Notes to Climate Science

1. Very simple climate models like these are used for various purposes, both within and beyond climate science. In some cases, they are coupled with economic models to produce integrated assessment models (IAMs), which are used to explore the costs of the climate policy proposals (Calel & Stainforth 2017; see also Frisch 2013).

2. Some models use spectral solution methods rather than finite-difference methods.

3. The IPCC assessment process is a hybrid scientific-governmental exercise that is of interest in its own right. See, e.g., Petersen 2012: Ch.7; Havstad and Brown 2017; Brown and Havstad 2017.

4. The IPCC’s approach to characterizing uncertainty, and the treatment of uncertainty in climate change assessments more broadly, are important topics but are beyond the scope of this entry. See, e.g., Mastrandrea et al. 2010; Yohe and Oppenheimer 2011; Petersen 2012; Adler and Hadorn 2014; Thompson et al. 2016; Bradley et al. 2017; Rehg and Staley 2017.

5. This is a very simplified description of fingerprint studies. For more details, see Hegerl and Zwiers 2011. In addition to fingerprint studies, there are also attribution approaches that apply time series methods to observations (Bindoff et al. 2013: Section 10.2.2).

6. A Congressionally-commissioned National Research Council report (NRC 2006) was more cautious than the IPCC, concluding that late twentieth century temperatures were the warmest of the last 400 years, and that it was “plausible” they were the warmest of the last millennium.

Copyright © 2018 by
Wendy Parker <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free