Notes to Chaos

1. Different authors use the terms ‘geometric growth’ and ‘exponential growth’ differently than I define them here.

2. Some authors advocate characterizing chaos in terms of notions from ergodic theory. For some discussion and references, see (Sklar 1995, pp. 235–40; Berkovitz, Frigg and Kronz 2006).

3. We have intuitions that there is some connection, but when nonlinearities are present, these connections are much more delicate than often assumed (Bishop 2011).

5. Recent analyses of functional magnetic resonance imaging studies reveal that there are many-to-many relationships between so-called neural correlates and mental states (Anderson 2010).

4. There is an additional problem in that many of the maps in chaos studies (e.g., the baker’s transformation) have purely mathematical origins rather than being derived from some more complex model for a target system. What connection these maps are supposed to have with the space of possibilities of actual systems is difficult to see.

6. As long as there is some uncertainty in the initial data of a target system even a very faithful model’s output will diverge away from the behavior of the target system. This is because any uncertainty in ascertaining the true initial conditions leads to divergence in the model behavior from the system behavior (Smith 2003); and, there is no way to reduce this uncertainty to zero (e.g., Bishop 2003).

7. Some have argued that classical chaos cannot amplify quantum indeterminacy because of environmentally induced decoherence (e.g., Berry 2001). However, such arguments invoking environmental decoherence seriously underestimate what is going on physically in the relationship between QM and CM (see §6.3 below).

8. For difficulties marrying up classical and quantum phase spaces, see (Bishop and Kronz 1999, pp. 135-136).

9. Control parameters are particular variables or other features of a system–e.g., temperature, voltage, flow rate–that we can change in a precise fashion and then observe how the system behaves as this parameter varies. These parameters make reference to structural aspects of the systems in question, like changes in temperature reflecting the energy input into the system.

10. So far as I know, there is no agreement on any quantum property that could distinguish between chaotic and non-chaotic quantum systems (Weigert 1992).

11. Wigner originally derived these distributions for complex (heavy) nuclei by assuming that, in the Heisenberg representation using typical basis vectors, the matrix elements of the Hamiltonian can be treated as if they are Gaussian random numbers. This produces a model, known as a random matrix model, that has no free parameters and is invariant under a wide range of change of basis. Wigner’s random matrix model was very successful in describing the energy spectra of complex quantum systems.

12. If the time evolution of a system requires at least \(N\) bits of input information about the initial state to obtain \(N\) bits of output information about its future state, then it is algorithmically complex. The string of information describing the future state given the initial state cannot be compressed at all. Classical chaotic trajectories are always algorithmically complex.

13. Even if one uses David Bohm’s version of QM (Bohm 1951; Bohm and Hiley 1993), which has continuous particle trajectories in spacetime, there are still important conceptual differences (e.g., the presence of an all-pervasive quantum potential in Bohm’s theory).

14. While it is true that apparent indeterminism can be generated if the state space one uses to analyze chaotic behavior is coarse-grained, this produces only an epistemic form of indeterminism leaving the ontological character of the underlying equations fully deterministic.

15. Note that Smart’s objection presupposes mind-brain identity (see The Identity Theory of Mind).

16. Many authors have concluded that Prigogine and collaborators were arguing that trajectories did not exist (e.g., Bricmont 1995), but this is not the case. The matter is somewhat technical and the Brussels-Austin Group has been notoriously unclear in writing about this point (see Bishop 2004).

Copyright © 2015 by
Robert Bishop <>

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