Jean Bodin

First published Fri Mar 25, 2005; substantive revision Mon Jul 30, 2018

Jean Bodin (1529/30–1596) was a lawyer, economist, natural philosopher, historian, and one of the major political theorists of the sixteenth century. There are two reasons why Bodin remains both fascinating and enigmatic: on the one hand, aspects of his life remain shrouded in legend; on the other, misunderstandings about his thought and political positions have engendered contradictions and discrepancies amongst historians which have been attributed mistakenly to Bodin himself. His most significant work, The Six Books of the Commonwealth (Les Six livres de la République, 1576), represents the sum total of legal and political thought of the French Renaissance. His Method for the Easy Comprehension of History (Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem, 1566) is at the pinnacle of early-modern, European humanism’s Ars historica. Finally, his work — if he was genuinely really the author — Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium Heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis, 1683), which was published posthumously, provides clues about his own religious views. Bodin’s spiritual beliefs did not coincide with any official religion of his day, but instead resembled a form of natural religion.

In this entry, we cite Bodin’s original works and their translations by using abbreviations. These abbreviations are defined in the first two subsections of the Bibliography. For example, Methodus will refer to the original work in Latin (Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem), while [Re] will refer to the B. Reynolds 1945 translation of Methodus into English and [Me] will refer to the P. Mesnard’s entire 1951 volume of French translations.

1. Bodin’s Life in Politics and Religion: Concord or Tolerance?

Jean Bodin was born near Angers between June 1529 and June 1530 to Guillaume Bodin, a wealthy “master tailor,” and Catherine Dutertre. Bodin studied in his hometown and while still young, took the habit of the Carmelites and lived in the monastery of Notre-Dames-des-Carmes. In 1545 he traveled to Paris with some of his religious brothers to study philosophy under the tutelage of the Carmelite Guillaume Prévost. The two years Bodin spent in capital city were rich in intellectual and spiritual experiences. In 1550 he studied at the respected law faculty of the University of Toulouse under the direction of Arnaud du Ferrier.

At the end of his studies in Toulouse, Bodin became the scientific editor for the Latin translation (Oppiani De venatione, 1555) from the Greek of Oppian of Apamea’s third-century treatise on hunting. In this work Bodin included a warm dedication to his protector, Gabriel Bouvery, Bishop of Angers. In 1559, he published in Latin an Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth (Oratio de instituenda in republica juventute ad senatum populumque Tolosatem, 1559). Here Bodin praises humanism and calls for it to be taught in the public schools. According to Bodin, if humanism were included in the cultural education the youth received, the political and religious harmony of the State would be strengthened (Oratio 25):

I maintain that there may be no law so sacred and divine that could better reinforce the social ties of the city than a common and identical education for all children. Even in spiritual matters, it enables the realization of the most perfect harmony of convictions between all citizens (summa conspiratione civium). However, if the role of ecclesiastical leaders is to ensure that the true religion (religo vera) is not stained by superstition or impiety, it is also the role of the magistrates, who hold the reins of the State, to ensure that the youth do not forsake the one, unchanging religion to follow other, diverse beliefs (ab una et eadem religione in varias distrahatur). In this manner we may conserve the semblance of a State. [trans. by the author][1]

One education for all citizens and one religion for all the faithful were Bodin’s conditions for civil agreement and cooperation within a State. Cultural and religious diversity were to be avoided. These ideas remained important themes throughout his life.

In 1560 Bodin returned to Paris where he was received by the Parlement as “Counsel to the king.” In 1562 he signed the oath of Catholicity that was required by the Chapter of Notre Dame of Paris as of November 15, 1561. At the beginning of the civil wars, Bodin wrote a letter to Jean Bautru of Matras, a counselor in the Parlement of Paris who was also attracted to evangelical ideas. In the letter, Bodin believed that the “true faith” was the cause of the civil conflict that afflicted France. Nevertheless he added that there was no better proof of Christianity’s truth than that “human forces conspire against it. If religion can be considered as the grounds and cause of wars, then those wars may be like a caring doctor who cannot heal a deep-seated disease without causing great pain or provoking much moaning from the patient.” Thus, Constantine struggled against the tyrants for the “Christian religion,” and before him Moses and Judas Macchabee fought against superstition (Lettre Bautru, [Ro] 79–80). Bodin’s opinion on this subject is contained in a brief document in which he is less concerned to discuss the causes of the current war than he is to describe the distinguishing characteristics of his faith. The sages of antiquity and the Christian era, he recalls, all distinguished themselves through their high morals and piety.

In 1566 Bodin published Method for the Easy Comprehension of History (Methodus). In this work Bodin developed his conception of universal, historical knowledge. Not only did historical and juridical knowledge enable the proper management and government of the State, but also rendered the State’s forms and changes (conversiones) intelligible.

Bodin continually surprises readers with the wide range of his knowledge. For example in his Response to the Paradoxes of Monsieur de Malestroit (Response, 1568), he explains his views on economic and financial matters. His theses on free trade, the benefits of exportation, and the error of establishing the value of money through royal decree regardless of the laws of the market, were unexpected by his contemporaries. His reputation grew along with his interest in public life and the problems of the realm. Also in 1568, he attended the Estates of Narbonne, possibly as an envoy for the central government. In 1570, he became the gruyer and prosecutor for the king in a commission for the forests of Normandy. During a debate on the ancient, royal right to collect tithes on the sale of forests, Bodin opposed the tithes and the sale. He considered both as forms of alienation; the king was only a common user of forests that actually belonged to the people. King Charles IX ignored Bodin’s objections and issued an edict in 1571 alienating his rights. Regardless of this tension with the king, Bodin became the “master of petitions” and counselor to the king’s youngest brother, François-Hercule, who was then the Duke of Alençon. On August 8, 1573, Bodin was in Metz as a member of the delegation that received the ambassadors of Poland, who came to offer their country’s crown to the king’s brother Henry, Duke of Anjou. The Bishop and Duke of Langres, Charles des Cars, welcomed the ambassadors in a speech delivered in Latin. Bodin immediately translated the speech into French (La Harangue, 1573). On this occasion, Bodin contacted the negotiators who favored Henry’s election to the Polish throne, including the Bishop of Valence, Jean de Monluc, and the State Counselor, Guy Du Faur de Pibrac. Bodin had known de Pibrac for many years, and Bodin later dedicated his Commonwealth to him. These contacts favored Bodin’s entry into the court of Henry, King of Poland, who also became King of France in 1574. In the meantime, Bodin’s social situation improved thanks to his marriage to Françoise Trouilliart on February 25, 1576. After the marriage, he succeeded his recently deceased brother-in-law, Nicolas Trouilliart to the position of the king’s prosecutor at the présidial of Laon.

The year 1576 was central in Bodin’s life; in that year he published his Six Books of the Commonwealth (République). In this monumental work Bodin tries to restore the institutional bases of the French kingdom, which the on-going war threatened to undermine on account of, among other things, the Reformers’ doctrine concerning tyranny and tyrannicide. For example, Bodin writes (République I, 8) about certain authors of slander and treatises:

…those who have written on the duties of magistrates[2] and other similar books[3] are wrong to support the idea that the Estates of the People [Estates General] are more important than the prince. Such ideas make obedient subjects revolt when they should obey their sovereign prince […] These notions are absurd (absurdes) and incompatible (incompatibles). [trans. by the author; cf.[Mc] 95]

In describing these doctrines as “absurd and incompatible,” Bodin levels a harsh critique and lays the basis for his response in his Six Books of the Commonwealth. Bodin supported the right of resistance in general, but he opposed the right “to take up arms.” Armed resistance was a tactic that the “Huguenots” claimed as a right, especially after the ravages of the St. Bartholomew’s Day Massacre. But 1576 was equally important in the history of France: after the king issued the Edict of Beaulieu (Paix de Monsieur) on May 6 and convened the Estates General in Blois, the wars of religion briefly subsided. In the royal edict, next to the words “those followers of the so-called Reformed Religion,” a distinction is made between “United” Catholics or the “Union of Catholics,” and the “associated” Catholics. The associated Catholics comprised the Duke of Montmorency and other supporters of François-Hercule, the current Duke of Anjou and Alençon, as well as the Catholics who had signed the Act of Association in 1575 with a party of moderate Huguenots.[4] The United Catholics was an association of Catholic nobles that allied with Duke Henry of Guise, advocated the reunification of the faith, and strove towards religious concord in France.[5] Leagues and associations formed on both sides of the religious and political spectrum until France became more and more divided.

At the same time, Bodin’s authority as an expert in affairs of State was growing. By the end of November 1576, he was received at court and sometimes dined with the king in order to discuss the most current events. Elected as the deputy of Vermandois, Bodin was sent officially to the Estates General of Blois. He recorded the proceedings of the meeting in his journal (Recueil, 1577). After attaining the presidency of the deputies of the Third Estate, Bodin revealed his unbending support for the interests of the “people.” Beginning with the meetings held in the middle of February 1577 in Blois, he refused to compromise with the clergy and nobility who desired to review the Cahiers des États in order to render the Third Estate the minority. Bodin’s haughty remarks jeopardized his position in the eyes of the king. Moreover he was firmly opposed to two royal petitions for subsidies as well as the perpetual alienation of crown territory, which he considered the “property of the people.” This resistance to royal power in matters of financial politics went hand in hand with his resistance in matters of religious politics. Bodin wanted to see an end to the religious wars. Totally convinced of the need for religious concord in order to facilitate political unification, he was willing to accept temporary measures of toleration until religious reunification could be achieved through the meeting of “a national or general council to resolve matters of religion” which was slated to be held “two years later.” In opposition to propositions made by Versoris (Pierre Le Tourneur), a fierce member of the League who supported violent means, Bodin was in agreement with the majority of the Third Estate whose deputies concluded that “the majority of voices will implore the king by written request, to unite his subjects in a Catholic, apostolic, and Roman religion by all holy and legitimate means without war.” Here, in two lines, was the essence of Bodin’s program of concord—not permanent religious tolerance. In the meantime, on January 6, 1577, Henry III had revoked the recent Edict of Beaulieu, and declared that he would no longer tolerate the “so-called Reformed religion” in his realm. Instead he would allow only the Catholic religion in France. At the same time, he took charge of the League or the Catholic Union.

The tensions with the sovereign did not advance Bodin’s career. He had to content himself for the time being as the royal prosecutor at the présidial of Laon, where he planned to retire. His studies and intellectual work increased and in 1578 he published Exposition of Universal Law (Juris), a small methodic textbook in which his theory of universal rights completes his vision of universal history that he had developed earlier in the Method. His work on judicial and historical research received not only praise, but also criticism, often harsh, which malicious readers heaped on him. For example, Michel of La Serre published a Remonstrance au Roi sur les pernicieux discours contenus au livre de la République de Bodin in 1579 that accused Bodin of attempting to diminish the sovereignty of the king and of defending, without being explicit, the Huguenots. This was exactly the opposite of what Bodin was trying to accomplish in his published works. On the other hand, the second accusation—the secretive membership in the Reformed religion—has found favor today amongst some modern biographers who attribute this membership to Bodin as a badge of honor. Bodin, knowing well that these two accusations were unfounded did not deem it necessary to respond to his slanderer, le sieur de La Serre, who in the meantime had been imprisoned on orders of the king. But serious and reasoned opposition to Bodin’s work was also not lacking. Professor Andreas Franckenberger did not accept the arguments that Bodin leveled against the ideas of Sleidan and Melanchthon concerning the Old Testament book of Daniel.[6] They had posited that according to Daniel’s theory of the “four monarchies” the monarchy following Holy Roman Empire was destined to rule the world. Pierre de l’Hostal disputed Bodin’s effort to reduce, through mathematic formulae, the number of government types.[7] As for Bodin’s friend, the medical doctor Augier Ferrier of Toulouse, he also challenged the numerology with which Bodin attempted to forecast governmental change.[8] In response to Ferrier and other detractors, Bodin took up the pen not only to defend himself but also to attack his critics in his work Defense of Jean Bodin by René Herpin (Apologie, 1581).

Bodin’s critics became more serious and dangerous with regard to his On the Demon-mania of Witches that was published in 1581 (Démonomanie). In his letter of dedication (December 20, 1579) to Christophle de Thou, the first president of the Parlement of Paris, Bodin explains why he write the work and the meaning of its title. First, he hoped to denounce the mania, the spiritual errors, and distraction, as well as the “fury” that sorcerers possess as they “chase after the devil.” He wrote this treaty with two purposes in mind: on the one hand, “to use it as a warning to all who will see him [the devil],” and on the other hand, “to alert readers that there is no crime that could be more atrocious or deserve more serious punishment.” Bodin wished to speak out against those who “try by all means to rescue the sorcerers through printed books.” He reminded all that “Satan has men in his grasp who write, publish, and speak claiming that nothing that is said about sorcerers is true.” It was essential to provide the tools to magistrates and judges, who were confronted by the accused sorcerers, in order to face this formidable problem. The work was bold and perilous for its author. Many wondered if Bodin, so curious about this topic, such an expert, so convinced of the devil’s existence, may not himself have been involved with witchcraft. These suspicions alarmed the authorities, and on June 3, 1587, the general prosecutor to the Parlement of Paris ordered the general lieutenant of the baillage of Laon to proceed with a search of Bodin’s home, on suspicion of witchcraft. This inspection brought no results due to the intervention of eight prominent citizens and two priests who registered their support of Bodin.

In the 1580s, Bodin’s diplomatic responsibilities were reduced at the same time that the prestige of the Duke of Alençon and Anjou, whom Bodin had accompanied on a voyage to England and Flanders, diminished. After the Duke’s unsuccessful attempt to seize Antwerp, Bodin wrote to his brother-in-law, Nicolaus Trouilliart, on January 22, 1583 and explained his useless efforts to dissuade the duke from such an undertaking. The death of Duke François-Hercule, the youngest brother of the king, raised dynastic problems: the presumptive heir, Henry of Navarre, was the leader of the Huguenots, and he was related to Henri III to the 22nd degree. Facing the eventuality of a “heretic” king, the League took the upper hand, and the Catholics strengthened their Holy Union. The “perpetual and irrevocable” Edict of Paris (called the Peace of Nemour) on July 7, 1585 prohibited the exercise of the reformed cult, and effectively revoked the Edict of Poitiers of the September 17, 1577 (also “perpetual and irrevocable”), which had conceded a slight, provisory measure of tolerance. The edict of 1585 was confirmed by the Edict of Rouen of July 1588 and was moreover defined as the “inviolable and fundamental law.” In other words, religious concord, in this case “forced” concord, represented the highest priority for the lawmakers. There are two sorts of religious edicts that alternate during the wars: edicts of pacification and provisional tolerance, and edicts of concord and union. In the “edicts of pacification,” which Bodin believed were the best means to avoid war, temporary tolerance takes precedence while final peace is delayed until a time when “God will grant us the grace to unite the nation in the same fold.” “Edicts of Union” or “Uniformity” (this was the word preferred by the Kings of England in their Acts of Uniformity) imposed peace through force and thereby implied that war could begin again. The Estates General of Blois sanctioned, on October 18, 1588, The Edict of Rouen as “the fundamental and irrevocable law of this kingdom.” The crisis reached its peak during a quick succession of events that shook the kingdom. First, on December 23 and 24, 1588, the leader of the Catholics, Henry of Lorraine [third Duke of Guise], and his younger brother, Louis de Lorraine, Cardinal of Guise and Archbishop of Reims, were assassinated on the orders Henry III. Second, in January 1589, the Parlement of Paris denounced this “massacre,” and the theology faculty of the Sorbonne freed subjects from their oath of faithfulness and obedience to the king. Finally on August 1, 1589, Jacques Clément, believing that he was killing a tyrant, assassinated the king. On August 4, 1589, Henry of Navarre claimed that he was willing to “be instructed” in order to return to the Catholic faith. The reality was such that, while the parties fought to claim the throne, the kingdom was without a king and the royalist party, which included Bodin, without a leader. During this period, Bodin, as a public figure, as the man responsible for the city of Laon, as a well-known authority on constitutional rights, and as a private citizen, was obligated to define publicly his political positions.

The Letter by Jean Bodin in which he discuss the reasons why he became a member of the League (Lettre Bodin), of January 20, 1590, published in Paris, Lyons, Toulouse, and Brussels, is clearly a masterpiece of political analysis once it is properly framed within its historical context. The work continues to be discussed and disparaged by historians and biographers of Bodin. Bodin explains why “the inhabitants or most of them” of Laon, including himself, became members of the “League.” Three factors played a role: first, article 9 of the 1588 Edict of the Union order all subjects to “join the current union” under the threat of being judged guilty of lèse majesté; second was the fear that “a regiment of Captain Bourg” would loot the town; third, assassination attempts had been launched against him [Bodin], from which he had barely escaped. Some would say that Bodin was forced to change his political position, but this is not the case; rather, great changes had occurred in the historical reality. Many, but not all, of the royalists (“regalists”) found themselves without a king or a party, turned toward the League as the group with the most similar agenda—the program of concord. In effect, the royalists and the League had had similar views regarding concord, the survival of political institutions, and the Gallic State. They disagreed however about the means to achieve their objectives, most notably how quickly to go to war against the Huguenots, the excessive power of the Duke de Guise (which diminished the authority of the king) and the interference of the pope and Spain. On these points Bodin, as a loyal officer of the king, kept his distance from the League. At that time the changes were so distressing that Bodin believed it was necessary to explain publicly the new circumstances in which France and the French found themselves. Only with these new circumstances in mind should Bodin’s response be evaluated. He himself did not question the changes because all that mattered for him was that he continued to serve the people whose well-being was “the supreme law.” Bodin’s continuing loyal service reveals his position. He had considered all of the matters carefully because he believed he would face “the judgment of God,” concerning his own actions as well as those of France. If the town should fall “into the hands of enemy [clearly the Huguenots],” Bodin wrote that he would worry neither for his life nor his goods, “as long as I [he] could serve the public.”

Examining the general situation of the warring factions, Bodin expresses himself frankly. He knew how to judge one of the most complex moments in French history clearly and without partisanship. By analyzing how he reaches his opinions, we can better understand his ideas. The prospects for a peace agreement were small because “the leaders and the partisans were, whether in the State or the Church, at odds in their morals, behavior, and inclinations. They absolutely cannot agree by speaking together.” Besides, the two parties were powerful internally and externally. The Maréchaux of France, the main officers of the crown, the second estate of the nobility all of the Huguenots, “politiques” and atheists and nearly all of the princes of the blood belonged to the party of the King of Navarre. Thus, in Bodin’s view, the “politiques and atheists” were linked to the reformed, which he considered the enemy. Outside of the kingdom, they were even more powerful and counted in their alliance: England, Scotland, Denmark, Sweden, the four Swiss cantons, and the Protestant princes of Germany. Addressing the party of the Holy Union, Bodin eulogized its leader, the Duke of Mayenne [Charles of Lorraine, the third son of Duke François de Guise and brother of the deceased Duke Henry], “whom it seems that God has appointed to be the Protector of Religion and the State.” In this circumstance, “this good leader, in addition to the public interest, can rightly pursue vengeance for his two brothers. Unfortunately he received bad advice from those who today carry arms and who belong to the opposing party.” This clause reveals much about Bodin’s opinion regarding the assassination of the Guises by Henry III, whom, Bodin believed, had been ill advised by the Huguenots. The Catholic party was strong in France, having on its side all of the clergy, all of the capital cities (except for Bordeaux), nearly all of the provinces, and 150 “good towns.” Abroad, the Catholics could call on the assistance of the “Pope and the Holy See, Chief of the Union,” the emperor and Catholic King “whom we can call, without flattery, the greatest prince carrying the title of king in Christendom over the past 150 years.” This list does not count other Catholic powers including the Dukes of Savoy, Florence, Ferrara, and Mantua, the Catholic Princes of Germany, and the three Elector Archbishops. As far as the right of succession, according to his calculations, forecasts, the study of numbers, and degrees of relationship (to the thirteenth degree for the Cardinal of Bourbon, Charles, brother of Antoine of Bourbon—King of Navarre, father of Henry—and to the fourteenth degree for the present King of Navarre, Henry) Bodin had no doubt that the Cardinal of Bourbon had a better claim than the King of Navarre. “Therefore, the King of Navarre, however good and clever the advice he may have, is, in my judgment, ill-advised when he does not recognize Monseigneur the Cardinal of Bourbon as king.” Had he been better advised, Henry should have freed his uncle, whom he was keeping in captivity, and allowed him to govern until succeeding him. Therefore, “he should stop this belligerence and contract an alliance with the House of Lorraine, by freeing the innocent Duke of Guise, [Charles of Lorraine, fourth Duke of Guise and eldest son of the deceased] and the Duke of Elbeuf, [Charles of Lorraine, count of Harcourt] who is being punished unjustly.” Bodin demonstrates his political acumen here not so much concerning the forecasts he makes based on numerology ( he repeats “I foresee,” three or four times) but for the recommendations he makes to the King of Navarre before ascending the throne. First he writes that the King of Navarre should be reconciled with the Catholic Church, which Navarre had already announced. Second, he should give the throne to his uncle, Charles de Bourbon, which given that Charles was sixty-seven at the time and died in May 1590, would have been a temporary arrangement. Henry did not do this. Third, he should have sought an agreement between the Lorraines or the Guises and the other Catholic princes. Navarre does this before and after he is crowned Henry IV. These recommendations prove Bodin’s clear political judgment.

Here we see a relatively little-known side to Bodin which nevertheless is consistent with the principles he had outlined in his Six Books of the Commonwealth. His advice is perceptive and objective; however, historians have glossed over this fact in order to depict Bodin as a man who should have been ashamed of joining the Holy Union. Yet Bodin was secure in his judgment, when he wrote (Lettre Bodin):

You now see, sir, that the Union’s case is better founded than you thought […] I see that everywhere men are making great efforts to assist it. I beg God to give you grace. ([Ro] 92–93; trans. by the author).

The victory of the Union would assure religious concord and the re-establishment of the institutions of the kingdom. This was Bodin’s wish and this is precisely what the Catholic and “very Christian King,” Henry IV, later brought to fruition through the Edict of Nantes of 1598. Nowadays, the generally accepted opinion that regards the Edict of Nantes as a “perpetual and irrevocable” law of permanent tolerance (or coexistence of two religions) is erroneous. This judicial measure was intended to restore the social and political cohesion of the realm in the short term. In the long term it was aimed at religious reunification in the one sole faith—that of the king. That is why the Edict was defined as a “law of concord,” through temporary tolerance. This was the authoritative judgment of Pierre de Beloy, the sole contemporary jurist and commentator of the Edict.[9] Bodin did not live to see it. He died of the plague between June and September 1596, after having declared in his testament that he wished to be buried in the church of the Franciscans of Laon.

In his last years, Bodin occupied himself with two projects. The first, Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime, concerned the essence of religion. If indeed it was from Bodin’s hand (and its attribution to him has as many partisans as it has its critics, as we shall see), it would have been written in these final years of his life. The work would be published long after his death (Heptaplomeres, 1683). The other, Theater of Universal Nature (Theatrum, 1596), dealt with natural philosophy. He had just enough time to add a dedicatory letter to Jacques Mitte, Count of Miolins on March 1, 1596.

2. Bodin’s Methodology of History and Law

When he began his research, Bodin was drawn to analysis and systematics as methods for organizing knowledge. In titling his work “Method”, he gave a new and definitive meaning to a word which previous authors had used to signify both “division” and “ratio” or “the procedure” for learning a discipline.[10] In Method, Bodin encourages his readers to use analysis, which he calls “that pre-eminent guide to the teaching of the arts […] in order that understanding of history (historiarum scientia) shall be complete and facile” (Methodus, [Re] 20; Latin [Me] 116). According to Bodin, it is through analysis that one is able to divide universals into parts, and to divide each part into subsections without losing the coherence of the whole. Therefore synthesis, he states, is no longer necessary because the individual episodes of nearly all historical accounts are already well adapted to each other, and the best historians have carefully reconstructed these partial and regional accounts into the tableau of universal history. Bodin writes (Methodus [Me] 116):

I call that history universal which embraces the affairs of all, or of the most famous peoples, or of those whose deeds in war and in peace have been handed down to us from an early stage of their national growth ([Re] 21).

Bodin ascribes a unique role to political knowledge, thereby distinguishing his writings from many similar treatments of the ars historica which were published at the end of the fifteenth century.[11] The masterpieces of this genre were produced in Italy such as Francesco Patrizi, Della historia dialoghi dece, 1560; and in France by François Bauduin, De institutione historiae universae et ejus cum jurisprudentia conjunctione, Paris 1561. Although he does not cite Bauduin, Bodin was indebted to this French author who was the first to describe in a scientific manner the multiple connections between law and universal history. The chapter headings include:

  1. What History is and of How Many Categories
  2. The Order of Reading Historical Treatises
  3. The Proper Arrangement of Historical Material
  4. The Choice of Historians
  5. The Correct Evaluation of Histories
  6. The Type of Government in States
  7. Refutation of those who Postulate Four Monarchies and the Golden Age
  8. A System of Universal Time
  9. Criteria by which to Test the Origins of Peoples
  10. The Order and Collection of Historians[12]

For Bodin, methodologies were visual representations of systems of knowledge. He makes this point in his work Exposition, where he states that the concept of “division,” which Plato had called divine, is the “universal rule of the sciences” (See also Juris, 1578). If history is divided into divine history, natural history, and human history, then law can be divided into natural law, human law, the laws of nations, public law, and civil law. From there, Bodin briefly describes and defines legal matters including: contracts, crimes, property, obligation, authority, jurisdiction, etc. Here more than in the Method, the reader sees Bodin’s pedagogical preoccupation with brevity and conciseness. The work is also illustrated with a number of schematic tables. In the private sphere, Bodin demonstrated his talent for teaching in A Letter to his Nephew (Épître, 1585), and in the short Advice on the Education of a Prince (Conseil, 1574–1586), which had limited circulation.

3. Bodin’s religiosity: Did He Believe or Not?

During his youth, Bodin received a Catholic education and he remained loyal to the Church until his death. Demonstrating his religious convictions, in a testament from June 7, 1596, he requested to be buried in a Catholic Church. Nevertheless, during his middle years, he was critical of the church hierarchy and occasionally expressed antipapal sentiments. On the basis of this evidence, his biographers have quickly labeled him a Protestant. Yet in his Lettre à Jean Bautru des Matras, a text based on his youthful religious ideas, it is clear that Bodin was not a pure Protestant, but rather a critic of the Roman Catholic clergy, its hierarchy, and some of its doubtful religious practices. Bodin was a fervent believer in the “true religion” which he considered “nothing other than looking to God with a purified spirit.”[13] These words reveal less a reformed Calvinist than an adherent of a belief system, whose orthodoxy was unclear, but which could be described as natural religion. Bodin possessed an expansive view of religion and a sincere belief in an all-powerful God. If he did agree with some Protestants who criticized the traditional Catholic teachings on such matters as the “veneration of images of the saints, the adoration of the Eucharist, and the belief in the fires of purgatory,” Bodin did not hold God responsible for these errors as certain sects did (e.g., the Epicureans, although the allusion is not clear).

This would be the equivalent to calling God a trickster (sceleratum) for allowing, during the millennia before Christ, all men, except the seven thousand (as stated by the divine Word), to live in the most despicable evilness. This would be absurd. (Lettre Bautru, [Ro] 81).

In this letter Bodin refrained from all commentary on the doctrine of the sacraments and dogma. Instead he considered the religion of Christ, to which he himself belonged (mea vel potius Christi religio), as accessible to all men of good will. This included the luminaries of the ancient world, most notably the Platonists, whom Bodin considered “close to being Christians.” His words, although far from being those of an adherent of the Reformation, are no less those of a critic of the papal curia an advocate of reform within the Catholic Church who was calling for a return to the essential, pure message of the Gospels. On the other hand, amongst fervent Catholics, Bodin’s views on the freedom of conscience[14] caused him to be suspect, even though his opinions on the freedom of the conscience was distinct from his theory of religious tolerance (the first was a matter for the private individual, the second for civil and public life). According to one contemporary in Bodin’s city of Laon, Antoine Richart, Bodin was “a politique and a dangerous Catholic” (Richart 1869, 68; cited in Chauviré 1914, 80). A later writer, Traiano Boccalini, labeled Bodin a “notorious atheist” because he had recommended the “the freedom of conscience” (Boccalini 1618, I, 64, p. 195).

The Heptaplomeres, written around 1593, appeared posthumously (Kiel, 1683). Here the author gives us evidence of his religious beliefs (presuming, for the moment, that Bodin was, in fact, the author). The seven speakers in the work represent as many different religions, confessions, and philosophical schools of thought: Coroni, Catholicism; Salomon, Judaism; Senamy, Skepticism; Octavus, a renegade turned Muslim; Friedrich, Lutheranism; Curtius, Calvinism; and Toralbe, natural religion. Toralbe often, but not always, seems to represent the author’s personal beliefs. Despite their diversity, the seven agree with the prohibition against publicly disputing the fundamentals of religion since “all matters that are disputed are immediately called into doubt.” They also agree that the freedom of conscience should be respected, because “one should not be constrained in matters of religion, and beliefs should be voluntarily embraced, not imposed” as Tertullian stated. On the other hand, the speakers differ on the freedom of worship. Even Curtius, the Calvinist, admits that “the desire to allow several religions to practice openly in the same city seems to me to be one of the most problematic issues in the world.” Although the author deliberately leaves this discussion open and without a definite conclusion, the dialogue hinges on the thoughts of Toralbe who states that “the laws of Nature and natural religion, which nature inspires in the heart, are sufficient for salvation.” The theologian Johann Diecmann refuted Bodin’s Heptaplomeres in his thesis, De naturalismo tum aliorum, tum maxime J. Bodini (Diecmann 1683). But beginning with Leibniz, the Heptaplomeres has not ceased to attract the attention of scholars on account of its outstanding erudition and the depth of the questions it addresses.

His antipapal sentiments, interspersed throughout his writings, have provided historians with evidence to label Bodin a Protestant. Nevertheless, his criticisms of the Catholic Church should not be taken as signs of Bodin’s adherence to the Reformed creed since the same views were expressed by a number of important jurists, theologians, and writers of the period; many of whom held an active interest in the new evangelical ideas. Some would later return to traditional Christianity. Their Catholicism may not have conformed to the orthodoxy of Rome, but it was similar to the reformist program of the Erasmian School (see, for example, the cases of Charles Du Moulin, François Bauduin, Claude d’Espence, George Cassander, Jean de Monluc, and others). Moreover, Bodin’s attacks on the papal curia did not escape the scrutiny of the ecclesiastical authorities. The official censure of the Church placed the Methodus (1583, 1591), République (1591), Démonomanie (1594), and the Theatrum (1628), on the Index of prohibited books.

4. Bodin’s Politics: Sovereignty or Absolutism?

Bodin’s major work, the Six Books of the Commonwealth, is a treatment of “political science,” a term which Bodin justly claimed he has coined. The books are titled:

  1. The Final End of the Well-ordered Commonwealth
  2. Of the Different Kinds of Commonwealth
  3. The Council
  4. The Rise and Fall of Commonwealths
  5. The Order to be Observed in Adapting the Form of the Commonwealth to the Diverse Condition of Men and the Means of Determining their Dispositions
  6. The Census and the Censorship.

Bodin’s primary contribution to political science of his day is his definition of sovereignty. Sovereignty, he contends, has an impact upon both the internal affairs of the State (such as in its exercise of full political power) as well as its external affairs (such as in its conduct of war and international relations). “Majesty or sovereignty is the most high, absolute, and perpetual power over the citizens and subjects in a Commonwealth, which the Latins call Majestas” (République, I, 8 [Mc] 84). Bodin’s discussion of tyrannicide is consistent with his political theory. For instance, while he states that there are instances when tyrannicide is justified (for example against tyrannical usurpers), killing a prince presumed to be a tyrant is forbidden if “the prince is an absolute sovereign.” Bodin explains (République II, 5):

If the prince is an absolute sovereign, as are the true kings of France, Spain, England, Scotland, Ethiopia, Turkey, Persia and Muscovy, whose authority is unquestionably their own, and not shared with any of their subjects, then it is in no circumstances permissible either by any of their subjects in particular, or in general, to attempt anything against the life and honor of their king, either by process of law or force of arms, even though he has committed all the evil, impious and cruel deeds imaginable. (see [To] and [Mc] 222)

Bodin paid particular attention to differentiating between the forms of State and the forms of government. For instance he defined a monarchy as the rule of one; aristocracy as the rule of a few; and democracy as the rule by all people. Yet monarchies might still be democracies according to Bodin, if the prince allows all of the people to have access to magistracies and State offices without regard for nobility, wealth, or virtue. Otherwise, a monarchy can be a form of aristocracy if the prince bestows State responsibilities only to the most noble, the richest, or the most virtuous. The same observations hold true for aristocratic and popular regimes.

The distinctions between the forms of State and the forms of government are essential for understanding the differences between royal monarchies, despotic monarchies, and tyrannical monarchies. The last two are easily confused. Bodin writes (République II, 2):

Despotic monarchy must not be confused with tyranny. There is nothing unfitting in a prince who has defeated his enemies in a good and just war, assuming an absolute right to their possessions and their persons under the laws of war, and thereafter governing them as his slaves; just as the head of a household is the master of his slaves and their goods, and disposes of them as he thinks fit, under the law of nations. But the prince who by an unjust war, or any other means, enslaves a free people and seizes their property is not a despot but a tyrant. (see [To]; cf. [Mc] 201)

The difference between despotism and tyranny is crucial. Despotism is legitimate and sometimes legal. Tyranny, on the other hand, is always illegitimate, illegal, and contrary to natural and divine laws. Therefore Bodin demonstrates that he is in process of constructing his theory of sovereignty not that of despotism. The same can be observed concerning absolute monarchies. When Bodin used the adjective “absolute” to define a sovereign, he did so as a Romanist, and as an historian of Roman law for whom the word absolutus was linked to legibus solutus—the prerogative of the one who is sovereign. One must pay close attention to Bodin’s writing to understand his concept of “absolute.” For Bodin a sovereign is “not bound” (absolutus) by the civil or positive laws which he or his predecessors had promulgated. Nevertheless a sovereign is always bound to natural and divine law. Sovereignty, according to Bodin, is as supreme as one wishes, but is also limited by natural and divine law. The Kings of France were glorious because their sovereignty was limited by divine and natural law (cf. Methodus, [Me] 208–209). Unfortunately, with the introduction of the word “absolutism” in the nineteenth century, historians of political philosophy began to consider Bodin as a theoretician of absolutism. This is a tendency that continues even today. In so doing, some historians have ascribed a doctrine to Bodin that was foreign to him. Instead Bodin systematized and defined a theory of sovereignty. But this problem of historical interpretation depends on the methodology and on the synchronic and diachronic perspective: when historians do not compare Bodin to Machiavelli, they study often Bodin in comparison to those who came after him: Grotius, Althusius, Locke, and particularly Hobbes, Montesquieu and Rousseau. Nothing should stop the historian from making such comparisons as long as it is not his or her sole method of analysis. As all historians understand, in order to fully and accurately understand an author, it is necessary to place his work squarely within the context and debates of his historical period. Therefore one should judge and interpret Bodin based on the works, sources, and documents current in his century rather than on those that would appear in the future.

5. Culture of a Renaissance Man: Economics, Sorcery, Naturalism

5.1 Bodin’s theories on economics and finances

In 1566, M. de Malestroict, master of accounts on the making of money, published his work, Paradoxes, to demonstrate that contrary to popular opinion in France, real prices had not risen over the past three centuries. In other words, the value of money had remained proportional to the amount of gold and silver it contained. For example, concerning inflation, Malestroict posited that although the price of land and property may have increased since the reign of St. Louis IX, inflation was not the culprit. Instead he believed that it was the decreasing amount of gold and silver which the money contained that caused prices to rise. Malestroict was convinced, following the opinions of the time, that gold and silver were representative values that were not influenced by the fluctuations of world markets. Also, while the price of various items might increase, the items were worth a constant amount of gold or silver which did not fluctuate. Because wealth is judged by the quantity of money, “the metals are the true and fair judges of market value or the price of items.”

Bodin refuted this argument and concentrated on the question of the abundance of gold and silver which he considered the principal and singular cause for the high prices of his era. “Previously no one had offered such an argument,” he says. In this matter he added two other secondary causes for high prices: the monopolies of merchants and craftsmen, who gathered in guilds and confraternities to establish the price of goods according to their own whims, as well as the scarcity of luxury goods. According to Bodin, war was another cause of rising prices: it creates shortages and therefore causes goods to become more expensive. Bodin posited that the solution to this lay in ending conflicts, since then the parties could occupy themselves with trade amongst themselves rather than waging war. In his opinion on the relationship between money and the price of goods, Bodin advocated an exchange, “which must be honest and free for the wealth and the grandeur of the realm.” He was opposed to the dominant opinion of his day, which was that of Malestroict, and which held that the solution to inflation was to attribute legal values to money by royal edict. For Bodin, the price of gold and silver should be set by the laws of the market, in other words by supply and demand. Hoping to advance these new ideas, Bodin was worried for people overwhelmed by inflation. According to Bodin a ruler “who changes the price of gold and silver ruins his people, country and himself.”

5.2 Theories on Demons

His treatment of demonism is written as an antidote to the outbreak of sorcery. This contagion was spreading at an alarming rate, thanks also to the society’s growing yet harmful indifference. Bodin trained his sights on Johann Wier (or Weyer; Piscinarius) the former servant of the famous master of occult Cornelius Agrippa and tutor to the children of Jeanne d’Albret (mother of Henry of Navarre, the future Henry IV). The work is divided into four books. The first introduces the reader to his basic ideas: the definition of a sorcerer; the association of demons with men; the difference between good and bad spirits; the human and divine means of understanding the mysteries of the occult, and the illicit means for influencing human events. The second book initiates the reader to magic in general and to silent and spoken invocations of evil spirits. Then he comes to the most debated questions, are those who renounce God bodily possessed by demons? What is lycanthropy? Can one change humans into animals? Can sorcerers cause illness, sterility, hail, storms, the death of men and animals? Book III proposes licit remedies against charms and incantations, and considers whether it is true that sorcerers have the power to heal. Here Bodin also addresses whether sorcerers have the ability to influence the finding of favor with the powerful, beauty, honors, riches, knowledge, and fertility. He discusses illicit means to prevent and heal evil spells, and the method for driving out evil spirits. The fourth book concludes the work by tackling the issues of magical practice and most importantly, the inquisition of sorcerers. He examines the methods for proceeding against them, the proof required, and the penalties to be inflicted. In most cases Bodin recommends the death penalty by burning.

5.3 Naturalism

In the last years of his life Bodin dedicated himself ambitiously to his work, with which he hoped to penetrate the secrets of the universe. His Theater of Universal Nature (Theatrum) is a treatment of the science of nature, or natural philosophy. According to the title, the work addresses “in five books the efficient and final causes of all things of the world.” It is a well-organized encyclopedia of universal knowledge in the form of a dialogue between Theorus, a curious theoretician who observers the world and Mystagogus, a master and guide. The first book examines the principals of nature and the origin and decline of the world. The second book addresses the natural elements of meteors, of rocks, metals and fossils. The third books explores types of animals; the fourth addresses the spirit, and the fifth book concerns the number, movement, and grandeur of the heavens respectively. This is an example of those works of natural philosophy, which wished to be exhaustive, and were typical of the Renaissance. The accusations of naturalism and atheism, which his Colloquium of the Seven About the Secrets of the Sublime (Heptaplomeres) had provoked, were only reignited and expanded by the Theatrum, regardless of the fact that he repeatedly refers to an all-powerful creator who admires the “order” in all things.

6. Justice for Bodin: Open and Closed Questions

Biographies have attributed religious, political, and philosophical doctrines to Bodin that he may have held. These historians have even used the word “conversion”—a strong word in the sixteenth century—to make their point. Rose writes of Bodin’s “conversion to Judaism”; Moreau-Reibel and Rose of his “conversion to the League,” which according to Rose is an “act of apostasy” too. Bayle, Naef and Bouchez describe his “conversion to Protestantism,” and Franklin of his “conversion to absolutism.” Likewise Bayle and Quaglioni describe Bodin’s tendency towards religious dissimulation or nicodemism. Within the confines of a biography, we are limited to address only the most important aspects of Bodin’s character as a political actor including his adhesion to the League and his abandonment of the “politiques.” Concerning the first point, his adhesion to the League, we have examined the Bodin’s position based on his own writings. The second point, Bodin’s relationship to the “politiques,” is based on suppositions which have become nearly a tradition in Bodin scholarship, and has been perpetuated and reinforced by generation after generation of historians. Unfortunately these historians have not sought sources on which to base this claim. In fact, there are no sources that support this argument. Indeed, Bodin never said that he was a “politique.” Briefly addressing the heart of the matter, historians have sought to make Bodin a convinced partisan of religious tolerance. During Bodin’s lifetime however, religious tolerance, defined as civil tolerance and a legal admission of confessional diversity within a country or city, was not the ideal it would later become after the eighteenth century. In the sixteenth century, it was men like Sébastian Castellion who extolled the co-existence of many religions, with which the reformed camp disagreed. The struggle of the Huguenots from the beginning of the civil wars, was to convert the king and realm to the true religion. Tolerance was not an ideal since one cannot tolerate what one cannot possibly accept. For example how could one allow Christ to coexist with Belial, or a false religion to coexist with the one and only true religion? No further proof of this conviction is needed than the fierce struggle both Calvin and Beza waged against Castellion. This example causes one to ask the question: if Castellion supported freedom of religion, why did the leaders of the Reformation, who professed the same desire, denounce him so fervently? Because, in the reality, the French Reformers did not want freedom of religion which could have “opened the door to all manner of sects and heresies,” as Calvin said. At the beginning of the wars of religion, they wanted to obtain the recognition of the reformed religion as the sole religion in the realm. Yet, after thirty-six years of war, and after the conversion of Henry of Navarre, they understood that their project was too ambitious and had to be limited. Only through true religious tolerance could they convert the remainder of the kingdom at a later time. The unity of faith, and Calvinist religious concord were the ideal of Reformers too. Concerning the “politiques,” we only have descriptions of them from their adversaries who considered them atheists and heathens. For instance they were accused of having no religion because they were inclined to admit the definitive coexistence of different forms of worship in the interest of civil peace. Nevertheless, why have modern historians, placed men, who they considered the “most liberal and sympathetic,” such as Bodin, Etienne Pasquier, Duplessis-Mornay, Pierre de Beloy and many others in the party of the “politiques.” These historians have projected their modern ideals of tolerance, religious freedom, pluralism, and diversity on to the period of the Wars of Religion. Thus these scholars believed they had done a great service to the men of the past by presenting them as forerunners of the later values. But, as we have seen, Bodin viewed confessional concord as the means capable of returning religious, civil and political unity to the kingdom. It should be recalled however that the problem was not that of “liberty of conscience,” which the French government had already guaranteed by edicts in 1563, but the liberty to worship. The freedom to worship is also at the heart of the question of tolerance. When Bodin and many of his contemporaries thought about tolerance, it was only as provisional tolerance with the hope of achieving civil peace and religious reunification in the future. For Bodin, concord was essential since it formed the foundation of sovereignty and was necessary for the full exercise of power.

To be fair to Bodin, the offenses poured out against him by his malicious contemporaries at the time of his adhesion to the League should be analyzed and understood historically. The same goes for the accusations of treason, turn-coating, trickery, opportunism, “the charge of his reversal of his belief on religious tolerance,” “his slipperiness and lack of principle in joining the League,” all of which we find today in his biographies. Bodin’s program of concord and unity was in opposition to permanent tolerance and established diversity in juridical, political, and theological questions, as we already seen.

6.1 Particular Questions

(1) A Judaising Catholic. Did Bodin’s passion for studying Judaic texts arise principally from the influence of his Jewish mother? The trail is a false one since his mother was not Jewish. (2) Another false trail concerns how he had miraculously escaped the St. Bartholomew massacre in Paris by seeking refuge with Christophle de Thou, the president of the Parlement of Paris — the story being “late and unverifiable”according to Jacquelin Boucher (1983). Paul Collinet, who maintained initially that Bodin was not in Paris but in the county of Rethelois at the time (Collinet 1908, 752), later revised his ideas: he had confused J. Bodin de Saint-Amand (our J. Bodin) with another, J. B. de Montguichet (Collinet 1910). This was in accordance with the study of Paul Cornu (Cornu 1907) about “two J. Bodins”. Nevertheless, Cornu himself cannot say where our Bodin was at that time.[15] In fact, we know nothing for certain about Bodin on the famous night of August 24, 1572, nor is it not a matter of central historical importance. (3) Belief in Witchcraft. Bodin, like the majority of people in the sixteenth century, believed in the devil and the power of Satan. These beliefs made his biographers, especially those of the nineteenth century, uneasy. They felt that such superstitions tarnished Bodin’s image. Baudrillart criticized Bodin’s work Demonomanie and wrote that “Absurd fanaticism, ridiculous and obnoxious should be written in the margins of each page of this unfortunate book” (Baudrillart 1853, 184, 188–189). Such vain preoccupations and a lack historical sense are two faults, among others, that distort the historical analysis of Bodin by those who wish to make him a man of their time rather than allowing him to be a man of his day.

6.2 Open Questions

Some recent studies of the Heptaplomeres have tended to cast some doubt on Bodin’s authorship of this work. Even if the issue of his authorship has not been decisively resolved, one of the secondary but beneficial consequences of these studies is that they have increased our understanding of the on sources which the author of this anonymous text drew — including not only the Daemonomania as well as the other works by Bodin, but also the writings of Johan Wier (1515–1588; Wier 1579). The most important studies questioninig Bodin’s authorship of the treatise are those by Karl F. Faltenbacher (2002, 2009) and David Wootton (2002), Jean Céard (2009) and Isabelle Pantin (2009). Refutations of this thesis, on the other hand, have been published by Jean Letrouit (1995), Andrea Suggi (2005, 2006, 2007) and Noel Malcom (2006).

6.3 Closed questions

Sometimes historical research progresses by leaps and bounds instead of a gradual and steady evolution. Thanks to new research (Fontana 2009) we are now in a position to settle on certain issues in Bodin’s life that have remained matters of conjecture until quite recently, such as his supposed visit to Geneva in 1552 (on which, see below). Biographers have been faced with a series of problems because, throughout his life, he was regularly confused with other individuals also called Jean Bodin, not least within his own family: he was the fourth of seven children, the second of whome was also called Jean (Levron 1950, 14). For this reason, he has often been assigned roles by historians which he may not have played. He has been conflated, for instance, with a certain Jean Bodin arrested in two trials for heresy in Paris, one in 1547 and the other in 1548 (Weiss 1889, 17–8; Naef; Droz; but see Levron 1948). He has also been confused with Jean Bodin de La Bodinière or Montguichet who, like our Jean Bodin, was an Angevin and a commissioner for the reformation of forests in Normandy, as well as a member of the household of the duke d’Alençon (cf. Chauviré, 33–4; Cornu 1907, 109–111 ; Holt 1986, 41). Among the avocats of the Parlement of Paris who swore an oath to uphold Catholism in 1562, there were two Jean Bodins, one of whom was ours (Delachenal 1885, 405–6). Someone called Jean Bodin was arrested at the priory of Saint-Denis-de-la-Chatre, rue Saint-Barthélemy in Paris on March 6, 1569, accused of being of the new opinion’. He was released on August 23, 1570 following the edict of pacification of Saint-Germain (Weiss 1923, 87-9; Droz 1948, 79; Boucher 1983). But this cannot be our Jean Bodin (De Caprariis 1959, 325). None of the various Jean Bodins of whom we have knowledge around 1569 — the student at Angers, the priest at Bourgueil in the parish of Saint-Aubin du Pavoil near Segré, or the merchant at St-Maurice — correspond to the Jean Bodin in whom we are interested (Levron 1948, 73–4). Nor ashould we identify Jean Bodin the philosopher with his various namesakes (Couzinet 1996, 240) who were implicated in the trial of La Môle and Coconnas in 1574 (Holt 1986, 41) or accompanied Brisson on a mission in 1581 (Moreau-Reibel 1933, 258), or got mixed up in the Champvallon affair of the following year (Radouant 1970, 45) or were suspected of having participated in the Babington Plot against Elizabeth I of England (Rose 1980, 215–6).

Equally, there is no tangible or demonstrable proof to support the supposed Protestant leanings of Bodin. Roger Chauviré (1914, 24) speculated, on the basis of his hypothetical stay in Geneva in 1552, that he had perhaps converted to the new faith. This particular supposition is linked to another, more general one, that Bodin had a truly reformed religiosity, coexisting with his other judaising tendencies and inclinations towards natural religion. This is why there is a persistent tendency among certain historians to perceive him as a dissimulating Protestant and ‘Nicodemite’. Following Naef and Droz, they believe that Bodin can be identified with ‘Jehan Bodin de Sainct-Amand diocese de Bourges’ (following Bordier, who, however, provides no references to Jean Bodin, author of the Republic) who spent time in Geneva in 1552, asking to be received as inhabitant there, who married Typhène Renault and had an argument with Jérôme Bolsec (Naef and Droz, 83) and who even became a minister of the Holy Word (Weiss, contradicted by Naef, 153; but see Droz, 83). All these hypotheses, however, have been undermined now that Letizia Fontana (2009) has demonstrated that the Jean Bodin who was present in Geneva in 1552 cannot possibly have been the philosopher. That said, it still remains possible that Bodin occasionally felt sympathy, on the religious grounds, towards Protestantism and Protestants in general, though this stopped short of adherence to the confession of the Reformed faith. Such an attitude could often be found among moderate Catholics, men of letters, jurists, writers and even theologians and was not in conflict with Bodin’s severely negative assessment — on a purely political level — of the Huguenots as a result of their raising arms against their sovereign.

7. Publications, Conferences and Projects, 2013–2018

In 2013 two important Bodin editions appeared. Sara Miglietti published her doctoral dissertation (Scuola Normale Superiore, Pisa): Jean Bodin, Methodus ad facilem historiarum congnitione, edizione, introduzione e commento di S. Miglietti, Pisa: Edizioni della Normale, with an accompanying Italian translation. In addition, Mario Turchetti published a critical edition of the first book of the French text of La République with a parallel Latin edition of De Republica, translated by Bodin and published in 1586 (see Cotroneo 2014 ‘Il ritorno di Bodin’); N. de Araujo is responsible for the text, and the preface is by Q. Skinner. This volume, the first of a projected six volume edition, is now available online from Classiques Garnier.

Its publication was the occasion for an international conference at the University of Fribourg (4–5 October 2013); and another is planned for 5 March 2015, organized by the Universities of Paris-IV Sorbonne (Denis Crouzet) and Paris-VI Descartes (Yves Charles Zarka).

An international conference was held in Oxford in June 2014 (St Anne’s College): ‘Community, Government and Territoriality in the Political Thought of Jean Bodin’, organised by Sophie Nicholls and Anne Becker.

The Reception of Bodin, edited by Howell A. Lloyd, was published in Leiden by Brill in 2013. The volume presents the sixteenth-century jurist as a “prismatic agent” through whose works a vast inherited juridical, philosophical, religious, political and anthropological fabric of learning of the West was disseminated in a revitalised form into world ripe for modernity.

At Tufts University (Boston, USA), a ‘Bodin Project’ has now been launched by Ioannis Evrigenis, the aim of which is to make available online the French, Latin and English (Six Bookes of a Commonweale in Richard Knolly’s 1606 translation) texts of Bodin’s Republic. The digitized editions produced by the ‘Bodin Project’ will, in due course, become part of the vast range of works consultable online from the (Perseus Digital Library).

Another Bodin Project was originally based at the University of Hull and is now based at Harvard.

The ‘Bodin Sources Project’, directed by Professor Kenneth D. McRae, aims to list the sources mentioned in five of Bodin’s major works – Methodus, République, Démonomanie, Theatrum and the commentary on Oppian – in machine-readable form. For further information, contact: K. D. McRae, Department of Political Science, Carleton University, 1125 Colonel by Drive, Ottawa ON K1S 5B6 Canada.

The hectic pace of Bodin studies has not let up in recent years; for brevity’s sake, however, only the most important contributions will be singled out here. Anna Di Bello (2014) traces in detail the way in which the Latin translation of La République was made, providing a new understanding of Bodin’s elaboration of his masterpiece. The parallels between the French and Latin versions, the collation of the two texts, and the comparisons between them provide the opportunity to evaluate Bodin’s preoccupations at two distinct moments in time. Those preoccupations include his conceptions of the State and the optimal structure for the realization of a polity which, beyond the good ordering and right administration of society, ensures the exercise of a sovereignty that preserves ‘harmonic justice’ in a royal monarchy such as France. Daniel Lee (2016) explores the Roman Law sources that underlie the emergence, and rise to prominence, of the theory of popular sovereignty in the early modern period. In two chapters, he seeks to undermine the traditional idea that Bodin is an ‘absolutist’ and tries to present him in a more authentic light. Howell A. Lloyd (2017) reconstructs the intellectual biography of Bodin in a novel way. Finally, Turchetti (2018) examines the distinction between despotism and tyranny, which was essential to Bodin as the juridico-political foundation of the right of resistance, but which was progressively forgotten in later centuries.

Despite this welcome resurgence of interest in Bodin, a remaining deisderatum is a new English translation of Bodin’s Republic, one which meets the needs of twenty-first-century researchers.


Works by Bodin Cited in the Text

[Oppiani] Oppiani De venatione, Libri IIII, J. Bodino Andegavensi interprete, Paris, apud Michaëlem Vascosanum, 1555.
[Oratio] Oratio de instituenda in republica juventute ad senatum populumque Tolosatem, Toulosae, ex officina Petri Putei, 1559. Latin text and French trans. in [Me] 30; English trans. in [Mo].
[Methodus] Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem, Parisiis, apud Martinum Juvenem, 1566. Text and French trans. in [Me] 104–269; English translation in [Re]. Italian translation by Sara Miglietti, Pisa, Edizioni della Normale, 2013.
[Response] Les Paradoxes de Monsieur de Malestroit, conseiller du Roy et maistre ordinaire de ses comptes, sur le faict des monnoyes, presentez à sa Majesté, au moi de mars 1566, avec la response de M. Jean Bodin ausdicts Paradoxes, Paris, Martin Le Jeune, 1568. English translation in [T].
[Lettre Bautru] Lettre à Jean Bautru de Matras, 1568. Latin text in [Ro] 79–81.
[La Harangue] La Harangue de Messire Charles de Cars evesque et duc de Langres prononcée aux magnifiques ambassadeurs de Poulogne estans à Metz le 8e jour d’aoust 1573 tournée de François en Latin par J. Bodin Av. cat., Paris, 1573.
[Conseil] Consilia Johannis Bodini Galli et Fausti Longiani Itali, De Principe recte institutendo. Cum praeceptis cuiusdam principis politicis, quae bene instituto in imperio observanda. Ex Gallica, Italica et Castellana lingua latine reddita a Johanne Bornitio Erphordiae, Excusa per Iohannem Pistorium, Anno 1603. Consilium Johannis Bodini de institutione principis aut alius nobilioris ingenii (Erfurt, 1603), in [Ro] 11–16 (Latin text without translation).
[République] Les Six Livres de la République, Paris, Du Puys, 1576. French editions in 1576, 1577, 1578, 1579, 1580, 1582, 1583, 1587, 1591, 1593, 1594, 1599, 1608, 1610, 1629, 1961, 1986, 2013. Latin editions in 1586, 1591, 1594, 1601, 1609, 1619, 1622, 1641, 2013. Italian editions in 1588 and 1964–1997. Spanish edition in 1590. German editions in 1592, 1611 and 1986. English edition in 1606. Bilingual edition, French with Latin, in 2013. (See the subsection below on Editions of the Commonwealth.) The seminal English translation in [Kn] is reproduced in [Mc].
[Recueil] Recueil de tout ce qui s’est négocié en la compagnie du Tiers État de France, en l’Assemblée généale des trois estats, assignés par le Roy en la ville de Bloys au 15 nov. 1576, place of publication unknown, 1577
[Exposition] Juris universi distributio, Paris, J. Du Puys, 1578. Text and French trans. in [J]; English trans. of extracts in A.L. Fell, Bodin’s Humanistic Legal System and Rejection of Medieval Political Theology, Boston: Mass., Oelgeschlager, Gunn and Hain, 1987.
[1579] Artis historicae penus octodecim scriptorium tam veterum quam recentiorum monumentis et inter eos Jo. praecipue Bodini libris Methodi historiae sex instructa, Basileae, P. Pernae officina, 1579.
[Apologie] Apologie de René Herpin pour la République de Jean Bodin, Paris, Jacques du Puys, 1581. (Herpin is an angevingian name which Bodin used for this work.)
[Démonomanie] De la démonomanie des sorciers, Paris, Jacques Du Puys, 1581; De magorum daemonomania, Libri VI, Hildesheim. Olms, 2003. English translation in [S].
[Épître] Epistre de J. Bodin touchant l’institution de ses enfants à son neveu, Bibliothèque Nationale MS Latin 6564, fols. 483–485, 1585. Published in [Ro] 3–4.
[Lettre Bodin] Lettre de Monsieur Bodin où il traite des occasions qui l’ont fait rendre ligueur, January 20, 1590. Text in [Ro] 87–93. Some letters of Bodin are published in various collections; see the appendix of Chauviré 1914 and Moreau-Reibel 1935.
[Heptaplomeres] Colloquium Heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis, ed. L. Noack, Schwerin, 1857 (first ed. Kiel, 1683). English translation in [Ku].
[Theatrum] Universae naturae theatrum, in quo rerum omnium effectrices causae et fines quinque libris discutiuntur, Lugduni, apud Jacobum Roussin, 1596. English trans. of extracts in A. L. Fell, Bodin’s Humanistic Legal System and Rejection of Medieval Political Theology, Boston, (Mass.), Oelgeschlager, Gunn and Hain, 1987.
[Paradoxon] Io. Bodini Paradoxon, quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate, nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit, Ad Bernardum Potierum Ludovici F., Parisiis, Excudebat Dionysius Duvallius, 1596; Latin Text and Italian Translation in bilingual Edition by Andrea Suggi, Paradosso sulla virtù, Milano: Nino Aragno, 2009.

Translations and Critical Editions Cited

[J] Jerphagnon, Lucien, text and French trans., Juris universi distributio, commentary by Simone Goyard-Fabre, notes by René-Marie Rampelberg, Paris, P.U. France, 1985.
[Kn] Knolles, R., trans., The Six Bookes of a Commonweale, Written by I. Bodin a famous Lawyer, and a man of great Experience in matter of State, based on French and Latin editions, London: Impensis G. Bishop, 1606.
[Ku] Kuntz, M., trans., Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1975.
[Me] Mesnard, Pierre, ed.,Œuvres philosophiques de Jean Bodin, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1951. (Collection “Corpus géneral des philosophes français. Auteurs modernes”, t. 5, 3); contains Latin texts and Mesnard’s French trans. of “Le discours au Sénat et au peuple de Toulouse”;“Tableau du droit universel”; “La méthode de l’histoire”.
[Mc] McRae, K.D., ed., The six books of a commonweale: a facsimile reprint of the English translation of 1606, corrected and supplemented in the light of a new comparison with the French and Latin texts, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1962.
[Mo] More, G.A., trans., Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth, Chevy Chase, 1965.
[Re] Reynolds, B., trans., Method for the easy comprehension of History, New York: Columbia University Press, 1945.
[Ro] Rose, Paul Laurence, ed., Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Politics, Genève: Droz, 1980. Contains “Épitre à son neveau” 1586; “Consilium de institutione principis” 1603; “Sapientiae moralis epitome” 1586; “Paradoxon” 1596; “Le Paradoxe de J. Bodin” 1598; “Lettre à Jean Bautru de Matras” 1568–69?; “Lettre de M. Bodin” 1590.
[S] Scott, R.A., trans., On the Demon-Mania of Witches, Toronto: Victoria University Press, 1995.
[T] Tudor, H., trans., Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit, Thoemmes Press, 1997.
[To] Tooley, M.J., trans., Six Books of the Commonwealth, Oxford: Blackwell, 1955. [Available online].


Editions of the Commonwealth

The first volume of a planned six-volume critical edition of Six Livres de la République, with the French text and facing Latin translation by Bodin (Paris: Classiques Garnier, 2013) and is available online (see section 7 above). For the complete French text, based on the 1593 edition, see Les six livres de la République, edited by Christiane Frémont, Marie-Dominique Couzinet, Henri Rochais, 6 vols, Paris: Fayard, 1976. A facsimile edition of the 1583 text was published in 1971 by Scientia Verlag.

For translations, see: (English) The Six Books of a Commonwealth, edited by K. D. MacRae, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1962, as well as the extracts in A. L. Fell, Bodin’s Humanistic Legal System and Rejection of Medieval Political Theology, Boston: Oelgeschlager, Gunn and Hain, 1987, and On Sovereignty. Four Chapters from The Six Books of the Commonwealth, trans. by J. H. Franklin, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1992, and the abridged translation, Six Books of the Commonwealth, edited by M. J. Tooley (cited above as [To]), which is available online; (Spanish) Los seis libros de la República 1, ed. José Luis Bermejo Cabrero, 2 vols, Madrid: Centro de Estudios Constitucionales, 1992; (German), Sechs Bücher über den Staat, edited by P.C. Mayer-Tasch, transl. B. Wimmer, München: Beck, 1981; and (Italian) I sei libri dello Stato, a cura di Margherita Isnardi Parente e Diego Quaglioni, 3 vols, Torino: Unione tipografico-editrice, 1964–1997.

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Other Internet Resources


The editors would like to thank James Blakeley for his efforts in translating this piece from French to English. He continued to provide help with the final version long after he was required to do so. The editors would also like to thank Jill Kraye for her editorial work on this entry. Mark Greengrass assisted in translating the revisions to the text in 2010, 2014, and 2018.

Copyright © 2018 by
Mario Turchetti

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