Bernard Bosanquet (1848–1923), British philosopher, political theorist and social reformer, was one of the principal exponents (with F.H. Bradley) of late nineteenth and early twentieth century ‘Absolute Idealism.’
- 1. Life
- 2. General Background
- 3. Principal Contributions
- 4. General Assessment
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Bernard Bosanquet was born on July 14, 1848 in Rock Hall (near Alnwick), Northumberland, England. He was the youngest of five sons of the Reverend Robert William Bosanquet by the latter’s second wife, Caroline (MacDowall). Bernard’s eldest brother, Charles, was one of the founders of the Charity Organization Society and its first Secretary. Another brother, Day, was an Admiral in the Royal Navy and served as Governor of South Australia. Yet another, Holford, was elected to the Royal Society and was a fellow of St John’s College, Oxford.
Bosanquet studied at Harrow (1862–1867) and at Balliol College, Oxford (1867–1870), where he came under the influence of German idealist philosophy, principally through his teacher T.H. Green and the work of Benjamin Jowett. (Green reputedly described Bosanquet as “the best equipped man of his generation” [Muirhead 1935, p. 21; McBriar 1987, p. 3].) Bosanquet received first class honors in classical moderations (1868) and literae humaniores (1870) and, upon graduation, was elected to a Fellowship of University College, Oxford, over F.H. Bradley. While at University College, Bosanquet taught the history of logic and the history of moral philosophy; his only published work during this time was a translation of G.F. Schoemann’s Athenian Constitutional History.
Upon the death of his father in 1880 and the receipt of a small inheritance in 1881, Bosanquet left Oxford for London, where he became active in adult education and social work through such organizations as the London Ethical Society (founded 1886), the Charity Organisation Society, and the short-lived London School of Ethics and Social Philosophy (1897–1900). During this time he met and married (in 1895) Helen Dendy, an activist in social work and social reform, who was to be a leading figure in the Royal Commission on the Poor Laws (1905–1909).
While in London, Bosanquet was also able to engage in philosophical work, and many of his major publications date from this time. Some of them—such as The Philosophical Theory of the State and Psychology of the Moral Self—were developed from lectures that he gave to adult education groups. He was an early member of the Aristotelian Society, and served as its Vice President (1888) and President (1894–1898).
In 1903, at the age of 55, Bosanquet briefly returned to university life, as Professor of Moral Philosophy at the University of St Andrews in Scotland. His health, however, was not good and soon he wished to devote more time to philosophical writing. He retired in 1908 to Oxshott, Surrey, where he nevertheless remained active in social work and philosophical circles. In 1910, Bosanquet was appointed Gifford Lecturer in the University of Edinburgh for 1911 and 1912. The text of these lectures—The Principle of Individuality and Value and The Value and Destiny of the Individual—serve as the most developed statement of his metaphysical views. Understanding Bosanquet’s metaphysics, however, requires recognizing that it reflects his earlier work in logic, ethics, social work, and political philosophy.
The publication of the Gifford lectures incited a good deal of critical reaction to Bosanquet’s views, particularly in metaphysics (e.g., on the idealism/materialism controversy and on the nature of finite individuality), logic (e.g., concerning the status of propositions and the nature of inference), and ethics. Despite his vigorous participation in such exchanges, present throughout Bosanquet’s work is his desire to find common ground among philosophers of various traditions and to show relationships among different schools of thought, rather than to dwell on what separates them.
In spite of the challenges to idealism from both within and outside of the academic world, discussion of Bosanquet’s work continued through the early decades of the 20th century. He died in his 75th year in London on February 8, 1923.
At the time of his death, Bosanquet was arguably “the most popular and influential of the English idealists” (Randall 1966, p. 488). He was the author or editor of more than 20 books and some 150 articles. The breadth of his philosophical interests is obvious from the range of topics treated in his books and essays—logic, aesthetics, epistemology, social and public policy, psychology, metaphysics, ethics and political philosophy. For his contributions to philosophy and to social work, he had been made a Fellow of the British Academy in 1907, and had received honorary degrees from Glasgow (1892), Durham (1903), Birmingham (1909), and St Andrews (1911).
Bosanquet was one of the earliest philosophers in the Anglo-American world to appreciate the work of Edmund Husserl, Benedetto Croce, Giovanni Gentile and Emile Durkheim, and the relation of his thought to that of Ludwig Wittgenstein, G.E. Moore, and Bertrand Russell is significant, though still largely unexplored. Although F.H. Bradley is today far better known in philosophical circles, in his obituary in the Times, Bosanquet was said to have been “the central figure of British philosophy for an entire generation.”
Bosanquet’s philosophical views were in many ways a reaction to 19th century Anglo-American empiricism and materialism (e.g., that of Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and Alexander Bain), but also to that of contemporary personalistic idealism (e.g., that of Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, James Ward, Hastings Rashdall, W.R. Sorley, and J.M.E. McTaggart) and organicism (e.g., Herbert Spencer). Bosanquet held that the inspiration of many of his ideas could be found in Hegel, Kant, and Rousseau and, ultimately, in classical Greek thought. Indeed, while at the beginning of his philosophical career Bosanquet described Kant and Hegel as “the great masters who ‘sketched the plan’” (Muirhead 1935, p. 21; see Bosanquet, Knowledge and Reality, p. vii), he said that the most important influence on him was that of Plato. The result was a brand of idealist philosophical thought that combined the Anglo-Saxon penchant for empirical study with a vocabulary and conceptual apparatus borrowed from the continent. Bosanquet is generally considered to be one of the most Hegelian of the British Idealists, though the extent to which the term ‘Hegelian’ is appropriate or illuminating in describing his work has been a matter of some debate (Sweet 1995).
More directly, Bosanquet’s thought shows a number of similarities to that of T.H. Green, his teacher, and to Bradley, his contemporary. Bosanquet himself acknowledges that these similarities are far from coincidental. He frequently admits his debt to Green’s works and, as late as 1920, he wrote that
since the appearance of Ethical Studies… I have recognized [Bradley] as my master; and there is never, I think, any more than a verbal difference or difference of emphasis, between us.(Letter to Lello Vivante, 27 March 1920, cited in Muirhead 1935, p. 262)
There is, however, at least some hyperbole in such comments. Bosanquet did not follow either Green or Bradley blindly (see Sweet 1996), and there are important differences in his work. While he defended Green’s ethical theory and many of Green’s conclusions, he addressed a number of issues never dealt with in Green’s corpus. Moreover, while it is clear that Bosanquet considered Bradley’s work in metaphysics and ethics to have been momentous, this admiration was no doubt influenced by the fact that Bradley’s philosophy and method reflected interests and an approach that Bosanquet had arrived at quite independently.
Bosanquet’s earliest philosophical writing was in logic; his interest in the area continued throughout his career, and it was initially considered to be the area in which he made his most significant contributions to philosophy.
The first published statement of Bosanquet’s views on logic appears in his 1883 essay, “Logic as the Science of Knowledge.” Here, one finds an explicit debt to Hegel and to Lotze (whose System of Philosophy he was encouraged by T.H. Green to translate and edit). Developed expositions of Bosanquet’s logic appear in his Knowledge and Reality: A Criticism of Mr F.H. Bradley’s ‘Principles of Logic’ (1885) and in Logic, or the Morphology of Knowledge (1888). (The main themes of this latter work were recast in a short volume, The Essentials of Logic .) Bosanquet produced a second edition of his Logic in 1911, adding a number of notes and three chapters dealing specifically with pragmatist and realist criticisms of idealist coherence theory. During the last decade of his life he engaged in a number of exchanges on questions in logic, culminating in the publication of Implication and Linear Inference (1920), which C.D. Broad described as containing “the clearest and most plausible account” of Bosanquet’s views (Broad 1920, p. 323).
For Bosanquet, logic is central to philosophy, but it is ‘logic’ in a broad sense. He writes:
By Logic we understand, with Plato and Hegel, the supreme law or nature of experience, the impulse towards unity and coherence […] by which every fragment yearns towards the whole to which it belongs… (Principle of Individuality and Value, p. 340).
The “inherent nature of reason,” Bosanquet adds, is “the absolute demand for totality and consistency” (Value and Destiny of the Individual, p. 9). Moreover, logic— which Bosanquet calls “the spirit of totality”—is “the clue to reality, value and freedom” (Principle of Individuality and Value, p. 23). Not surprisingly, then, Bosanquet argues that metaphysics—“the general science of reality”—cannot be distinguished from logic—the science of knowledge—any more than one can separate a result from the process which produces it.
Despite the connection between logic and knowledge, however, Bosanquet denied that he was doing epistemology—in the sense of a theory of cognition in which truth and reality are treated as independent of one another.
In general, there are three key elements to Bosanquet’s logic.
First, logic is concerned with
the properties which are possessed by objects or ideas in so far as they are members of the world of knowledge. (Essentials of Logic, p. 44)
Everything that can be studied must be “asserted” in consciousness and, thus, is ultimately the concern of logic.
Second, Bosanquet writes that reality is
composed of contents determined by systematic combination in a single coherent structure. (Logic, p. 5)
To have a complete description of some thing, then, it must be understood in its context and in its relations to other things. Similarly, to say that a judgement is ‘true’, we must take the system in which the judgement is bound up and then note
how unintelligible that part of our world… would become if we denied that judgement. (“Logic as the Science of Knowledge”, Works, vol. 1, p. 302)
Bosanquet’s view is best described, then, as a coherence theory—though it is one that is concerned with more than the formal consistency of the set of true propositions.
Third, according to Bosanquet,
the true meaning of propositions lies always ahead of fully conscious usage, as the real reality lies ahead of actual experience (Logic, 2nd ed., p. x).
Our understanding of the world, then, is always incomplete. Nevertheless,
experience forces thought along certain lines from partial to more complete notions. (“Logic as the Science of Knowledge”, Works, vol. 1, p. 311)
Coherence, therefore, is attained by a dialectical, evolutionary process. But this does not mean that humanity will some day arrive at ultimate truth.
Bosanquet’s logic has been the subject of significant discussion; the focus of this was, and still is, is the nature of inference and the theory of induction.
In Implication and Linear Inference, for example, Bosanquet defends his long-standing view that inference is “every process by which knowledge extends itself” (op. cit., p. 2). It is made possible by implication—i.e., the property of each system whereby one can go from one part to all other parts. Standard formal logic (e.g., linear inference or syllogistic) is only a limited form of inference for, as Bosanquet reminded his readers, logical principles are not part of some abstract real but are the expression of the movement and life of the mind.
Bosanquet considered induction as importantly related to deduction; in this respect, his views are similar to those of Christoph Sigwart and W.S. Jevons. To see specifically how induction and deduction are related, one must start with Bosanquet’s distinction between the verification of a hypothesis and its establishment. In induction, a hypothesis is “verified by the agreement of its deduced conclusion with observed facts”; it is established only “in proportion as we are convinced that the verified results could not be deduced from any other principle” (“Logic as the Science of Knowledge”, Works, vol. 1, p. 329). But then Bosanquet adds that “every verified result is pro tanto a confirmation of any principles from which it is deducible” (ibid.). Inference, then, is neither deductive (i.e., from general principles) nor inductive (e.g., from instances or sense data), but “systematic”—it proceeds from within a whole or a system. Thus, knowledge does not exist as a set of isolated formal propositions; all that we know is within a system.
Bosanquet’s view of inference and of induction had significant consequences, not only for the then-contemporary understanding of logic—by challenging the view that deductive inference is “useless” (because those who know the premises already know the content of the conclusion)—but also for the ‘new’ logic of Frege, as developed by Russell and Whitehead, where judgement was separated from inference and ‘linear implication’ was the norm. It is perhaps for this reason that Bosanquet’s arguments incited not only a wide-ranging critical response—particularly from the ‘neo-realists’ at Cambridge and in the United States—but also the tantalizing remark by Wittgenstein to Moore in 1914 (cited in McGuinness 1988: 199–200) that some of Wittgenstein’s (unsuccessful) Cambridge B.A. dissertation was “cribbed” from Bosanquet’s logic.
Although Bosanquet’s logic follows, in many respects, that of Hegel, it arguably avoids Bertrand Russell’s criticism of Hegel’s logic—i.e., that it unconsciously assumes and incorporates the faults of traditional logic. Indeed, Bosanquet’s defense of elements of classical deductive logic against J.S. Mill’s criticisms “made philosophy safe for logic” and was, in large part, responsible for “rehabilitating” logic in British philosophy, particularly after the critiques of Locke and his successors (see Allard 2007). It has also been argued (by Fred Wilson 2007) that Bosanquet’s views on logic and scientific method are close to those of some contemporary critics of empirical accounts of natural laws, such as Fred Dretske and David Armstrong.
Bosanquet’s publications on metaphysics date from the late 1880s, but it was not until the early 1910s, when he was in his 60s, that he published his comprehensive statement on the topic—his Gifford lectures, The Principle of Individuality and Value and The Value and Destiny of the Individual. It is important to realise that it was only after he had developed his views in ethics, social work, philosophical psychology, and political philosophy, that his metaphysics took its final form.
Bosanquet’s first essays on metaphysics—“Is Mind Synonymous with Consciousness?” and “What Takes Place in Voluntary Action?”—focused on the nature of mind, and in 1893–94 he offered a course of lectures that became the basis of his book, Psychology of the Moral Self (1897). Opposed to the crude associationist and the ‘push and pull’ psychology of empiricists (such as David Hume, J.S. Mill, and Alexander Bain) who held that thought consists of disconnected, discrete data of the senses, and the ‘psychological habits’ that arise out of the contiguous relations of these data, Bosanquet argued that one cannot separate the human individual from everything makes up its world. It does not follow, however, that reality is not autonomous of individual consciousness. Bosanquet writes that “everything is real so long as you do not take it for more than it is” (Principle of Individuality and Value, p. 240, see Logic, Vol. 1, p. 273) (see Hamilton Grant 2015).
A key interest of Bosanquet was the articulation of a theory of mind and will. In Psychology of the Moral Self, in a lecture on “The Organisation of Intelligence”, Bosanquet argues that “[t]he psychical elements of the mind are so grouped and interconnected as to constitute what are technically known as Appercipient masses or systems” (op. cit., p. 42). The mind or self, then, is a multiplicity of such systems. Bosanquet describes the mind, then, as “a growth of material, more like a process of crystallization, the material moulding itself according to its own affinities and cohesions” (op. cit., p. 9)—a view which, he says, is implicit in Plato and Aristotle.
In his Gifford lectures, Bosanquet moves beyond the discussion of mind in order to focus on a principle underlying much of his philosophical thought and rooted in his studies in logic—individuality.
In the first series of Gifford lectures, The Principle of Individuality and Value, Bosanquet holds that when we speak of ‘the real’ or ‘truth’, we have in mind a ‘whole’ (i.e., a system of connected members), and it is by seeing a thing in its relation to others that we can say not only that we have a better knowledge of that thing, but that it is, as Bosanquet writes, “more complete”, more true, and more real. Since this whole is self-contained and self-sufficient, Bosanquet calls it (following Aristotle) an ‘individual’. But because of its ‘independence’ and self explanatory character or necessity, it is also a universal. The ‘whole’ is, then, what Bosanquet calls a “concrete universal”. This “logical universal as a living world” he calls “individuality” or “the Absolute” (op. cit., p. xx), and the metaphysical position he adopts is often referred to ‘absolute idealism’.
According to Bosanquet, the “mainspring of movement and effort in [the finite] world” is “contradiction” (op. cit., p. xxviii). Nevertheless, as principles come into conflict, a process of harmonisation also occurs. Terms are readjusted or new distinctions are introduced, so that conflicting elements find a place in the result. This process or method of meeting and removing contradiction, characteristic of the growth of any thing, is what Bosanquet calls the argument a contingentia mundi, and it is through this process that we come to the Absolute.
Individuality is the principle of value. Since individuality is “logical self-completeness [and] freedom from incoherence” (op. cit., p. xxxi), Bosanquet holds that, in as far as things are completely organised and have parts which confirm and sustain one another, they have value; it is not a matter of whether they are, as in utilitarian accounts, desired.
In Bosanquet’s metaphysics, there is no rigid line between ‘nature’ or the physical, and ‘mind,’ and it makes no sense to talk of a ‘transcendent,’ as some kind of ‘supernatural’ world (see “The True Conception of Another World”; see also Mander 2017: 242). Bosanquet is clearly opposed to dualism; he sees the mind as “a perfection and cooperation of the adaptations and acquisitions stored in the body” (op. cit., p. xxv) and not a separate thing, independent of the body. Bosanquet’s anti-dualism does not, however, lead to panpsychism—the view that all nature has consciousness. (In this respect he appears to differ from F.H. Bradley.) Still, he argues that nature is complete only through human consciousness. Human consciousness serves, Bosanquet holds, as a “copula” between nature and the Absolute.
In the second series of Gifford lectures, The Value and Destiny of the Individual, Bosanquet focuses on how his theory of the Absolute bears on the nature and value of the finite (i.e., human) individual. He does so, first, by saying something of the evolution or development of the human person, as both a natural being and a being possessing a self-determining will; then, by looking at finite beings in relation to one another; and, finally, by showing how finite selfhood can have stability and security. Progress in the development of the human individual, Bosanquet suggests, is not serial nor should it be seen as approximation towards a defined telos. The destiny of the finite self is that it comes to recognise itself as an element of the Absolute; it is in relation to this, Bosanquet says, that one sees its value.
Some critics responded that Bosanquet’s arguments radically reduced or eliminated the value of the human person because, they claimed, the “perfection of human personality” that he advocated was not the development of a finite individual as a finite individual. This issue was the focus of an important exchange among Bosanquet, Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, G.F. Stout, and R.B. Haldane on “Do Individuals Possess a Substantive or Adjectival Mode of Being?” (Bosanquet et al. 1918). Here, Bosanquet asserts that individuals characterise the world “as permanent qualifications”—but, at the same time, he reiterates his view that finite selves are not “necessarily eternal or everlasting units” (op. cit., pp. 86–87). Still, one may say that while Bosanquet’s absolute idealism leads him to reject certain conceptions of the self, he does not reject its existence or its value. He simply denies that finite individuals are wholly independent centres or ultimate principles of value. Extensive scholarship by Mander (2005) and Sweet (1997a) suggest that Bosanquet’s case was stronger than Pringle-Pattison’s.
Although Bosanquet described his approach as ‘idealist’, he was aware that the term was broad and potentially misleading. In work published after the Gifford lectures, Bosanquet took pains to try to explain how his view was entirely unlike the subjective idealism challenged by G.E. Moore’s “The Refutation of Idealism” (1903) and, in “Realism and Metaphysic” (1917), Bosanquet suggested that his philosophy could be more accurately described as “speculative”.
Bosanquet pursued this issue of the character of his philosophy in The Distinction between Mind and its Objects (1913) and in the last book to be published during his lifetime, The Meeting of Extremes in Contemporary Philosophy (1921).
In The Distinction between Mind and its Objects—which dealt with common characteristics of American neo-realism and Italian neo-idealism (specifically, that of Benedetto Croce and Giovanni Gentile), and the relation of his own account to that of philosophical realism and the neo-realists—Bosanquet argued that the terms ‘idealism’ and ‘realism’ are both vague and misleading. There are, as he notes, different kinds of realism and different kinds of idealism as well. Moreover, the terms are not antithetical; in fact, Bosanquet saw some affinity between his position and that of the realist Samuel Alexander. Nevertheless, Bosanquet thoroughly rejected the views of such authors as R.B. Perry, W.P. Montague, and E.B. Holt. He argued that, while aiming at providing a comprehensive view of reality, this ‘new realism’ restricts the place of mind and cuts it off from physical reality. (For a recent mention, see Hamilton Grant, in Ferraris 2014: 10).
The very title of The Meeting of Extremes in Contemporary Philosophy (1921) reveals Bosanquet’s conviction that, despite the apparently radical differences separating them, there is a convergence both in aim and in result of the investigations of the different dominant philosophical schools —for example, on such matters as the reality of time, positive development in ethics, and human progress. Bosanquet notes that, although there is a clear disagreement among critical realists and absolutists concerning the nature of ‘the real’, as each seeks a complete account, it is led to positions that are characteristic of its ‘opponent’. Bosanquet’s own “speculative philosophy”—based, he maintains, on careful analysis of experience—complements both of the preceding approaches. Bosanquet argued that, with a more reasoned understanding of progress and a correct account of the nature of ‘individuality’ and the ‘unity’ of reality (where mind and its objects are seen together in a single context), the absurdities of the extremes of idealism and realism can be avoided, and the opposition between them can be overcome.
Bosanquet’s philosophical views on religion were in large part influenced by early nineteenth century biblical studies—initially, mediated through the writings of Green, Edward Caird, and Benjamin Jowett.
The work of David Strauss, Ferdinand Baur, and others, at the beginning of the nineteenth century, marked a turn in the scholarly approach to religion and scripture, towards what is now called ‘the scientific study of religion’. Religious experience, sacred texts, and religious practice were now to be seen as phenomena open to critical investigation and which could—and should—be examined independently of one’s religious commitment, and according to the principles of literary and historical analysis. Strauss and his followers challenged the tendency to equate religious dogmas and creeds with original religious experience, and they were particularly doubtful whether one could recover much knowledge of such experience from ‘events’ recorded in scripture.
By the mid-nineteenth century, this approach to the study of religion had established itself in Britain, particularly in Oxford. Figures such as Jowett and Caird, and others in the Church of England ‘Broad Church movement’ (such as Frederick Temple, Bishop J.W. Colenso, and Thomas Arnold) argued for a more analytical and rational approach to understanding religious belief—though they were frequently criticised for this by Church authorities.
The distinction of practice from dogma and experience from creeds was, however, also a feature of the evangelical movement within the Church of England. Bosanquet, like many of his fellow idealists, was raised in an Evangelical household; his later philosophical views, then, can be seen as an evolution, rather than an interruption or contradiction, of his early religious convictions.
Despite his conventional religious upbringing, Bosanquet was not an orthodox Christian. While he did claim that religion was not only central to one’s life, but was that which made life worth living, he held that, taken literally or at face value, many particular religious beliefs are either incoherent or false. Bosanquet notes that, in religion, “rationalism, curiosity, metaphor, and deduction from metaphor, operate by way of distortion” (What Religion Is, p. 68), and that, to help one read biblical texts, one must engage in a hermeneutical enterprise, and “learn to interpret” them—though, even here, he doubted whether “the sacred books of a Church” can ever be “understood in their actual meaning” (Essays and Addresses, p. 132). Moreover, some religious beliefs do not mean what many take them to mean. Bosanquet argues, for example, that, if we examine the idea of God—who is often described as an ‘infinite individual’—we will find that to attribute ‘infinity’ to a being would be inconsistent with “every predicate which we attach to personality”. Finally, Bosanquet held that religious belief in general is not about some supernatural being or transcendent realm, entering into our daily lives. It focuses, rather, on what takes place in the world. His analysis of religion and religious belief is, then, ‘immanentist’.
Bosanquet distinguished religious beliefs about particular persons or events from ‘religion’ (or, what was the same thing for him, ‘faith’ or ‘religious consciousness’). Still, he did not see himself as either an agnostic or atheist, or as reducing ‘religion’ to the ‘ethical’. While he states that there is much in Christianity that is no longer intelligible, he insists that religion—in the sense of religious consciousness—is needed for morality, and that an ethics cut off from religion is “without sap or life”. Similarly, Bosanquet’s opposition to seeing religion or religious belief as a faith in something supernatural does not mean that he denied the existence of the spiritual or held a reductionist view of reality. When it comes to human consciousness, he argued, the spiritual—the ‘inward’ transfiguration of the ‘outward’ aspects of life—is at least as much a part of what exists as the visible and material. This ‘infinite’ here is what Bosanquet called the ‘Absolute’.
Human beings are, Bosanquet noted, aware of something infinite that bears directly on their lives, and in his entry on Philosophy of Religion, for J.M. Baldwin’s Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology (1902), he writes that it is this awareness, and one’s commitment to
that set of objects, habits, and convictions, whatever it might prove to be, which [one] would rather die for than abandon, or at least would feel himself excommunicated from humanity if he did abandon
that constitutes what religion is (Collected Works, vol. 1, p. 33). (While some idealists, such as Pringle-Pattison, seem to have held that such an Absolute is God, Bosanquet did not—though neither does he explicitly reject the existence of God.) Still, religious belief is neither the same as, nor tied essentially to, rituals and practices. Neither does it require adherence or assent to a set of propositions or dogmas—and certainly not to a set of propositions focusing on beings or events in the history of a community of believers. Religious belief is, in short, quite distinct from theism. In this, Bosanquet brings to completion views characteristic of many of the nineteenth-century British idealist philosophers (see Sweet 2014).
While one finds religious belief and religious consciousness throughout history and throughout the world, Bosanquet rejects the view that all religions are on a par. Religious consciousness has evolved, and higher forms of religion—i.e., those which show a unity of the Divine and human nature—are the more ‘true’. What Bosanquet is ultimately interested in, then, is religion in its highest or most developed form—what Caird called “Absolute Religion”. Though Bosanquet does not develop what, specifically, this means, his Gifford lectures give some hint as to the direction of his thought.
Despite his criticisms of, and challenges to, Christianity, Bosanquet believed that the world had benefitted from Christian civilisation and culture, and that Christianity was a progress over earlier stages of religion. Moreover, he not only frequently employed allusions to Christian religious belief and practice to illustrate his general views, but retained elements from Christian doctrine, such as the ideas of the atonement and of justification by faith—though in a highly modified form. The doctrines of the atonement (to which Bosanquet often referred, using the words of Goethe, as ‘dying in order to live’) and of ‘justification by faith’ (which emphasised the presence of religious consciousness in ‘works’) have a practical rather than a doctrinal significance. The former reflected the notion of ‘self-sacrifice’, involved in the achievement of self-realisation—where one had to ‘die’ to the desires of one’s ‘private will’ in order to ‘live’ as a more complete moral agent. And the latter was a reminder that one’s actions could have a moral and spiritual character only so far as they were carried out, out of a set of “dominant ideas” to which one was committed.
Given his explanation of what religion is, Bosanquet holds that religion is entirely consistent with reason. He insists that religious belief as a whole is not superstition, and that it is true so far as it is an expression of a “nisus towards the whole” (Principle of Individuality and Value, p. 98). Again, since particular religious beliefs purport to be cognitive, they must, at least in principle, be able to be known by believers and non-believers alike. (He is, however, sceptical about the relevance of traditional apologetics.) In both cases, the standard that Bosanquet employs in order to assess truth in religion is the same as that which he uses to assess the truth in general—namely, coherence.
In his 2006 The God of Metaphysics, T.L.S. Sprigge endorses a broadly Bosanquetian account of religion, but raises a number of criticisms of Bosanquet’s account—particularly concerning its implications for ethics. Sprigge argues, for example, that by his assimilation of evil into the Absolute, Bosanquet not only fails to take evil seriously, but encourages passivity, assuming that evil is either inevitable or will eventually disappear on its own. The claim that Bosanquet’s absolute idealism entails such an attitude towards evil seems difficult, however, to square with Bosanquet’s concern for public welfare and interest in social reform (see Sweet 2007).
Though Bosanquet’s analysis of religious belief reflects an understanding that, broadly speaking, was shared by a number of his fellow idealists, it is significantly different from other late 19th century and early 20th century perspectives, such as those of William Clifford, John Henry Newman, and William James, and can be seen as an alternative to them. Given its immanentist character and insistence on separating religion or faith from dogma and theology, it is close to the view of religion that one finds in twentieth-century authors, such as R.B. Braithwaite, R.M. Hare, and W. Cantwell Smith. Bosanquet’s views, like those of these authors, have been challenged (for example, by C.C.J. Webb, François Houang, and Alan P.F. Sell) for not only being inconsistent with any orthodox theism, but as presenting in its stead a non-realist, generic religion (which, some critics hold, is not religion at all). It is, however, important to recognise that Bosanquet is not advancing a non-cognitivist or fideist view of religion, and that he maintains that both religious belief as a whole and particular religious beliefs must meet appropriate rational standards (see Sweet 2000).
Bosanquet’s writings on art and aesthetics are not as well known as those of the third generation idealist, R.G. Collingwood (1889–1943) or of his Italian late contemporary Benedetto Croce (1866–1952). Yet Bosanquet was the author of the first history of aesthetics in English—described by Monroe C. Beardsley as a “pioneering work” (1966: 14) that was the only comprehensive study of aesthetics in English for half a century—and he was referred to by the literary scholar and Oxford Professor of Poetry, A.C. Bradley as “the only British philosopher of the first rank who had dealt fully with this branch of philosophy [i.e., aesthetics]” (A.C. Bradley, p. 570).
Bosanquet had a life-long interest in the arts, and his writings are replete with examples and illustrations taken from them. He read widely, particularly poetry, from the classics to the moderns, and for several years served on the (London) Council of the Home Arts and Industries Association. Among his early works was a translation of The Introduction to Hegel’s Philosophy of Fine Art (1886)—to which he wrote an important introduction—and he was the author of several articles on aesthetics, A History of Aesthetic (1892), a series of lectures on aesthetics given to the London Ethical Society (1895–96), and Three Lectures on Aesthetic (1915).
Bosanquet’s aesthetics shows a debt to Hegel, to the Romantic poets, to the Arts and Crafts movement, and to the philosophy of Hermann Lotze (1817–1881). Bosanquet was particularly inspired by Hegel’s views on the function and the development of art, but he was also influenced by the Romantic movement and its disciples (e.g., J.W. Goethe, F.W.J. Schelling, and William Wordsworth—but also S.T. Coleridge, Robert Southey, and William Blake), a movement that, interestingly, Hegel had disparaged. The Romantics’ emphasis on unity, the importance of art as a form of self-expression essential to the development of the self, and the organic conception of nature all have an important place in Bosanquet’s work. But other Romantic themes were not adopted so readily. Bosanquet rejected any emphasis of emotion over reason, and he acknowledged the importance of limits to art and to artistic activity in general.
For Bosanquet, art is revelatory of the ‘spiritual’ character of the world, and aesthetics is important because it is a disciplined attempt to understand how artists and artworks contribute to this. Bosanquet’s work in aesthetics focused on four principal issues: i) the nature and evolution of aesthetic consciousness, ii) artistic production, iii) aesthetic appreciation—particularly, the experience of beauty, ugliness, and the sublime in art, and iv) the role of art in the development of character. Throughout, Bosanquet writes that he is simply following Hegel’s lead—though his work is clearly a development rather than a repetition of Hegel’s views.
The first issue, aesthetic consciousness, is discussed at length in Bosanquet’s A History of Aesthetic (and, to an extent, in his introductory essay to The Introduction to Hegel’s Philosophy of Fine Art). In A History of Aesthetic, for example, Bosanquet describes the gradual recognition, over the course of European history, of art as a synthesis of content and expression. He traces the continuity and ‘interruption’ in the understanding of art and the beautiful, from the classical Greek model (with its idea that “art... is symbolic”), through the middle ages, to the beginnings of a concrete synthesis in Schiller and Goethe, and then towards a “synthesis of content and expression in that ‘characteristic’ which overmasters the mind and feeling” (History of Aesthetic, p. 458) which he finds in Ruskin’s analysis of “the penetrative imagination”. While Hegel had earlier held that there was a development in consciousness over time—that at one point includes aesthetic consciousness—Bosanquet was not committed to the Hegelian claim that aesthetic consciousness developed dialectically.
For Bosanquet, aesthetics is importantly connected to metaphysics; understanding art and the work of the artist requires a broader metaphysical and logical theory. (It is this relation between the metaphysical and the aesthetic, developed in Bosanquet’s later writings, that led Dorothy Emmet to write that Bosanquet’s Three Lectures on Aesthetic was his “most successful book” [Emmet 1998: 28].) For Bosanquet, aesthetic experience was characteristic of the higher experiences we have that give us insight into the full nature of reality, and features of such experiences were features that one also finds in logic and metaphysics. Art, then, can help not only in understanding other aspects of the world, but by revealing something of the “spiritual” character of the world.
The second major issue that Bosanquet focused on was what is—and what is involved in the production of—a work of art. Here, too, Bosanquet’s treatment of this topic goes beyond Hegel’s; it also anticipates elements later found in Collingwood and Croce.
The creation of a work of art, according to Bosanquet, is an expression of spirit or feeling; some see Bosanquet as articulating a nascent expression theory of art. Yet Bosanquet held that there is also a content communicated in a work of art, and so it is “representative” (Three Lectures, p. 57)—not in the sense of copying a natural object, but as embodying the ‘soul’ or essence of an object or a feeling in a new medium. (Here, Bosanquet is clearly influenced by Hegel’s view that beauty exists when the Idea is embodied in sensuous form.) While artists have some preconception of the effect they wish to produce in the work of art, they also learn as they engage in the activity itself. A work of art, then, is a product of a process of expression, but this expression must normally be completed in an object in the ‘physical’ world. Thus, Bosanquet insists, while a work of art originates in the subjective, it is also something objective. He writes:
Feeling, […] in order to be capable of utterance in determinate form, must take on an objective character. (Value and Destiny of the Individual, p. 43)
While some have suggested that Bosanquet’s account of the embodiment of a feeling in a work of art is unclear (Kobayashi 2009: 166), Bosanquet would likely reply that such a concern is addressed by his view that a work of art is a “concrete universal”—that it possesses an organisation and a unity that shows a relation of interdependence among its parts, and it presents certain general principles in a concrete form.
The third principal issue that concerned Bosanquet is what happens when a person encounters a work of art, i.e., aesthetic appreciation. In his Three Lectures on Aesthetic, Bosanquet analyses the “aesthetic attitude” which, he says, is an activity not of the mind alone, but of the whole person—“body-and-mind”. (This issue of the connexion of body and mind is discussed at length in Lecture V of The Principle of Individuality and Value.) Although Bosanquet is an idealist, he is an objective idealist, and holds that, like perception, aesthetic experience involves the whole person.
On Bosanquet’s view, the aesthetic attitude is “contemplative”—it is a “preoccupation with a pleasant feeling, embodied in an object which can be contemplated” (Three Lectures, p. 10). But the work of art is also something in which the spectator finds his or her feelings “expressed”. Bosanquet writes that when we “imaginatively contemplate” an art object, we are “able […] to live in it as an embodiment of our feeling” (Three Lectures, p. 30); there is no ultimate distinction between art and the feelings it evokes in us. Moreover, the appreciation of a work of art requires understanding it as a whole or as a unity—and so it must be organisational. This organisational character refers not only to elements or features within the art object itself, but to the environment in which the work comes to be. Further, Bosanquet argued that art (and aesthetic consciousness) have their basis only in a community. Art, then, is social and public—so far as both the artist and the spectator are epistemically dependent on the communities in which they live.
Bosanquet’s discussion of aesthetic appreciation in the Three Lectures also addressed such questions as the forms of aesthetic satisfaction and the different “kinds” of beauty—beauty being understood as more than what is aesthetically pleasing. It is here that most of the critical attention to his work (e.g., by John Dewey 1893) has been focussed. Bosanquet argues that while beauty is sometimes “easy”—accessible to and recognisable by all—the excellence of certain beautiful items may be evident only to those possessing “aesthetic insight”. Because of the “intricacy” or complexity of the components of a work of art, some might consider an aesthetically excellent object to be an ugly one. This, Bosanquet writes, is a mistake. Ugliness is, Bosanquet argues, strictly speaking a failure in expression. Ugliness in art must not be confused with “difficult art”—i.e., art that is beautiful, though many may fail to appreciate it. (For a recent discussion of ‘difficulty’ in art, see Perricone 2018.)
Bosanquet’s fourth principal concern in aesthetics was with the role of art in the development of character. In several early essays (from 1886 to 1890), he emphasised how art leads to an expansion of the self—of the artist, in creating the work of art, but also of the spectator, in appreciating the work. (Bosanquet followed William Morris and John Ruskin in holding that this result follows as much from “artistic handiwork” as from “fine art”.) In the short term, aesthetic appreciation leads to a greater ability to appreciate not only art but life. But, as indicated earlier, Bosanquet also maintains that in the long term—here, agreeing with Hegel—art is a vehicle for the recognition of insights concerning the unity of reality, and for an experience of something greater than ourselves.
While Bosanquet’s aesthetics is close to the expression theory associated with Collingwood and Croce, and while there is a continuity between Bosanquet’s work and Collingwood’s early studies in aesthetics, Bosanquet was a sharp critic of Croce. Bosanquet holds that any adequate aesthetic theory must leave room for externality in art, and so he thinks that any theory that calls into question “the reality of the external world”—which he believes Croce’s does—cannot provide an accurate portrayal of the unity of the world. Bosanquet also challenges, for example, the claim that art is prior to the conceptual and the philosophical. He argues that Croce ignores that “the aesthetic attitude is learnt” (“Croce’s æsthetic”, in Collected Works, Vol. 1, p. 113), and that if language is just expression, not only are logic and conceptual meaning are excluded from it, but we get a metaphysical “singleness” without substance, content, or “definite meaning”. Finally, Bosanquet writes that Croce fails to provide an adequate statement of the relation between the aesthetic, nature, and the metaphysical. By restricting the aesthetic to the realm of art, Croce ignores the role that the beauty of nature has in calling us “out of ourselves” and to the recognition of what is real.
Bosanquet’s account of the production of the work of art and the nature of aesthetic appreciation is arguably an advance on Hegel, not only in the understanding of art and aesthetic experience as something more than a prelude to Religion, but in re-situating them within the history of the development of consciousness. (Consequently, he denied what he saw to be the Crocean interpretation of Hegel: that, at some point, art—as uniquely expressing certain truths—would cease to have a function, and be superseded by another form of consciousness.) Moreover, Bosanquet’s view that art is an expression of emotion—later articulated and developed by Croce and Collingwood—may nevertheless be able to avoid some of the criticisms raised against these later formulations. While Kobayashi has argued that this account fails to explain how the aesthetic sentiment or feeling can be shared by the artist and spectators (2009: 166), Bosanquet would likely respond that an explanation is to be found in his account of the work of art as a concrete universal. Some studies (e.g., by Morigi 2001) have suggested that there are insights within Bosanquet’s work that warrant further investigation of idealist aesthetics, and others argue that Bosanquet’s analyses of aesthetic judgement and aesthetic consciousness may plausibly bear on other fields (e.g., politics) concerning matters related to self consciousness and our relations to other persons.
Bosanquet’s social and political philosophy is called ‘idealist’ because of his view that social relations and institutions were not ultimately material phenomena, but best understood as existing in human consciousness. Writing largely in reaction to the utilitarianism of Bentham and Mill and to the natural-rights based theory of Herbert Spencer, Bosanquet’s views show both a strong influence of Hegel and an important debt to Kant and to the classical Greek thought of Plato and Aristotle. Indeed, Bosanquet often spoke of his political theory as reflecting principles found in classical philosophy, and one of his early works was a commentary on Plato’s Republic. Nevertheless, his political thought lies clearly within the tradition of liberalism.
The main source for Bosanquet’s social and political philosophy is The Philosophical Theory of the State (1899 [1923; Sweet and Gaus (ed.) 2001]; See Sweet 1997b), though many of his ideas are developed in dozens of articles and essays which he wrote for professional academic journals, for publications of the Charity Organisation Society and for the popular press. Like many of his fellow idealists (notably T.H. Green, D.G. Ritchie, William Wallace, John Watson, and, to a lesser degree, F.H. Bradley). Bosanquet’s principal concern was to explain the basis of political authority and the state, the place of the citizen in society, and the nature, source and limits of human rights. The political theory that he developed is importantly related to his metaphysics and logic—particularly to such notions as the individual, the general will, “the best life”, society, and the state. In order to provide a coherent account of such issues, Bosanquet argued, one must abandon some of the assumptions of the liberal tradition—particularly those that reveal a commitment to ‘individualism’.
Bosanquet saw authority and the state neither as based on individual consent or a social contract, nor as mere products of a sovereign, but as part of the natural development of humanity, and as expressions of what he called the “real” or general will. On Bosanquet’s view, the will of the individual is “a mental system” whose parts—“ideas or groups of ideas”—are
connected in various degrees, and more or less subordinated to some dominant ideas which, as a rule, dictate the place and importance of the others [i.e., of the other ideas that one has] (Bosanquet 1893–94, p. 311).
Thus, Bosanquet writes that,
[i]n order to obtain a full statement of what we will, what we want at any moment must at least be corrected and amended by what we want at all other moments.
But the process does not stop there. He continues:
this cannot be done without also correcting and amending it so as to harmonise it with what others want, which involves an application of the same process to them. (1899 [1923; Sweet and Gaus (ed.) 2001]: 133)
In other words, if we wish to arrive at an accurate statement of what our will is, we must be concerned not only with what we wish at some particular moment, but also with all of the other wants, purposes, associations and feelings that we and others have (or might have) given all of the knowledge available. The result is one’s “real” or the “general will”. Moreover, the dominant ideas characteristic of this real will provide a basis for shared understanding within the community and the state (see Sweet 2019). Some have argued that the possibility of such an understanding provides a basis not only for how language is a fundamental element in political community (see Grygienc 2018), but how it could be the “medium through which reality is given concrete shape” (Lejeune 2018).
Bosanquet sees a relation between the “real” or ‘general will’ and the “common good”. He writes that “The General Will seems to be, in the last resort, the ineradicable impulse of an intelligent being to a good extending beyond itself” (op. cit., p. 127). This ‘good’ is nothing other than “the existence and the perfection of human personality” which Bosanquet identified with “the excellence of souls” and the complete realisation of the individual. It is so far as the state reflects the general will and this common good that its authority is legitimate and its action morally justifiable. Bosanquet describes the function of the state, then, as “the hindrance of hindrances” to human development. (op. cit., p. 189)
The influence of Rousseau and Hegel is clearly evident here (Sweet 1991). Bosanquet saw in Hegel’s Philosophy of Right a plausible account of the modern state as an “organism” or whole united around a shared understanding of the good. Moreover, like Hegel, he argued that the state, like all other social “institutions”, was best understood as an ethical idea and as existing at the level of consciousness rather than just material reality. Within nation states, Bosanquet held that the authority of the state is absolute, because social life requires a consistent co-ordination of the activities of individuals and institutions.
Still, although Bosanquet believed that the state was absolute, he did not exclude the possibility of an organized system of international law (see Nicholson 1976). The conditions for an effective recognition and enforcement of such a system were, he thought, absent at that moment—though he held out hope that the League of Nations reflected the beginnings of the consciousness of a genuine human community and that it might provide a mechanism by which multinational action could be accomplished.
Because the state can be said to reflect the general will that Bosanquet claimed is also each individual’s real will, Bosanquet held (following Rousseau) that sometimes individuals can be required to engage in certain activities for their own good—that is they can be “forced to be free”. Moreover, he maintained that it is in terms of the ‘common good’ that one’s “station” or “function” in society is defined, and it is the conscientious carrying out of the duties that are attached to one’s ‘station’ that constitutes ethical behaviour. In fact, on Bosanquet’s account, it is primarily in light of one’s service in the state that a person has the basis for speaking of his or her personal identity. Not surprisingly, then, as Tyler (2006) points out, Bosanquet was frequently challenged by those who claimed that he was anti-democratic and that his philosophical views led to a devaluation of the individual. Such attacks ignore, however, Bosanquet’s insistence on liberty as the essence and quality of the human person and his emphases on the moral development of the human individual and on limiting the state from directly promoting morality (which reflects both his own reading of Kant and the influence of Green’s Kantianism.) Moreover, while Bosanquet did not hold that there were any a priori restrictions on state action, he held that there were a number of practical conditions that did limit it. For example, while law was seen as necessary to the promotion of the common good, it could not make a person good, and social progress could often be better achieved by volunteer action. (It is just this emphasis that Bosanquet found and defended in the approach to social work of the Charity Organisation Society.)
Although the state and law employ compulsion and restraint, they are considered to be ‘positive’ in that they provide the material conditions for liberty, the functioning of social institutions, and the development of individual moral character. For Bosanquet, then, there was no incompatibility between liberty and the law. Moreover, since individuals are necessarily social beings, their rights were neither absolute and inalienable, but reflected the “function” or “positions” they held in the community. For such rights to have not only moral but legal weight, Bosanquet insisted that they had to be recognized by the state in law. Strictly speaking, then, there could be no rights against the state. Nevertheless, Bosanquet acknowledged that, where social institutions were fundamentally corrupt, even though there was no right to rebellion, there could be a duty to resist.
It is in his discussion of the nature, source, and limits of state action and of the nature of rights that Bosanquet introduces the topic of punishment. Bosanquet considers the three dominant theories of punishment—retribution, reformation, and prevention—and seems to find all defective; some have argued that, like Green, in the end Bosanquet does not offer a clear, consistent theory of punishment. Yet Bosanquet writes that “[t]he three main aspects of punishment [...] are really inseparable” (1899 [1923; Sweet and Gaus (ed.) 2001]: 215). Punishment is the response to an act of a bad will—and so it can be regarded as retributivist—but it also has a properly preventive element, as well as a reformatory character (since “the aim of punishment is to make the offender good” (p. 206). The tension among these three theories has also led to the question of whether Bosanquet offers a “unified theory of punishment”, and more recent scholarship, such as that of Brooks (2010), Crossley (2004), and Sweet (2000), all argue that there is a way of reconciling the different theories, though they disagree on the specifics of how that can occur.
Although Bosanquet is sometimes regarded as a conservative, recent studies have pointed out that he was an active Liberal and, in the 1910s, supported the Labour Party. He insisted on the positive role that the state can have in the promotion of social well being, he was in favour of worker ownership, he supported Irish Home Rule, and, during the Second Boer War, was initially sympathetic to Boer independence (see Sweet : 233–234; for a nuanced recent account, see Boucher : 325). It is also worth noting that Bosanquet’s audience was as much the professional social worker or the politician, as the philosopher. He was well-informed of the political situation in Britain, on the continent, and in the United States. His interests extended to economics and social welfare, and his work in adult education and social work provided a strong empirical dimension to his work. This background supplied him with a broad base from which to reply to challenges from many of his critics—e.g., from philosophers, like Mill and Spencer, and from social reformers, such as Sidney and Beatrice Webb and the founder of the Salvation Army, General William Booth. Despite charges that Bosanquet’s political philosophy is simplistic, inconsistent, or naive, Adam Ulam notes that The Philosophical Theory of the State
has a comprehensiveness and an awareness of conflicting political and philosophical opinions which give it a supreme importance in modern political thought. Bosanquet is both a political theorist and a political analyst. (Ulam 1951: 50)
Colin Tyler (2002) argues that Bosanquet’s political thought can also provide a basis for the recognition of cultural diversity suited to a liberal, multicultural society.
It has sometimes been suggested that the influences of Kant and Hegel lead to a tension in Bosanquet’s political thought (see Vincent 1982). Bosanquet’s emphasis on the moral development of the human individual and on limiting the state from directly promoting morality clearly reflects a Kantian influence. Moreover, Bosanquet believed that “the best life” that he describes as the “end” of the individual and of the state alike, approximates what Kant referred to as “the kingdom of ends”. Even Bosanquet’s justification of the authority of the state can be seen as a reflection of a Kantian imperative that one wills the state as a necessary means to the moral end.
Soon after his move to London, in 1881, Bosanquet joined his half-brother Charles, and his friend and former classmate C.S. Loch, in their work with the Charity Organisation Society (COS). This led to a lifelong association with the COS—one with which Bosanquet was indelibly connected. He was a Member of Council of the COS from 1898 until his death, serving as Vice Chairman (1901–1915) and as Chairman (1916–1917). He also served on Administration and District Committees of the COS and was involved in the operation (and, from 1908–1912, served as Chairman of the Executive Council) of the COS-sponsored School of Sociology and Social Economics from 1903 until its incorporation into the London School of Economics in 1912.
For Bosanquet, social work needed to be connected with education and, by extension, educational reform. Through his cousin Mary C. McCallum, Bosanquet learned about the Home Arts and Industries Association and its role in practical education and, starting in 1891, he frequently lectured and taught university extension courses for the London Ethical Society (LES)—initially under auspices of the University Extension Scheme at Essex Hall—and its successor, the short-lived London School of Ethics and Social Philosophy (1897–1900). Many of his publications, including The Essentials of Logic, A Companion to Plato’s Republic for English Readers, Psychology of the Moral Self, and The Philosophical Theory of the State, were based on or were prepared as texts for these courses.
Bosanquet’s lectures and essays on social topics deal not only with general concerns on the role of social institutions and the state in promoting the good life, but on specific questions dealing with social reform. Many of these essays were published in the Charity Organisation Review, but several were of a broad interest and appeared in leading philosophical and sociological journals and books. In Essays and Addresses (1889), Bosanquet advances an “ideal of modern life” which he calls “Christian Hellenism”. There, in an essay entitled “The Kingdom of God on Earth”, he gives an analysis of the relation between the human individual and the community that was taken up later in his political philosophy.
Particularly because of his COS work, Bosanquet was familiar with the empirical data on what was called “the social problem”, and he made extensive concrete proposals for social reform; one finds examples of this in “In Darkest England” On the Wrong Track (1891), his discussion and critique of Salvation Army General William Booth’s programme for the alleviation of pauperism, and in Aspects of the Social Problem (1895), a collection of essays which he edited and to which he contributed six of the 18 chapters. Bosanquet believed, however, that the key to social progress was the development of individual character. It was this focus on character rather than social conditions that brought his views into conflict with a number of reformers, including the Fabian social radicals, Sidney and Beatrice Webb. In particular, it led to the accusation that Bosanquet’s views were too individualistic and out of touch with the root of the problem of poverty (see Hobhouse 1918: 78–79). This disagreement came to a head during the sessions of the Royal Commission on the Poor Laws on which both Helen Bosanquet and Beatrice Webb served. Some commentators have noted that, when one examines their specific suggestions on practical policy, the differences between the Bosanquets and their opponents are more often over strategy than principle.
For Bosanquet, education was not simply the acquisition of knowledge, but of values; his involvement in adult education was inspired both by his interest in bringing advanced formal education to a larger population that had a more extensive life experience than the typical undergraduate, but also by his views on art in the development of character. While an adequate education requires having some understanding of general principles, it also involves moral and aesthetic values. In his early writings, but also in his later work, Bosanquet is particularly concerned with how such values can be inculcated.
In his two early essays on “Artistic Handiwork in Education” (1887), Bosanquet argued for some form of handicraft work being introduced into elementary and secondary education. This, Bosanquet wrote, can contribute to the awakening, the enjoyment, and the appreciation of beauty in nature and in art. Handicraft that has a distinctively artistic character requires not only exertion through the exercise of active apprehension, but also “seeing deeply” into nature. Moreover, the study of works of art provides a key to understanding both the culture and character of other nations but also universal human values.
Similar views on education can be discerned in Bosanquet’s The Education of the Young in ‘The Republic’ of Plato (1900), in his remarks on “How Could the Ethical Efficiency of Education be Increased?” (1908), and in essays in Some Suggestions in Ethics (1918). In Some Suggestions in Ethics, for example, Bosanquet distinguishes between “ignorance” and “stupidity”. Ignorance is the intellectual state of not knowing facts. But, more problematic for Bosanquet, is stupidity—the “inability to see” or the blindness to values—for it either distorts, or reflects a distortion of, one’s “ideas concerning facts, objects and truths” (op. cit., p. 236). For Bosanquet, then, education should be primarily directed at improving character; it is the remedy for “awakening interests and proportioning them to values” (op. cit., p. 237). This, however, requires educational reform in schools—concerning the atmosphere or tone of the school, the personality of the teachers, and the organisation of work and play. Through the social activities involved in participation—particularly of the young—in the arts or in artistic training, Bosanquet believed that society can facilitate both the appreciation of beauty and moral excellence.
Interest in Bosanquet’s work—as with idealism as a whole—waned during the middle decades of the 20th century. Of the idealists, the writings of Bradley and, in political theory, Green, are now much better known. There is no simple explanation of this; many factors seem relevant.
First, some of the work that made Bosanquet’s reputation in his time—his popular essays, the books and articles that came out of his university extension courses, and his involvement in social policy—now seems largely dated. Bosanquet’s association with the majority report of the Poor Law Reform Commission and his alleged championing of the nation state, led many to see him as a conservative if not reactionary thinker whose contributions to social and public policy, and to political philosophy, were outdated almost as soon as they had been published.
It has been suggested, as well, that some of the concepts central to Bosanquet’s work are problematic or not clearly defined, and that several of his essays lack the logical rigor that one finds in material destined for the more specialized audience of academic philosophers. While insightful and wide ranging—and while accessible to a much wider audience than the work of other idealists, such as Bradley and J.M.E. McTaggart—Bosanquet’s writings lack the sharpness, the density, and, at times, the outrageousness of those of some of his contemporaries.
It is also fair to say that Bosanquet himself was an indifferent literary stylist. His work often betrays a looseness that one tends to find in texts based on lectures prepared for general audiences or for classes, and he wrote that “I usually rush my books, I get so tired of them” (Muirhead 1935: 131). His early work on logic was also remarked upon for its “stiffness” (ibid., p. 58). But these primarily stylistic issues may also be a consequence of Bosanquet’s refusal to sever philosophical analysis from the experience which Bosanquet was trying to investigate.
There are other reasons that no doubt contributed to the decline of interest in Bosanquet’s work. By the early part of the 20th century, philosophical idealism as a whole was seen by many as a philosophical dead-end, with figures such as G.E. Moore, Bertrand Russell, and A.J. Ayer challenging what they saw as its irredeemably obscure vocabulary, as well as its questionable underlying speculative metaphysics.
Nevertheless, the influence and legacy of Bosanquet, and of British idealism in general, should not be underestimated.
One area in which today one sees a resonance or legacy is in political and social thought; Bosanquet’s arguments have been seen as at least close—or even a preferred alternative—to the work of some contemporary communitarians. Bosanquet’s emphasis on the importance of a common good, on the social character of the individual, and on the fundamental place of substantive social ends within a community, are echoed in the more recent writings of Charles Taylor (1992) and Alasdair MacIntyre (1990). Other authors (such as Gerald Gaus [1983, 1994, 2001]) see in Bosanquet’s work a model of a substantive liberalism.
A second area that is beginning to be explored is that of Bosanquet’s relation to philosophers of succeeding generations in Britain, such as R.G. Collingwood and Michael Oakeshott. Collingwood, for example, discusses Bosanquet’s political philosophy in his unpublished “Notes Towards a Theory of Politics as a Philosophical Science” (see Connelly 2002), and Oakeshott regarded The Philosophical Theory of the State as “the only theory which has paid thoroughgoing attention to all the problems which must be considered by a theory of the State” (Oakeshott 1936).
Other areas that have been the subject of some recent study are Bosanquet’s views on religion and on logic. Bosanquet is known to have had an influence on the ‘social gospel’ of the English theologian and future Archbishop of Canterbury, William Temple. More broadly, Bosanquet’s emphasis on the moral, and not doctrinal, character of religious belief is, as noted earlier, reflected in recent work in the study of religion. While many accept the standard view that idealist logic was problematic and no rival for the later logic of Russell and Wittgenstein, it bears noting that, given Bosanquet’s view of the centrality of logic to philosophy, he engaged and debated then-current developments in logic, such as that of Franz Brentano, Alexius Meinong, and Russell. For example, in the posthumously published Three Chapters on the Nature of Mind (1923), Bosanquet closely examines Russell’s account in The Analysis of Mind, claiming that there were many points on which both were in agreement, and that Russell’s view was not so much wrong as “too narrow”. It has also been argued that Bosanquet’s views on logic and scientific method are close to those of some contemporary critics of empirical accounts of natural laws.
Just as the recent exploration of the origins of analytic philosophy have led some authors to look more closely at its relations with British idealism, the intellectual roots of Bosanquet’s idealism also need to be more thoroughly explored. Though Bosanquet’s debt to the writings of Hegel and Kant is relatively well-known, there were a number of other important influences on his work (see Sweet 1995). Perhaps the most significant is that of classical Greek thought, and it is only recently recognised that Bosanquet’s philosophy cannot be fully appreciated without am appreciation of his debt to Greek philosophy.
Finally, even as Bosanquet’s influence, and that of British idealism as a whole, diminished at home, they continued for some time afterward in other countries of the English-speaking world. Thus, aside from the ‘third generation’ of idealists or idealist-influenced philosophers in Britain (such as Collingwood, Michael Oakeshott, and Dorothy Emmet), Bosanquet’s thought also had an impact in English-language philosophy in Canada (with John Watson), in South Africa (with R.F.A. Hoernlé (see Sweet 2010), A.R. Lord (see Sweet 2005), and Andrew Murray), and in India (with Hiralal Haldar, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan, and Benoy Ray) (see Sweet 2011).
In recent years, then, there has been a renewed interest in Bosanquet’s work—particularly concerning his philosophical and social thought. Given the number of studies published during the past forty years on Hegel, Green and, more recently, Bradley, and given the reevaluation of the significance of the work of British idealism and its place in the history of philosophy, there has been a steady reconsideration of the contribution of Bosanquet’s philosophy as well.
The most comprehensive list to date of Bosanquet’s work is found in Vol. 1 of Essays in Philosophy and Social Policy, 1883–1922, (ed. William Sweet), Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 2003, pp. xxxix–lxv.
The 20 volume Collected Works of Bernard Bosanquet (edited by William Sweet) appeared in 1999 from Thoemmes Press (Bristol, U.K.). In addition to reprints of the standard editions of Bosanquet’s principal works, the Collected Works contains two volumes of previously uncollected essays, with notes and Introductions. The Collected Works includes the following texts:
- Knowledge and Reality, A Criticism of Mr. F. H. Bradley’s ‘Principles of Logic’, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, 1885.
- Logic, or the Morphology of Knowledge, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1888. 2nd ed., 1911.
- Essays and Addresses, London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1889.
- A History of Aesthetic, London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1892. 2nd ed., 1904.
- The Civilization of Christendom and Other Studies, London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1893.
- The Essentials of Logic: Being Ten Lectures on Judgement and Inference, London and New York: Macmillan, 1895.
- Aspects of the Social Problem, Bosanquet (ed.), London: Macmillan, 1895. [Note: This volume appears only in part in the Collected Works. It omits essays by other authors as well as those which appear in Bosanquet’s later books, but adds a number of additional essays by Bosanquet on social policy.]
- A Companion to Plato’s Republic for English Readers: Being a Commentary adapted to Davies and Vaughan’s Translation, New York/London: Macmillan, 1895.
- The Philosophical Theory of the State, London: Macmillan, 1899; 4th ed., 1923. See also below The Philosophical Theory of the State and Related Essays by Bernard Bosanquet, Sweet and Gaus (eds) 2001. Page numbers in this article are from the last.
- Psychology of the Moral Self, London and New York: Macmillan, 1897.
- The Principle of Individuality and Value. The Gifford Lectures for 1911 delivered in Edinburgh University, London: Macmillan, 1912.
- The Value and Destiny of the Individual. The Gifford Lectures for 1912 delivered in Edinburgh University, London: Macmillan, 1913.
- The Distinction Between Mind and its Objects. The Adamson Lecture for 1913 with an Appendix, Manchester: University Press, 1913
- Three Lectures on Aesthetic, London: Macmillan, 1915.
- Social and International Ideals: Being Studies in Patriotism, London: Macmillan, 1917.
- Some Suggestions in Ethics, London: Macmillan, 1918; 2nd ed. 1919.
- Implication and Linear Inference, London: Macmillan, 1920.
- What Religion Is, London: Macmillan, 1920.
- The Meeting of Extremes in Contemporary Philosophy, London: Macmillan, 1921.
- Three Chapters on the Nature of Mind, London: Macmillan, 1923.
- Science and Philosophy and Other Essays by the Late Bernard Bosanquet, J.H. Muirhead and R.C. Bosanquet (eds), London: Allen and Unwin, 1927.
Two recent editions of Bosanquet’s work are
- The Philosophical Theory of the State and Related Essays by Bernard Bosanquet, with Introductions, notes, and annotations by William Sweet and Gerald F. Gaus (eds), Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press/South Bend, IN: St Augustine’s Press [distributed by University of Chicago Press], 2001.
- Essays in Philosophy and Social Policy, 1883–1922, William Sweet (ed.), 3 volumes, Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 2003.
Several of Bosanquet’s undergraduate essays appear in
- Unpublished Manuscripts in British Idealism; Political Philosophy, Theology and Social Thought, Colin Tyler (ed.), 2 vols. Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2005; reprinted, Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2008.
- Acton, H.B., 1936/1937, “The Theory of Concrete Universals”, Mind (New Series), 45: 417–31; 46: 1–13.
- –––, 1967, “Bernard Bosanquet”, The Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 1), Paul Edwards (ed.), New York: Macmillan, pp. 347–350.
- Allard, James, 2007, “Bosanquet and the Problem of Inference”, in W. Sweet, ed., Bernard Bosanquet and the Legacy of British Idealism. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2007, 73–89.
- Armour, Leslie, 1979, “The Dialectics of Rationality: Bosanquet, Newman and the Concept of Assent”, in Rationality Today, Ottawa: University of Ottawa Press, pp. 491–497.
- –––, 2000, “Moral and Economic Socialism; Bosanquet, the Economy, and ‘the Citizen Mind’”, Bradley Studies, 6: 18–45.
- Beardsley, Monroe C., 1966, Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present, New York: Macmillan.
- Bedau, Hugo Adam, 1978, “Retribution and the Theory of Punishment”, Journal of Philosophy, 75: 601–620.
- Bosanquet, Bernard, 1893–-94, “The Reality of the General Will”, International journal of Ethics IV, pp. 308–321 (reprinted in Aspects of the Social Problem , London: 1895, and in Science and Philosophy and Other Essays .
- Bosanquet, Bernard, A. S. Pringle-Pattison, G. F. Stout, and Lord Haldane, 1917–18, “Do Finite Individuals Possess a Substantive or Adjectival Mode of Being?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, ns XVIII (1917–1918): 479–506; reprinted in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society , suppl. vol. 1: 75–194.
- Bosanquet, Helen, 1924, Bernard Bosanquet: A Short Account of his Life, London: Macmillan.
- Boucher, David, 2020, “British Idealism, Imperialism and the Boer War”, History of Political Thought, 41: 325–348.
- Boucher, David and Andrew Vincent, 2001, British Idealism and Political Theory, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
- Boucher, David, James Connelly, Stamatoula Panagakou, William Sweet, and Colin Tyler, 2005, “British Idealism and the Political Philosophy of T.H. Green, Bernard Bosanquet, R. G. Collingwood, and Michael Oakeshott”, British Journal of Politics & International Relations, 7: 97–125.
- Bradley, A. C., 1921–23, “Bernard Bosanquet (1848–1923)”, Proceedings of the British Academy, X: 563–575.
- Bradley, James, 1979, “Hegel in Britain: A Brief History of British Commentary and Attitudes”, The Heythrop Journal, 20: 1–24; 163–182.
- Broad, C.D., 1919, “The Notion of a General Will”, Mind (n.s.), 28: 502–504.
- –––, 1920, “Critical Notice of Implication and Linear Inference”, Mind (n.s.), 29: 323–338.
- Brooks, Thom, 2010, Punishment and British Idealism, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Bussey, Gertrude Carman, 1916, “Dr. Bosanquet’s Doctrine of Freedom”, Philosophical Review, XXV: 711–719 and 728–730.
- Carr, H. Wildon, 1920, “Mr Bosanquet on Croce’s Aesthetic”, Mind (n.s.), 29: 207–211.
- Carritt, E.F., 1935, Morals and Politics: Theories of their Relation from Hobbes and Spinoza to Marx and Bosanquet, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Carter, Matt, 1999, “Ball, Bosanquet and the Legacy of T.H. Green”, History of Political Thought, 20: 674–694.
- Cole, G.D.H., 1925–1926, “Loyalties”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (n.s.), XXVI: 151–170.
- Collini, S., 1976, “Hobhouse, Bosanquet and the State: Philosophical Idealism and Political Argument in England: 1880–1918”, Past and Present, 72: 86–111.
- –––, 1978, “Sociology and Idealism in Britain: 1880–1920”, Archives européennes de sociologie, 19: 3–50.
- Connelly, James, 2002, “Sweet, Bosanquet and ‘the Hindrance of Hindrances’”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 9: 112–122.
- Crane, Marion Delia, 1916, “Dr. Bosanquet’s Doctrine of Freedom”, Philosophical Review, XXV: 719–728.
- –––, 1920, “The Method in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet”, Philosophical Review, XXIX: 437–452.
- Crane (Carroll), Marion, 1921, The Principles of Absolutism in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet, New York. Ph.D. thesis in philosophy, Cornell University. (Reprinted in 1921, “The Principle of Individuality in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet”, Philosophical Review, XXX: 1–23 and “The Nature of the Absolute in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet”, Philosophical Review, XXX: 178–191.)
- Crossley, David, 2004, “The Unified Theory of Punishment of Green and Bosanquet”, Bradley Studies, 10: 1–14.
- Cunningham, G. Watts, 1923, “Bosanquet on Teleology as a Metaphysical Category”, Philosophical Review, XXXII: 612–624.
- –––, 1926, “Bosanquet on Philosophic Method”, Philosophical Review, XXXV: 315–327.
- –––, 1933, The Idealist Argument in Recent British and American Philosophy, New York: The Century Co..
- den Otter, Sandra, 1996, British Idealism and Social Explanation: A Study in Late Victorian Thought, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Dewey, John, 1893, “Review of A History of Aesthetic”, Philosophical Review, II: 63–69.
- Dockhorn, Klaus, 1937, Die Staatsphilosophie des Englischen Idealismus, Köln/Bochum-Langendreer: Heinrich Poppinghaus o. H.-G.. (Bosanquet is discussed on pp. 61–116.)
- Emmet, Dorothy, 1989, “Bosanquet’s Social Theory of the State”, The Sociological Review, 37: 104–127.
- –––, 1998, Outward Forms, Inner Springs: a study in social and religious philosophy, Basingstoke: Macmillan Press / New York, NY: St. Martin’s Press.
- Feinberg, Walter, 1966, A Comparative Study of the Social Philosophies of John Dewey and Bernard Bosanquet, Ph.D. thesis in philosophy, Boston University.
- Ferraris, M., 2014, Introduction to New Realism, London: Bloomsbury.
- Fisher, John, 1976, “The Ease and Difficulty of Theory”, Dialectics and Humanism, 3: 117–124.
- Gaus, Gerald, 1983, The Modern Liberal Theory of Man, Canberra: Croom Helm.
- –––, 1994, “Green, Bosanquet and the philosophy of coherence”, in Routledge History of Philosophy, Volume 7—The Nineteenth Century, C.L. Ten (ed.), London: Routledge.
- –––, 2001, “Bosanquet’s communitarian defense of economic individualism: a lesson in the complexities of political theory”, in The New Liberalism: Reconciling Liberty and Community, Avital Simhony and D. Weinstein (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Gibbins, John R., 1992, “Liberalism, Nationalism and the English Idealists”, in History of European Ideas, 15: 491–497.
- Gilbert, K., 1923, “The Principle of Reason in the Light of Bosanquet’s Philosophy”, Philosophical Review, XXXII: 599–611.
- Ginsberg, Morris, 1919–1920, “Is there a general will?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, XX: 89–112.
- Grygienc, Janusz, 2018, “The General Will and the Speech Community: British Idealism and the Foundations of Politics”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 26: 660–680.
- Harris, Frederick Philip, 1944, The Neo-Idealist Political Theory: Its Continuity with the British Tradition, New York: King’s Crown Press (Ph.D. thesis, Columbia University).
- Haldar, Hira-lal, 1927, Neo-Hegelianism, London: Heath Cranton. [Haldar 1927 available online]
- Hamilton Grant, Iain, 2015, “Everything”, Monist, 98: 156–167.
- Hobhouse, Leonard T., 1918, The Metaphysical Theory of the State, London:George Allen & Unwin.
- Hoernlé, R.F.A., 1919, “Bernard Bosanquet’s Philosophy of the State”, Political Science Quarterly, 34: 609–631.
- Hogdson, S.H., 1901–1902, “Bernard Bosanquet’s Recent Criticism of Green’s Ethics”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, II: 66–71.
- Houang, François, 1954a, De l’humanisme á l’absolutisme: l’évolution de la pensée religieuse du néo-hegelien anglais Bernard Bosanquet, Paris: Vrin.
- –––, 1954b, Le néo-hegelianisme en Angleterre: la philosophie de Bernard Bosanquet (1848–1923), Paris: Vrin.
- Jacobs, Ellen, 1986, Bernard Bosanquet: Social and Political Thought, Ph.D. thesis, City University of New York.
- Jacquette, Dale, 1984, “Bosanquet’s Concept of Difficult Beauty”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 43: 79–88.
- Kobayashi, Chinatsu, 2009, “Bosanquet, Collingwood et l’esthétique idéaliste britannique”, Philosophiques, 36: 149–182.
- Lang, Berel, 1968, “Bosanquet’s Aesthetic: A History and Philosophy of the Symbol”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 26: 377–387.
- Laski, H., 1928, “Bosanquet’s Theory of the General Will”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, n.s. supp. vol. VIII: 45–61.
- LeChevalier, Charles, 1963, La pensée morale de Bernard Bosanquet (1848–1923): Étude sur l’univers moral de l’idéalisme anglais au 19e siecle (Thèse complementaire pour le doctorat ès lettres), Paris: Vrin; republished under the title Éthique et idéalisme: le courant néo-hegelien en Angleterre, Bernard Bosanquet et ses amis, Paris: Vrin, 1963.
- Lejeune, Guillaume, 2018, “From the Bankruptcy of Relations to the Reality of Connections: Language and Semantics in Bradley and Bosanquet”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 26: 700–718.
- Lindsay, A.D., 1923–1924, “Sovereignty”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, XXIV: 235–254.
- –––, 1928, “Bosanquet’s Theory of the General Will”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, n.s., supp. vol. VIII: 31–44.
- MacAdam, James I., 1988, “What Rousseau Meant by the General Will”, in Rousseau’s Response to Hobbes, Eds. Howard R. Cell and James I. MacAdam, New York: Peter Lang, pp. 152–153. (This chapter originally appeared as an article in 1966–1967, Dialogue, 5: 498–515.)
- McBriar, A.M., 1987, An Edwardian Mixed Doubles: The Bosanquets versus the Webbs; A Study in British Social Policy 1890–1929, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- MacEwen, Philip, 1999, “Does Morality Depend on Religion? A Response to Bosanquet and Rachels”, Idealistic Studies, 29: 53–74.
- MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1990, “The Privatization of the Good”, The Review of Politics, 52: 344–61.
- MacIver, R.M., 1917, Community: A Sociological Study, New York: Macmillan. (Esp. Appendix A on the individual, the association, and the community, pp. 421–425, and Appendix B, “A Criticism of the Neo-Hegelian Identification of Society and the State”, pp. 425–433.)
- –––, 1969, Politics and Society, David Spitz (ed.), New York: Atherton Press. (Contains letters between Bosanquet and MacIver on the distinction between society and the state.)
- Mander, W.J., 2000, “Bosanquet and the Concrete Universal”, Modern Schoolman, 77: 293–308.
- –––, 2005, “Life and Finite Individuality: The Bosanquet/Pringle-Pattison Debate”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 13: 111–130.
- –––, 2011, British Idealism: A History, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2017, “New Conceptions of Transcendence in the Thought of the British Idealists”, History of European Ideas, 43: 241–250.
- Marcuse, Herbert, 1960, Reason and Revolution: Hegel and the rise of Social Theory, Second edition, Boston: Beacon Press.
- Mathew, M.C., 1942, “Bosanquet’s Logical Theory”, Philosophical Quarterly (India), 17: 314–324.
- McGuinness, B.F., 1988, Wittgenstein: A Life—Young Ludwig, 1889–1921, London: Duckworth.
- McTaggart, J.M.E., 1901, Studies in Hegelian Cosmology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Meadowcroft, James, 1995, Conceptualizing the State: Innovation and Dispute in British Political Thought 1880–1914, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Metz, Rudolf, 1935, Die philosophischen Stromungen der Gegenwart in Großbritannien, Leipzig: Felix Meiner Verlag; (A Hundred Years of British Philosophy, J.W. Harvey, T.E. Jessop, and Henry Sturt (trans.); J.H. Muirhead (ed.), London: George Allen & Unwin, 1938).
- Milne, A.J.M., 1962, The Social Philosophy of English Idealism, London:Allen & Unwin.
- Moore, G.E., 1903, “The Refutation of Idealism”, Mind, n.s. 12: 433–453; reprinted in his Philosophical Studies, London: K. Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co, 1922, pp. 2–30.
- Morigi, Silvio, 2001, “Bosanquet, Temple and Collingwood: ‘Penetrative Imagination’ and ‘Essential Symbol’ in Aesthetic and Religious Experience”, Bradley Studies, 7: 214–230.
- Morrow, John, 1984, “Liberalism and British Idealist Political Philosophy: A Reassessment”, History of Political Thought, 5: 91–108.
- –––, 1985, “Ancestors, Legacies and Traditions: British Idealism in the History of Political Thought”, History of Political Thought, 6: 491–515.
- –––, 2000, “Community, Class and Bosanquet’s ‘New State’”, History of Political Thought, 21: 485–499.
- Morris-Jones, Huw, 1968, “Bernard Bosanquet”, International Encyclopedia of the Social Sciences, David L. Sills (ed.), New York: The Free Press, Vol. 2, pp. 131–134.
- Moser, Claudia, 1989, Die Erkenntnis- und Realitätsproblematik bei Francis Herbert Bradley und Bernard Bosanquet, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
- Mowat, Charles L., 1961, The Charity Organization Society, 1869–1913: Its Ideas and Work, London: Methuen.
- Muirhead, J.H. (ed.), 1935, Bernard Bosanquet and his Friends, London: George Allen & Unwin.
- Nicholson, Peter P., 1976, “Philosophical Idealism and International Politics: A Reply to Dr. Savigear”, British Journal of International Studies, 2: 76–83.
- –––, 1990, The Political Philosophy of the British Idealists: Selected Studies, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- O’Sullivan, Noel, 1987, The Problem of Political Obligation, New York: Garland.
- Oakeshott, Michael, 1936, “Review of Bertil Pfannenstill, Bernard Bosanquet’s Philosophy of the State”, Philosophy, 11: 482–483.
- Pant, Nalini, 1977, Theory of Rights: Green, Bosanquet, Spencer, and Laski, Varanasi: Vishwavidyalaya Prakashan.
- Parker, Christopher, 1988, “Bernard Bosanquet, Historical Knowledge, and the History of Ideas”, Philosophy of Social Science, 18: 213–230.
- Perricone, Christopher, 2018, “On Difficulty, Elitism, and Friendship in Art”, Journal of Aesthetic Education, 52: 106–123.
- Pfannenstill, Bertil, 1936, Bernard Bosanquet’s Philosophy of the State, Lund: Håkan Ohlsson.
- Primoratz, Igor, 1994, “The Word ‘Liberty’ on the Chains of Galley-Slaves: Bosanquet’s Theory of the General Will”, History of Political Thought, 15: 249–267.
- Pucelle, Jean, 1955, L’idéalisme en Angleterre de Coleridge à Bradley, Neuchâtel: Ed. de la Baconnière.
- Quinton, Anthony, 1971, “Absolute Idealism”, Proceedings of the British Academy, LVII: 303–329.
- Randall, J.H., Jr., 1966, “Idealistic Social Philosophy and Bernard Bosanquet”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, XXVI: 473–502. (Reprinted in Volume 3 of The Career of Philosophy, 3 volumes, New York: Columbia University Press, 1977, pp. 97–130.)
- Robbins, Peter, 1982, The British Hegelians: 1875–1925, New York: Garland Publishing.
- Robinson, Jonathan, 1980, “Bradley and Bosanquet”, Idealistic Studies, 10: 1–23.
- Russell, Bertrand, C. Delisle Burns, and G.D.H. Cole, 1915–1916, “The Nature of the State in its External Relations”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, n.s. vol. XVI: 290–310. (A round table, with a discussion of Bosanquet’s theory of international politics.)
- Sabine, George, 1923, “Bosanquet’s Theory of the Real Will”, Philosophical Review, XXXII: 633–651.
- –––, 1973, A History of Political Theory, 4th ed., Hinsdale, IL: The Dryden Press. (A discussion and critique of Bosanquet and T.H. Green, pp. 725–753.)
- Salomaa, J.A., 1929, Idealismus und Realismus in der englischen Philosophie der Gegenwart, Helsinki: Suomal. Tiedeakat..
- Sell, Alan P.F., 1995, Philosophical Idealism and Christian Belief, New York: St. Martin’s Press.
- Seth Pringle-Pattison, Andrew, 1917, The Idea of God in the Light of Recent Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1918, “Do Finite Individuals possess a substantive or an adjectival mode of being?”, in Life and Finite Individuality, H. Wildon Carr (ed.), Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supp. vol. I,: 103–126.
- Simhony, Avital, 2013, “The ‘Social’ is Prior to the ‘Political’: Bosanquet Revisited (Again)”, Hegel Bulletin, 34: 245–268.
- Spiller, Gustav, 1934, The Ethical Movement in Britain: A Documentary History, London: The Farleigh Press.
- Sprigge, T.L.S., 2006, The God of Metaphysics: Being a Study of the Metaphysics and Religious Doctrines of Spinoza, Hegel, Kierkegaard, T. H. Green, Bernard Bosanquet, Josiah Royce, A. N. Whitehead, Charles Hartshorne, and Concluding with a Defence of Pantheistic Idealism, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Stedman, Ralph E., 1931, “Bosanquet’s Doctrine of Self-Transcendence”, Mind, n.s. 40: 161–170; 298–309.
- –––, 1934, “Nature in the Philosophy of Bosanquet”, Mind, n.s. 43: 321–334.
- Sturt, Henry, 1906, Idola Theatri: A Criticism of Oxford Thought and Thinkers from the Standpoint of Personal Idealism, London: Macmillan.
- Sweet, William, 1991, “Bernard Bosanquet and the Development of Rousseau’s Idea of the General Will”, in Man and Nature: L’homme et la nature, X: 179–197.
- –––, 1995, “Was Bosanquet a Hegelian?”, in Bulletin of the Hegel Society of Great Britain, 31: 39–60.
- –––, 1996, “F.H. Bradley and Bernard Bosanquet”, in Philosophy after F.H. Bradley, James Bradley (ed.), Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press.
- –––, 1997a, “‘Absolute Idealism’ and Finite Individuality”, Indian Philosophical Quarterly, 24: 431–462.
- –––, 1997b, Idealism and Rights, Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1997; paperback ed., 2005.
- –––, 2000, “Bernard Bosanquet and the Nature of Religious Belief”, in Anglo-American Idealism: 1865–1927, W.J. Mander (ed.), Westport, CT: Greenwood Press, pp. 123–139.
- ––– (ed.), 2001, British Idealism and Aesthetics [special issue of Bradley Studies] 7(2).
- –––, 2005, “A.R. Lord and Later British Idealist Political Philosophy”, British Journal of Politics & International Relations, 7: 48–66.
- –––, 2007, “God, Sprigge, and Idealist Philosophy of Religion”, in Consciousness, Reality and Value: Festschrift in Honour of Prof. T.L.S. Sprigge, Leemon McHenry and Pierfrancesco Basile (eds.), Frankfurt/Paris: Ontos Verlag, pp. 181–210.
- –––, 2010, “R.F.A. Hoernlé and Idealist Liberalism in South Africa”, South African Journal of Philosophy, 29: 118–134.
- –––, 2011, “British Idealism and its ‘Empire’”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 18: 7–36.
- –––, 2014. “British Idealist Philosophy of Religion”, in Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century, W.J. Mander (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press), pp. 560–584.
- –––, 2019, “Bosanquet‘s Political Philosophy: Nicholson, and the ‘Real Will’”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 25: 223–252.
- Tallon, Hugh Joseph, 1939, The Concept of Self in British and American Idealism, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
- Taylor, Charles, 1992, The Malaise of Modernity , Toronto: House of Anansi Press.
- Thakurdas, Frank, 1978, The English Utilitarians and the Idealists, Delhi: Vishal Publication.
- Tsanoff, Radoslav A., 1920, “The Destiny of the Self in Professor Bosanquet’s Theory”, Philosophical Review, XXIX: 59–79.
- Turner, Frank M., 1981, The Greek Heritage in Victorian Britain, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Tyler, Colin, 2000, “This Dangerous Drug of Violence: Making sense of Bernard Bosanquet’s theory of punishment”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 7: 114–38.
- –––, 2002, “Negotiating the ‘Modern Wilderness of Interests’: Bernard Bosanquet on Cultural Diversity”, Contemporary Political Theory, 1: 157–180.
- –––, 2006, Idealist Political Philosophy: Pluralism and Conflict in the Absolute Idealist Tradition, New York: Continuum.
- Ulam, Adam, 1951, The Philosophical Foundations of English Socialism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Vincent, Andrew, 1982, “The Individual in Hegelian Thought”, Idealistic Studies, 12: 156–168.
- –––, 1992, “Citizenship, poverty and the real will”, The Sociological Review, 40: 702–725.
- Vincent, Andrew and Raymond Plant, 1984, Philosophy, Politics and Citizenship: the Life and Thought of the British Idealists, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- von Trott, A., 1938, “Bernard Bosanquet und der Einfluß Hegels auf die englische Staatsphilosophie”, Zeitschrift für Deutsche Kulturphilosophie, Band 4, Heft 2: 193–199.
- Wahl, Jean, 1920, Les philosophes pluralistes d’angleterre et d’amerique, Paris: Alcan.
- Watson, John, 1925, “Bosanquet on Mind and the Absolute”, Philosophical Review, XXXIV: 427–442.
- Weldon, T.D., 1946, States and Morals, London: John Murray.
- White, David A., 1970, “Revealment: A Meeting of Extremes in Aesthetics”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 28: 515–520.
- Willis, Kirk, 1988, “The Introduction and Critical Reception of Hegelian Thought in Britain 1830–1900”, Victorian Studies, 32: 85–111.
- Wilson, Fred, 2007, “Bosanquet on the ontology of logic and the method of scientific inquiry”, in W. Sweet (ed.), Bernard Bosanquet and the Legacy of British Idealism, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2007, 267–296.
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