Notes to John Langshaw Austin

1. Austin’s emphasis on the good standing of distinctions drawn within ordinary language echoes a similar emphasis in Cook Wilson. See Marion 2009. It is recapitulated and developed in Grice and Strawson 1956 and Putnam 1962.

2. Ultimately, the dispute between Austin’s approach and approaches based broadly on Grice’s work turns on delicate issues concerning the extent to which, and ways in which, ordinary judgments, and our views about the sources and status of ordinary judgments, can be overturned either on the basis of attempts to systematize and generalize those judgments, or on the basis of our commitment to general principles taken to govern specific judgments. Grice recognizes a special case of the general issue in his Studies (1989: 49).

3. This component of Austin’s views about truth has figured importantly in recent discussions about the context- or occasion-sensitivity of our use of language. See, for example, Travis 2008: 1–18.

4. The distinction between performative and descriptive functions had earlier been articulated and exploited by Austin in his “Other Minds” (1946). Austin’s feel for the distinction appears to have stemmed from his engagement with some of H. A. Prichard’s work on the nature of promises, about which Austin and Prichard had corresponded. See e.g., Prichard 1979: 171.

5. Austin’s paper formed part of a symposium with Strawson 1950, as co-symposiast, offering a critical response. Others soon joined the fray. The ensuing dispute was messy, and served, I think, to hinder understanding of, and engagement with, Austin’s initial discussion. A useful discussion of some of the initial mess may be found in Wheatley 1969. See also Chisholm 1964; Mates 1974; Strawson 1964b, 1965; Warnock 1962, 1964, 1973c, 1989: 45–64; C.J.F. Williams 1973.

6. Austin writes: “the statement…is a ‘logical construction’ out of the makings of statements” (1962b: 1 fn.1).

7. Note that Austin doesn’t claim that the formula specifies a necessary condition for truth.

8. These are conventions only in the general sense that they are correlations that are both arbitrary and instituted on the basis of manifest human decision. Thus ‘conventional’ is employed to contrast with ‘natural’ in something like the way suggested in Plato’s Cratylus.

9. The distinction here partly reflects a distinction that figures throughout Austin’s work between general (type) abilities, opportunities for their exercise, and their particular exercises. A distinction of this sort plays a central role in Austin’s “Other Minds” (1946) and Sense and Sensibilia (1962a) discussions of knowledge and perception, and also figures in his “Ifs and Cans” (1956a) discussion of abilities.

10. Although Austin doesn’t take a stand on the matter, it would be an over-simplification to think that the demonstrative conventions must function independently of the descriptive conventions. It may well be, for example, that the descriptive conventions aid selection of a target situation—for instance, by indicating that the target situation is, or might easily be taken to be, one in which a cat is on a mat.

11. It is because decision or judgment is required in order to determine classification of the present case as e.g., red, rather than this being determined by purely natural relations of similarity, that Austin speaks here of a role for an additional convention.The two most important aspects of Austin’s thought here are these. First, sameness of type is registered in judgment or (in an attenuated sense) decision, rather than in experience (which registers only similarities). Second, what is a matter for judgment or decision is not simply whether there is a sameness present but rather whether the sameness that is required by a particular linguistic typing is present. What Austin says leaves open whether he means to be sketching an account of the determination of types or rather offering only an outline account of the registration of, and selection amongst, independently determined types. On the former view, Austin would be outlining a theory of types or universals; on the latter, he would be offering an account of the connection between types or universals and linguistic practice. Austin makes some relevant observations about theories of universals in his 1940ms, especially: 69–75.

12. It’s plausible that in appealing to states of affairs, situations, and events as a range of particulars, Austin was in effect following Cook Wilson’s lead. See Marion 2009 for discussion of Cook Wilson’s views concerning the existence of such particulars.

13. This provides the context for Austin’s favorable reference to “‘coherence’ and pragmatist theories of truth” triggered by the following question: “Is it true or false that the dog goes round the cow?” (1950a: 130, 130 fn.1). Plausibly, this alludes to William James’ discussion of the occasion-sensitivity of the question whether, in a case in which both a squirrel and a man are circling a tree, the man goes round the squirrel (James 1907/1975).

14. The requirement here would have to be made more complicated in order to cope with the different way that truth can vary across contexts due to indexicals (e.g., “here”, “now”) or demonstratives (e.g., “this”). However, since the sentences we are considering do not (explicitly) involve indexicals or demonstratives, we can ignore that complication for present purposes.

15. For discussion of the bearing of Austin’s views on the standing of literal meaning, see Crary 2002 and Hansen 2014.

16. Austin considers taking the third line with a range of cases including definitions, value judgments, and performatives in “Truth” (1950a: 131–132). It is a good question how well this approach can be fitted with his deflationary leanings.

17. 1962b. Austin first appeals to a version of the distinction in “Other Minds” (1946: 97–103), in discussing the function of claims to know.

18. Austin’s doesn’t explicitly state that the illocutionary act is the fundamental locus of assessment as to truth. However, the claim is of a piece with his claim (considered earlier in discussing whether Austin is a deflationist about truth) that assessment as to truth covers a variety of more specific assessments as to merit (including happiness), assessments which themselves most naturally target illocutionary acts: assessments as to fairness, reasonableness, and so forth. See 1950a: 130, 1956b: 250–251, 1957: 180. In addition, Austin emphasises that, on his view, the rheme—the core of the locutionary act—“is a unit of speech; its typical fault is to be vague or void or obscure, &c.” (1962b: 98); its characteristic fault is not to be false. Similarly, Austin considers the types of failures to which locutionary acts are characteristically susceptible and says, “…failures here will not be unhappinesses as [in the case of the illocutionary act], but rather failures to get the words out, to express ourselves clearly, etc.” (1962b: 106). Finally, if Austin viewed the locutionary act rather than the illocutionary act as the fundamental target of assessment as to truth, then it would be difficult to understand Austin’s treatment of performative utterances in the context of his distinction between locutionary and illocutionary acts. Performative utterances differ from other utterances in an illocutionary, rather than a locutionary, way. Hence, the default prediction would be that performative utterances are apt for any form of assessment that applies to locutionary acts in general. If those forms of assessment included assessment as to truth, then it would be natural to expect Austin to use the distinction between locutionary and illocutionary acts as the basis for explicitly rejecting the earlier suggestion that performative utterances are not up for assessment as to truth. What Austin does instead is to argue that performative utterances may be at the service of illocutionary acts that are apt for assessment as to truth—in particular, acts of stating (see 1962b: 133–147).

19. Austin 1946 is ostensibly an engagement with Wisdom 1946 on the topic of knowledge of other minds. Although Austin focuses on general issues about knowledge, he also draws on the general discussion in making some interesting and distinctive proposals about knowledge of other minds (see Austin 1946: 103–116).

20. For example, Austin writes: “Surely, if what has so been said is correct, then we are often right to say we know even in cases where we turn out subsequently to have been mistaken—and indeed we seem always, or practically always, liable to be mistaken” (1946: 98).

21. Austin focuses on the slightly unusual presentation of such an argument in Ayer 1940, together with some consideration of its development in Price 1932, as well as the connected discussion in Warnock 1953. Austin’s explicit aim is to undermine one form of argument, in a small number of particular presentations. However, he takes the texts that he considers to be “…the best available expositions of the approved reasons for holding theories which are at least as old as Heraclitus…” (1962a: 1), and he expresses the hope that some of the arguments and methods that he employs may have wider applicability. However, it is a legitimate source of complaint that Austin doesn’t give the argument that he considers the best possible run for its money, and doesn’t consider closely related and more convincing arguments. For example, Austin fails to consider arguments based upon the apparent possibility of hallucinations that are induced by brain manipulation and that perfectly match (are indistinguishable from) genuine cases of perception. For discussion see Martin ms.

22. Austin’s position is a clear precursor of forms of disjunctivism about perception, as developed for example in Hinton 1973, Martin 1997, McDowell 1982, and Snowdon 1981. However, I don’t think that Austin can be read straightforwardly as a proto-disjunctivist. A minimal commitment of disjunctivism is rejection of the more general principle that it follows from the fact that two experiences are indiscriminable on the basis of introspection (contrast: the objects of two experiences are indiscriminable) to their subject that the experiences are of the same fundamental kind (contrast: have objects of the same fundamental kind). And as far as I know, Austin doesn’t clearly and explicitly reject the general principle. He therefore leaves somewhat open that an argument for sense-data, or against his favored view of perception, might be mounted on the basis of the more general principle. And to that extent, he isn’t (clearly and explicitly) a disjunctivist about sensory experience. See Soteriou 2009.

23. Austin seems later to withdraw, or at least to weaken, the claim here about “intentionally”, perhaps due in part to the influence of G. E. M. Anscombe. See Austin 1966: 283–285.

24. Austin appears to endorse the following style of account. An aggravating modifier is (normally) correctly applicable to actions of type A when and only when the following two conditions are met: (a) the piece of machinery targeted by the modifier is not involved in normal or standard (free and responsible) instances of A; and (b) the piece of machinery targeted by the modifier is involved in this particular instance of A. Where an application fails condition (a) and meets condition (b), it is liable to represent to an audience that the piece of machinery in question is not involved in normal or standard instances of A. Similarly, an excusing modifier is (normally) correctly applicable to instances of action type A when and only when the following two conditions are met: (a) the piece of machinery targeted by the modifier is involved in normal or standard (free and responsible) instances of A; and (b) the piece of machinery targeted by the modifier is not involved in this particular instance of A. Where an application fails condition (a), it is liable to represent that the piece of machinery in question is involved in normal and standard (free and responsible) instances of type A. Where such an application meets condition (b), it’s liable to represent that machinery which normally serves to underpin free and responsible actions of the type in question is not operative in the present instance. See 1957: 189–193; 1966.

To a first approximation, one might usefully think of the (a) conditions as akin to kinds of felicity conditions and the (b) conditions as akin to felicity-dependent truth-conditions. Note that I’ve presented the account as though pairs of modifiers like “voluntary” and “involuntary” target the same machinery. However, Austin holds that, in some cases, such pairs target different machinery so that, for example, “involuntary” is not equivalent to “not voluntary”. See Austin 1957: 189–193.

25. Austin in effect allows (for the sake of argument) that in cases in which we would take (i) “S can A” to be true, we would also be prepared to take to be true (ii) “S can A, if S chooses to”. However, Austin rejects both Moore’s claims (iii) that it follows that the conditional claim made using “If S chooses to A, S can A” is true and (iv) that it follows that the conditional claim made using “If S chooses to A, S will A” is true. In both cases, Austin’s point is very simple. As Austin understands the claims in (iii) and (iv), both claims—as hypothetical or causal conditionals—ought to contrapose. Thus, if Moore’s proposal were correct, then we ought to be in a position to derive from (i) and/or (ii) the following: (v) “If S can’t A, it’s not the case that S chooses to A” and (vi) “If S doesn’t A, it’s not the case that S chooses to A”. However, it seems obvious that neither (v) nor (vi) follows from (i) or (ii). Ergo, according to Austin, we should reject that claims that (iii) and (iv) follow from (i) and (ii), and with them Moore’s pretensions to have avoided the problem posed to (i) by determinism.

However, there is a flaw in Austin’s argument, arising from its dependence on contraposition. On the most natural construal, the conditionals comprising Moore’s proposal are subjunctive conditionals, for example, “If it were the case that S chose to A, then it would be the case that S could A.” However, subjunctive conditionals do not contrapose. From “If it were not the case that I took the homeopathic remedy, then I would have been ill for two weeks” it does not follow that this is true: “If I had not been ill for two weeks, then I would have taken the homeopathic remedy”. Nonetheless, although Austin’s direct argument fails, at least as directed against a subjunctive Moore, it is plausible that he is anyway right to reject at least Moore’s claim about (iii). More pressing against that claim is the credibility of Austin’s counter-proposal, on which “S can A, if S chooses to” is construed as “S can (A if S chooses to)”, rather than as “If S were to choose to A, then it would be the case that S could A”. That is, it is more plausible to understand the claim as one about our abilities to act on our choices, than as one about what abilities we would possess were we to make certain choices. After all, it’s implausible to suppose that one’s choices bear in that way on whether or not one possesses the ability to implement them. Moore’s claim about (iv), detached from its dependence on (iii), is a special case of the second proposal of Moore’s that Austin considers.

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