Notes to Biodiversity

1. Jetzkowitz et al. (2018: S42) argue

biodiversity is not defined as a set of entities but rather as diversity among different entities, that is, as a disposition. Thus, epistemologically, one can ask in which form biodiversity exists as well as, ethically, why we should conserve a disposition (rather than entities). It is disputable whether it is appropriate to attribute “intrinsic value” to the concept of variability at all.

See also Justus et al. (2009), McShane (2017), and the SEP entry on biodiversity preservation (Brennan & Lo 2002 [2016]) for related discussion of intrinsic value and biodiversity.

2. The pre-history section provides a different description of this transition from a typical focus on single species to a concern also about biotic diversity. Rather than jumping to a post 1985 appreciation of “diversity”, the pre-history documents much work in the 1970’s that announces a concern about loss of living variation.

3. Burch-Brown and Archer (2017) refer to one case for eliminativism that draws on earlier history. They present an argument that “the concept of biodiversity is simply too inclusive and ambiguous to be useful” by referring to MacArthur (1972). However, that paper’s actual complaint was about the ambiguity of the multitude of ecological diversity measures. Burch-Brown and Archer go on to defend a definition in which biodiversity refers to “the variety of life” or “heterogeneity” and suggest this could be called “variationist”. This has some correspondence to the general variation framework, but adds in ecological aspects, such as heterogeneity of behaviour or ecosystem structure—so perhaps reflecting their implicit linking of ecological diversity measures to biodiversity.

4. There is indeed a case for calling “biodiversity” a confusing term. For example, Mace, Norris, & Fitter. (2012) includes a multitude of aspects in possible definitions:

the definition embraces many alternative diversity measures; (2012: 20)

biodiversity is a factor controlling the ecosystem processes that underpin ecosystem services. For example, the dynamics of many soil nutrient cycles are determined by the composition of biological communities in the soil; (2012: 22)

the definition can be interpreted broadly to make it operational for all ecosystem service assessments (2012: 20)

… It also includes the variability that arises from species being part of ecological complexes (2012: 20)

it excludes measures based solely on abundance or amount… (2012: 20);

Mace et al. (2018: 3) later go on to include abundance, in interpreting the goal of “halting the loss of biodiversity” to include halting

the declines in abundance and distribution of species as well as the structure and functioning of biological communities.

Copyright © 2021 by
Daniel P. Faith <>

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