Gender in Confucian Philosophy

First published Mon Feb 27, 2023

The study of gender in Confucian philosophy is a complicated task, since there is no conceptual equivalent of “gender” in the Chinese linguistic construct. Instead of deriving from a set of natural dispositions or bodily functions, man and woman in the Confucian textual tradition are kinship- and ritual-dependent. The process of genderization where a person becomes a socially recognizable “man” (nan 男) or “woman” ( 女) is concomitant with the process of ritualization where gender differentiation is embedded in various familial/social roles marked along the lines of “inside” (nei 內) and “outside” (wai 外). The sphere of nei, when it is coupled with woman, denotes a restrictive ritual and physical boundary that is mainly concerned with household management and familial roles of wife and mother. Women of talents and virtues who are able to transgress the restrictive ritual boundary of nei into the expansive realm of wai are few and far between.

Beyond examining the “standard” canonical Confucian texts, the incorporation of historical records of women’s biographies such as the biographies of “exemplary women” (lienü 列女) and the didactic texts for women such as the Four Books for Women (Nüsishu 女四書) in the discussion of gender is necessary, since Confucianism—the inexact translation of its Chinese counterpart, Ru 儒—is not a study of a singular thinker; rather it is a family of thoughts with an extensive and diverse textual tradition. This uniquely women-centric literary genre not only provides us with a wealth of women’s biographical records and perspectives but also offers a rare window into the emergence of gender-based consciousness legitimizing both female readership and female authorship, despite the fact that advanced literacy is ritually reserved for men only. This is one of the paradoxical fallouts from these conservative didactic texts that aim at fostering female dependency and compliance to patrilineage.

The prioritization of patrilineage underpins the Chinese family system and is codified in various ritual practices. The marriage rite, for instance, has two different meanings for men and women. For women, marriage is an occasion of exodus from her natal family and hence her personhood/womanhood hinges on her ability to fully integrate into her husband’s patrilineage. For men, marriage serves two ritual functions: ensuring the continuity of sacrificial services in his ancestral hall, and posterity. And since only patrilineage counts, having a male heir is of utmost importance not just for men, but also for new brides and mothers-in-law alike who oftentimes participate in gender oppressive practices in order to amass sufficient resources, to produce or acquire the coming of a male heir. Footbinding, although unconnected to Confucian philosophy textually, nonetheless is a popular entrance into the study of gender oppression in pre-modern China. The familiar exoticization of footbinding is a clear case of “orientalism” seeing non-western cultures as barbaric and oppressive to the so-called “third-world” women.

Dismissing the ethical valence of non-western traditions as devoid of feminist potential, if not outright anti-feminist, is a common sentiment in feminist discourse inter-culturally. This is true in the contemporary feminist engagement with Confucian philosophy as well. Pushbacks against this feminist caricature of Confucianism from the Chinese-comparative communities began to surface around the mid-1990s, first focusing on the positive comparison between care ethics and Confucian ren 仁, and then expanding into possible Confucian applications to various contemporary issues such as abortion, same-sex marriage, elder care, etc. Building on this positive feminist engagement with Confucian philosophy, here proposed is a hybrid feminist theory—Confucian feminism—using Confucian terms, methods, and concerns as a theoretical basis to address women’s issues, experiences, and concerns in the contemporary world. This hybrid feminist theory is a forward-looking project intended to spur further positive feminist engagement with Confucian philosophy in order to formulate diverse and viable conceptual tools for women to envision their own liberatory future beyond the confine of the western philosophical canon.

1. “Gender” in Translation

The trouble with the study of gender in Confucian philosophy begins with the concept of “gender” as an analytic category for feminist theorizing. The term “xingbie 性别” (natural differences) or “shehui xingbie 社會性别” (societally constructed natural differences) now used to translate “gender” is a neologism introduced during the 1990s as a local, internal response to the importation of western feminist theories (Spakowski 2011: 31–54; Dai 2019: ch. 12; S. Y. Chan 2023). Whatever the concept of “gender” stands for in contemporary feminist discourse, it does not have a clear, ready-made Chinese counterpart in its linguistic memories, ancient or modern. Prior to the 1990s, the term “nüxing 女性” (woman/female nature) is the closest approximation used to designate a sense of universal “womanhood” or the “female sex” outside their kinship roles. And, just like the later variants of “xingbie” and “shehui xingbie” used to translate the concept of “gender”, “nüxing” is also a neologism constructed during the 1920s by the May Fourth Movement as part of their modernization project to mark the end of the indigenous representation of “women” as funü 婦女 (married women and young maidens) (C. S. Chan 1988: 19–39; Barlow 1989, 1994a, 1994b).[1]

According to the earliest etymological dictionary, Discussing Writing and Explaining Characters (Shouwen jiezi), the character 女 was defined synonymously as fu 婦 (married women). The overlapping of 女 and fu 婦 points to the prioritization of kinship roles in the process of genderization. Generally speaking, refers to daughters or young maidens, a life-stage before becoming fu. The synonymy of 女 and fu 婦 (as well as nan 男 and zhangfu 丈夫, i.e., husband) as defined by the Shouwen jiezi, hence, can be seen as a linguistic clue to the Chinese conception of nannü 男女 (man/woman), who are essentially fufu 夫婦 (husband/wife) in waiting.

The concept of “women” or “gender” as a kinship-neutral discursive category hence is absent in the Chinese intellectual traditions including Confucianism. The lack of an indigenous linguistic equivalent of “gender” or “women”, to some (as it is for the May Fourth thinkers in the 1920s as well as for some contemporary feminists who seek to bring Chinese women’s movements into the fold of the global feminist movements), serves as an indication of the conceptual inadequacy, if not backwardness, of Chinese society to articulate gender and to contribute to this very modern project of feminist discourse/movements. But, for others, the imposition of western conceptual paradigms distorts the subject matter at hand and consequently misconstrues the roots of gender oppression as well as its possible solutions in the study of gender in Confucianism (Hall & Ames 1998: 79–100; 2000: 75–96; Rosenlee 2006). This linguistic trouble of “gender” serves to highlight the conceptual chasm in the inter-cultural discourse of “Confucianism”, which itself is also a much debated inexact translation of Ru 儒 (Jensen 1997; Standaert 1999; Barrett 2005; Csikszentmihalyi 2020; Richey 2023)

2. Yin-Yang 陰陽 Correlative Cosmology

Men and women in Confucian philosophy are properly “gendered” when they are ritualized to embody a series of familial/social roles; their genderization is not derivative from a set of kinship-neutral inborn traits, as the way “man” or “woman” as a conceptual category functions in the contemporary western discourse. Nevertheless, the equivocation of yin/yang 陰陽 and femininity/masculinity has become a popular analytic entrance into the study of gender in Confucian philosophy. Numerous scholars have attributed gender oppression and the misogynistic strains in Confucian philosophy to the correlation of yin with women and yang with men. Dong Zhongshu’s Luxurious Dews of the Spring and Autumn (Chunqiu fanlu; 2nd century BCE text)—especially Ch. 43: “Yang the Venerable, Yin the Lowly” and Ch. 53: “Basic Meaning” where one finds the exaltation of yang and the devaluation of yin—is named as the culprit transforming the supposedly more egalitarian, textual presentation of gender relations in the pre-Han era to the decisively patriarchal bent of Han Confucianism (Csikszentmihalyi 2003: 163–64; R. Wang 2005; Pang-White 2018: 8–10). On the flip side, the Daoist texts that consistently favor yin over yang are said to suggest the possibility of a matriarchal past or at least a maternal matrix (Needham 1956: 105; Chen 1969: 401–05; Wawrytko 2000: 163–98; Lee 2014: 57–77). Such theoretical postulation of a matriarchal past based on the textual presence of a favorable yin over yang, however alluring, runs the risk of over-interpretation as well as the risk of oversimplification of the issue of gender relations as a matter of yin-yang cosmology.

Yin-yang—as most prominently a Daoist concept, but also broadly shared in many different schools of thought including Confucianism—unlike the western oppositional binary of femininity-masculinity, is not primarily, exclusively, nor invariably a gender-based concept (Rubin 1982; Graham 1986; Black 1989). Rather, yin-yang—that functions as an organizational cosmic schema—is applicable to gender, but itself is cross-gender and beyond gender. Yin and yang exist only in relation to one another internally as the way warmth-coldness only exist relative to one another. Furthermore, when using yin-yang as an organizational schema, achieving balancing harmony is always the goal, not domination nor subordination of one to the other. And hence yin-yang at its face value cannot even function as a theoretical explanation for gender oppression where women are subordinated to and dominated by men. The focus on the yin-yang cosmology yields little that is useful in the study of gender in Confucian philosophy.

3. Nei-wai 內外 and Gendered Differentiation

Since being a man or a woman is concomitant with one’s embodiment of familial/social roles through ritual learnings, the interrogation of how these roles are inscribed ritually would be a much more fruitful way into the study of gender in Confucian philosophy. Ritualization marks not only the beginning of the process of genderization, but more fundamentally the beginning of humanity/civility. The concept of xing 性—a stand-in for human nature or animal nature—is not what sets one class of people apart from the other, or humans from animals.[2] As Confucius said in the Analects, “By nature we are similar; learned habits set us apart” (17.2; for other translations see Ames & Rosemont 1998). Similarly, according to the Xunzi,

As regards to raw material, nature, awareness and capability, junzi and petty persons are equal […] Rather, it is the way they employ these to make decisions make them different. (Xunzi 4.9; for other translations see Knoblock & Zhang 1999)

Sages and the rest of us are of the same kind (lei 類), and there is little distinguishing difference between humans (ren 人) and birds/beasts (qinshou 禽獸), since raw materials and in-born propensities are possessed in common by humans and animals alike.[3] Ritual (li 禮) differentiation (bie 别) is that slight differentiation separating humans from animals. According to the Xunzi,

The reason why humans are human is […] because they have the ability to make distinctions. Whereas birds/beasts have father and son, they don’t have the affection between father and son; and whereas birds/beasts have male and female (pinmu 牝牡), they don’t have the differentiation between man and woman (nannü 男女). Hence, the way of humanity cannot be without distinctions. (Xunzi 5.9)

The most important distinction that humans make, as the same passage goes on to say, is ritual differentiation (Xunzi 5.10).

3.1 Nei-wai as Gendered Spheres

Ritual differentiation gives rise to role differentiation, and among them, gender role differentiation (nannü zhibie 男女之別 or fufu youbie 夫婦有別) is foundational. As it is said in the Book of Rites (Liji),

From the distinction between man and woman came the righteousness between husband and wife. From the righteousness between husband and wife came the affection between father and son. From the affection between father and son came the rectitude between ruler and minster. Hence it is said, “The marriage rite is the root of other ritual observances”. (Liji, “Hunyi” chapter; for other translations see Legge 1885)

Gender role differentiation, in turn, is marked along the spatial binary of inside-outside (nei-wai 內外). According to the Book of Changes (Yijing),

In the Family (Jiaren 家人) hexagram, a woman’s correct place is in the nei and man in the wai, that men and women occupy their correct places is the great righteousness of heaven and earth […] Let the father be the father, the son son, the brothers brothers, the husband husband, the wife wife, then the way of family will be correct; when the family is correct then the world will be secured. (Yijing, “Jiaren” hexagram, “Tuanzhuan” commentary; for other translations see Legge 1882)

Gender role differentiation corresponding to the spatial binary of nei-wai, hence, lays the groundwork for all other human relations—be familial or political—to follow.

The nei-wai binary - much like the yin-yang binary - is correlative, overlapping, as well as cross- and beyond-gender. But unlike the cosmic concept of yin-yang, nei-wai is primarily a spatial concept demarcating both ritual and physical boundaries. This inside-outside spatial demarcation doesn’t mean that nei is inferior to wai. On the contrary, nei is the focused center on which one anchors in order to proceed to or retract from the wai. Even though the nei-wai spatial boundary is ever shifting and overlapping depending on one’s proximity to the focused center (Yu 1986; Ko 1994; Ames 1994; Hay 1994), whatever counts as nei is necessarily and invariably encircled by the expansive sphere of wai. The sphere of nei is necessarily and invariably a defined inside marking whatever outside of it as wai. Hence, the spatial concept of nei-wai, when it is coupled with gender role differentiation, draws a much more restrictive sphere—both ritually and physically—for women compared to a more expansive sphere for men where advanced literary learning, non-familial roles, and service to the wider world including officialdom are located.

According to the Book of Songs (Shijing), the gender marking of nei-wai signifying the spheres of domesticity and officialdom respectively begins as soon as a child is born: a boy is clothed in robes, placed on couches to sleep and given [official] scepters to play with, whereas a girl is clothed in wraps, laid on the ground to sleep, and given [weaving] tiles to play with (Shijing, Song 189 “Sigan”; for other translations see Legge 1876). Similarly, in the Liji, the birth of a boy is signaled by placing a bow (i.e., archery as one of the six arts in the Confucian educational curriculum for men) on the left side of the door, whereas a girl’s birth is marked by a handkerchief (i.e., weaving/embroidering as part of women’s work in the four womanly virtues, side 四德) on the right side of the door. Children are to begin their self-conscious embodiment of these gender roles at age seven when boys and girls cease to sit together nor eat together on the same mat, and at age ten, their educational curricula begin to diverge widely: a boy is to venture out seeking worthy mentors to broaden his education befitting his anticipated expansive responsibilities both as a husband and as a scholar-knight (shi 士), whereas a girl is engaged in homebound training for an enclosed, domestic life befitting her anticipated role as a congenial, pleasant, understanding, and compliant wife (Liji, “Neize” chapter).

3.2 The Ritual Confinement of Nei

One thing to keep in mind is that to say a woman is marked as a person of nei training for her anticipated domestic roles of wife and mother is not the same as to say that these familial roles are somehow insignificant ethically in Confucian philosophy. On the contrary, the highest accolade for a benevolent ruler is called “the father and mother of the people” (minzifumu 民之父母) indicative of parental parity.[4] The Confucian reverence for the role of mother is best shown in the enduring maternal icon of Mengmu (mother of Mencius) perpetuated in countless didactic texts for women. Furthermore, the marriage rite, that commences the spousal relationship, as proscribed in the Liji, “Jiaotesheng” chapter, dignifies the bride by requiring the groom to perform the job of a servant standing by the carriage and handing the bride the strap to assist her in mounting. This ritual gesture is meant to convey the reverence that the husband owes to the wife, since spousal affection is built on mutual respect and a harmonious household is foundational to a secured world. As explained in the Liji, “with respect there comes affection; it is with this spousal affection that the sage kings are able to secure the world” (Liji, “Jiaotesheng” chapter).[5]

Furthermore, unlike many of the canonical thinkers in the western intellectual tradition from Socrates down to Kant where the inherent inferiority of women—not in terms of the roles that women play, but their in-born nature as such (e.g., the “Re-Reading the Canon” series of the Pennsylvania State University Press)—are explicitly stated, Confucian philosophy offers no such articulation of women’s in-born inferior nature, moral or otherwise. Much of the depiction of virtuous women in the antiquity period, such as Liu Xiang’s Exemplary Women’s Biographies (Lienü zhuan; c. 18 BCE), consistently applies the same moral and intellectual accolades to women as they do to men. In other words, women in Confucian philosophy are not inferior by nature, nor are their gender roles indicative of their inferior nature.

Much of the gender hierarchy in Confucianism is derived from the gender markings along the spatial as well as ritual boundary of nei-wai. Once again, this is not to say that nei is inferior to wai; being associated with nei does not automatically make women inferior to men, nor does the gender association of woman with nei devalue nei (Goldin 2009: 371–74). But using nei-wai as a mark of gender differentiation does dictate which sphere one should inhabit. Gender-based hierarchy is, first and foremost, embedded in the spousal relationship, since the role of a wife is to follow and the husband’s is to lead. As the same Liji passage on the marriage rite quoted earlier goes on to say,

In passing the front door gate, the man precedes and the woman follows, and with this the right relation between husband and wife commences. (Liji, “Jiaotesheng” chapter)

To follow and to lead indicate more than just complementary role differentiations; they indicate power differentials as well: the one who leads takes charge and the one who follows cannot initiate or dictate the direction of the union. Wifely subordination is both functional and gender-based. In marriage—just as in any institution—there are inevitable role differentiations, but the spousal hierarchy is gender-based, instead of capacity, merit, or age based. As a person of nei, a woman can only express her life’s work through ritualized familial roles (i.e., daughter, wife, and mother); there are no non-familial roles available to her without first being mediated and thereby legitimated by the men of her kin. That meditating requirement constricts what is deemed possible for a woman to be a properly gendered person.

Unlike men, women have no non-familial roles—such as friend (you 友), scholarly knight (shi 士), ruler (jun 君), or minster (chen 臣)—available to them. For instance, even to make friends and maintain friendship outside one’s kin pose quite a challenge for women, since the notion of “friend” (you 友) and “travel” (you* 游) are synonymous at times.[6] For a woman to travel outside the bound of her household, it not only raises logistic challenges, but more importantly, requires additional justifications for her ritual transgression. The ritual requirements for women not to traverse the bounds of the domestic are dictated in various Classics.[7] To transgress that—or any ritual boundary—compelling, circumstantial justifications are required. Hence the gender marking of nei makes all non-familial roles prima facie out of reach for women.

The famed case of Confucius as a traveling scholarly knight spending decades wandering around different states to propagate his moral visions and collecting friends and disciples along the way was beyond the reach for any equally talented and virtuous woman. There was simply no legitimate, ethical, or normative route for women to partake in governance exercising political authority, except through marriage and only in service of patrilineage such as occupying the position of a dowager or as the kin of a high ranking official. And even then, it was problematic and precarious at best. As shown in the Analects 8.20, Confucius discounted King Wu’s wife as among the ten capable ministers (chen 臣) that King Wu boasted to have. Or, as recorded in the Analects 6.28, Confucius felt compelled to explain himself with a dramatic appeal to tian 天 as his witness of ritual propriety to Zilu who was displeased by the encounter between Confucius and Nanzi—a powerful concubine of Duke Ling of Wei (r. 534–492 BCE)—audaciously calling herself a little lord![8]

3.3 Traversing the Nei-Wai Boundary: The Case of Ban Zhao

Ban Zhao (c. 45–117 CE) was the first and foremost Confucian woman scholar-official—one of the few exceptions where women were able to have remarkable achievements in the wai comparable to their male counterparts, despite the structural limitations of nei. Ban Zhao came from a long line of erudite families: both of her great-great-grandfather and great-grandfather held imperial scholarly degrees; her grandfather and great-uncle were court scholar-officials, and so were her father and eldest brother; her second brother was a famed frontier governor-general granted the rank of marquis and her son was also a court official granted the rank of marquis. Lastly, her great aunt, her mother, her younger sister-in-law, and her daughter-in-law were equally erudite. Ban Zhao was given an advanced education immersed in classical learning by both of her father and mother, and after the death of her eldest brother, she was summoned by Emperor He (r. 89–105 CE)—though without the official title—to complete the imperial account of the History of Han. Serving as a de facto grand imperial scholar, Ban Zhao was in charge of the instruction of not only the palace women and princesses, but also her ten male colleagues in the imperial library, including Ma Rong who later became a famed scholar as well as his brother Ma Xu (Swann 1932 [2001: 17]). After the emperor’s death, Ban Zhao also served as a close advisor to Empress Dowager Deng (r. 106–121 CE) who was then the de facto ruler since the reigning emperor was still an infant (Swann 1932 [2001: 43]; Pang-White 2018: 32). No other virtuous and talented woman outside the royal family had managed to achieve the same position ever since.

Beyond the political, the pristine preservation of Ban Zhao’s Admonition for Women (Nujie; c.106 CE) is equally impressive, considering the scarcity of women’s records in antiquity. Furthermore, this treatise despite its overall conservative bent, is probably the earliest extant text in human history advocating for equal education for women (Swann 1932 [2001: xvii]). Ban Zhao’s advocacy for women’s education, in turn, provided a historical precedent and a much needed justification for virtuous and talented women to engage in classical learning that was ritually reserved for men. Indeed, for many subsequent generations of women from empresses to widowed commoners, Ban Zhao held the esteemed position as the first teacher for women as Confucius was for men (Swann 1932 [2001]; Pang-White 2018).

As remarkable as it was, Ban Zhao’s ascendancy in the realm of wai was first and foremost made possible through her familial luck, not through the socially sanctioned venues available to many men of talents. Being born into a long line of erudite families that could spare precious resources to educate her for no apparent social utility, and being widowed at a young age allowed Ban Zhao to virtually live a life of letters and governance as her male counterparts did. Without such familial luck, it would be unthinkable for women to leave a mark in the realm of wai without incurring significant social costs. This is one of the many inevitable fallouts from the nei-wai gender marking that generates structural impediments for women to leave their marks in the realm of literary culture and state governance.

The outward expansion of one’s virtuous influences in a concentric fashion from self, family, state, to the world at large in order to bring about the idyllic state of “great harmony” (datong 大同) is the highest spiritual goal of Confucianism (Liji, “Liyun” chapter). After all, Confucius spent decades leaving his family behind and risking his own life instructing rulers and disciples alike all in an effort to moralize the world around him beyond his own family. Being thus confined to the realm of nei, denied all non-familial roles, and deprived of all normative routes to operate and excel in literary culture and state governance, a woman’s moral personhood, thus construed, is essentially curtailed and dependent on the men of her kin.

4. Female Dependency and Didactic Texts for Women

As a person of nei, ritually speaking, a woman is without rank, title, or name of her own. And hence it is by necessity that a woman throughout her life cycle is dictated by the doctrine of “three-fold following/dependency” (sancong 三從): when young, she follows her father, when married, her husband, when widowed, her sons. The advantage of translating cong 從 as following/dependency instead of obedience is that the principle of generational seniority is one of the mitigating factors in the Chinese gender system where not only is the position of mother accorded with accolades textually and ritually, but also is in actual possession of a tremendous amount of power over the sons however grand the sons’ social stations may be: emperors, generals, prime ministers, or famed scholars.

The iconic maternal model of Mengmu—the widowed mother of Mencius—is a case in point. As recorded in the Exemplary Women’s Biographies (Lienü zhuan) 1.11, Mencius was displeased with his wife for what he perceived as her lack of ritual propriety in their private quarter; instead of sending her daughter-in-law back to her natal family, Mengmu reprimanded Mencius for his own lack of ritual propriety by entering their private quarter without first announcing himself as the instigating cause of this familial discord (for translation see Kinney 2014). It is clear from this famed tale of Mengmu that the widowed mother continued to exercise her maternal authority over the adult son, overriding his decisions even on his spousal relations. Nonetheless, even a revered widowed mother is still ritually a person without rank, title, or name of her own. The iconic case of Mengmu is after all memorialized as the mother of Mencius who went on to achieve great literary and political fame!

4.1 Sancong 三從 and Side 四德

A woman’s dependency on men throughout her entire life cycle is codified ritually, textually, but also by necessity, given the fact that no other socially sanctioned venues to the realm of wai are open to her. The teaching of sancong 三從 first appears in the Liji and is widely circulated in the later Confucian texts.[9] As explained in the Liji in conjunction with the marriage rite:

Women are the ones who follow others; when they are young they follow their fathers and elder brothers, when they are married they follow their husbands, and when their husbands die they follow their sons. “Husband” denotes supporter. A husband uses wisdom to lead others. (Liji, “Jiaotesheng” chapter)

To be compliant was generally advised as the way of married women. As recorded in the Mencius, “To look upon compliance (shun 順) as their correct course is the way of married women” (3B2; for other translations see Lau 1970 [2003]).

Since marriage is the only socially sanctioned venue open to women, to successfully navigate the marriage life is essential for women; the teaching of “four [womanly] virtues” (side 四德) is meant to explicitly spell out four essential areas for women’s self-cultivation, much like the teaching of “five social relations” (wulun 五倫) for men as they journey outward from family, state, to the world at large (Mencius 3A4; Zhongyong, Ch. 20; Daxue). The teaching of side was first introduced in the Liji as an intensive three-month training curriculum for the bride-to-be in the context of the marriage rite; the betrothed young maiden is to be instructed on four areas of being a wife: virtue, speech, comportment, and work (Liji, “Hunyi” chapter). And Ban Zhao’s Nüjie then provided a clear summation and explanation of what each area consists of.

The basic tenet of side is diligence and sincerity; these four areas of self-cultivation are achievable ideals for women in much the same way as the virtue of ren 仁 is an achievable ideal for Confucius. As Ban Zhao wrote,

These four are women’s utmost virtues, therefore one cannot be without them. With intentional sincerity, they are easy to accomplish. Confucius is said to have commented: “Is ren far? If I desire ren, ren is here. This is what it means”. (Nüjie, Ch. 4: “Fuxing”; also see Analects 7.30)

The parity of side for women and ren as the highest Confucian ideal (for men) is clear. Even though the virtue of ren is non-gendered in Confucian texts, the necessary concentric expansion of one’s moral cultivation from family, state, to the world at large is not accessible to women, and hence in effect, the highest achievable moral ideal for women is side, that focuses on practical training in the areas of ritual propriety, cautious speech, modest comportment, and household management in the roles of wife and mother.

4.2 Women’s Education and Nüshishu 女四書

The cultivation of women’s domestic roles in the nei as on par with men’s expansive moral cultivation in the wai is propagated partly through the literary genre of the “didactic texts for women” that are written for, of, and by women. Ban Zhao’s Nüjie (c. 106 CE) is the inaugurating text, which, by and large, focuses on the limited domestic roles and ritual trainings for women emphasizing modesty, pleasing compliance, spousal fidelity, resourcefulness, and diligent servitude to patrilineage. The overall conservative bent of this literary genre contrasts greatly with the emergence of gender-based consciousness as its natural fallout from a literary genre that gives justifications to not only female readership, but also female authorship and hence also provides justifications for advanced literary education for women as well.

In order to advocate for an equal educational curriculum for women, Ban Zhao in Chapter two of the Nüjie appealed to the textual authority of the Liji to lay claim that girls at age eight should begin their literary education and by age fifteen should be given advanced classical education, despite the contrary was stated in the cited text. In the Liji, “Neize” chapter, two separate educational curricula for boys and girls are explicitly laid out: girls are to learn only basic literacy of numbers and objects, and by age ten while boys begin their classical education with outside mentors, girls cease to venture out. Instead, girls should focus on the domestic trainings of cooking, weaving, and food preparation in addition to mastering pleasing speech and compliance. Serving equivalently as the grand imperial scholar, Ban Zhao would be highly unlikely ignorant of the ritual injunction stated in the Liji; Ban Zhao’s textual subversion for the sake of equal education for women was then obviously intentional. The radicality of Ban Zhao’s advocacy for educational parity, however, was clothed under the conservative rhetoric of husbandly leadership and wifely servitude: husband should lead the wife with virtue and wife should serve the husband with virtue, and hence both should be equally educated (Nüjie, Ch. 2; for translation see Swann 1932 [2001]; Pang-White 2018). Setting aside the many possible reasons for Ban Zhao’s conservatism, the irony that women should be given advanced education on par with men so that they can serve men better is not lost here.

Nonetheless, Ban Zhao’s advocacy for educational parity itself became a historical precedent and a much needed justification for many virtuous and talented women in subsequent generations to continue pursuing a life of literary learning and authorship in a society where there were no legitimate venues available for women to apply their advanced education beyond the domestic realm of nei. Unlike men, these women of talents required additional justifications for them to cross the ritual boundary into the realm of wai. The literary genre of women’s didactic texts—its conservativism notwithstanding—provided that safe passage for learned and talented women to cross into the wai without leaving the nei nominally.

The authors of the Four Books for Women (Nüsishu) compiled by Wang Xiang during the late Ming are cases in point. All five women authors lived an extraordinary life on par with their male counterparts: Ban Zhao’s Nüjie of Han (c.106 CE), Song Ruoxin and Song Ruozhao’s The Analects for Women (Nülunyu) of Tang (c.820/825 CE), Empress Renxiaowen’s Instructions for the Inner Quarter (Neixun) of Ming (c.1405 CE), and Woman Liu’s Concise Selections of Model Women (Nüfan jielu) of Ming (c.1580 CE).[10] In a sense, one of the safest ways for women to exercise their socially deemed superfluous literary talents was to author conservative didactic texts which provided a deflecting cover for their extraordinary lives.

Ban Zhao, as noted earlier, lived an exceptional life of scholarship and state governance that was beyond the reach of not only women in the nei, but also most men of letters. Song Ruoxin and Song Ruozhao of Tang declined marriage proposals, instead choosing a life of scholarly work and were appointed by the emperor as “scholar-officials/teachers” (xueshi 學士/xiansheng 先生) instructing princes, princesses, and consorts alike. Empress Renxiaowen lived a life of the highest level of literary learning by virtue of her royal position, but also had her literary works including Neixun preserved and propagated by the Emperor’s royal edict, making them available to the wider audience. Woman Liu, unlike all the previous authors, did not come from a prominent family, but was widowed at a young age and lived a long life of her own accord immersed in literary learning for sixty years, writing the most self-assertive didactic text among the Nüsishu and had her writings preserved by her son Wang Xiang, the editor of the Nüsishu (Pang-White 2018).

The impact of this uniquely women-centric literary genre of the didactic texts for women obviously went beyond its overall conservative content. Its subversive effect on virtuous and talented women was made clear not only through the kind of life that these women authors had, but also through the emergence of gender-based consciousness that asserted not only the importance of women’s work in the nei, but also women’s own authority over their own domain. Instead of looking to men for intellectual guidance, virtuous and talented women became the historical precedents for other women.

4.3 Gender-based Consciousness

The emergence of gender-based consciousness is the natural fallout from this uniquely women-centric literary genre made for women, of women, and by women. Ban Zhao’s Nüjie as the inaugurating text for this literary genre and the kind of life that Ban Zhao lived became inspirational models for other equally talented and virtuous women. Song Ruoxin and Song Ruozhao who self-consciously invoked Ban Zhao as their interlocutor in their original draft of the Nülunyu—intended as a parity to the Confucian canonic text of Lunyu—are clear examples of this sort. Instead of looking to Confucius as their intellectual guide, the two Song sisters took Xuan Wenjun (c. 4th century CE)—a learned woman held the position of instructor in the state academy teaching over one hundred students—as Confucius, and took Ban Zhao as their Yen Hui (i.e., Confucius’s favorite disciple) in their imagined dialogical instructions to provide domestic counsels to women (Jiutangshu, Ch. 56, paragraph 33), seemingly invoking a women-centric intellectual genealogy.

Empress Renxiaowen composed Neixun with a view to supplant Ban Zhao’s seven brief chapters of Nüjie in order to offer a comprehensive text for women’s education; this is another example of women’s affirmation of their own intellectual authority over the domain of nei. Furthermore, Empress Renxiaowen equated her own effort in writing the Neixun as a standard text for women’s education with the famed Confucian scholar’s (i.e., Zhu Xi; 1130–1200 CE) compilation of the Elementary Learning (Xiaoxue) as a standard text for men (Neixun, Preface), making women’s education comparable to men’s.

The self-assertiveness of a women-centric genealogy and women’s own intellectual authority is most clearly illustrated in the Nüfan jielu, the last text of the Nüsishu. Unlike Ban Zhao’s Nüjie, Woman Liu’s Nüfan jielu was not overly concerned with household management nor immersed in excessive humble rhetoric of lowliness. Instead, Woman Liu appealed to past virtuous and talented women from empresses, female generals, concubines, to servants as historical precedents to illustrate the importance of nei and furthermore to advocate for the priority of nei over wai, women over men, daughters over sons (Nüfan jielu, Ch. 1, Ch. 3, Ch. 9, and Ch. 11). Woman Liu’s audacious claim of female priority is part of this subversive effect of the didactic texts for women, which paradoxically are meant to propagate female servitude and compliance to patrilineage.

5. Patrilineage and Gender Oppression

Virtuous and talented women who are able to leave their marks in the wai are indeed few and far between. Women for the most part in Confucian philosophy are exalted for their unyielding devotion and diligent servitude to patrilineage throughout their life cycle as daughters, wives, or mothers. Since there is no other socially sanctioned venue for women to leave their marks in history, the only social accolade for women comes in the form of their exceptional devotion and servitude to patrilineage. The literary genre of biographies of “exemplary women” (lienü 列女) compiled by Confucian court historians is a case in point.

Liu Xiang’s Lienü zhuan 列女傳 (c. 18 BCE) is the inaugurating text for the “lienü” literary tradition that later became a standard feature in each dynastic history from the Han to the last dynasty of the Qing (for the “lienü” entry in dynastic histories, see Judge and Ying 2011, Appendix B). Liu Xiang’s Lienu zhuan is a collection of commentarial biographies of women from early antiquity onward and was originally composed as an admonition to Emperor Cheng (r. 33–7 BCE) to recognize the importance as well as the precarious influences of palace women. The text was organized under six distinct sets of virtues—“maternal rectitude” (muyi 母儀), “worthy and enlightened” (xianming 賢明), “benevolent and wise” (renzhi 仁智), “principled and righteous” (jieyi 節義) and “persuasive and communicative” (biantong 辯通), plus one chapter on the “deprived and favored” (niebi 孽嬖). As shown above, women in antiquity were not strictly praised for their gender roles per se since among the six sets of virtues enumerated in the text, only the virtue of muyi 母儀 (maternal rectitude) is gender-role specific. And yet women’s unyielding devotion and diligent servitude to patrilineage still formed part of their social memorialization in other non-gender specific categories of virtue.

5.1 Lienü zhuan 列女傳 and Gendered Virtues

Female servitude to patrilineage is so pervasive that it shapes even the way in which a virtuous and talented woman is memorialized even if the enumerated virtues under which she is celebrated are non-gender specific. For instance, even under the non-gendered virtue of “persuasive and communicative” (biantong) where women in early antiquity were celebrated as skillful rhetoricians turning a precarious situation in their favor through the sheer power of persuasion, the narratives of these skillful women rhetoricians were still told in the context of or their servitude to patrilineage.

Take for example the opening biography of Ch. 6, Lienü zhuan 6.1: “Guan Zhong of Qi’s Concubine, Jing”. Jing was a skillful rhetorician who successfully helped Guan Zhong (c. 720—645 BCE)—the famed prime minister of Qi—decipher the opaque speech of Ning Qi. Guan Zhong was under the Duke’s directive to gauge Ning Qi’s intention to serve, and yet during their encounter Ning Qi only uttered the phrase “How vast, the white water” which had vexed Guan Zhong for five days. Upon seeing Guan Zhong’s vexation, Jing, the concubine, offered her help to lessen his burden, but was quickly dismissed as nothing that she would understand. Jing was obviously erudite, since she was able to place Ning Qi’s speech of “How vast, the white water” in the context of an old Ode signaling Ning Qi’s willingness to serve the Duke. The story ended with a praise of Guan Zhong’s recommendation of Ning Qi to the Duke who then was able to secure the means to good governance. It is clear that even though Jing was as erudite as Ning Qi, one was offered the position of a minister and the other remained a lowly concubine who had to persuade Guan Zhong not to take her lowly status as the ground to dismiss her ability to help him in the first place. The most a talented woman could do was to be of service to the men of her kin who then were memorialized for their achievements in the wai.

5.2 Marriage and Womanhood

The prioritization of patrilineage underpins the Chinese family system and is codified in various ritual practices. For instance, the marriage rite has two different meanings for men and women. As explained in the White Tiger Hall (Baihutong), the term “marriage” (jiaqu 嫁娶) is in fact a compounded term: jia 嫁 for women and qu 娶 for men. For a woman, to get married (jia 嫁) is to seek an external completion so as to find a suitable home, and for a man, to qu 娶 is to acquire [a bride] (Baihutong, “Jiaqu” chapter; for other translations see Tjan 1949 [1952]; also see Shuowen jiezi). In other words, in the family system of patrilineage, marriage for the groom is an occasion of acquisition for his family contiguous to his existing identity, whereas for the bride an occasion of exodus from her own natal family in search for a new home, an external completion to her personhood/womanhood.

A successful integration into the husband’s patrilineage is indeed essential to a woman’s life ritually and by necessity. In the Confucian textual tradition, marriage is consummated, however, not through the physical intimacy between the husband and wife, but through the ritual completion of ancestor worship. According to the Liji, the purpose of marriage is twofold: first is to secure the sacrificial service in the ancestral temple, and second to continue the lineage (Liji, “Hunyi” chapter). To secure her service to the ancestral hall marks the priority of the marriage institution and hence also marks the beginning of a consummated marriage through which a new bride establishes herself as part of this new patrilineage.

A new bride becomes a wife in the fullest sense only after she has partaken in the ancestral rites; otherwise, she is not yet a member of her new patrilineal family. As explained in the Baihutong,

To take in a wife without first announcing it in the ancestral temple, it will be inauspicious […] Once a wife has been here for three months, she is now allowed to partake in the ancestral worship […] If she dies before partaking in the ancestral worship, her body is to be interred with her natal family; this is to show that she is not yet a wife in the fullest sense. (Baihutong, “Jiaqu” chapter; also see Liji, “Zengziwen” chapter)

In addition, according to the customary law of “Three grounds a wife cannot be expelled” (sanbuchu 三不出) as stated in the Family Sayings of Confucius (Kongzi jiayu), a wife’s participation in the three-year mourning ritual for the in-laws constitutes one of the three compelling grounds that overrides the customary law of “Seven reasons for expelling a wife” (qichu 七出), one of which is childlessness (Kongzi jiayu, “Benmingjie” chapter; for other translations see Kramers 1950).[11] In sum, for a woman to establish herself as part of this new patrilineage, she must retrospectively observe the ancestral rites or prospectively provide a male heir.

5.3 Wifely Fidelity and Widowhood

Non-gender specific virtues as enumerated in Liu Xiang’s Lienü zhuan dissipated from the subsequent dynastic historical accounts of exemplary women’s biographies; women in the post-Han era were praised specifically for adhering to their gender roles, such as wifely fidelity, widow chastity, and maternal rectitude (Raphals 1998: Appendix 5). The power of these historical accolades for women obviously reinforced the limited roles and social venues available for women. One way for women to garner social accolades is through observing spousal fidelity, and there is a long tradition in Confucian texts that teach the virtue of wifely fidelity. According to the Liji,

Faithfulness is the requisite in all service of others, and faithfulness is the virtue of a wife. Once mated, she will not change for her entire life; therefore, when her husband dies, she will not remarry. (Liji, “Jiaotesheng” chapter)

Similarly, as stated in the Baihutong in the context of the wifely duty to remonstrate with the husband:

when the remonstration is not taken, the wife cannot thus leave the husband. Once mated, the wife cannot change for her entire life. There is no justification for deserting one’s husband. (Baihutong, “Jianzheng” chapter)

Wifely fidelity to patrilineage is cumulated in the observance of widowhood, and since the Han dynasty (206 BCE–220 CE) onward, widowhood had been recognized as one of the many honored deeds by the imperial court with a “testimonial of merit” that elevated one’s entire household. The cult of widowhood reached its height during the Qing dynasty (1644 to 1912 CE) where widowhood became a religious expression that enshrined chaste widows at the state and county’s expense (Mann 1987: 37–56). Considering the fact that a woman is ritually without rank, title, or name of her own, for her to earn an imperial merit—which at times comes with monetary awards—is itself an impressive achievement. But as impressive as this might seem, social accolades for women, unlike those for men, must be mediated through patrilineage; she is exemplary because of her servitude to the men of her kin.

Without that kinship tie, it would be nearly impossible for a woman to acquire social recognition. One only needs to compare the biographies of “exemplary women” (lienü 列女) with the “exemplary [men’s] biographies” (liezhuan 列傳)—both are standard entries in each dynastic historical records compiled and written by Confucian court historians—and it is clear that there was no such kinship meditation needed for men of virtue, even though many of them were recorded to have benefited from their mothers’ instructions. Men are exemplary mainly because of their own doings, whereas women are memorialized, if and only if, they are tied to patrilineage as filial daughters, faithful wives, chaste widows, or devoted mothers.

In prioritizing the perpetuation of patrilineage, women often participate in gender oppressive practices such as female infanticide, child bride, and concubinage. It is in the wife’s interest that her new family has a male heir through which she anchors her place in the family, since her failure to produce children is one of the seven grounds for her expulsion from the marriage. Through whatever means necessary, a wife must ensure that there is sufficient family resources for her to produce or procure the coming of a male heir. Perpetuating patrilineage is also codified into the very practice of filiality (xiao 孝). As shown in this famed saying of Mencius,

There are three unfilial things, and to have no posterity is the greatest. King Shun married without informing his parents was because otherwise he would have no posterity. An exemplary person considers this so treating what he did as if he had informed them. (Mencius 4A26)

Not to inform one’s parents of one’s marriage is a serious ritual infraction, but the imperative to perpetuate one’s lineage overrides that ritual requirement. The perpetuation of patrilineage, hence, is of utmost importance.

6. Contemporary Feminist Discussions

A systematic examination of gender relations using gender as a category of analysis is a mark of feminist theorizing. In the philosophical community, this often involves critical re-reading of the canon shedding light on the overt display of misogyny textually, historically, and culturally in noted canonical thinkers from Plato to the twentieth century (e.g., the “Re-Reading the Canon” series of the Pennsylvania State University Press). But beyond the critical interrogation of the canon’s misogyny, feminists also engage in the effort of re-appropriation of the canon for the purpose of constructing liberating solutions for gender-based oppression (Schott 2003: Ch.1). However, in the theoretical space, feminist consciousness and westernization are more or less synonymous, since positive feminist theorizing is largely reliant on western canonical texts. Non-western intellectual traditions, if they are included at all, are used as an example of moral depravity to demonstrate the plights of “third-world” women.

6.1 “Third-world” Women and Multiculturalism

Around the 1970s, there was a surge of interest in studying the lives of women outside the western sphere in order to construct a global history of women. By going beyond the western sphere, feminists intended to provide an empirical proof of the urgency and the ubiquity of gender oppression, while expanding their sphere of concern to include their less fortunate sisters in the “third-world”. In cross-cultural studies, the status of “third-world” women is usually measured on a sliding scale of universal victimhood with western women being the most liberated, the most gender-conscious, and the most self-determined (Mohanty 1984, 2003; Mohanty, Russo, & Torres 1991; Narayan 1997). Western feminists see gender-based oppression faced by non-western women as “similar but much worse”, treating non-western cultures/traditions as the worsening factors aggravating the suffering of “third-world” women.

A multicultural approach to gender studies is said to be bad for “third-world” women, since, unlike the west, non-western cultures/traditions are said to be deeply entrenched in their patriarchal past, and unlike western feminists, “third-world” women with their “false consciousness” have no agency of their own (Okin 1994: 5 & 11; 1999: 22). The only solution to universal patriarchy then seems to be a whole-sale importation of western thought and way of life to the rest of the world. For “third-world” women are said to be better off, if their indigenous cultures are preferably changed by modeling after the western liberal culture or simply “to become extinct” (Okin 1999: 22).

In the western imagination, footbinding remains as the favorite example of Chinese patriarchy and moral depravity focusing on the exotic, highly sexualized nature of the practice (Levy 1966; Jackson 1997; Dworkin 1974; Greenhalgh 1977; Daly 1978 [1990]).[12] The familiar exoticization of footbinding is a clear case of “orientalism” seeing non-western cultures as barbaric and oppressive to the so-called “third-world” women (Said 1978). Even though there is no textual basis connecting Confucian philosophy to the practice of footbinding that has persisted for a thousand years, the prolonged co-existence of the practice and Confucian teaching to some makes Confucian philosophy suspect by association.

6.2 Care Ethics and Confucian Ren

Seeing non-western cultures/traditions as deeply entrenched in patriarchy of a by-gone era that should be left behind for good is a common sentiment in feminist encounters inter-culturally. And this is true in the feminist engagement with Confucian philosophy as well. From the turn of the twentieth century to the mid-1990s, the engagement between feminism and Confucian philosophy, as Terry Woo puts it, has been mostly a one-sided affair: feminists criticizing Confucianism for its victimization of women (Woo 1999: 110). The common caricature of Confucian philosophy as synonymous with patriarchy inevitably leads to the sentiment that Confucian philosophy is incompatible with feminist theorizing. Pushbacks from the Chinese-comparative communities against this feminist caricature began in the mid-1990s, centering on the positive comparison between care ethics and Confucian ren 仁 on the ground that both share the emphasis on caring relations and relational personhood (Li 1994; Hall & Ames 1998: 79–100; 2000: 75–96; and two special issues of the Journal of Chinese Philosophy: Lai [ed.] 2000 and Gu [ed.] 2009).

Some care ethicists have voiced specific concerns regarding the incorporation of non-western intellectual traditions into feminist theorizing, in that its distinctive “feminist” as well as “feminine” character is being adulterated by such incorporation (Held 2006: 22; Noddings 2010: 140).[13] “Indigenous” feminism that frames traditions in a progressive idiom is dismissed as a “cultural recovery” project, seen as easily coopted and swept away by the nationalistic efforts. The development of “indigenous” feminism is, hence, framed by some as “Trojan horses” from the conservative right that would only lead to further oppression of women on the ground (Dalmiya 2009: 205–207). Curiously, no such out-pouring worries are voiced when western intellectual traditions/canonical thinkers are routinely incorporated into contemporary feminist theorizing.

6.3 Comparative Feminist Studies on Confucianism

A quick survey of the content of publications in feminist journals such as Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy—whose journalistic mission is to propagate feminist philosophy—illustrates the lopsided dependency on western canonical texts for feminist theorizing. Few publications outside the Chinese-comparative philosophical communities have explored any feminist potential in non-western intellectual traditions including Confucianism to address women’s issues, concerns and experiences in the contemporary world. Non-western philosophies, if included at all, in feminist theorizing serve more as negative examples illustrating how else things could possibly go wrong for “third-world” women, instead of serving as positive conceptual resources for women’s liberation from gender-based oppression.

Despite the lack of positive engagement from the feminist communities with Confucian philosophy, the Chinese-comparative communities, nevertheless, persist. Around the mid-2010s, the Chinese-comparative communities began to go beyond the issue of compatibility between care ethics and Confucian ren and took a step further to articulate positive Confucian approaches to address women’s concerns, issues, and experiences in the contemporary world, such as abortion, same-sex marriage, mothering, ecofeminism, domestic violence, elder care, etc. (Butnor & McWeeny 2014; Olberding 2015; Pang-White 2016; Foust & Tan 2016; Yuan 2019). The field of comparative feminist philosophy exploring the feminist potential in Confucianism is the latest attempt to reconceptualize the complex connection between gender and Confucian philosophy laying the foundation for an inclusive, transnational, transcultural feminist theory.

7. Confucian Feminism: A Hybrid Feminist Theory

Considering how routinely canonical western philosophers—some with egregious connections to misogyny, white supremacy, Nazism, or pedophilia, personally or textually (Park 2013; Oltermann 2014; Zack 2017; Kirkpatrick 2019; Chrisafis 2019; Rosenlee 2020a,b)—are extensively integrated into contemporary feminist theorizing, it prompts the question: why not Confucian philosophy? In the following, we will look at a theoretical construction of a hybrid theory of Confucian feminism by using characteristic Confucian concepts, methods, and concerns to navigate women’s issues, concerns, and experiences in the contemporary world. Confucian feminism proposed here is not just a historical study of women’s lives in the Confucian textual tradition. Rather, it is a forward-looking project intended to formulate a feminist theory based on a distinct Confucian framework—a feminist theory that is Confucian—on par with other feminist theories such as liberal feminism, social feminism, etc. in the pantheon of feminism.

7.1 Rectification of Nei-Wai

Sexism is undeniably a shared human experience in most societies. Different intellectual traditions might have framed the degree and the ways in which women are lesser differently—let it be lesser in intellect, will, or sphere of influence—but women’s lesser status is plain. Women in Confucian philosophy are lesser, first and foremost, in their sphere of influence; the womanly sphere of nei—even though it is indispensable to the expansive sphere of wai—is restrictive and mostly concerned with the functional aspects of household management. Confucius’s famous saying that one does not need to leave home to get involved in state governance is true to a certain extent (Analects 2.21), but part of the process of self-cultivation to achieve moral perfectibility is to expand one’s sphere of influence concentrically from family, state, to the world at large.

A woman, confined to the realm of nei, is essentially a functional vessel for household management, a sort of thing that Confucius said a well-rounded exemplary person should not be (Analects 2.12). The structural impediment derived from the confinement of nei will need to be addressed in Confucian feminism, since any viable feminist theory, first of all, will need to be able to deal with the gender-based division of labor that confines each gender to a set of prescriptive roles and duties regardless of one’s actual capacities or unique circumstances. The nei-wai distinction as applied to gender, as noted earlier, is derived from the functional differentiation (bie 别) in the spousal relationship as in fufu youbie (夫婦有别). Hence, in order to address the problem of the confinement of nei, the spousal relationship as articulated in the Confucian five core social relations (Mencius 3A4; Zhongyong, Ch. 20; Daxue) will also need modification as well.

One possible replacement for the spousal relationship within the Confucian framework would be friendship (you 友), which is anchored in the virtue of trust (xin 信). Unlike the spousal relationship, friendship is not primarily, distinctively, nor invariably gender-based; furthermore, the excellence of Confucian friendship is marked by friends’ mutual commitment to moral perfectibility, instead of a functional distinction based on gender or a fulfillment of some sort of external obligations/duties. Lastly, given the long overlapping usage of friendship and familial relationships from antiquity onward, east and west, this substitution is not inappropriate textually or historically (Rosenlee 2015).[14]

7.2 Friendship as Spousal Relationship

Replacing spousal relationship with friendship will enable us to address the many problematics associated with the gender-based division of labor; furthermore, we will be able to accommodate the expanded institution of marriage to include same-sex couples. This new conceptual paradigm of marriage is both Confucian and feminist. It is feminist, since it discards gender-based restrictions/hierarchy in the division of labor. It is also Confucian, since it utilizes one of the five Confucian social relations (father-son, husband-wife, siblings, ruler-minister, friends). Friendship is a corridor bridging the familial and the world at large, in much the same way, marriage serves as a pathway through which two strangers become family. The idyllically enduring spousal bond till death do us part is also characteristic of true friendship in good times and bad. In sum, friendship and spousal relationship are not only compatible, but also oftentimes mirror one another in form and in content.

The advantage of using our Confucian friendship-based model of marriage is that it provides us with a flexible approach to household management and child-rearing as an alternative to the 50/50 equal split prevalent among liberal feminists (Okin 1989) or the call for the abolition of the institution of family and marriage advocated by some radical feminists (Allen 1984 [1993]; Card 1996, 2007). Compared to the liberal 50/50 equal split, the Confucian friendship model is much more attainable and, unlike the radical call for abolition, the Confucian model addresses instead of evading the problems of family and marriage. For the vast majority of women (and men) who continue to opt to enter the marriage institution and to propagate, the call for abolition provides no applicable guidance. Furthermore, the liberal template of absolute equality in intimate relationships is not attainable since favors done for one’s loved ones are not usually tracked on a scoresheet. Nor is this desirable. In a good relationship of any kind, there must be a sense of reciprocity, but unlike in a contractual transaction, in a good marriage or friendship, reciprocity is not marked by numerical equality.

For what is especially appealing about friendship is the penetrating understanding that two good friends have of one another, and that faithful understanding of one another is what enables friends to transcend the temporal needs to repay in kind and in a timely manner that an ordinary dealing in everyday life demands. Friends are faithful to one another, not in a sense of blind obedience, but in a way that insists on the enduring goodness in one another, both actual and potential. By being faithful to one another in this way, friends not only see what is good in one another, but also help realize what else is possible through thick and thin. Looking at marriage in this way, to mandate a 50/50 equal split makes marriage seem not only transactional, but also contrary to what is required in an enduring friendship.

7.3 Relational Personhood and Dependency Care

It is important to note that the Confucian friendship model is not a replica of the contemporary peer friendship model that is morally neutral and is underpinned by an autonomous concept of the self (English 1979 [1989]; Dixon 1995). As many contemporary scholars have argued, unlike the liberal model of individualism, Confucianism offers a relational conception of the self whose personhood is deeply entrenched in the intertwining of the self and other (Ivanhoe 2007; Ames 2011; Rosemont 2015). The Confucian relational personhood is, first and foremost, grounded in the parent-child relationship, and that Confucian emphasis on the parent-child relationship not only fits right into the ongoing feminist discourse on care ethics but also is ahead of the growing consensus among philosophers that the liberal concept of an autonomous self is a deeply flawed one.

Most feminists, even those anchored in the liberal tradition, have begun to theorize a more robust concept of the self that is relational and embodied (Mackenzie 2014). And most feminists have looked past the “Man of Reason” as a guide for moral and political theory (Lloyd 1984, 2002). In particular, feminists with the rise of care ethics have begun to take the activity of caring as meriting ethical insights that have long been discarded to the realm of the sentiment, personal, or pre-moral. In contrast, Confucianism not only exalts the moral valence of caring relations, but more importantly recognizes the political dimension of caring, a critical step that was lacking in the early development of care ethics (Card 1990; Friedman 1993: Ch. 6; Yuan 2002).

Confucianism understands that interdependency is an existential given and hence providing care to vulnerable others in Confucianism is not only a moral response, but also a characteristic political response of a ren-based benevolent state. For the way of Confucians, according to the competing school of Mo (Mojia), is characterized by the parental devotion of caring for the newborn infant (Mencius 3A5). Remarkably, in Confucian philosophy, the discussion of caring for the newborn infant occurs not in the context of the so-called “womanly sphere”, but instead in the context of state governance.

The metaphor of caring for the newborn infant in state governance is first derived from the Book of Documents (Shujing):

if the king tended to the people as if he were tending to his own newborn infant, then the people would be tranquil and orderly. (Shujing, “Kangzhao” chapter; for other translations see Legge 1879).

And the way to tend to the newborn infant is to be responsive and sincere. As the same passage is further elaborated in the Great Learning (Daxue):

In the “Kangzhao” [of Shujing] it is said, “Act as if you were watching over an infant”. If one is really responsively sincere, though one may not exactly hit the mark, one will not be far from doing so (for other translation see Legge 1885, Liji, “Daxue” chapter).

Providing good care for the most vulnerable is an integral part of Confucian political discourse. A kingly state, according to the Mencius, takes caring for those without the care of a family—the widower, the widow, the childless, and the orphan—as its first political consideration (Mencius 1B5). Similarly, according to the Xunzi in the discussion of the regulation of a king:

Those who have one of the Five Illnesses (wuji 五疾) should be raised up and gathered in so that they can be cared for. They should be given official duties commensurable with their abilities and employment adequate to feed and clothe themselves so that all are included and not even one of them is overlooked. (Xunzi 9.1)

According to the later commentary, the “Five Illnesses” here refers to physical or mental disabilities (Watson 1963: n3, 34).

Unlike the liberal bifurcation of the family and the state or the private and the public, the Confucian model provides a relational alternative to address the issue of dependency care that has long been advocated by care ethicists (Noddings 1984; Kittay 1999; Held 2006). For, in Confucianism, caring for others is not just constitutive of one’s moral personhood, but more importantly a political ideal that grounds the state authority in its demonstrated capacity to provide good care for the most vulnerable—the young, the old, the sick, and the disabled—as if one were caring for one’s own family. In other words, to care for those who cannot care for themselves beginning in one’s family and then concentrically radiating to the world at large has both ethical and political importance in Confucian philosophy.

7.4 Ren as Feminist Care

Some early critics of care ethics have pointed out that by advocating for a care-based approach to ethics by itself doesn’t make it feminist, since it might well exacerbate the demand for caring labor on women (Card 1990; Friedman 1993; Yuan 2002). In Confucian feminism, this imbalance in caring labor is addressed through the substitution of the gender-based division of labor in marriage on the basis of nei-wai with friendship. Without gender-based hierarchy or the gender-based division of labor on the basis of nei-wai, this Confucian model not only provides a flexible arrangement for both men and women to assume different caring responsibilities, but also guards against a one-sided demand for self-sacrifice. Since a mutual commitment to moral perfectibility is the anchor of Confucian friendship, exploitation and moral degradation characteristic in many oppressive relationships would also be contrary to a friendship-based marriage where caring labor is performed for the sake of propelling each other to moral perfectibility, not for the sake of fulfilling the gender-based division of labor or gender-based hierarchy.

Once the gender-based division of labor and hierarchy is removed from the performance of caring labor, Confucian feminism can move forward with its moral affirmation of the importance of caring for others, especially those who cannot care for themselves. This pronouncement is feminist because not only is it morally sound, but because, as a feminist, one should be committed to creating a more caring and equitable world not just for oneself but for those who need it most. No feminist, as Eva Kittay argues, would, could, or should advocate for voluntary abandonment of the old, the young, the sick, or the disabled, let it be under the pretext of the pursuit of equality or fairness (Kittay 2002: 238). If feminists abandon those who cannot help themselves, then the focus on one’s liberation from gender-based oppression rings hollow.

As in Confucianism where morality is deeply embedded in the cultivation of one’s relational personhood, feminism should also live up to the basic moral decency of being responsive to the needy, first, in one’s family and then concentrically radiating to the world at large. There should be no chasm between being a feminist and being a morally responsive person to those who cannot care for themselves from near to afar. Confucian feminism—a hybrid account of a feminist theory in a Confucian framework—is committed to creating an ever more inclusive and compassionate world through a ren-based self-cultivation and through a ren-based political governance.

The caricature of Confucianism as synonymous with patriarchy and a backwater ideology need not persist. With the rise of the field of comparative feminist studies on Confucianism, it is now also possible to imagine a hybrid Confucian-feminist theory to address women’s issues, concerns, and experiences. This tentative theoretical construct of Confucian feminism is here to serve as a facilitator to spur further positive engagement between the Chinese-comparative communities and the feminist communities to not only expand the range of our understanding of gender oppression in the lives of women, but also provide women with viable conceptual tools going beyond the confine of the western philosophical canon to articulate their own vision of a liberating future.


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All the Chinese texts cited can be found in the Chinese Text Project, an open sourced, internet search engine. All the Chinese translations are by the present author, unless noted otherwise.

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Other Internet Resources

Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry on Gender in Chinese Philosophy.

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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