From the Boston Tea Party to Mahatma Gandhi’s Salt March, and from suffragists’ illegally casting their ballots to whites-only lunch counter sit-ins, civil disobedience has often played a crucial role in bending the proverbial arc of the moral universe toward justice. But what, if anything, do these acts, and countless others which we refer to as civil disobedience have in common? What distinguishes them from other forms of conscientious and political action?
On the most widely accepted account, civil disobedience is a public, non-violent and conscientious breach of law undertaken with the aim of bringing about a change in laws or government policies (Rawls 1999, 320). On this account, people who engage in civil disobedience operate at the boundary of fidelity to law, have general respect for their regime, and are willing to accept the legal consequences of their actions, as evidence of their fidelity to the rule of law. Civil disobedience, given its place at the boundary of fidelity to law, is said on this view to fall between legal protest, on the one hand, and conscientious refusal, uncivil disobedience, militant protest, organized forcible resistance, and revolutionary action, on the other hand.
This picture of civil disobedience, and the broader accounts offered in response, will be examined in the first section of this entry, which considers conceptual issues. The second section contrasts civil disobedience, broadly, with other types of protest. The third focuses on the justification of civil disobedience, examining upstream why civil disobedience needs to be justified, and downstream what is its value and role in society. The fourth examines states’ appropriate responses to civil disobedience.
- 1. Features of Civil Disobedience
- 2. Other Types of Protest
- 3. Justification
- 4. Responding to Civil Disobedience
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Henry David Thoreau is widely credited with coining the term civil disobedience. For years, Thoreau refused to pay his state poll tax as a protest against the institution of slavery, the extermination of Native Americans, and the war against Mexico. When a Concord, Massachusetts, constable named Sam Staples asked Thoreau to pay his back taxes in 1846 and Thoreau refused, Staples escorted him to jail. In a public lecture that Thoreau gave twice in 1848, he justified his tax refusal as a way to withdraw cooperation with the government and he called on his fellow townspeople to do the same. Thoreau’s lecture, titled “The Rights and Duties of the Individual in relation to Government,” formed the basis of his 1849 essay, “Resistance to Civil Government.” In 1866, four years after Thoreau’s death, the essay was republished under the title “Civil Disobedience.” Some scholars believe the new title was provided by Thoreau’s sister Sophia, his sole literary executor and sole editor of his posthumous edited works (Fedorko 2016). But others have provided evidence for Thoreau’s authority over the edits in the 1866 text (Dawson 2007).
Whereas Thoreau understood the “civil” in civil disobedience to characterize the political relations between civilian subjects and their civil government, today most scholars and activists understand the “civil” to relate to civility – a kind of self-restraint necessary for concord under conditions of pluralism. The next sub-sections review central features of civil disobedience.
Lawbreaking: First, for an act to be civilly disobedient, it must involve some breach of law. In democratic societies, civil disobedience as such is not a crime. When an agent who engages in civil disobedience is punished by the law, it is not for “civil disobedience,” but for the recognized offenses she commits, such as disturbing the peace, trespassing, damaging property, picketing, violating official injunctions, intimidation, and so on.
When civil disobedients directly break the law that they oppose – such as Rosa Parks violating the Montgomery, Alabama, city ordinance requiring African Americans to sit at the back of public buses and give up those seats to white riders if the front of the bus filled up – they engage in direct civil disobedience. By contrast, when disobedients break a law which, other things being equal, they do not oppose, in order to demonstrate their protest against another law or policy – such as anti-war protesters staging sit-ins in government buildings – they engage in indirect civil disobedience. The distinction between direct and indirect civil disobedience is mainly relevant to the possibility of mounting constitutional test cases, since one cannot test the constitutionality of a law in court without actually breaching it. Although some scholars argue that direct civil disobedience is preferable to its indirect counterpart because it is most clearly legible as an act of protest against the law breached (C. Cohen 1966, 4–5), most scholars maintain the acceptability of indirect disobedience given that not all unjust laws or policies can be disobeyed directly (M. Cohen 1970, 109–110; Rawls 1999, 320; Brownlee 2012, 19–20). For instance, a same-sex couple living in a jurisdiction that forbids same-sex marriage cannot get married in violation of the law. Black Lives Matter activists cannot directly disobey police brutality, stop-and-frisk policing, or the acquittal of police officers who killed unarmed Blacks. Also, even when a person can engage in direct disobedience of a law, doing so may be unduly burdensome, such as when the punishment for the breach would be extreme.
Principledness: An act of lawbreaking must be deliberate, principled, and conscientious, if it is to be civil and, hence, distinguishable from ordinary criminal offenses. Civil disobedience cannot be unintentional (say, done in ignorance of the fact that one is violating the law): it must be undertaken deliberately. Principled disobedience can be distinguished from ordinary criminal offending by examining the motives that underlie the disobedient act. The person must intend to protest laws, policies, institutions, or practices that she believes are unjust on the basis of her sincerely held moral or political commitments. The agent may not be correct or even entirely reasonable about her convictions, but she holds them sincerely. In these ways, principled disobedience is distinct from garden-variety criminal activity, which is generally self-interested and selfish, opportunistic and unprincipled.
Conscientiousness: The deliberate and principled features of civil disobedience are often brought together under the umbrella of conscientiousness and equated with seriousness, sincerity, depth of conviction, and selflessness – again, in order to contrast civil disobedience with criminal lawbreaking. In response, some scholars highlight the pervasiveness of self-interested civil disobedience – of the ‘not in my backyard’ variety (e.g., people protesting against a new highway passing through their neighborhood) – as a challenge to the supposed conscientiousness of all civil disobedience (Celikates 2016, 38). Others insist that civil disobedience need not be selfless: oppressed groups indeed have a lot to gain from their anti-oppression struggles, including better life prospects, improved material conditions, and heightened self-respect (Delmas 2019, 183–4). And, unsurprisingly, many of the most famous civil disobedients – Mohandas Gandhi, Rosa Parks, Martin Luther King, Jr., Nelson Mandela – were members of the groups whose rights they sought to champion. But conscientiousness – understood as sincerity and seriousness – does not require selflessness, and ordinary crime should not be equated with selfishness, as the example of Robin Hood illustrates. That said, some thinkers also challenge the requirement of seriousness by regarding, for example, the DDoS (distributed denial-of-service) attacks undertaken by Anonymous, such as Operation: Avenge Assange, as acts of civil disobedience, despite their ‘lulz-seeking’, playful and non-serious motivations (Celikates and de Zeeuw 2016, 211–3).
What makes an act of disobedience civil? Scholars commonly consider all or some of the five features below to define civil disobedience.
Typically, a person who commits an offense has no wish to communicate with her government or society. This is evinced by the fact that usually such a person does not intend to make it known that she has offended. In contrast, civil disobedience is understood as a communicative act – a kind of symbolic speech, which aims to convey a message to a certain audience, such as the government and public. Civil disobedients are thought to contribute arguments to the public sphere. Typically, their message is a call for reform or redress; and their audience is the majority. Civil disobedience is variously described as an act by which “one addresses the sense of justice of the majority of the community” (Rawls 1999, 320), as “a plea for reconsideration” (Singer 1973, 84–92), and as a “symbolic… appeal to the capacity for reason and sense of justice of the majority” (Habermas 1985, 99). Even when scholars expand the central criteria for civil disobedience, they agree that civil disobedience is essentially communicative. In comparison, other types of principled disobedience are not necessarily communicative. For instance, animal rescue primarily seeks to relieve the suffering of the rescued animals; the tactic of environmental sabotage known as ‘tree-spiking’ primarily seeks to prevent or stall the cutting down of trees (Delmas 2018a, 44–45). Both types of action can of course be understood in terms of their messages, too, but communicating such a message is not their primary aim in each case.
On many accounts, civil disobedience must be not only communicative, but also public in a specific way. Publicity may designate different features: (i) the openness of the act, (ii) non-anonymity of the agent, (iii) advance warning of planned action, (iv) responsibility-taking for the action, or (v) an appeal based in publicly shared principles of justice. The first four requirements may be classified together under the umbrella of publicity-as-visibility, while the fifth can be dubbed publicity-as-appeal. Since the latter requirement matters mainly for the justification of civil disobedience, it is discussed below (§3.2). That said, Rawls (1999, 321), for one, clarifies the publicity of civil disobedience by describing it as a “political act,” to wit, “an act guided and justified by political principles, that is, by the principles of justice which regulate the constitution and social institutions generally,” thereby suggesting that publicity-as-appeal is in fact part of the definition of civil disobedience.
Rawls and Hugo Bedau (1961, 655), on whom Rawls relies, defend all of the features of publicity-as-visibility, arguing that civil disobedience could never be covert or secretive but could only ever be committed in public, openly, and with advance warning to authorities (per (i)–(iii); and additionally that it involves responsibility-taking (iv). The thought is that publicity is crucial to the civil disobedient’s communicative aims and that any violation of these features of publicity would obscure or muddy the nature of civil disobedience as a communicative act. Critics have rejected the requirement to give advance warning as a defining criterion of civil disobedience. If a person publicizes her intention to breach the law, by giving advance notice about it, then she provides legal authorities with the opportunity to abort her action (Dworkin 1985, 115; Smart 1991, 206–7). For instance, anti-nuclear activists who advertise their planned trespass on military property would simply be prevented from executing their action. In this case, not giving advance warning is necessary to accomplish the communicative act.
Some theorists have also denied the first two publicity requirements above that civil disobedients need to act openly and non-anonymously. Some argue that publicity is compatible with covertness and anonymity, so long as agents claim responsibility for their actions after the fact (Greenawalt 1987, 239; Brownlee 2012, 160; Scheuerman 2018, 43–5). For instance, Edward Snowden’s leaks of classified information about the National Security Agency (NSA)’s massive surveillance programs constitute acts of civil disobedience in this view because, although Snowden obtained and leaked the documents covertly, he eventually claimed responsibility and sought to publicly justify his actions (Scheuerman 2014, 617–21; Brownlee 2016, 966). In this view, the only publicity requirement is (iv) that agents take self-identifying responsibility for their actions after the fact. The other requirements of publicity-as-visibility – openness, non-anonymity, and advance warning – can in fact detract from or undermine the attempt to communicate through civil disobedience and are therefore not necessary to identify civil disobedience. Given, however, that there is often widespread reluctance to regard as “civil” covert and anonymous acts of disobedience such as assistance to undocumented migrants or anonymous hacktivism, other thinkers accept (i), (ii), and (iv) as standard requirements of publicity-as-visibility and deem covert acts to be uncivil without pre-judging their degree of justifiability (Delmas 2018a, 44–5).
Like publicity, non-violence is supposed to be essential to the communicativeness of a civilly disobedient act, non-violence being part of its legibility as a mode of address. “To engage in violent acts likely to injure and to hurt is incompatible with civil disobedience as a mode of address. Indeed, any interference with the civil liberties of others tends to obscure the civilly disobedient quality of one’s act” (Rawls 1999, 321). (The strategic and tactical value of non-violence is discussed in §3.3.) Critics have objected to the supposed incompatibility between violence and communication, arguing that violence, depending on its form and targets, does not necessarily obscure the communicative quality of a disobedient’s act. Burning a police car or vandalizing a Confederate monument, as some protesters did under the Black Lives Matter banner, conveys a clear message of opposition to police brutality and anger at the state’s failure to address systemic racism. The compatibility between violence and communication is further underscored in cases of self-directed violence: self-immolation may provide “an eloquent statement of both the dissenter’s frustration and the importance of the issues he addresses” (Brownlee 2012, 21–2). On this basis, some scholars deny altogether the requirement that civil disobedience be non-violent (M. Cohen 1970, 103; Brownlee 2012, 198–9; Moraro 2019, 96–101).
Some scholars also see nothing inherently contradictory in the notion of “violent civil disobedience” independent of its communicative aims. John Morreall views a person’s physical assault on a slave owner chasing a runaway slave, in violation of the Fugitive Slave Act of 1850, as a case of “justifiable violent civil disobedience” (1976, 42–3). Jennifer Welchman considers “violence, threats of violence, covert acts of sabotage, blackmail, and even assault” as means that civil disobedients can justifiably use to obstruct and frustrate injustice (2001, 105). But, arguably this route is too hasty, as it disregards what seems to be an essential and powerful association between civil disobedience and non-violence: the civility of civil disobedience seems to entail non-violence. The difficulty is to specify the appropriate notions of violence and non-violence.
This is a difficult task in part given its high political stakes: protests labeled as non-violent are more likely to be perceived favorably; protests labeled as violent are more likely to alienate the public and to be met with violent repression. In addition, the labeling of protests, as Robin Celikates notes, “far from being a neutral observation, is always a politically charged speech act that can reproduce forms of marginalization and exclusion that are often racialized and gendered” and tends to serve the interests of socially dominant or mainstream voices (2016, 983). On this basis, Celikates casts doubt on the usefulness of “a fixed category of non-violence … for a philosophical analysis of disobedience informed by its social and political reality” (ibid.). Nonetheless, specifying the categories of violence and non-violence is important to push back against disingenuous uses of these categories, as when the police declare a peaceful protest a ‘riot’ – a common occurrence in the 2020 Black Lives Matter protests (ACLED 2020).
One way to conceive of violence is as the use of physical force causing or likely to cause injury (Rawls 1999, 321). However, non-violent acts or even legal acts may indirectly yet foreseeably cause more harm to others than do direct acts of physical force. A legal strike by ambulance workers or a roadblock on an important highway may well have more severe consequences than minor acts of vandalism (Raz 1979, 267). Psychological violence can also cause injury to others. Philosophers typically reject the childhood chant that “sticks and stones may break my bones, but words will never hurt me,” recognizing that harm and injury do not come solely from the use of physical force. For one thing, words can incite physical violence. Words can also hurt even without the threat of physical injury, such as verbal insult and harassment, which can undermine the recipient’s sense of equal standing, self-worth, and safety. The implication for civil disobedience is that the requirement of non-violence prohibits the use of tactics likely to inflict psychological violence on one’s opponents. Aggressive confrontations designed to denigrate and humiliate (distinct from attempts to elicit shame through displays of unearned suffering and appeals to conscience) are incompatible with the civility and non-violence of civil disobedience.
Rawls does not mention, and it is unclear whether, non-violence prohibits certain actions that don’t physically or psychologically injure others but still cause harms, such as property damage (e.g., vandalism), violence to self (e.g., hunger strikes), and coercion (e.g., forceful occupation).
Property damage: Authorities, much of the public, and many scholars tend to conceive of non-violence strictly, as excluding any damage to property (Fortas 1968, 48–9, 123–6; Smith 2013, 3, 33; Smith and Brownlee 2017, 5; Regan 2004). Two broad reasons may explain the inclusion of property damage within the category of violence. One is the classical liberal understanding of private property as an extension of one’s person; the other is the assumption that property damage is likely to lead to violence against persons. John Locke formulates both when he argues it is “lawful for a man to kill a thief, who has not in the least hurt him, nor declared any design upon his life … [because] I have no reason to suppose, that he, who would take away my liberty, would not, when he had me in his power, take away every thing else” (Locke 1690, III §18). By counting all instances of property destruction as violent, such a view dissuades one from drawing evaluative distinctions among different cases, methods, targets, and aims. However, not all property damage is or should be viewed as equal: burning one’s Selective Service card to protest the military draft is not equivalent to burning crosses to intimidate African Americans and Jews; smashing a stained-glass window depicting enslaved persons in a cotton field (as a Yale janitor did in 2016) is not equivalent to smashing the windows of a store in order to loot it. For some thinkers, such differences are not only issues of justification. They insist that violence and non-violence simply do not exhaust the descriptive possibilities and that we should think of property damage as a third conceptual category distinct from the other two and requiring its own evaluative assessment (Sharp 2012a, 307; Delmas 2018a, 49, 244–5). Other scholars have instead argued that non-violence can encompass property damage (Milligan 2013, ch. 2; Scheuerman 2018, 46–7, 77, 87). They hold that civil disobedients can remain non-violent while engaging in selective destruction of property, assuming the damage is minor and relates clearly to the civil disobedient’s message, such as when pacifists hammer warhead nose cones.
Self-violence: Self-violent protests include tactics such as lip-sewing, self-cutting, hunger strikes, self-exposure to the elements, and self-immolation. When theorists list hunger strikes among the tactics of civil disobedience, they often do not address the question of whether self-violence is compatible with non-violence properly conceived, but simply assume an affirmative answer. Some scholars cast doubt on this notion, given the violence of self-destructive protests and given activists’ self-understanding of their own actions (see Bargu’s 2014 critical ethnographic study on the 2000–2007 death fast by left-wing militants in Turkish prisons). A notable exception to the theoretical neglect of self-violence is Gandhi (1973, 103–5, 120–5), who thought that hunger strikes were coercive and violent but that fasts of moral pressure and Satyagrahic fasts were persuasive and non-violent (Sharp 2012a, 134, 151, 262); and likewise, that self-immolation could accord with non-violence (ahimsa) and be fueled by satyagraha (‘Truth-force’ in Sanskrit) under the right circumstances (Gandhi 1999, 79.177; Milligan 2014, 295–9).
Coercion and persuasion: Theorists often complete the dichotomy between violence and non-violence by seeing violence as a means of coercion, non-violence as a means of persuasion, and the two as incompatible. Coercion can be defined as “any interference by an agent, A, in the choices of another agent, B, with the aim of compelling B to behave in a way that they would not otherwise do” (Aitchison 2018a, 668; see also entry on coercion). Persuasion, by contrast, requires initiating a dialogue with an interlocutor and aiming to elicit a change of position or even their moral conversion. Coercive tactics impose costs on opponents. For instance, land occupation by environmental activists is designed to prevent or delay oil pipeline construction. Boycotts are also considered to be coercive tactics to the extent that they impose acute costs on businesses (through lost revenue) and sometimes involve intimidation and the threat of force to ensure maximum compliance with the boycott (Umoja 2013, 135–42). Some theorists of civil disobedience hold that civil disobedients cannot resort to coercion; they can only seek to persuade and appeal to their opponent’s moral conscience, which excludes confrontational and coercive tactics (Lefkowitz 2007, 216; Brownlee 2012, 24).
Practitioners and other critics maintain that this dichotomy between non-violent persuasion and violent coercion is false on the grounds that there is such a thing as ‘non-violent coercion’, which is furthermore compatible with the goal of moral suasion. Non-violence appeals to the conscience of the public, by eliciting shame and indignation at the witnessing of civil disobedients’ suffering and their discipline in the face of violent repression. After the 1955–56 Montgomery bus boycott, which unleashed spectacular white retaliatory violence, Martin Luther King, Jr., saw appeals to conscience as insufficient without disruption and “some form of constructive coercive power” (King 1968, 137). “Nonviolent coercion always brings tension to the surface”, he wrote (ibid.), affirming “the coercive face of nonviolence” along with its persuasive face (Livingston 2020a, 704; see also Terry 2018, 305). “The purpose of our direct action program,” King proclaimed in his ‘Letter from a Birmingham Jail’, “is to create a situation so crisis packed that it will inevitably open the door to negotiation” (King 1991). Non-violent action is thus the means to the goal of both forcing negotiations – an essential “mechanism for social change” (Atack 2012, 139) – and of persuading – its corresponding mechanism for moral and cultural change. This leaves open the question whether confrontational attacks that single out particular persons through harassment, doxing, and ‘calling out’ are compatible with non-violence. Such acts are coercive and, like verbal insults, they may be said to inflict psychological violence on the target.
Civil disobedients are standardly expected to take responsibility for, and accept the legal consequences of, their lawbreaking. Their evading punishment would make their acts ordinary crimes or acts of rebellion; their willingness to invite punishment is supposed to demonstrate their endorsement of the legal system’s legitimacy and their “intense concern over the issue at hand” (C. Cohen 1966, 6; see also Brownlee 2012 ch. 1; Tai 2017, 146). Non-evasion is an essential correlate of the conscientiousness and non-violence of civil disobedience: submitting to law enforcement is part of the dramatic display of suffering required by non-violence. That said, theorists have fleshed out this requirement of non-evasion in different ways, arguing variously that the agent must (i) willingly submit to arrest and prosecution, (ii) plead guilty in court, (iii) not try to defend her crime, and/or (iv) not complain about the punishment received (Delmas 2019, arguing that only (i) is necessarily entailed by non-evasion). Some theorists reject (ii) and (iii), proposing instead that agents plead ‘not guilty’ in court, so as to deny the state’s characterization of the civil disobedient act as a public wrong (in this view, disobedients should either deny responsibility of having committed the action as alleged by the prosecutor or admit responsibility but deny criminal liability) (Moraro 2019, 143–7). Indeed, while the civil disobedient who pleads ‘guilty’ and does not try to defend her ‘crime’ highlights her willingness to self-sacrifice, a ‘not guilty’ plea accompanied by a defense of her action might be more effective at communicating her convictions and persuading others, including by inviting jury nullification. By contrast, some thinkers reject (i) and (iv) on the grounds that when civil disobedience is morally justified, the state’s imposition of punishment is itself problematic and arguably impermissible, so that further protests against civil disobedients’ arrests, prosecutions, and sentences are justified (Zinn 2002, 27–31). Critics have also noted that punishment can be detrimental to dissenters’ efforts by compromising future attempts to assist others through protest (Greenawalt 1987, 239) and that willingness to accept punishment cannot be reasonably expected when agents know they risk heavy fines or very long sentences for their actions (Scheuerman 2018, 49–51).
In some views, being civil means that civil disobedients behave in a dignified and respectful manner by following the conventional social scripts that spell out displays of dignity and ways of showing respect in their society. Some theorists understand civility itself as respect for “minimal civil norms” (Milligan 2013, ch. 2); others count decorum as an additional, implicit requirement of civility in line with manifestations of self-restraint (Delmas in Çıdam, et al. 2020, 524–5). Decorum may be understood to prohibit conduct that would be seen as offensive, insulting, or obscene (with the standards for each varying widely across cultures). In Scheuerman’s view, Gandhi and King, but not liberals and democrats, thought that politeness and decorum had a role to play (2018, 11–31). Yet one reason to think that decorum has seeped into the common understanding of civil disobedience is that it helps to explain why some protests by Pussy Riot, ACT UP, and Black Lives Matter, among others, which were conscientious, communicative, public, non-violent, and non-evasive, were denied the label civil: to wit, because protesters shouted down their opponents, expressed anger, used offensive language, or disrespected religious sites (Delmas 2020, 18–9). Critics, however, deny that civil disobedience needs to be decorous and push back against denials of civility, insofar as these are often deployed to silence activists (Harcourt 2012; Zerilli 2014). They deem expressions of anger and offensive or obscene displays to be compatible with civility (Scheuerman 2019, 5–7; Çıdam, et al. 2020, 517–8) and insist on dissociating the politics of ‘respectability’ from civil disobedience (Pineda 2021a, 161–3).
What makes an act of civil disobedience special? On some accounts, an act that satisfies the criteria of civility identified above, especially non-evasion, signals disobedients’ respect for and fidelity to the legal system in which they carry out their protest, in contrast with ordinary offenders and revolutionary agents (Rawls 1999, 322). Signaling one’s fidelity to law by abiding the demands of civility is seen as necessary to thwart fears of disorder or counter the impression that civil disobedients are contemptuous of democratic procedures. Critics point out that agents do not necessarily respect, nor have any reasons to respect, the legal system in which they carry out their civil disobedience (Lyons 1998, 33–6). It is thus useful to distinguish the outward features of the civilly disobedient act from the inward attitudes of the civilly disobedient agent.
Many thinkers argue that the link between the disobedient act’s civility and her fidelity to law or endorsement of the legal system can indeed be pulled apart. For one thing, agents intent on overthrowing their government may well resort to civil tactics simply because civil disobedience works (Sharp 2012b). Some theorists nonetheless hold on to the connection between civility and fidelity to law. For instance, some discard some of the requirements of civility but maintain that the civilly disobedient agent can still be motivated by respect for law and act within the limits of fidelity to law while disobeying covertly, evading punishment, damaging property, or offending the public (Brownlee 2012, 24–9; Scheuerman 2018, 49–53; Moraro 2019, 96–101). Others hold that it is worthwhile to maintain the link between the act’s civility and its conveying fidelity to law, whether or not agents actually endorse the system’s legitimacy, insofar as its self-restraint holds the key to civil disobedience’s place in democratic culture (Smith 2013, 32–5; Delmas 2019, 173–4).
Other theorists deny that civil disobedients need to demonstrate fidelity to law, taking what Scheuerman (2015) dubs an anti-legal turn. Civility, on a number of recent accounts (Brownlee 2012 ch. 1; Moraro 2019, ch. 2; M. Cooke 2021), is satisfied when agents aim to communicate with an audience and engage with the public sphere. On a radical understanding, the civility of civil disobedience is compatible with tactics “that will be regarded as uncivil because of their confrontational or even violent character, including massive disruption, the destruction of property, and the use of restrained force in self-defense,” only excluding para-military confrontation (Celikates 2021, 143).
This anti-legal turn goes along with what we may call a critical turn in scholarship on civil disobedience. Not only do theorists critique the liberal account of civil disobedience as unduly narrow and restrictive (as contemporary critics of Rawls already did) and articulate a more inclusive concept; but they also critique the ideology that undergirds the common account, uncovering the ways in which it distorts the reality of the practice, deters resistance, and buttresses the status quo (Celikates 2014, 2016; Delmas 2018a, ch. 1; Pineda 2021b, ch. 1). In this vein, several scholars have reassessed the complex legacy of Thoreau and Gandhi to the civil disobedience tradition, in order to both show the misappropriation of their writings on political resistance and to call for a reappropriation and appreciation of their visions (Mantena 2012; Hanson 2021; Livingston 2018; Scheuerman 2018, ch. 1, 4). Scholars have also reconsidered the historical record of the American Civil Rights Movement to excavate the radical understanding of civil disobedience forged by actors themselves, in lieu of the romantic and sanitized version that dominates public perception of the Movement (Hooker 2016; Livingston 2020a, 2020b; Pineda 2021b, ch. 2–5; Mantena 2018; and Shelby and Terry 2018). Setting the record straight matters not just for historical accuracy but also because the Civil Rights Movement is used as the benchmark to judge contemporary protest movements such as Black Lives Matter, unfavorably comparing today’s activists with an idealized standard with the effect of prejudicing the public against them.
Although civil disobedience often overlaps broadly with other types of dissent, nevertheless some distinctions may be drawn between the key features of civil disobedience and the key features of these other practices.
The obvious difference between legal protest and civil disobedience is that the former lies within the bounds of the law, but the latter does not. Legal ways of protesting include, among many others, making speeches, signing petitions, organizing for a cause, donating money, taking part in authorized demonstrations, and boycotting. Some of these can become illegal, for instance when law enforcement declares an assembly unlawful and orders the crowd to disperse, or under anti-boycott legislation. Some causes may also be declared illegal, such that one cannot be associated with the cause or donate to it (such as the Communist Party in the U.S.). Most of the features exemplified in civil disobedience – other than its illegality – can be found in legal protest: a conscientious and communicative demonstration of protest, a desire to bring about through moral dialogue some lasting change in policy or principle, an attempt to educate and to raise awareness, and so on.
A practice distinct from, but related to, civil disobedience is rule departure on the part of authorities. Rule departure is essentially the deliberate decision by an official, for conscientious reasons, not to discharge the duties of her office (Feinberg 1992, 152). If an official’s breach of a specific duty is more in keeping with the spirit and overall aims of the office than a painstaking respect for its particular duties is, then the former might be said to adhere better than the latter does to the demands of the office (Greenawalt 1987, 281). Rule departures resemble civil disobedience in that both communicate the agent’s dissociation from and condemnation of certain policies and practices. Civil disobedience and rule departure differ mainly in the identity of their practitioners and in their legality. First, whereas rule departure typically is done by an agent of the state (including citizens serving in juries), civil disobedience typically is done by citizens (including officials acting as ordinary citizens and not in the capacity of their official role). Second, whereas the civil disobedient breaks the law, the official who departs from the rules associated with her role is not usually violating the law, unless the rule she breaks is also codified in law. For instance, jurors may refuse to convict a person for violating an unjust law. When they do, they nullify the law. However, many judges forbid any mention of jury nullification in their courtroom, so that jurors are not allowed to advise each other of the possibility to refuse to convict (Brooks 2004).
Conscientious objection may be defined as a refusal to conform to some rule, mandate, or legal directive on grounds of personal opposition to it. Examples include conscripts refusing to serve in the army; public officials refusing to issue same-sex marriage licenses; and parents refusing to vaccinate their children as mandated by state law. Public officials’ conscientious objection is indistinguishable from rule departures insofar as the agent refuses to discharge the set of duties associated with her official role. Conscientious objectors’ non-conformity may stem from very different kinds of motives: the conscript’s religious pacifism or moral and political opposition to a particular war or military occupation, for instance, has little in common with anti-vaxxers’ pseudo-scientific beliefs. But, in many views, conscientious objection is conscientious in the sense identified above, that is to say, sincere, serious, and reflecting the depth of the person’s conviction. In other views, however, when an objector seeks to keep her act private and to avoid detection, this casts doubt on her sincerity and seriousness (Brownlee 2012, ch. 1). As an objection, conscientious objection also shares with civil disobedience the agent’s opposition to the law, since the conscientious objector refuses to conform with the law because she considers it bad or wrong, totally or in part, and thus seeks to disassociate herself from it.
Conscientious objection is often considered to be the private counterpart of civil disobedience: where civil disobedients address the public, are motivated by and appeal to general considerations of justice, and seek to bring about reform, conscientious objectors are supposed to be animated by personal convictions and to simply seek to preserve their own moral integrity through exemption (Smith and Brownlee 2017). For instance, consider that the refusal of Jehovah’s Witnesses to salute the flag is a matter of private religious morality; they do not seek to abolish the practice of saluting the flag for all citizens. Their example is instructive in another way: Jehovah’s Witnesses’ refusal is legally protected. Conscientious objection, unlike civil disobedience, is not necessarily unlawful. Indeed, the law protects conscientious objectors in many contexts, including in the military and healthcare, by carving out exemptions for them.
Some thinkers distinguish conscientious objection from conscientious evasion and stress that we should not overstate the private and personal characteristics of the former. Conscientious objectors often act openly and non-anonymously and take responsibility for their non-conforming act by attempting or being willing to justify it to authorities. To that extent, they may be said to meet the publicity-as-visibility requirement. Some agents, in contrast, undertake their conscientious objection covertly and evasively as conscientious evasion. A young man drafted to fight a war he opposes, for instance, may openly refuse to serve and be arrested and charged for his refusal, or covertly dodge the draft by going AWOL. While conscientious evasion is incompatible with the intention to communicate, conscientious objection may have a public or communicative component, as Thoreau clearly did with his conscientious tax refusal, in a way that blurs the distinction with civil disobedience. Moreover, when such actions are taken by many people – as they often are – their collective impact can approximate the kind of communicative protest exemplified in civil disobedience (Delmas 2018a, ch. 7). In this vein, Emanuela Ceva (2015) highlights the public and political character of conscientious objection (what we call publicity-as-appeal above), which she conceives of as ‘a form of political participation’.
Writings on immigration and on civil disobedience have merged into an area of research devoted to principled disobedience in response to anti-immigration policies. One view, which focuses on what individual actors should do about immigration, examines various unlawful tactics of resistance, including evasion, deception, use of force against state officials, and smuggling (Hidalgo 2019, chs. 5–6). Another view conceives of illegal migration as a form of resistance to global poverty (Blunt 2019, ch. 4), while a third sees unauthorized border crossing as a type of conscientious evasion (Cabrera 2010, 136–43, 165). It is further useful to distinguish transnational civil disobedience from global civil disobedience. Transnational (or trans-state) civil disobedience is the principled violation of a state’s law or policy (a) by individuals who are not citizens or authorized permanent residents of that state, such as asylum-seekers marching from Hungary to Austria against E.U. regulations; or (b) by the state’s own citizens on behalf of outsiders, such as U.S. citizens active in the Sanctuary movement who provided illegal assistance to asylum-seekers from Central America in the 1980s. Both kinds of cases involve at root the “principled claim… that the state’s law is misaligned with the foundational moral principles of the current global system” (Cabrera 2021, 322). Acts of global civil disobedience, on this view, involve “claims implicating structural principles of the global system itself, as misaligned with its foundational moral principles” (Cabrera ibid.). For instance, when the sans-papiers in France openly protest against their socio-political and legal exclusion through occupations, demonstrations, and hunger strikes, they may be viewed as engaged in acts of global civil disobedience. One last useful category of principled disobedience that relates to immigration restrictions, although it overlaps with rule departures and conscientious objection, is official or local disobedience, as when local authorities declare themselves ‘Sanctuary cities’ to protect immigrants by refusing to cooperate with federal authorities (Blake and Hereth 2020, 468–71. See also Applbaum 1999, ch. 9 on ‘official disobedience’ and Scheuerman 2020 on ‘state-based’ or ‘political institutional civil disobedience’).
Digitalization – access to personal computers and the Internet – has transformed not only our lives and interactions, but also our disobedient practices. From piracy to DDoS attacks and from open-access coding to Digital Care Packages (which provide tools to circumvent censorship and surveillance), digital disobedience has emerged as a rich terrain for theoretical inquiry. Scholars disagree about the application of the defining features of civil disobedience to the digital, e.g., whether client-sided DDoS actions, which involve only voluntary botnets, amount to “virtual sit-ins”; whether hacktivists such as Anonymous may be considered civil disobedients despite their covert and evasive actions, their penchant for pranks, and their singling out of particular individuals for doxing and retaliation (such as in Operation Hunt Hunter which targeted ‘revenge porn’ magnate Hunter Moore); or whether the use of zombie botnets in DDoS attacks and the cost of updating security systems for the target evinces the violation of non-violence (see, e.g., Critical Art Ensemble 1998; Himma 2006; Scheuerman 2018, ch. 6; Celikates 2015, 2016; Sauter 2016; Delmas 2018b; Züger 2021).
These debates aside, it is useful to distinguish different kinds of digital tools, sites, strategies, and aims. First, activists use digital technology as tools to organize, document, communicate, raise funds, and make decisions. For instance, Black Lives Matter activists use social media to promote their cause, raise consciousness about systemic racism, and publicize instances of police brutality. They use crowdfunding platforms for fundraising to cover bail and other legal expenses for those arrested. They encourage people to use police scanner apps to watch police activity and legal assistance apps to record encounters with law enforcement officials. Second, the digital is itself a crucial site and object of activism. Hacktivists envision a different Internet – one that is democratic and democratically controlled, free, respectful of privacy, and creative. They protest against the digital architecture of surveillance and control that has been imposed on netizens without their consent. For instance, a number of websites, search engines, and online communities launched coordinated actions in 2012 to protest against the Stop Online Piracy Act (SOPA) and the Protect IP Act (PIPA), whose overbroad scope they saw as threats to online freedom of speech. Third, some properly digital strategies of principled disobedience have emerged, such as DDoS actions, web defacement, and hacking. For instance, the No Border network created a fake Lufthansa website touting its “Deportation Class service … the most economic way to travel the world” (“special restrictions apply … no round trips available”). The Open Access Movement, which advocates for open-source software and an open-source repository of academic and scientific research, combines all three dimensions of digital disobedience: it uses networked computers to organize and communicate; it seeks to bring about a free Internet characterized by the free flow of software, science, and culture and has developed a coherent political platform in its defense; and it deploys properly digital strategies, such as illegal downloads and peer-to-peer file sharing (which is illegal when the content torrented is copyrighted material). The Open Access Movement epitomizes a public, geeks-and-grassroots mass movement that not only promotes online democratic governance, but also enacts it within the movement (Swartz 2008 [Other Internet Resources]; Delmas 2018b, 79–80).
Uncivil disobedience is not a distinct category of political action, but a cluster concept or umbrella term that can be used to designate acts of principled disobedience that may or may not be communicative, and which violate one or more of the marks of civility by being covert, violent, evasive, or offensive (Delmas 2018a, 2020; Lai 2019). Examples include animal rescue, Sanctuary assistance, sabotage, ecotage (e.g., monkeywrenching and tree-spiking), graffiti, leaks, government whistleblowing, hacktivism (including DDoS attacks), guerrilla protests, and riots. These various act-types do not share any essential property, besides violating one or more of the commonly accepted criteria of civility. Each form of uncivil disobedience must be examined (conceptualized and assessed) on its own. By conceptualizing uncivil disobedience, scholars intend to counter the theoretical impetus to make the concept of civil disobedience ever broader to encompass protests that one approves of, but which do not fit the standard account and may not even fit activists’ self-understanding either. For instance, in her 1913 speech “Freedom or Death”, the suffragist Emmeline Pankhurst described herself as a “soldier” in a “civil war” waged against the state and defended the use of militant tactics, including heckling, window-smashing, sabotage, arson, and hunger strikes: radical defiance was the point of such uncivil tactics. Identifying some principled disobedient acts as uncivil makes room to focus on their justification. Scholars have defended such uncivil disobedience as political rioting (Pasternak 2019), vandalism (Lim 2020; Lai 2020), violent protest (Kling and Mitchell 2019), coercive strike tactics (Gourevitch 2018), and direct action (Smith 2018).
While a civil disobedient does not necessarily oppose the regime in which she acts, the revolutionary agent is deeply opposed to that regime (or a core aspect of that regime). Revolutionary agents may not seek to persuade others of the merits of their position – communication is usually not their primary aim, although they convey the urgency of a regime change. When revolution is called for, such as under colonial occupation, there is no need to justify constrained acts of protest like civil disobedience. Indeed, more forceful resistance can be justified as we pass into the realm of just war theory (Buchanan 2013; Finlay 2015). This is not to say that all violent tactics, including terror, are permissible, since the use of violence must not only pursue a just cause but also accord with proportionality and necessity (i.e., be undertaken in last resort and with a reasonable chance of success). As will be discussed in the next section, revolutionary activists and thinkers like Frantz Fanon (2004, ch. 1) and Gandhi disagreed about the effectiveness of violence in emancipatory struggles, but not about its justifiability, as Karuna Mantena (2018, 83–4) has shown.
The task of defending civil disobedience is commonly undertaken with the assumption that in reasonably just, liberal societies people have a general moral duty to follow the law (often called political obligation). It is on the basis of such an assumption that civil disobedience requires justification. This section examines common understandings of the problem of disobedience (3.1), before presenting prominent accounts and critiques of the conditions under which civil disobedience may be justified (3.2). Whether or not theorists assume that civil disobedience is presumptively impermissible and in need of justification, their analyses also articulate the value and role of civil disobedience in non-ideal, nearly just or less-than-nearly-just liberal democracies (3.3).
Philosophers have given many arguments in favor of the moral duty to obey the law (see entry on political obligation). Despite the many critiques of, and general skepticism toward, arguments for the moral duty to obey the law, most prominently following A. John Simmons (1979), theorists of civil disobedience have continued to conceive of the practice’s illegality as a hurdle to surmount (see Lyons 1998 for an analysis of the endurance of such a problematic assumption). They conceive of principled disobedience in general as presumptively wrong because it violates political obligation, undermines the rule of law, and destabilizes society both through example, by signaling to others that anyone can disobey if they feel the urge, and in principle, by expressing disrespect for law’s authority. They contend that civil disobedience in particular is presumptively wrong because of its anti-democratic nature. The agent who violates the outcomes of democratic decision-making processes because she disapproves of them puts herself above the law and threatens the legal and democratic order. Some see in it a violation of reciprocity, a kind of political “blackmail” and a sign of “moral self-indulgence” and arrogance, insofar as a minority, whose views didn’t prevail, disregards democratic processes and imposes on the majority its own view of the good and just (C. Cohen 1971, 138–45; Dworkin 1985, 112; Weinstock 2016, 709; for a response to the charge of ‘epistemic arrogance’, see Hindkjær Madsen 2021).
Recent scholarship on civil disobedience has taken what may be dubbed an anarchist turn, as theorists tend to no longer approach civil disobedience as presumptively wrong and in tension with political obligation. Although some theorists still defend the latter (Smith 2013), most start from skepticism vis-à-vis the moral duty to obey the law (Brownlee 2012; Celikates 2014, 2016). Others defend a disjunctive moral duty to obey the law or disobey it civilly (Lefkowitz 2007); and still others argue that the grounds commonly used to support political obligation – the natural duty of justice, the principle of fairness, the Samaritan duty, and associative obligations – yield duties to resist injustice, through civil and uncivil disobedience, under non-ideal circumstances, and that such duties should be considered among our political obligations (Delmas 2018a). Likewise, on a virtue-ethical account, political obligation can be understood as an obligation to respect rather than to obey the law, which can sometimes give rise to a duty to engage in civil disobedience (Moraro 2019, ch. 6).
Given the assumption that people have a moral duty to obey the law and the concern that civil disobedience has the potential to destabilize society, Rawls famously raised the bar for the justified use of the practice, requiring acts of civil disobedience 1) to target serious and long-standing injustice and at the same time appeal to widely accepted principles of justice, 2) to be undertaken as a last resort, and 3) to be done in coordination with other minority groups with similar grievances (Rawls 1999, 326–9). These conditions for the justification of civil disobedience, which are critically examined in this part, are closely tied not only to the ostensible need to diffuse its destabilizing potential and discourage proliferation of the practice, but also to the efficacy and role of civil disobedience in society (which is explored further in 3.3).
Longstanding Injustice: Why did Rawls restrict the target of civil disobedience to entrenched, longstanding injustices – in particular, violations of the principle of equal basic liberties? For Rawls, civil disobedience’s chance of success rests on the clarity of the injustice: everyone must be able to recognize the violation as an injustice, given widely accepted principles of political morality. Racial segregation fell in this category, according to Rawls, but not economic inequality. Rawls thinks that appeals to publicly shared principles of constitutional morality (per the publicity-as-appeal requirement) are more likely to persuade the majority and succeed to bring about reform. Rawls, Jürgen Habermas, and Ronald Dworkin restrict both civil disobedients’ appeals and their possible targets: they exclude matters of policy, as well as injustices that do not consist of incontrovertible violations of widely accepted principles of justice.
Critics reject this justificatory condition because it arbitrarily excludes both progressive but not widely shared conceptions of justice (such as cosmopolitanism) and appeals to other principles of morality besides justice (say, regarding the ethical treatment of animals; Singer 1973, 86–92). And whereas Dworkin (1985, 111–2) finds anti-nuclear protest unjustifiable to the extent that it turns on judgments of policy instead of appealing to fundamental principles of political morality, Robert Goodin (1987) counters that the justice/policy distinction is flimsy and arbitrarily drawn and insists that civil disobedients should pursue the common good by protesting international and climate policies. Scholars also include in the class of justifiable targets private agents such as trade unions, banks, health insurance companies, labs, farm factories, and private universities (Walzer 1982, ch.2; Smith 2013, 55–6; Milligan 2013, ch. 11–12; S. Cooke 2016). Finally, observation of past and present social movements, including the Abolitionist movement, #MeToo, and Black Lives Matter, suggests that, rather than appealing to the public principles of political morality, civil disobedients may in fact seek to transform common sense morality.
Last Resort: What grounds the widely accepted requirement that civil disobedience be undertaken as a last resort? How do we know agents have met it? One position is that, in a liberal democracy, citizens should use proper legal channels of political participation to express their grievances (Raz 1979; though Raz grants that individual acts of disobedience can be justified in liberal regimes). But, since causes defended by a minority are often those most opposed by persons in power, legal channels may be less than wholly effective (Rawls 1999, 327). Moreover, it is unclear when a person could claim to have reached a situation of last resort; she could continue to use the same tired legal methods without end. To ward off such challenges, Rawls suggests that, if past actions, including by others, have shown the majority to be immovable or apathetic, then further attempts may reasonably be thought fruitless and the dissenter may be confident her civil disobedience is a last resort (1999, 328).
Minority Group Coordination: The coordination requirement is designed to regulate the overall level of dissent (Rawls 1999, 327). The idea is that since minority groups are equally justified in resorting to civil disobedience when they have sufficiently weighty objections, these groups should avoid undermining each other’s efforts through simultaneous appeals to the attention of society and government. While there is some merit to this condition, arguably civil disobedience that does not meet it can still be justifiable. In some cases, there will be no time or opportunity to coordinate with other minorities. In other cases, other minority groups may be unable or unwilling to coordinate. The refusal or inability of other groups to cooperate should arguably not affect the ultimate defensibility of a person’s or group’s use of civil disobedience.
A reason for Rawls to defend this coordination requirement is that often coordination serves a more important concern, namely, the achievement of good consequences. It is often argued that civil disobedience can only be justified if there is a high probability that it will produce positive change, since only such change can justify exposing society to the risks of harm usually associated with civil disobedience – namely, its destabilizing and divisive potential and the risk that it could encourage lawbreaking or escalate into uncivil disobedience. In response to these challenges, one might question the empirical claims that civil disobedience is divisive and that it has the consequence of leading others to use disobedience to achieve changes in policy. One might also question whether it necessarily would be a bad thing if civil disobedience had these consequences. Concerning likelihood of success, civil disobedience can seem most justifiable when the situation appears hopeless and when the government refuses to listen to conventional forms of communication. Additionally, even when general success seems unlikely, civil disobedience might be defended for any reprieve from harm that it brings to victims of a bad law or policy. Tree-hugging, for example, can delay or curtail a clear-cut logging scheme and thereby prolong the protection of an ecosystem.
The justification of civil disobedience further articulates the conditions for its effective role in society. Far from undermining the rule of law or destabilizing society, civil disobedience could strengthen the social and legal order. Civil disobedience can have a justice-enhancing value: it can serve “to inhibit departures from justice and to correct them when they occur” (Rawls 1999, 336). Equally, it can have a legitimacy-enhancing function, with some thinkers conceiving of civil disobedience as ‘the guardian of legitimacy’ (Habermas 1985, 103). Both ideas deem the practice of civil disobedience to be a valuable component of the public political culture of a near-just constitutional democratic society. Habermas even took the state’s treatment of civil disobedience as a ‘litmus test’ for the maturity of the political culture of a constitutional democracy: “Every constitutional democracy that is sure of itself considers civil disobedience as a normalized – because necessary – component of its political culture” (Habermas 1985, 99).
While Habermas’s account resembles Rawls’s liberal approach in many ways, its distinctive deliberative strand has also influenced democracy-based accounts, which defend the justification and role of civil disobedience on the basis of its contribution to democracy. Deliberative democrats (Markovits 2005; Smith 2013, ch. 1–3), republican democrats (Arendt 1972), and radical democrats (Celikates 2014, 2016) focus on the potential of civil disobedience to enhance democratic legitimacy and to constitute in itself a form of democratic empowerment. Agents engaged in civil disobedience can enhance democratic legitimacy in a number of ways, including by putting a heretofore-neglected issue on the political agenda and raising awareness about its stakes; contributing to and informing democratic deliberation; highlighting the outsize influence of powerful players and the exclusionary effects of certain processes of public deliberation, and working to make the latter more inclusive. Civil disobedience does not only aim to invigorate democratic sovereignty, but also can constitute a form of democratic empowerment in itself – an exercise of political agency that is especially meaningful for marginalized groups. Through civil disobedience, individuals discover and realize their power. They work together and forge bonds of solidarity. They engage in democratic politics. Theorists’ examples to illustrate democratic civil disobedience include: the Occupy Movement, pro-democracy movements around the world, anti-globalization and anti-austerity protests, climate justice activism, and Campesino movements for land redistribution and agrarian reform. Many activists further enact within their movement the norms and values that guide their struggles, for instance through radical inclusion, direct democratic decision-making, aspiration to consensus, and leaderless organizational structures. Some theorists insist on the need to align the means of protest with its aims, by deploying only persuasive, non-violent forms of protest that reflect democratic ideals (Habermas 1997, 383–4; M. Cooke 2016), while others contend that civil disobedience can be confrontational and coercive without betraying its democratic aims (Smith 2021; Fung 2005, 409).
A third approach to the value of civil disobedience, besides the liberal and democratic lenses, comes from the political realist perspective. Robert Jubb (2019) critiques Rawlsian accounts of civil disobedience for the binary theory of political authority they rest on: they take the whole political order to be either legitimate or illegitimate, and thereby ignore or deny the possibility that a regime may be authoritative in virtue of having a democratic mandate, yet fail to protect everyone’s basic liberties or to treat all its members as equals, for example. Jubb proposes instead to “disaggregate” political authority, that is, to distinguish between the different forms of authority which a political order may possess or lack, in order to make sense of the conditions under which different forms of protest and resistance may be appropriate. Other realists criticize both liberal and deliberative democratic perspectives for their deductive, top-down approach to moral analysis, their quest for rational consensus, and their assumption that people can be persuaded by rational arguments alone (Sabl 2001, 2021; Mantena 2012). Realist accounts of civil disobedience stress instead “the ubiquity of moral disagreement and the permanence of political conflict” (Sabl 2021, 153). Andrew Sabl, for instance, envisions civil disobedience as a properly ‘political technology’ (2021, 165), situated between submission and revolution, through which agents seek to effect change in the basic allocation of burdens and benefits by raising costs for adversaries, but without undermining the state’s basic functions such as its provision of public goods.
For her part, Mantena debunks the common understanding of Gandhi and King as committed in principle and absolutely to non-violence, showing that their endorsement of non-violence reflected concerns of political efficacy. They considered political violence to be “futile”, that is, ineffective for social change and likely to bring about “dangerous and perverse consequences in politics” (Mantena 2018, 84). In Gandhi’s view, violence would cultivate the wrong kind of independence for India and breed the wrong kind of polity, amounting to a mere change of personnel in a violent state and generating unstable conditions. Mantena identifies “three faces of nonviolent action”, which we can reframe as realists’ account of the triple value of civil disobedience: 1) morally, civil disobedience is the right means by which oppressed people can regain dignity and self-respect; 2) strategically, it is a necessary means to just and stable political results and future democratic concord; and 3) tactically, the dramatization of civil disobedients’ discipline works effectively to persuade opponents. Recent social scientific research has corroborated the effectiveness of non-violence in campaigns of civil resistance, which seek to topple dictatorships or colonial powers (Chenoweth and Stephan 2011; Schock 2015).
Many democratic theorists incorporate political realism in their approach as they strive to think about and “learn from the streets” (Celikates 2014), in a “bottom-up” approach designed to understand particular contemporary protest movements. This approach constitutes a stark departure from “top-down” liberal approaches like Rawls’s and Dworkin’s that require agents justify their disobedient protest before engaging in it. As Alexander Livingston puts it, many democratic and critical theorists today seek to draw “theoretical insights from protest movements themselves around the globe rather than legislating moral guidelines for activist praxis from the sidelines” (Çıdam et al 2020, 540). Guy Aitchison sees this as a central feature of the ‘new civil disobedience debate’, in which scholars seek to respond to ‘a new era of political protest and unrest’ characterized by “the proliferation and intensification of oppositional political action by groups challenging economic inequality, racist policing, immigration enforcement, austerity, war, climate change, financial oligarchy, privatization, and corporate domination of cyberspace” (Aitchison 2018b, 5, 7–8) – which theorists tend to be in broad sympathy with. Such bottom-up approach also diverges from David Lefkowitz’s and Kimberley Brownlee’s defenses of a moral right to civil disobedience that applies impartially to all acts of civil disobedience, justified or not (see 4.2).
How should the state respond to civil disobedience? The question of appropriate legal response applies, first, to the actions of law-enforcers when deciding whether and how to intervene in a civilly disobedient action. It applies, second, to the actions of prosecutors when deciding whether to file charges and proceed to trial. Finally, it applies to the actions of judges (and juries) when deciding whether to convict and (for judges) how much to punish. All three contexts of legal sanctions beg the question of criminal law’s function.
How much punishment is appropriate for civil disobedients? Is punishment appropriate at all? If there is a right to civil disobedience, then, as we saw, it protects people from punishment. Even if there isn’t, is punishment indefensible if it sanctions morally justified civil disobedience? The tensions become clear when we consider the criminal law’s function, which is to punish and prevent crimes, that is, to tackle wrongful conduct. Unlike civil wrongs, which are privately brought, criminal wrongs are public wrongs: the polity, not the victim (there may not be any), prosecutes the alleged wrongdoer. Punishment, depending on one’s overarching account, serves to: dissuade people from committing the types of conduct identified as wrongful (Bentham 1789 ); appropriately respond to those who culpably commit them (Moore 1997), including by engaging with them in a moral dialogue so that they repent and reform (Duff 1998); and/or express the community’s moral disapproval of such conduct (Feinberg 1994). So, we may ask, from the consequentialist, forward-looking standpoint, whether the state should deter civil disobedience; and, from a retributivist (desert-based) or communicative, backward-looking perspective, whether civil disobedients deserve the community’s censure (Bennett and Brownlee 2021).
If civilly disobedient breaches of law are public wrongs, comparable to or worse than ordinary offenses, then civil disobedients should be punished similarly or more severely than those who commit ordinary offenses. Kent Greenawalt lays out reasons to hold that civil disobedients deserve the same punishment as others who breach the same laws. First, the demands of proportionality would seem to recommend a uniform application of legal prohibitions. Since trespass is prohibited, persons who breach trespass laws in protest of either those laws or other laws would seem to be equally liable to persons who breach trespass laws for private purposes. Second, any principle that officials may use to excuse justified illegal acts will result in some failures to punish unjustified acts, for which the purposes of punishment would be more fully served. Even when officials make correct judgments about which acts to excuse, citizens may draw mistaken inferences, and restraints of deterrence and norm acceptance may be weakened for unjustified acts that resemble justified ones (Greenawalt 1987, 273). What follows is that all such violations, justified and unjustified, should be treated the same.
There also are reasons to believe that civil disobedients should be dealt with more severely than are others who have offended. First, as mentioned above, disobedients seem to have put themselves above the law in preferring their own moral judgment about a certain issue to that of the democratic decision-making process and the rule of law. Second, the communicative aspect of civil disobedience could be said to aggravate disobedient offenses since their communication usually is attended by much greater publicity than most covert violations are. This forces legal authorities to concern themselves with the possibility that law-abiding citizens will feel distressed, insecure, and perhaps imposed on, if no action is taken. So, notes Greenawalt, while authorities may quietly let minor breaches pass, failure to respond to violations performed, in some respect, in the presence of authority, may undercut claims that the rules and the persons who administered them deserve respect (1987, 351–2). Third, and related, civil disobedients often invite, and might inspire, other citizens to do what they do. Such risk of proliferation of civil disobedience and, further, of its escalation into lawlessness and violence, may support the imposition of more severe punishment for agents engaged in civil disobedience.
However, both the models of civil disobedience presented above, which stress its role and value in liberal democracies, and the arguments for the right to civil disobedience examined below, strongly push for the opposite view that civil disobedients, if punished at all, should be dealt with more leniently than others who have offended. The preceding discussion highlights that civil disobedience is in fact a public good – a crucial component of democratic culture, in Habermas’s words – and, hence, many theorists defend the state’s responsibility to treat civil disobedients leniently.
Dworkin argues that the state has a “special responsibility to try to protect [the civil disobedient], and soften his predicament, whenever it can do so without great damage to other policies” (Dworkin 1978, 260). The government can exercise its responsibility of leniency by not prosecuting civil disobedience at all, depending on the balance of reasons, including individual rights, state interests, social costs, and constitutional benefits. Reasons for prosecuting in any particular case are ‘practical’, not intrinsic or deontological, and always potentially defeasible. In general, prosecutors should not charge disobedients with the most serious offenses applicable and judges should give them light sentences. Leniency follows from the recognition of the special constitutional status of civil disobedience.
In this view, officials at all levels have the discretion to not sanction civil disobedients, and they should use it. Prosecutors have and should use their discretion not to press charges against civil disobedients in some cases, or to charge them with the least serious offense possible. Dworkin (1985) urges judges to engage in an open dialogue with civil disobedients (at least those who articulate legal arguments in defense of their actions) and dismiss their charges after hearing them, or to use their discretion in sentencing, for instance by accepting guilty pleas or guilty verdicts but imposing trivial punishments.
However, this proposal could amount to letting judges evaluate the worthiness of individual civil disobedients’ causes, which would not on its own guarantee judicial leniency. To the contrary, judges might well systematically decide against civil disobedients, upholding the special interests of the ruling class of which they are part. The proceduralist insistence on courts’ neutrality avoids this pitfall, and generally warns against turning courtrooms into political forums. Yet the transformation of courts into public fora might not be so insidious, and may indeed be part of a necessary institutional reform to provide civil disobedients with a platform, perhaps along the lines of Arendt’s (1972, 101–2) proposal to treat civil disobedients as a kind of people’s lobbyists (see Smith 2011).
For Rawls, there is only a moral right to engage in justified civil disobedience. But many other theorists defend at least a limited right to engage in civil disobedience irrespective of a particular act’s justification, given the general value of the practice. Dworkin (1978) outlines what such a right of conduct might look like, analogizing civil disobedients with Supreme Court justices, who test the constitutional validity of (unjust) law through direct disobedience of that law. In doing so, they can make law more faithful to the principles of justice and fairness that justify it (on Dworkin’s theory of law). Some theorists accept the value of constitutional challenges but argue that once the law is found by a high court to be constitutional and disobedients’ initial conviction is upheld, disobedients have a duty to accept their punishment and recognize the law’s validity (Fortas 1968; Nussbaum 2019, 177). In contrast, Dworkin argues that forcing citizens to obey court decisions – including the Supreme Court’s – would mean forcing them to do something their conscience forbids them to do, which would contravene the constitutional imperative, entrenched in the First Amendment and rooted in dignity, to respect individuals’ “right to conscience” and protect their freedom of speech.
The right to conscience, on this account, thus grounds a weak “right to break the law”. It is a right in the sense that one “does the right thing to break the law, so that we should all respect” the agent when she follows her conscientious judgment about doubtful law and refuses to comply with a law that requires her to do what her conscience forbids (Dworkin 1978, 228–37), but it does not ground a right in the strong sense that the government would do wrong to stop her from disobeying. In other words, on this view, the right to disobedience is deemed to be compatible with the state’s right to punish. Contra Cohen (1966, 6), Rawls (1999, 322), and others, however, Dworkin does not defend agents’ moral duty to accept punishment (1985, 114–5). He considers non-evasion of legal sanctions to be a good strategy for civil disobedients denouncing unconstitutional law and unjust policy (justice- and policy-based civil disobedience on his view) but denies that accepting punishment is a conceptual, moral, or tactical requirement for civil disobedience motivated by personal convictions (‘integrity-based’ civil disobedience). For the latter, Dworkin argues that utilitarian reasons for punishing should be weighed against the fact that the accused acted out of principled convictions, and that the balance should generally favor leniency.
Joseph Raz puts forward a different account of the right to civil disobedience, insisting that this right extends to cases in which people ought not to exercise the right: it is part of the nature and purpose of rights of conduct that they give persons a protected sphere in which to act rightly or wrongly. To say that there is a right to civil disobedience is to allow the legitimacy of resorting to this form of political action for causes one opposes (Raz 1979, 268). That said, Raz places great emphasis on the kind of regime in which a disobedient acts, arguing that only in an illiberal regime could individuals have a right to civil disobedience to reclaim their political participation rights which their illiberal state is violating: they are entitled to “disregard the offending laws and exercise their moral right as if it were recognized by law.” Raz adds that “members of the illiberal state do have a right to civil disobedience which is roughly that part of their moral right to political participation which is not recognized in law” (Raz 1979, 272–3). By contrast, in a liberal state, the right to political activity is, by hypothesis, adequately protected by law and, hence, the right to political participation cannot ground a right to civil disobedience.
A different view of rights holds that when a person appeals to political participation rights to defend her disobedience, she does not necessarily criticize the law for outlawing her action. Lefkowitz maintains that members of minorities can appreciate that democratic discussions often must be cut short so that decisions may be taken, and those who engage in civil disobedience may view current policy as the best compromise between the need to act and the need to accommodate continued debate. Nonetheless, they also can point out that, with greater resources or further time for debate, their view might have held sway. Given this possibility, the right to political participation must include a right to continue to contest the result after the votes are counted or the decisions taken. And this right should include suitably constrained civil disobedience because the best conception of political participation rights is one that reduces as much as possible the impact that luck has on the popularity of a view (Lefkowitz 2007; see also Smith 2013, ch. 4; Ceva 2015).
An alternative response to Raz questions whether the right to civil disobedience must be derived from rights to political participation. Brownlee (2012, ch. 4) bases the right to civil disobedience on a right to object on the basis of sincere conviction. Whether such a right would fall under participation rights depends on the expansiveness of the latter rights. When the right to participate is understood to accommodate only legal protest, then the right conscientiously to object, which commonsensically includes civil disobedience, must be viewed as distinct from political participation rights.
A further challenge to a regime-focused account is that real societies do not align with a dichotomy between liberal and illiberal regimes; rather they fall along a spectrum of liberality and illiberality, being both more or less liberal relative to each other and being more or less liberal in some domains than in others. Perhaps, in a society that approximates a liberal regime, the political-participation case for a right to civil disobedience diminishes, but to make legally protected participation fully adequate, a liberal society would have to address Bertrand Russell’s charge that controllers of the media give defenders of unpopular views few opportunities to make their case unless they resort to sensational methods such as disobedience (1998, 635).
Philosophers have typically focused on the question of how courts should treat civil disobedients, while neglecting to apply that question to law enforcement. Yet the police have much discretion in how to deal with civil disobedients. In particular, they have no obligation to arrest protesters when they commit minor violations of the law such as traffic obstruction: accommodation of and communication with protesters is something they can but all too rarely decide to do. Instead, many governments practice militarized repression of protests. Local police departments in the U.S. often respond to demonstrations with riot gear and other military equipment. Also, the British government sought to strengthen public order laws and secure new police powers to crack down on Extinction Rebellion (XR), the global environmental movement whose street protests, die-ins, and roadblocks for climate justice have brought cities to a standstill.
One notable exception to the theoretical neglect of law enforcement is Smith’s (2013, ch. 5) articulation of a “policing philosophy” that orientates policing strategies toward accommodation, rather than prevention or repression, of civil disobedience. On Smith’s view, “the police should, where possible, cooperate with civilly disobedient activists in order to assist in their commission of a protest that is effective as an expression of their grievance against law or policy” (2013, 111). Accommodation requires communication channels between police and activists and involves strategies such as pre-negotiated arrests. While the U.S. often implements punitive and strong-handed law enforcement strategies, the U.K.’s current goal (at the time of writing) is, according to one senior police source, to develop ‘move forward’ – proactive and preventive – tactics that are designed to clear the streets of XR demonstrators. Neither approach respects anything like a right to civil disobedience.
A constitutional government committed to recognizing the right to civil disobedience would also have to reform part of its criminal laws and make available certain defenses. Brownlee proposes two. First, disobedients should have access to a “demands-of-conviction,” excusatory defense to point to the deep and sincere reasons they had for believing they were justified in acting the way they did (Brownlee 2012, ch. 5). Second, states should accept necessity as a justificatory defense for civil disobedience undertaken as a reasonable and parsimonious response to violations of and threats to non-contingent basic needs (Brownlee 2012, ch. 6). As these defenses suggest, constitutionally recognizing civil disobedience does not mean making civil disobedience legal. Disobedients would still be arrested and prosecuted, but they would get to explain and defend their actions in court. They would be heard.
There have been shifts in the paradigm forms and goals of civil disobedience over the past century, from the suffragettes’ militant activism in pursuit of their basic rights of citizenship to the youth climate movement’s school walkouts and mass demonstrations to demand governments take urgent action to combat the climate crisis. Even so, civil disobedience remains an enduring, vibrant part of political activism and, increasingly, benefits from transnational alliances.
Theorists have long assumed that civil disobedience only begs justification in liberal, democratic societies – the best real-world candidates for legitimate states. However, civil disobedience also raises questions in undemocratic and illegitimate contexts, regarding its overall role, strategic value, and tactical efficacy. For instance, disobedient protests in support of democracy in Hong Kong may not be presumptively impermissible given China’s authoritarian rule. Yet they still beg significant questions concerning the proper contours of extra-institutional dissident politics and the justification of uncivil and forceful tactics in repressive contexts, including violence against police and the destruction of pro-China shops and Chinese banks.
Finally, whereas theorists have tended to think of civil disobedience as generally undertaken to achieve worthy public goals, liberal democratic states have recently witnessed much disobedience in pursuit of anti-democratic and illiberal goals, including conscientious refusal to abide by antidiscrimination statutes and violations of, and protests against, laws requiring the provision of reproductive services and the public health measures enacted to slow the spread of the coronavirus. We may need a different lens than liberal and democratic theorists have offered to evaluate the full range of conservative social movements, counter-movements, and reactionary movements which resort to civil (and other forms of) disobedience.
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We thank Adrian Blau, Adam Cureton, Alan Hamlin, Jonathan Quong, Ben Saunders, Hillel Steiner, Zofia Stemplowska, John Tasioulas, Joseph Raz, and an anonymous referee for their useful suggestions. Thanks to Kelsey Vicar for research assistance.
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