Catharine Trotter Cockburn

First published Sat Jan 8, 2005; substantive revision Fri Nov 10, 2023

Cockburn’s philosophical reputation rests largely upon her polemical works in defense of John Locke and Samuel Clarke. While she displays a range of interests in these works, her primary concern is to defend a moral epistemology that combines elements of Locke’s epistemology with a proto-Clarkean moral fitness theory. Cockburn’s morality is best described as a broadly rationalistic natural law theory that draws strongly on Locke’s concept of reflection. According to Cockburn we discover the foundations for moral rules through reflection upon human nature and divine nature. Humans are then able to determine moral right and wrong by assessing the fitness or unfitness of given acts with reference to these natures.

1. Life

Cockburn was born in London on August 16, 1679.[1] As a child, she taught herself to write, became proficient in French, and studied Latin grammar and logic. In addition to her studies, she devoted time to writing plays. In 1695, Cockburn’s first play Agnes de Castro was staged, and was published the following year. In 1698, her second play, Fatal Friendship, was staged and printed. Both plays were very well received and she enjoyed some celebrity in theatrical circles. Cockburn wrote three more plays over the next three years.

While Catharine Trotter was establishing her reputation as a playwright, she was also studying Locke’s work, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Trotter was so deeply impressed with his ideas that she felt obliged to take up her pen in defense of Locke. Cockburn’s first philosophical work, published in 1702 and entitled The Defence of Mr. Locke’s Essay of Human Understanding, was a response to a series of three anonymously-penned pamphlets critical of Locke’s Essay. Locke himself was so impressed with the work, he presented Cockburn with a substantial gift of money and books in appreciation.

In 1739, Cockburn wrote her Remarks upon some Writers in the Controversy concerning the Foundation of moral Duty and moral Obligation. It was finally published, anonymously, in 1743 in the English literary journal The History of the Works of the Learned. Remarks upon some Writers considers primarily the work of philosopher Samuel Clarke and various critics of his moral theory. In 1747, she published a critique of the moral philosophy of Dr. Thomas Rutherforth, entitled Remarks upon the Principles and Reasonings of Dr. Rutherforth’s Essay on the Nature and Obligation of Virtue, whose work was strongly critical of Samuel Clarke’s moral theory. In this work, Cockburn again defends a Clarkean view of morality.

Cockburn was also deeply interested in religious issues and she wrote and published a series of theological works. These included a work, in the form of two letters, that examined Catholic and Protestant doctrine entitled A Discourse concerning a Guide in Controversies. This work was first published in 1707. Another work, first published in 1726, entitled A Letter to Dr. Holdsworth Occasioned by his Sermon, was mainly a defense of Locke’s orthodoxy against charges of heresy. She wrote and published a second Vindication of Locke’s orthodoxy against Holdsworth, in two parts.This work was not published until it was included in Cockburn’s collected works; Cockburn’s work had attracted sufficient attention that Thomas Birch approached her with the idea of a volume of her collected works, including her correspondence. She aided in the editing of this work, but did not live to see its publication in 1751. She died in May of 1749.

2. Philosophy

Although primarily concerned with moral issues, Cockburn philosophical writings (which are taken here to include The Defence of Mr. Locke’s Essay of Human Understanding (hereafter referred to as the Defence), Remarks upon some Writers and Remarks upon the Principles and Reasonings of Dr. Rutherforth’s Essay) address a range of philosophical issues. In the Defence, she addresses a series of issues surrounding Locke’s empiricism, which include not only moral knowledge, but also the knowledge humans can have of God’s veracity and of the immortality of the human soul. There is also a broad range of topics addressed in her work Remarks upon some Writers, in which Cockburn begins by addressing several philosophical issues – necessity, the infinitude of space, and the nature and existence of spirits with regard to the notion of substance. The latter discussion revolves generally around epistemological concerns regarding the knowledge of real essences and the nature of substance, in which she argues that spirits must have extension of a sort in order to be proper substances. She makes this argument by appeal to a broadly Lockean view regarding substance.

However, it is her moral theory that is most prominently emphasized throughout her works. Cockburn was mainly concerned with grappling with the defects and strengths of some of the predominating issues in moral theory at this time. Cockburn’s own position is an amalgam of three dominant strains of eighteenth-century morality: moral rationalism, moral fitness theory and moral sense theory. Moral rationalism is, broadly speaking, the view that morality is the result of a rational process, whereby the mind reasons about moral ideas and creates moral rules (although many thinkers, like Cockburn, argued that the mind, by this process, is actually in some way discovering eternal moral rules). Moral fitness theory is a rationalist theory that includes the notion that the human mind is able to grasp the various moral relations that result from the essential natures of things in the universe; e.g., the nature of humans and God creates a relation that necessitates the allegiance of humans to their superior (this view was made most famous by Samuel Clarke). Moral sense theory is the view that humans possess a special sensory ability that can determine, pre-rationally, what is good or evil (This view was made most famous by Shaftesbury and Hutcheson). However, for many theorists, like Cockburn, this sensory information is not definitive – but is seen as an aid to moralizing that can, and should, be corrected by reason.

Much of the groundwork for her view is laid in the Defence. This was written as a response to the Remarks Upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding, a series of three pamphlets published between 1697 and 1699 that aimed to expose the deficiencies of Locke’s empiricism. The Remarks were published anonymously and their authorship has been the source of some controversy. Long thought to have been written by Thomas Burnet, this attribution has recently been challenged (see Walmsley, et al., 2016); the author shall be referred to here as the Remarker. The Remarks raised doubts concerning the tenability of Locke’s epistemology as a foundation for, among other things, moral knowledge. In the Essay and other works, Locke had suggested that morality could be known by reason and had emphasized the demonstrative character of morality – thereby making a claim to the certainty with which moral ideas could be known. However, Locke never provided an explicit account of how fundamental moral ideas are derived. The Remarker concludes that Locke’s epistemology is simply insufficient to the task, and that moral ideas, on Locke’s system, remain as uncertain as the ideas of God’s nature and the immortality of the soul. The Remarker uses the critique of Locke as the springboard for their own moral position, one best described as a brand of moral sense theory, in which conscience is the human capacity for empirically discerning the moral value of acts. In other words, one can, upon observing a given set of circumstances, know with immediate certainty whether that act is morally good or evil.

Cockburn responds to the Remarks by showing that Locke’s epistemology can satisfy these concerns. Cockburn approaches the question of Locke’s epistemological foundations by emphasizing an aspect of Locke’s theory of ideas of which Locke himself makes little use in his account of moral knowledge. However, it is a concept that he uses in his proof of God’s existence (the proof of which Cockburn reiterates in her Defence). Cockburn’s moral theory employs Locke’s concept of reflection as a foundation not just for our knowledge of God, but also as a means for human moral knowledge. She argues that it is by reflecting upon the operations of our own minds that we can reach an understanding of both human and divine nature. According to Cockburn, morality is grounded in human nature, and the truth of moral laws is guaranteed by the fact that humans are designed by God. This emphasis on human nature leads Cockburn quite naturally into a fitness account of morality that predates Clarke’s own view – human nature entails that certain actions are fit and appropriate for humans and certain are not. In later works, Cockburn explicitly adopts the language of fitness relations to describe the necessary moral order arising from our created natures.

In the Defence, Cockburn also introduces the idea of ‘conscience’ as a way of accounting for human moral sentiment. According to Cockburn, conscience is a faculty, which she describes as a “sudden affection.” This idea of conscience as a kind of natural moral affection complements Cockburn’s view that morality is founded upon human nature: Moral knowledge arises from reflection upon our own natures and moral affection arises out of our natural constitutions. Cockburn uses this notion of conscience as a response to the Remarker’s account of morality. She argues that conscience is not an immediate source of moral knowledge, but a source of moral affection or feeling that complements, and presupposes, a proper (i.e., rational) knowledge of moral laws.

In later works, Cockburn adopts the term ‘moral sense’ to describe the affective faculty of conscience, a term which is not meant to signal any affinity with Francis Hutcheson. She understood Hutcheson to found morality exclusively on the moral sense while her own view sees moral sense as only one component within a largely rationalistic account of human moral understanding. It is not surprising that Cockburn developed a proto-moral sense theory in the Defence and in later works. She sought early on to establish a foundation for morality in human nature that sufficiently accounted for the type of natural and seemingly immediate human moral sensibility that the Remarker believed was not accounted for by Locke.

Cockburn takes up the defense of Samuel Clarke’s theory in later works. Her first defense of Clarke was made in Remarks upon some Writers. Here we find the language of ‘fitness’ occupying an even more prominent place than it had done in the Defence. This is only natural, given that the work is partly devoted to a defense of Clarke’s fitness theory, which had come to prominence in the intervening years. Throughout her discussion, Cockburn maintains a commitment to the basic view that morality is founded in the nature of humans and God. She sees this view as cohering with the general concept of fitness that she locates in Clarke and his followers. In the Remarks upon some Writers, Cockburn responds to critics of Clarkean moral fitness theory. These critics attack Clarke from a shared basic view of morality as a system of laws expressing God’s will. These laws are enforced by rewards and punishments that obligate by appealing to the fundamental human desire for happiness and freedom from pain. Rewards and punishments are thus seen as the fundamental means of harmonizing God’s will and human interest. Their main objection to fitness theory is that fitness relations are not primitive moral constructs, but actually presuppose more primitive constructs – i.e., God’s will and human interest. Clarke’s theory is accused of failing to provide sufficient account of these fundamental facts of divine and human nature. Cockburn responds to this line of criticism by arguing that fitness theory in fact rests upon a more robust conception of the relationship between the will of God and human interest than do the voluntarist accounts offered by Clarke’s critics.

According to Cockburn, fitness theory assumes that both human nature and God’s creative will are fundamental for morality. Fitness theory rests upon the view that human interest is a basic expression of a human nature brought into being by divine will. Natural good and evil are thus fundamental concepts for moral fitness theory, for it is human nature and all that is associated with it that provides the basis for moral law. For Cockburn, it is through knowledge of our own and God’s natures that humans can understand the right and proper relations that ought to subsist in the universe. According to this account, moral obligation arises from the demands of our natures – that is, we ought to be guided by that which is suitable and proper to our natures as rational and social beings. Common sense judges virtuous practice according to what is fit and natural, and not merely according to the good the practice produces.

In Cockburn’s third and last philosophical work, the Remarks upon the Principles and Reasonings of Dr. Rutherforth’s Essay, she answers Dr. Thomas Rutherforth, a critic of Clarke’s fitness theory. Rutherforth himself offers a brand of consequentialism, defining as moral goodness that which brings about good and prevents evil. Cockburn objects to this view, arguing that it ignores the underlying fitness relations that serve to define what harms and benefits are significant or relevant for human beings in particular circumstances. Even a hermit or someone stranded on a deserted island may possess a sense of virtue, Cockburn argues, since virtue is not founded on our prediction of the effects our actions will have on other people. On Cockburn’s view, humans have a natural and innate tendency toward what is good and benevolent that transcends merely weighing the effects of one’s actions. Cockburn identifies the moral sense as being a source of this disinterested affection essential to moral decision-making. While reason retains its position of prominence in her morality, the moral sense plays an important role according to her in motivating agents to act morally. The obligation we feel to obey moral rules arises, for Cockburn, not from reason alone, but from the perceptions of natural conscience, or moral sense. The moral sense, if governed by the “natural perceptions of the understanding,” ought to influence our actions – it is a necessary component in creating moral obligation.

Here again, Cockburn sought to distance herself from Hutcheson’s moral sense theory. For Cockburn, moral sense was an important factor in accounting for moral judgments, but she insisted on its subordination to reason as a guide in moral judgment. She holds this moral sense account in concert with her fitness view. She presents her moral sense theory within the context of a general moral fitness theory, suggesting that Clarkean moral fitness theory could easily accommodate such an account. In this way, Cockburn sees herself as offering an account of moral motivation not entirely obvious in Clarke’s theory, but tempering the suggestion of blind instinct she sees in Hutcheson’s moral sense view. Cockburn’s morality sought to establish a foundation for morality in human nature that sufficiently accounted for the type of natural and seemingly immediate human moral sensibility that the Remarker believed was not accounted for by Locke and that Clarke’s critics saw as lacking in his fitness view.


Primary Sources

  • The Works of Mrs. Catharine Cockburn, Theological, Moral, Dramatic, and Poetical In Two Volumes. (1751), 1992, Thomas Birch (ed.); reprinted, London: Routledge/Thoemmes.
  • Catharine Trotter Cockburn: Philosophical Writings, 2006, Patricia Sheridan (ed.), Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press.

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