can derive the conclusion ‘the capacity of nutrition belongs to plants’ using the premise ‘the capacity of nutrition belongs to all living things’, since ‘living thing’ is the genus of the species ‘plants’. If the construed premise is accepted, either by the opponent in a dialectical debate or by the audience of a public speech, we can draw the intended conclusion. In the Rhetoric though the situation is slightly different (see below § 7.4), because here the topic-neutral type of topoi that was prevalent in the Topics seems to play a secondary role. Many topoi of the Rhetoric seem to be rather ‘material’ in the sense that they are only useful for establishing conclusions of a certain content; this is why the appropriate topos here cannot be selected by formal criteria, but must be chosen in accordance with the content of the envisaged conclusion—whether, for example, something is said to be useful or honourable or just, etc.
It has been disputed whether the topos (or, more precisely, the ‘if …, then …’ scheme that is included in a topos) that we use to construe an argument must itself be regarded as a further premise of the argument. It could be either, as some say, the premise of a propositional scheme such as the modus ponens, or, as others assume, as the conditional premise of a hypothetical syllogism. Aristotle himself does not favour one of these interpretations explicitly. But even if he regarded the topoi as additional premises in a dialectical or rhetorical argument, it is beyond any doubt that he did not use them as premises that must be explicitly mentioned or even approved by the opponent or audience.
7.4 Rhetorical Topoi
Even though there are good reasons for thinking that the nature and use of topoi in Aristotle’s Rhetoric are based on his elaborate account of dialectical topoi in the Topics (see above § 7.2 and § 7.3), commentators are faced with the difficulty that the use of the word ‘topos’ in Aristotle’s Rhetoric is much more heterogeneous than in the Topics. Beside topoi which do perfectly comply with the description given in the Topics, there is an important group of topoi in the Rhetoric that are not topic-neutral and hence do not contain instructions for arguments of a certain logical form, but rather with a certain predicate (for example, that something is good, or honourable, or just, or contributes to happiness, etc.). While those latter ‘material’ topoi so to speak are, after all, used to construe arguments, there are also mentions of so-called ‘topoi’ in the context of the non-argumentative means of persuasion, which might be taken as procedural instructions, but no longer seem to be concerned with the construction of arguments, which was the one and only function of dialectical topoi.
In addition to the more heterogenous use of the word ‘topos’ in the Rhetoric (which might originate from Aristotle’s attempt to combine his own dialectical use of the term with more traditional rhetorical uses), there is the problem of the controversial distinction in Rhet. I.2, 1358a2–35 between topoi (which are understood to be general/common) on the one hand and certain specific devices (idia) on the other. While Aristotle seems inclined to call the general or common topoi simply ‘topoi’, he uses several names for the opposing, specific items (e.g. idiai protaseis, idia, eidê). This distinction has a major impact on the structure of the Rhetoric as a whole (see above § 2), in that it is responsible for the occurence of ‘specific’ instructions, premises, ‘topoi’ or whatever in the bulk of the first book and the occurence of ‘common’ topoi in the second part of the second book. Traditionally, this distinction has been understood as a division between general/common topoi on the one hand and specific topoi on the other (the traditional view has been defended among others by Cope 1877 and Rapp 2002). However, it is unclear (i) what the opposition between general/common and specific refers to, (ii) where in the Rhetoric the common topoi can be found and (iii) whether the distinction is meant to be a distinction between topoi in the first place, since even though Aristotle distinguishes topoi that are common from specific (idia) rhetorical devices, he never explicitly uses the phrase ‘specific topoi’, as one might expect on the traditional reading.
As for (i), Aristotle points out in Rhet. I.2 that some things are specific to physics, others to ethics, etc. This seems to suggest a distinction between topoi (or other building blocks of arguments) that are peculiar to the different sciences on the one hand and other topoi that are not, but are instead applicable to all sciences and fields of knowledge alike—just as (most of) the dialectical topoi of the Topics are. However, from Rhet. I.3 on, Aristotle makes the readers think, by contrast, that ‘specific’ refers to the different genres of rhetoric, so that some topoi are specific to deliberative, others to epideictic, and still others to juridical speech. Correspondingly, this would require a sense of being‘common’ that boils down to saying that they are not specific to one single species of speech, but that does not amount to the topic-neutrality of the dialectical topoi.
With regard to (ii), it is generally agreed that the specific topoi can be found in the first book of the Rhetoric and the common topoi in the second. Most commentators assume that all common topoi are listed in chapters II.23–24 (real enthymemes in II.23, fallacious enthymemes in II.24). However, it is less common to count the items listed in II.19 (about the possible/impossible, past and future facts, significance and insignificance) as common topoi, which might be due to the controversy mentioned in (i) about the required sense of being ‘common’, for the topoi in II.19 are applicable to all genres of speech, but are most probably not common in the way the dialectical topoi are. In addition, it is important to notice that even chapter II.23, which is undisputedly dedicated to common topoi, is a mixed bag, for it includes some topoi, especially in the first third of the chapter, that, being topic-neutral, thoroughly correspond to dialectical topoi and even might be generally applicable as the dialectical topoi are, while some other topoi mentioned in II.23 are quite different in style, as they are taken from extant historical speeches.
The most difficult debates are posed by (iii), as the traditional interpretation is based on some fragile assumptions. Not only does Aristotle never call the specific items ‘topoi’ by name, it is also significant that the specific items that are listed in Rhet. I.5-15 often have the form of mere propositions or premises rather than of topoi as we know them from the Topics (see above § 7.3). This is why several authors insist that the distinction between topoi, which are thought to be common, and idia is not a distinction between different types of topoi, but between topoi and something else, most notably premises, commonly accepted premises or premises established by the arts. This objection comes in several versions. (a) Several authors subscribed to the view of Solmsen 1929 that there are two types of enthymemes, respresenting different stages in the development of Aristotle’s logical thinking insofar as some are taken from topoi (deriving from Aristotle’s early- pre-syllogistic logic) and some are built from premises through the figures of the syllogism (thus presupposing syllogistic logic), not from topoi. According to this view, the specific topoi given in the first book of the Rhetoric are the premises of the latter type of enthymemes, and the enthymemes of the former type are taken only from common topoi. From this point of view, only common topoi would be topoi in the proper sense, while specific topoi would be, strictly speaking, nothing but premises. Accordingly, one would expect to find propositions of the form “All F are just/noble/good” in the first book of the Rhetoric; with such propositions one could construe syllogisms like “All F are just/noble/good—This particular x is F—This particular x is just/noble/good.” Against Solmsen it has been objected that what one actually gets in the first book hardly fits Solmsen’s model. In some sense one finds more than the required premises in that Aristotle gives here not only isolated propositions, but also certain propositions together with a reason or a justification. Furthermore, chapters I.6–7 of the Rhetoric offer topoi which can also be found in the third book of Topics; in the Topics they are clearly called ‘topoi’, so that there is less pressure to think that they are premises rather than topoi. (b) Grimaldi 1958 requires that in order to build a rhetorical argument one needs the logical form of an argument provided by the topoi plus the material (content) provided by the specific premises or idia. A more refined version of this ‘complementarity’-view has been suggested by Rubinelli 2009, who, however, also allows of the possibility that some enthymemes are taken only from the topoi, while others are only taken from the idia. Against Grimaldi’s view it is has been objected that many of the common topoi listed in chapters II.23–24 are not based on linguistic, semantic or logical categories as the topic-neutral topoi of the Topics are. Some of them only offer strategic advice, for example, to turn what has been said against oneself upon the one who said it. For this reason, it would be misleading to interpret the common topoi of the Rhetoric as providing logical schemes of inference. (c) Havrda 2019 has attacked the presuppositions of the traditional view, but does not settle for the alternatives suggested by Solmsen, Grimaldi or Rubinelli either. According to him, Aristotle never distinguishes between common and specific topoi. Rather, he distinguishes between two different sources of rhetorical deductions; one source, the dialectical one, uses topoi, while the other, which is based on definitions provided by arts and sciences, does not.
8. Style: How to Say Things with Words
Rhet. III.1–12 introduces the topic of lexis, usually translated as ‘style’. This topic was not announced until the final passage of Rhetoric II, so that most scholars have come to think of this section as a more or less self-contained treatise. The insertion of this treatise into the Rhetoric is motivated by the claim that, while Rhetoric I & II dealt with thought (dianoia), i.e., about what the orator should say, it remains to inquire into the various ways of saying or formulating one and the same thing. In the course of Rhetoric III.1–12 it turns out that Aristotle tackles this task by using some quite heterogeneous approaches. After an initial exploration of the field of delivery and style (III.1) Aristotle tries to determine what good prose style consists in; for this purpose he has to go into the differentiation and the selection of various kinds of nouns, one of which is defined as metaphor (III.2). The following chapters III.3–6 feature topics that are at best loosely connected with the theme of good prose style; among these topics is the opposite of good style, namely frigid or deterring style (psuchron) (III.3), the simile, which turns out to be connected with the metaphor (III.4), the issue of correct Greek (III.5), the appropriateness (III.7) and the means by which one’s style becomes long-winded and dignified (III.6). Chapters III.8–9 introduce two new approaches to the issue of style, which seem to be unrelated to everything that has been said so far: These are the topics of the rhythmical shaping of prose style and of periodic and non-periodic flow of speech. Chapters III.10–11 are dedicated to how the orator can ‘bring things before one’s eyes’, which amounts to something like making the style more vivid. Again metaphors are shown to play a crucial role for that purpose, so that the topic of metaphor is taken up again and deepened by extended lists of examples. Chapter III.12 seems to make a new start by distinguishing between oral and written style and assessing their suitability for the three genres of speech (see above §2). The philosophical core of Aristotle’s treatise on style in Rhetoric III.1–12 seems to be included in the discussion of the good prose style (see below §8.1), however it is the topic of metaphor (see below §8.2) that has attracted the most attention in the later reception up to the present day.
8.1 The Virtue of Style
Originally the discussion of style belongs to the art of poetry rather than to rhetoric; the poets were the first, as Aristotle observes, to give an impulse for the study of style. Nevertheless he admits that questions of style or, more precisely, of different ways to formulate the same subject, may have an impact on the degree of clarity: “What concerns the topic of lexis, however, has some small necessary place in all teaching; for to speak in one way rather than another makes some difference in regard to clarity; although not a great difference…” (Rhet. III.1, 1404a8–10). Clarity again matters for comprehension and comprehensibility contributes to persuasiveness. Indeed Aristotle even claims that the virtue or excellence (aretê) of prose style ultimately depends on clarity, because it is the genuine purpose of a speech is to make something clear. In prose speeches, the good formulation of a state of affairs must therefore be a clear one. However, saying this is not yet enough to account for the best or excellent prose style, since clear linguistic expressions tend to be banal or flat, while good style should avoid such banality. If the language becomes too banal it will not be able to attract the attention of the audience. The orator can avoid this tendency of banality by the use of dignified or elevated expressions and in general by all formulations that deviate from common usage. On the one hand, uncommon vocabulary has the advantage of evoking the curiosity of an audience. On the other hand the use of such elevated vocabulary bears a serious risk: Whenever the orator makes excessive use of it, the speech might become unclear, thus failing to meet the default requirement of prose speech, namely clarity. Moreover, if the vocabulary becomes too sublime or dignified in relation to prose’s subject matter (Aristotle assumes it is mostly everyday affairs), the audience will notice that the orator uses his words with a certain intention and will become suspicious about the orator and his intentions. Hitting upon the right wording is therefore a matter of being clear, but not too banal; In trying not to be too banal, one must use uncommon, dignified words and phrases, but one must be careful not to use them excessively or inappropriately in relation to prose style and the typical subject matter of prose speeches.
Bringing all these considerations together, Aristotle defines the good prose style, i.e. the virtue of prose style, as follows: “Let the virtue of linguistic form be defined as being clear, for since the logos is a (linguistic, sc.) sign, it would fail to bring about its proper function, whenever it does not make clear (whatever it is the sign of, sc.)—and neither banal/mean/flat (tapeinên) nor above the deserved dignity, but appropriate (prepon)” (Rhet. III.2, 1404b1–4; similar at III.12, 1414a22–26). According to this definition, the virtue of prose style has to avoid two opposed tendencies, both of which are excessive and therefore fallacious: The good style is clear in a way that is neither too banal nor too dignified, but appropriate (in proportion to the subject matter of prose speech). In this respect the definition of stylistic virtue follows the same scheme as the definition of ethical virtues in Aristotle’s ethical writings, insofar as both the stylistic virtue and the virtue of character are defined in terms of a mean that lies between two opposed excesses. If the virtue of style is defined as a mean between the banality involving form of clarity and overly dignified (and hence inappropriate) speech, it is with good reason that Aristotle speaks of only one virtue of prose style, and not of clarity, ornament (by dignified expressions) and appropriateness as three distinct virtues of style. However, from the times of Cicero and Quintilianus on, these three, along with the correctness of Greek or Latin, became the canonical four virtues of speech (virtutes dicendi). Reading Aristotle through the spectacles of the Roman art of rhetoric, scholars often try to identify two, three or four virtues of style in his Rhetoric.
Finally, if the virtue of style is about finding a balance between banal clarity, which is dull, and attractive dignity, which is inappropriate in public speeches, how can the orator manage to control the different degrees of clarity and dignity? For this purpose Aristotle equips the orator with a classification of words (more or less the same classification can also be found in Poetics chapter 21): First of all Aristotle distinguishes between the kuria onamata, the standard expressions, and the glôtta, the borrowed words, idioms or vernacular expressions. Most examples that Aristotle gives of this latter class are taken from the different Greek dialects, and most examples of this type are in turn taken from the language of the Homeric epos. Further classes are defined by metaphors and by several expressions that are somehow altered or modified, e.g., newly coined expressions (pepoiêmena), composite expressions (especially new or unusual compositions (ta dipla)), and lengthened, shortened or otherwise altered expressions. Sometimes Aristotle also uses the term kosmos under which he collects all epithets and otherwise ornamental expressions. These different types of words differ in accordance with their familiarity. Most familiar are the usual or current words, the least familiar words are the glôtta or words that are newly coined. The metaphors are also unknown and unusual, because a usual, well-known word is used to designate something other than its usual designation (see below §8.2). The best established words, the kuria, make their subject clear, but do not excite the audience’s curiosity, whereas all other types of words are not established, and hence have the sort of attraction that alien or foreign things used to have. Since remote things are admirable (thaumaston) and the admirable is pleasant, Aristotle says, one should make the speech admirable and pleasant by the use of such unfamiliar words. However one has to be careful not to use inappropriately dignified or poetic words in prose speech. Thus the virtue of style is accomplished by the selection and balanced use of these various types of words: Fundamental for prose speech is the use of usual and therefore clear words. In order to make the speech pleasant and dignified and in order to avoid banality the orator must make moderate use of non-familiar elements. Metaphor plays an important role for prose style, since metaphors contribute, as Aristotle says, clarity as well as the unfamiliar, surprising effect that avoids banality and tediousness.
8.2 Aristotelian Metaphors
According to Aristotle Poetics 21, 1457b9–16 and 20–22, a metaphor is “the application of an alien name by transference either from genus to species, or from species to genus, or from species to species, or by analogy, that is, proportion”. These four types are exemplified as follows:
|(i)||From genus to species||There lies my ship||Lying at anchor is a species of the genus “lying”|
|(ii)||From species to genus||Verily ten thousand noble deeds hath Odysseus wrought||Ten thousand is a species of the genus “large number”|
|(iii)||From species to species||(a) With blade of bronze drew away the life||(a) “To draw away” is used for “to cleave”|
|(b) Cleft the water with the vessel of unyielding bronze||(b) “To cleave” is used for “to draw away.” Both, to draw away and to cleave, are species of “taking away”|
|(iv)||From analogy||(a) To call the cup “the shield of Dionysus”||(a) The cup is to Dionysus as the shield to Ares|
|(b) To call the shield “the cup of Ares”||(b) The shield is to Ares as the cup to Dionysus|
Most of the examples Aristotle offers for types (i) to (iii) would not be regarded as metaphors in the modern sense; rather they would fall under the headings of metonomy or synecdoche. The examples offered for type (iv) are more like modern metaphors. Aristotle himself regards the metaphors of group (iv), which are built from analogy, as the most important type of enthymemes. An analogy is given if the second term is to the first as the fourth to the third. Correspondingly, an analogous metaphor uses the fourth term for the second or the second for the fourth. This principle can be illustrated by the following Aristotelian examples:
|(a)||The cup to Dionysus as shield to Ares.||To call the cup “the shield of Dionysus” or the shield “the cup of Ares” is a metaphor.|
|(b)||Old age to life as the evening to day||To call old age “the evening of the life” or the evening “old age of the day” is a metaphor|
|(c)||Sowing to seed as X to sun rays, while the action of the sun in scattering his rays is nameless; still this process bears to the sun the same relation as sowing to the seed.||To call (a nameless) X “sowing of sun rays” is a metaphor by analogy|
|(d)||= (a)||To call the shield “a cup without wine” is also a metaphor by analogy.|
Examples (a) and (b) obey the optional instruction that metaphors can be qualified by adding the term to which the proper word is relative (cp. “the shield of Ares,” “the evening of life”). In example (c), there is no proper name for the thing that the metaphor refers to. In example (d) the relation of analogy is not, as in the other cases, indicated by the domain to which an item is referred to, but by a certain negation (for example “without name”); the negations make clear that the term is not used in its usual sense.
Metaphors are closely related to similes; but as opposed to the later tradition, Aristotle does not define the metaphor as an abbreviated simile, but, the other way around, the simile as a metaphor. The simile differs from the metaphor in the form of expression: while in the metaphor something is identified or substituted, the simile compares two things with each other, using words as “like,” “as”, etc. For example, “He rushed as a lion” is, according to Aristotle, a simile, but “The lion rushed” is a metaphor.
While in the later tradition the use of metaphors has been seen as a matter of mere decoration, which has to delight the hearer, Aristotle stresses the cognitive function of metaphors. Metaphors, he says, bring about learning (Rhet. III.10, 1410b14f.). In order to understand a metaphor, the hearer has to find something common between the metaphor and the thing the metaphor refers to. For example, if someone calls the old age “stubble”, we have to find a common genus to which old age and stubble belong; we do not grasp the very sense of the metaphor until we find that both, old age and stubble, have lost their bloom. Thus, a metaphor not only refers to a thing, but simultaneously describes the thing in a certain respect. This is why Aristotle says that the metaphor brings about learning: as soon as we understand why someone uses the metaphor “stubble” to refer to old age, we have learned at least one characteristic of old age.
Glossary of Selected Terms
- Accepted opinions: endoxa
- Argument: logos
- Art: technê
- Character: êthos
- Counterpart: antistrophos
- Credible: axiopistos
- Decision (practical): prohairesis
- Deduction: sullogismos
- Emotions: pathê
- Enthymeme: enthumêma
- Example: paradeigma
- For the most part: hôs epi to polu
- Induction (epagôgê)
- Judgement: krisis
- Location: topos (an argumentative scheme)
- Maxim: gnômê
- Means of persuasion: pistis (in pre-Aristotelian use this word also designates a certain part of the speech)
- Metaphor: metaphora
- Persuasive: pithanon
- Place: topos (an argumentative scheme)
- Practical intelligence: phronêsis
- Premise: protasis (can also mean ‘sentence’, statement’)
- Probable: eikos
- Proof: apodeixis (in the sense of ‘demonstrative argument, demonstration’)
- Proof: tekmêrion (i.e. a necessary sign or sign argument)
- Sign: sêmeion (can also mean ‘sign argument’)
- Style: lexis
- Specific topoi: idioi topoi (Aristotle refers to them also by ‘idiai protaseis’ or ‘eidê’)
Translations, Editions and Commentaries
- Bartlett, Robert C., 2019. Aristotle’ Art of Rhetoric, translation with an Interpretive Essay, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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