Seventeenth-Century Theories of Consciousness

First published Thu Jul 29, 2010; substantive revision Fri Mar 6, 2020

In the seventeenth century, “consciousness” began to take on a uniquely modern sense. This transition was sparked by new theories of mind and ideas, and it connected with other important issues of debate during the seventeenth century, including debates over the transparency of the mental, animal consciousness, and innate ideas. Additionally, consciousness was tied closely to moral identity, with both French and Latin lacking even a linguistic distinction between consciousness and conscience (i.e., a moral sensibility). This semantic shift marked a philosophical division between the psychological or phenomenal aspects of thought and a moral sensibility as well. The discussions on all of these topics were rich and varied in the seventeenth century—the article below provides a view from forty thousand feet.

1.The Linguistic Transition

Tracing the development of consciousness in the early modern period is complicated by the fact that both Latin and French, the two primary languages in which philosophy was written, have a single term that could mean either (a) moral conscience, or (b) consciousness. For Latin, the term is conscientia; in French it is conscience. (The verb and adjective forms are similarly ambiguous.) These terms were used with both of their major senses (along with other minor senses) in the seventeenth century, and so any interpretation of the important texts will have to be sensitive to this potential ambiguity.

But, more importantly, the underlying reason for this ambiguity is due to the shift in meaning that was taking place during the seventeenth century. Conscientia and conscience, both of which primarily signified a moral conscience prior to the seventeenth century, were now taking on a new, purely psychological, meaning. And the philosophers of this period were among the main figures influencing this shift in meaning.

Things aren’t any easier for philosophy written in English or German, both of which do have a linguistic means of distinguishing the two concepts. The English term “consciousness” first became widely used in the seventeenth century to mark out this new concept; the German term “Bewusstsein” was coined in the early eighteenth century (the German word for conscience is “Gewissen”). But even with a new word to identify the concept, the English and German terms had multiple shades of meaning. By 1727, we find an English text defining consciousness as:

(a) “The reflex Act, by which a Man knows his Thoughts to be his own Thoughts,” (b) “the Direct Act of Thinking; or (which is of the same Import;) simple Sensation,” or (c) “the Power of Self-motion, or of beginning of Motion by the Will” (quoted in Thiel 1991, p. 80).

So, when reading English philosophical texts it is a tricky matter assigning a meaning or analysis to the term. But, of course, this is true to the nature of the problem. Philosophers of the seventeenth century were sketching out a concept that remains problematic to this day. In today’s discussions of consciousness, it is fairly common to mark out even further distinctions to identify which aspect of the problem one is addressing (creature consciousness, state consciousness, phenomenal consciousness, access consciousness, etc.). While some have used these later terms to make sense of what seventeenth-century philosophers are attempting to articulate in their theories, these finer-grained concepts will be for the most part left to today’s philosophers. This entry will instead see what sense can be made from the seventeenth-century philosophers' own attempts at providing a coherent analysis of consciousness.

(For a helpful survey of linguistic history the Latin term conscientia prior to the seventeenth century, see Hennig 2007, pp. 466–481. For the transition in seventeenth century French, see G. Lewis 1950, pp. 111–114. For an account of the introduction of the philosophical term in English, see Thiel 1991. For a more literary account of the different senses of the terms in Latin and Greek, see C.S. Lewis 1960.)

The Story. It will be helpful to sketch the narrative arc before becoming immersed in the details of individual systems. There are two significant shifts that will emerge in the discussion below. The first is the one I’ve already indicated: the transition from moral conscience to a purely psychological concept of consciousness—a move from shared knowledge to a notion of consciousness as what is privately introspectable. This starts with Descartes and, in England, with the Cambridge Platonists. While this is certainly a major development, the central concept remains largely unanalyzed. The second shift occurs later in the seventeenth century, when philosophers start to see consciousness as itself something to be explained. This latter transition begins with the Cartesian philosophers who say more about the nature of consciousness in their development of Descartes’s system and in order to avoid some of the objections raised against it. But for the most part these Cartesians remained committed to consciousness as a fundamental property of the mind, a “mark of the mental.” Leibniz completes this second transition by arguing that consciousness cannot be a mark of the mental. He develops an account of mental representation and provides an analysis of consciousness in terms of mental representations, arguing that this results in a fully natural explanation for something that was otherwise mysterious. This represents the start of an explanatory project that continues to this day: can consciousness be explained in terms of something more fundamental?

2. Descartes and the Cartesians

A history of consciousness, in its modern sense, properly starts with Descartes. While it is true that some ancient and medieval philosophers prefigured some aspects of the modern concept of consciousness (see Heinämaa, et al. 2007), a significant shift took place in the seventeenth century, and starting with Descartes in particular, that corresponds with the linguistic shift describe above. So, it is worth asking what it is about Descartes’s project that gave rise to a new way of thinking about conscientia.

2.1 Descartes on Consciousness

In the Geometric Exposition following the second set of replies to the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641), Descartes defines thought in the following way:

Thought. I use this term to include everything that is within us in such a way that we are immediately aware [conscii] of it. Thus all the operations of the will, the intellect, the imagination and the senses are thoughts. I say ‘immediately’ so as to exclude the consequences of thoughts; a voluntary movement, for example, originates in a thought. (CSM II 113 / AT VII 160; cf. Principles of Philosophy Part I, §9 / AT VIIIA 7–8)

Here, in 1641, we have Descartes defining thought in terms of consciousness—a thought is something “in us” of which we are conscious.

There are obvious problems from the start. In what way am I conscious of my thoughts? It seems, rather, that I am conscious of what my thoughts represent. Descartes was well aware of the distinction between a thought and the object of thought, and he made use of two technical terms to mark out this distinction. Descartes distinguished between the form of thought, which he calls idea:

Idea. I understand the term to mean the form of any given thought, immediate perception of which makes me aware [conscius] of the thought. (CSM II 113 / AT VII 160)

Notice the similar reflective aspect of this: it is the perception of an idea that makes me conscious of the thought. But the idea is simply the form of the thought itself. The object of thought is whatever is represented by the thought. And so, Descartes defines the “objective reality of an idea” as “the being of the thing which is represented by an idea insofar as it exists in the idea…. For whatever we perceive as being in the objects of our ideas exists objectively <or by representation> in the ideas themselves” (CSM II 113 / AT VII 160).

And so, as a first pass, it seems that consciousness for Descartes entails a perception (that has some content) and a second reflective act by which I am aware of the first perception. It seems that the reflective aspect of consciousness does remain as a part of Descartes’s account of consciousness, but we’ll see that it’s less clear just what exactly the “second reflective act” is. But it is also the case that Descartes isn’t so interested in an analysis of consciousness as such. We might be looking for an analysis of consciousness; Descartes is not. For Descartes, consciousness is taken as given.

To see the trajectory from earlier theories of mind, it will be helpful simply to see that, in the cogito argument of the First and Second Meditations, Descartes sees reason to doubt all features of his mind other than what is consciously available to him. And even then, his conscious thoughts serve only as evidence of his own existence—they don’t give any further evidence that what they represent about things external to him either exist at all or exist as represented by the idea in his mind. And so consciousness implicitly becomes, for Descartes, the “mark of the mental” and any further development of theories of mind along these lines will have to consider the role of consciousness in the mental economy.

The role of consciousness, for Descartes, is primarily epistemic—it makes certain things available to the mind. Three particular aspects of this come to the fore in the Meditations:

  1. Transparency of the Mental: All of my thoughts are evident to me (I am aware of all of my thoughts), and my thoughts are incorrigible (I can’t be mistaken about whether I have a particular thought).[1]
  2. Reflection: Any thought necessarily involves knowledge of myself.[2]
  3. Intentionality: My thoughts come to me as if representing something.[3]

Each of these emerge as necessary planks of Descartes’s argument in the Meditations. By simply having a thought (e.g., “I am doubting”) I know that I am having a thought and that this necessarily entails that I exist. This inference depends on the transparency of the mental and a reflective act (which Descartes further emphasizes in the Third Meditation, CSM II 34 / AT VII 49). Further, the intentionality of thought is part of what allows the meditator to infer that he is not alone in the world—he has a thought of an infinitely perfect being, and he has other thoughts of material objects. From this material—the thoughts and what they appear to represent—he is able to infer that God and the material world do in fact exist.

Do these three factors provide us with a full analysis of consciousness? Not entirely. But when pressed to defend these three aspects of the mind, he gives us more material from which we may infer an account of consciousness. For example, Antoine Arnauld, in the Fourth Set of Objections, raises the following problem for Descartes:

The author lays it down as certain that there can be nothing in him, in so far as he is a thinking thing, of which he is not aware [conscius], but it seems to me that this is false. For by ‘himself, in so far as he is a thinking thing,’ he means simply his mind, in so far as it is distinct from his body. But all of us can surely see that there may be many things in our mind of which the mind is not aware [conscius]. The mind of an infant in its mother’s womb has the power of thought, but is not aware [conscius] of it. And there are countless similar examples, which I will pass over. (CSM II 150 / AT VII 214)

Arnauld is objecting here to the transparency thesis—there are countless examples, he thinks, of thoughts of which the thinker is not conscious (a very interesting admission!). How does Descartes respond?

As to the fact that there can be nothing in the mind, in so far as it is a thinking thing, of which it is not aware [conscius], this seems to me to be self-evident. For there is nothing that we can understand to be in the mind, regarded in this way, that is not a thought or dependent on a thought. If it were not a thought or dependent on a thought it would not belong to the mind qua thinking thing; and we cannot have any thought of which we are not aware [conscius] at the very moment when it is in us. In view of this I do not doubt that the mind begins to think as soon as it is implanted in the body of an infant, and that it is immediately aware [conscius] of its thoughts, even though it does not remember this afterwards because the impressions of these thoughts do not remain in the memory. (CSM II 171–172 / AT VII 246)

The possible evidence against the transparency thesis, namely, the baby in the womb, does not tell against it, since failing to remember having a conscious thought does not entail that one did not have a conscious thought. But this answer, as a defense of the transparency thesis, raises a problem for reflection. If reflection is necessarily involved in consciousness, for Descartes, then is he here granting that even a fetus can reflect?

Descartes appears to resist this in his later correspondence with Arnauld. Arnauld distinguishes “simple reflection” from “express reflection,” and argues that although “simple reflection” is “intrinsic to all thought,” it is distinct from the sort of reflection necessary for intellectual memory and understanding. Descartes responds with his own distinction:

[W]e make a distinction between direct and reflective thoughts corresponding to the distinction between direct and reflective vision…. I call the first and simple thoughts of infants direct and not reflective…. But when an adult feels [sentio] something, and simultaneously perceives that he has not felt it before [i.e., it involves intellectual memory], I call this second perception reflection, and attribute it to the intellect alone, in spite of its being so linked to sensation that the two occur together and appear to be indistinguishable from each other. (CSM III 357 / AT V 220–221)

Arnauld, however, preserves this distinction in terms of reflection. According to Arnauld,

[O]ur thought or perception is essentially reflective upon itself: or, as it is said rather better in Latin, est sui conscia. For I do not think without knowing that I think. I do not know a square without knowing that I know it. (Arnauld 71)

This reflection that is essential to any thought, however, does not involve a second order perception. Each thought, according to Arnauld, has reflection built into it—a representation of the subject of thought is an essential part of the content of each thought. This is what he calls “simple” or “virtual reflection” to distinguish it from the sort of reflection that is a result of the subject focusing her attention on some other thought, which does require a second-order thought taking the lower-order thought as its object. (See Nadler 1989, 118–22 for discussion of this.)

Although Descartes resists attributing reflection, even simple reflection, to infants, Arnauld’s distinction is in line with Descartes’s response to another of his objectors. Pierre Bourdin attempts to raise problems for Descartes on the supposition that consciousness requires a distinct reflective thought:

By “thinking” you may mean that you understand and will and imagine and have sensations, and that you think in such a way that you can contemplate and consider your thought by a reflexive act. This would mean that when you think, you know and consider that you are thinking (and this is really what it is to be conscious [conscius esse] and to have conscious awareness [conscientia] of some activity). Such consciousness, you claim, is a property of a faculty or thing that is superior to matter and is wholly spiritual, and it is in this sense that you are a mind or a spirit. (CSM II 364 / AT VII 533–534)

Descartes denies this inference:

My critic says that to enable a substance to be superior to matter and wholly spiritual…, it is not sufficient for it to think: it is further required that it should think that it is thinking, by means of a reflexive act, or that it should have awareness [conscientia] of its own thought. This is…deluded…. [T]he initial thought by means of which we become aware [adverto] of something does not differ from the second thought by means of which we become aware that we were aware of it [per quam advertimus nos istud prius advertisse], any more than this second thought differs from the third thought by means of which we become aware that we were aware that we were aware. (CSM II 382 / AT VII 559)

Descartes does not here deny that reflection is necessary for consciousness. Rather, he is denying that reflection requires a distinct thought. (Note, however, the shift in tense, “…we become aware that we were aware…,” which casts doubt on whether these could be identical thoughts. More on this below.)

And so, in response to these objections Descartes gives us some refinements on his account of consciousness. Consciousness, for Descartes, is an intrinsic property of all thoughts (even of the thoughts of infants) by which the subject becomes aware of the thought itself. While this involves reflection, the reflective thought is not distinct from the initial thought itself.

The adjustments Descartes makes in his claims about consciousness have led some scholars to conclude that Descartes doesn’t have a single account of consciousness. Rather, he is working with multiple distinct notions of consciousness (see Radner 1988, Lähteenmäki 2007, and Simmons 2012). Whether or not he would have been aware of this is unclear.

Summary. Descartes provides one of the first purely psychological uses of the concept of consciousness when he defines thought in terms of consciousness. However, he does not provide an analysis of the concept. Rather, he employs the concept in a way that grounds his epistemic claims in the Meditations, for example. But the ways in which he employs the concept is suggestive of an analysis: a conscious thought is a mental state that is somehow self-intimating. And all thoughts, according to Descartes, have this basic property.

This sketch of an analysis was bequeathed to Descartes’s disciples, who argued over how best to understand consciousness. It is clear that Descartes’s project gives a central role to consciousness, but Descartes nowhere gives us an analysis of this basic concept. Is there anything about consciousness as such that allows it to play this central role?

(For more on the topic of consciousness and the related topics of transparency of the mental, representation, and reflection in Descartes, see Alanen 2003, Broughton 2008, Hennig 2007, Lähteenmäki 2007, McRae 1972, Radner 1988, Rozemond 2006, Simmons 2012, and Wilson 1978. Interpretations of Descartes’s account of consciousness differ significantly. Hennig, for example, argues that Descartes is not in fact using the term conscientia in a new way. Simmons, on the other hand, argues that Descartes has the resources for a nuanced account of consciousness, allowing for a wide variety of psychological phenomena.)

2.2 In the Aftermath of Descartes

Three main threads of a psychological sense of conscience emerge from this sketch of Descartes’s views, and they immediately generate philosophical controversy.

  1. Consciousness makes thoughts transparent to the mind: Are we aware of all our thoughts? When we are aware of having a thought, can we doubt that we are having that thought?
  2. Consciousness involves reflection. Is consciousness essentially constituted by a perception distinct from the original perception? Does consciousness necessarily involve memory or reflection? Is all consciousness a form of self-consciousness?
  3. Conscious thought is intentional. Are all thoughts representational? What is the nature of intentionality and what is its relation to consciousness?

Each of these three sets of questions were taken up and developed in different directions by the philosophers that followed Descartes most closely. The Cartesians, as they are called, were divided on each of these issues, and these sets of questions continue with us in one form or another to this day.

2.2.1 Transparency

Many Cartesians followed Descartes in defining thought in terms of consciousness. Louis de la Forge, who systematized Descartes’s account of the mind, defined thought in this way:

Thought [is] that perception, consciousness [conscience], or inner knowledge which each one of us experiences directly in ourselves when we are aware of [s’aperçevoir de] what we do or of what takes place in ourselves. (La Forge 39)

And later,

[T]he nature of thought consists [in] that consciousness [conscience], testimony [témoignage] and inner sensation [sentiment interieur] by which the mind is aware [averti] of everything it does or suffers and, in general, of everything which takes place immediately in itself at the same time as it acts or is acted on. (La Forge 57, translation altered)

Note that here La Forge elaborates on Descartes’s definition. He treats these terms as equivalent: perception, consciousness, testimony, inner sensation. Descartes does not describe consciousness in terms of sentiment, and this addition raises important questions—is consciousness simply a kind of sensation? Is it to interior perception what our senses of sight, sound, taste, etc. are to the perception of external things? Or is it different in kind?

Malebranche follows La Forge in this identification. In The Search after Truth, Malebranche uses “consciousness” (conscience) and “inner sensation” (sentiment interieur) interchangeably. (See, for example, Book III, Part 2, Chapter 7, Search 236–239.) Later, he defines thought in a way that closely models La Forge’s definition:

[B]y the words thought, mode of thinking, or modification of the soul, I generally understand all those things that cannot be in the soul without the soul being aware of them through the inner sensation it has of itself. (Search 218)

(Schmaltz argues that Malebranche was strongly influenced by La Forge in his argument here. See Schmaltz 1996, 16ff.)

Thus, La Forge and Malebranche continue Descartes’s commitment to transparency. However, the shift to “interior sense” is an important shift, since it marks a shift in the content of what is transparent to the mind, especially concerning the mind’s own nature. Malebranche famously denied Descartes’s claim that the mind is better known than the body. This is due to the fact that, although we know body confusedly through our sensations of the external world, we nevertheless have knowledge of the nature of body. (I’ll leave aside Malebranche’s complicated story of how we come to have that knowledge.) But, in the case of the mind, all we have is the internal sense of the mind—we do not know the nature of the mind since we have no such concept. Malebranche says:

It is true that we know well enough through our consciousness, or the inner sensation that we have of ourselves, that our soul is something of importance. But what we know of it might be almost nothing compared to what it is in itself. (Search 238)

He later gives an explanation of why we have knowledge of bodies through the ideas of bodies, but not so for the soul:

The knowledge that we have of our soul through consciousness is imperfect, granted; but it is not false. On the other hand, that knowledge that we have of bodies through sensation or consciousness, if the confused sensation we have of what takes place in our body can be called consciousness, is not only imperfect, but also false. We therefore need an idea of the body to correct our sensations of it—but we need no idea of our soul, since our consciousness of it does not involve us in error…. (Search 239)

Thus, consciousness, as internal sensation, gives us imperfect knowledge of the soul, but it is knowledge that is sufficient for all practical (and, importantly for Malebranche, theological) purposes.

So, the subtle shift in the meaning of consciousness to “internal sensation” places some limits on what can be known about the mind by means of consciousness. One can be aware that one is thinking, but this does not give us a clear idea of the soul. It is not self-knowledge of the same sort. But note also the other shift that this entails—marked by Malebranche’s qualification in the passage above. The sensation of external objects may not be (properly speaking) consciousness. Consciousness is an interior phenomenon, a sensation of what is going on in us, and so the visual perception of a red ball can be called consciousness only in a derivative way. This leads us to questions about reflection, taken up in the next thread.

2.2.2 Reflection

As discussed above, already in the Seventh Objections to the Meditations, the objection was raised that consciousness appears to require a distinct reflective thought. Descartes denied the inference, saying that

[T]he initial thought by means of which we become aware of something does not differ from the second thought by means of which we become aware that we were aware of it, any more than this second thought differs from the third thought by means of which we become aware that we were aware that we were aware. (CSM II 382 / AT VII 559)

Again, as noted above, Descartes’s response here is not a denial that reflection is necessary for consciousness—he denies that reflection requires a distinct thought. La Forge and Malebranche both follow Descartes in this denial (see Schmaltz 1996, 18).

But this passage is somewhat ambiguous. Here Descartes distinguishes (1) becoming aware of something, which apparently requires only a single thought, from (2) becoming aware that we were aware of something. Apparently, first-order awareness does not require a reflective act. And, while becoming aware that we were aware of something does require a reflective act, it does not require a distinct thought (and so the threatening regress is not problematic). But it’s not at all clear from this passage how the reflection could be built in to the original thought, especially since there appears to be a shift in tenses (the second awareness is temporally posterior to the initial awareness).

Antoine Arnauld develops an account of reflection that incorporates this distinction. The reflection that is essential to any thought does not involve a second order perception. As noted above, Arnauld argued that each thought has reflection built into it, although this does not entail a second-order thought. Only explicit reflection, where an individual focuses their attention on their own thoughts, requires a second-order perception. (For more on Arnauld’s account, see Nadler 1989, 118–22.)

As Geneviève Lewis shows, this issue became a critical source of debate in the later seventeenth century. She notes that Pierre-Silvain Régis, in his defense of Cartesianism, commits himself to some sort of reflective knowledge as a constitutive part of consciousness. Régis, like Arnauld, reaches all the way back to Augustine as a source for this doctrine, quoting Augustine’s claim that “it is necessary that [an animal] perceives (sentio) that it does see when it sees” (Augustine 37, quoted by Régis, Système I, 150) When conscious of something, one “perceives that one perceives it.” This way of putting it was actually quite common as a way of describing the psychological sense of consciousness—one not only sees a red ball, but one also perceives that one perceives the red ball. This sounds for all the world like a reflective act.

On the basis of this, one of the chief opponents to Cartesianism, Pierre Daniel Huet, argues that the Cartesians are begging the question. He argues,

Every thought involves three things: the thinking mind, the thing placed before the thinking mind [i.e., the object of thought], and the action of the thinking mind on the thing placed before it. (Huet 82)

Descartes, Huet contends, fails to distinguish these three things in the cogito argument. When Descartes says ego cogito, I am thinking, what is the object of thought? His own thought itself. But, and here is the objection, this cannot be the same thought as the original thought, “for if it were, the action would be turned back upon itself, which is absurd and contrary to the natural light so often invoked by Descartes” (83). Nevertheless, this is the very response Descartes gives in his response to Bourdin. Why does Huet think this is “absurd and contrary”?

Huet goes on:

[I]n order for me to think that I am thinking, two thoughts are needed, with one reflecting on the other—the later, current one on the previous, earlier one—so that in order for the first thought, by which the mind is aware, to be placed before the mind, the second thought, by which the mind is aware, is of the first thought. Or, in short, the first thought will be the end or object of the second; the second will be the action of the mind whereby it is directed to the first thought. But it is a contradiction that both should occur by a single action… (84)

In his reply, Régis argues that this is precisely what is going on. He argues that we have no need for distinct reflective ideas; Descartes “perceives that he thinks by a single and simple idea, which is known through itself” (Réponse 35; cf. Système I, 150). And then he argues that if a second act were necessary then an infinite regress would threaten, since in order to be aware of the second thought one would need a third, and so on.[4] Huet sidesteps this objection with a response drawn from Aquinas: “he [Aquinas] admits that thoughts will be multiplied ad infinitum and that the mind is infinite—not in act, but in potency” (Huet 86).

But underlying all of this is a further, important, difference between Huet and the Cartesians. Huet argues that

This expression [i.e., “ego cogito”] is defective, for it should be taken to mean, and to be worth as much as if I were to say, ‘I am thinking that I was thinking.’ For like the eyes, the human mind can attend to only one thing at a time. Thus, in order for me to think that I am thinking, two thoughts are needed…. (84)

If Huet’s phrase “the human mind can attend to only one thing at a time” means that a we can think of only one thing at a time, then the Cartesians will reject this premise. Indeed, Descartes explicitly does so (see CSM III 335 / AT V 149). But Régis responds by rejecting the premise that the eye sees only one thing at a time, reinforcing the analogy between the mind and the eye. He argues that if thought is to the mind as light is to the eye, then when we see something, there are three distinct aspects of the event: “the eye that sees, the action by which it sees, and the object seen” (Réponse 35). Suppose now that we say, “I see the light.” Must we suppose that there must be a second light illuminating first? No; we see the light by itself. Similarly for thought—if Huet grants the analogy, he “must conclude that [a thought] is known through itself” (Réponse 36).

The result is that, for the Cartesians, a thought can “turn back upon itself,” which is what Huet finds absurd. Huet’s objection is that the Cartesians are illicitly smuggling in the subject as an object of all thoughts. If so, he argues, then this requires a second thought, which undermines the cogito argument.

And so one of the crucial points of clarification for a theory of consciousness is getting straight on whether consciousness involves reflection, and, if so, whether that requires a distinct reflective thought.

2.2.3 Intentionality

These considerations of incorrigibility and reflection have implications for the intentionality of thought. Antoine Dilly, another Cartesian philosopher of the seventeenth century, will bring out some of these points. In response to an argument by Ignace Gaston Pardies in which Pardies defends a certain kind of knowledge in animals, Dilly defends the Cartesian position. He writes (in 1676):

To avoid falling into an equivocation concerning the word reflection, it is good to recognize that [a] we can sometimes reflect on what we do and [b] sometimes the first thought that we have is not only perceived, but when a second thought takes the first for its object it happens that we know its nature much better by this repeated inspection. This is even more so since the first thought principally renders its object present to the soul and by being sensed informs us of its [i.e., the thought’s] presence. But this second thought has as its object only the first; it shows it to us as lively as the first shows us its object. Thus it should not be believed that each thought is followed by a second that makes it known, because the latter would have to have a third, and so on to infinity. But we are assured, being convinced by our own experience, that all thought is made sensible to the soul, not by any veritable return on itself, but directly and immediately merely by its presence: thus when I see, my vision makes sensible what is, without having need for any other thing. Each person can be much better convinced of this by consulting themselves…. (Dilly 116–118)

There are two noteworthy elements here. First, Dilly repeats the arguments we saw in Régis, advancing the view that thoughts are known through themselves rather than requiring a distinct reflective thought. Second, Dilly nevertheless characterizes our perception in terms of reflection in order to preserve a sense in which the original perception “informs us” of its presence (i.e., the presence of the idea), by means of which we are aware of the object of thought. This is the sort of awareness that Descartes and the Cartesians have been working to preserve.

Dilly is developing this thought with an eye to dismissing what Pardies describes as “corporeal knowledge.” As Dilly understands this, Pardies is saying that an animal can perceive something without perceiving that it perceives, contrary to the Augustinian slogan mentioned above. That is to say, there may be a representation of the object in the animal, but the animal is unaware of the object. Dilly responds:

Is it conceivable that [a dog] is led to run to his master by a genuine knowledge that he has of him, without knowing that he perceives his master…? How could he identify this man from a hundred others that resemble him without perceiving that he sees him and is assured, from the inside, that it is him and not some other that he needs to go to for petting? And how does he do all of this without knowing that he does it? (122)

Underlying Dilly’s rhetorical questions about the dog in need of a good petting is a thesis about intentionality. According to Dilly, any attempt to demonstrate that animals have thought must consider how the thought would enter into the passions and actions that the animal is experiencing. It is not enough simply to develop an account of perception by which the things around the animal are impressed upon it.

The implicit argument here is that there is no genuine representation if there is no awareness of the representation. Whatever a dog qua machine is acting on when running to his master, it is not an internal representation of his master that the dog acts on with purpose. The “corporeal knowledge” would be nothing but connections or impressions of one body on another—without an awareness of these impressions and what they represent, they won’t serve the purposes of knowledge, sensation, action, or volition.

Dilly argues that intentionality requires awareness—a thought does not represent an object unless there is a subject that is aware of the representation. And so the consciousness of a thought is conceptually prior to its intentionality, which is to say that intentionality is simply a kind of consciousness.[5] But, as we will see, others will argue in the reverse direction. Indeed, if a conscious thought is a representation of something plus a reflective act, then it seems that the representation is conceptually prior to consciousness. What is being worked out during this period is what, exactly, the relation of consciousness, representation, and thought really is. And this is something of enduring interest.[6]

3. Spinoza

While many philosophers after Descartes took up the issues related to consciousness left by Descartes, one possible exception is Spinoza. On some interpretations, he doesn’t have much to say at all about consciousness.[7] This is somewhat striking, given how much Spinoza had to say about ideas and the mind. However, this may be a reflection of just how thin Spinoza’s attribute of thought really is, bringing together what in Descartes were distinct concepts: will and intellect, judgment and perception, and the like, developing a fully naturalized account of the mind. And so it seems that, insofar as Spinoza has a theory of consciousness, it will be explained in terms of some other more fundamental feature of the mind.

Spinoza’s theory of mind is a thoroughly representational theory of mind. The mental consists simply in representational content, for Spinoza. In Ethics 2p7, he argues that “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things,”[8] which is to say that for each extended object, there is a parallel idea. This is called mind-body parallelism. From this Spinoza is able to develop his theory of mind: “The first thing that constitutes the actual being of a human mind is nothing but the idea of a singular thing which actually exists” (2p11). Each mind is itself an idea with a particular object—in the case of humans, the mind is the idea of its body, and whatever happens in the body will be represented in the mind (as he argues in 2p12 and 2p13). The mind is a particular idea that represents a singular object, namely, the body that it is parallel to. This is a fully representational theory of mind, and anything else that can be inferred from the mind will have its parallel in the body that it represents. (For more on Spinoza’s representational theory of mind, see Della Rocca 1996.)

So, of the three main threads discussed above, it seems that the intentionality of thought is the primary pivot on which everything else turns for Spinoza’s theory of mind. There are suggestions in Spinoza’s Ethics that he thinks there are some representations of which we are unaware. At the end of the Ethics, Spinoza describes the “wise man” as the one who is “conscious of himself, and of God, and of things” (5p42s), the clear implication being that those who aren’t wise fail to be conscious of themselves, God, or things, even if these things are present to mind through a mental representation. And so, it seems that Spinoza needs an account of consciousness that does not extend to every mental representation (or, at the very least, not to the same degree).

3.1 Moral Consciousness

As the reference to the “wise man” above suggests, Spinoza’s primary use of the term “consciousness” is moral, but he is making a significant departure from the older sense of the term as “moral conscience.” There is no inner testimony that Spinoza thinks we should heed. Rather, he is focusing our attention on how we think of ourselves as a part of the natural order. He uses this concept to draw together his moral, epistemological, and metaphysical projects.

It is significant that Spinoza rarely used the term conscientia (in its various forms) in the Ethics, and when he does it is almost exclusively in parts 3 through 5, where Spinoza is considering the nature of specifically human affects and bondage or freedom with respect to them. Indeed, the few times Spinoza uses conscientia in Parts 1 and 2, he does so in a way that points forward to its use in the later part of the Ethics.[9]

The proposition in which the term conscientia gets the widest use is 3p9:

P9: Both insofar as the Mind has clear and distinct ideas, and insofar as it has confused ideas, it strives, for an indefinite duration, to persevere in its being and it is conscious of this striving it has.

Dem.: …since the Mind (by IIp23) is conscious of itself through ideas of the Body’s affections, the Mind (by p7) is conscious of its striving.

Schol.: When this striving is related only to the Mind, it is called Will; but when it is related to the Mind and Body together, it is called Appetite. This Appetite, therefore, is nothing but the very essence of man, from whose nature there necessarily follow those things that promote his preservation. And so man is determined to do those things.

Between appetite and desire there is no difference, except that desire is generally related to men insofar as they are conscious of their appetite. So desire can be defined as appetite together with consciousness of the appetite.

The “content” of consciousness—what it is we are conscious of when we have a mental state with the form articulated in 3p9, is best expressed by the following quotation from the appendix to Part 1:

[A]ll men are born ignorant of the causes of things, and…they all want to seek their own advantage, and are conscious of this appetite.

From these [assumptions] it follows, first, that men think themselves free, because they are conscious of their volitions and their appetite, and do not think, even in their dreams, of the causes by which they are disposed to wanting and willing, because they are ignorant of [those causes]. It follows, secondly, that men act always on account of an end, viz. on account of their advantage, which they want.

The transition Spinoza is attempting to effect in his readers is a transition from this sort of consciousness—where we falsely regard ourselves as free, we think of the world as having a rich and extensive teleology, and we think of ourselves as agents freely acting on purposes and ends—to another sort of consciousness in which we know ourselves to be part of an “eternal necessity” (5p42s). As Spinoza puts it:

Therefore, the more each of us is able to achieve this kind of knowledge [i.e., the third kind of knowledge], the more he is conscious of himself and of God, i.e., the more perfect and blessed he is. (5p31s)

And so the role of consciousness for Spinoza is primarily moral—the moral transition is a transition in the content of our consciousness. But, as already noted, this appears to require some variation between what is strictly represented by the mind and the way it appears to the mind in consciousness. To get at this difference, we’ll need to look more closely at the form of consciousness for Spinoza.[10]

3.2 Ideae Idearum

At the beginning of the previous section, we noted that Spinoza rarely uses the term conscientia, and when he does it is primarily in parts 3 through 5. This claim, while true, is somewhat misleading. Note that the quotation above from 3p9 refers us back to 2p23 for his claims about consciousness. And again in 3p30d, 3def.aff1, and 4p8d Spinoza refers us back to 2p23, 19, or 21. It seems clear that he intends 2p19 through 23 to have some consequence for his theory of consciousness, and so many commentators have tried to develop an account of consciousness from what Spinoza says in that section of the Ethics.

2p23 does not say anything about consciousness as such. Instead, it describes the way the mind knows itself and the limits on the mind’s knowledge of itself. Here is what Spinoza says:

P23: The Mind does not know itself, except insofar as it perceives the ideas of the affections of the Body.

Dem.: The idea, or knowledge of the mind (by P20) follows in God in the same way, and is related to God in the same way as the idea, or knowledge, of the body. But since (by P19) the human Mind does not know the human Body itself, i.e. (by P11C), since the knowledge of the human Body is not related to God insofar as he constitutes the nature of the human Mind, the knowledge of the Mind is also not related to God insofar as he constitutes the essence of the human Mind. And so (again by P11C) to that extent the human Mind does not know itself.

Next, the ideas of the affections by which the Body is affected involve the nature of the human Body itself (by P16), i.e. (by P13), agree with the nature of the Mind. So knowledge of these ideas will necessarily involve knowledge of the Mind. But (by P22) knowledge of these ideas is in the Mind itself. Therefore, the human Mind, to that extent only, knows itself, q.e.d.

Many of the crucial phrases are ambiguous here, but as a first attempt, we might say that Spinoza is arguing for the following thesis:

A mind has a conscious thought of P iff

  1. the mind has an idea that represents its body being affected by P; and
  2. the mind has a second idea representing the first to itself.

This is one way to make sense of “perceiv[ing] the ideas of the affections of the Body.” Edwin Curley presents such an interpretation of this passage (Curley 1969, 128). The benefit of this theory of consciousness is that it is thoroughly representational, and so it is consistent with Spinoza’s general project of developing a representational theory of mind. Further, this theory would seem to entail that not all minds are conscious (or that not all thoughts are conscious)—Spinoza suggests that infants are not conscious in 5p6s and 5p35s

Despite these advantages, this initial understanding of this passage has fallen under heavy fire. Margaret Wilson has objected to this reading by arguing that it does not provide a satisfactory way of distinguishing between conscious and non-conscious minds or conscious and non-conscious thoughts. Since, in God, there must be ideas of all ideas, any given idea (and any given mind) will have the necessary second idea (or even infinitely many—see 2p21s) that would render it conscious. (See Wilson, 134–138 for further objections.) Jonathan Bennett puts forward similar objections, concluding that if this is Spinoza’s account of consciousness, it is “absurdly excessive” (Bennett 188). Curley concedes the point (see Curley 1988, 71–72).

Others have tried to rehabilitate this interpretation and respond to the potential objections. Lee C. Rice (1990) and Christopher Martin (2007) both offer responses to the objections and attempt to defend this interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of consciousness. Their efforts at making sense of 2p19–23 are interesting, but it is not easy from this section of the text to avoid the “absurdly excessive” conclusions. Of course, one could simply bite the bullet here and say that Spinoza is in fact “absurdly excessive”! He is committed to panpsychism, why not take the short step to a similarly extensive account of consciousness? Indeed, the next set of interpretations are prepared to go that far.

3.3 Complexity and Power

Despite the explicit reference to the “ideas of ideas” passages in later discussions of consciousness, Stephen Nadler (2008) and Don Garrett (2008) think this is the wrong place to look for Spinoza’s theory of consciousness. Instead, they develop their interpretations from the thesis of mind-body parallelism.

While Nadler is inclined to think that Spinoza does not have a full-blown account of consciousness, what Spinoza does offer is “very suggestive…for a particular kind of project, one that represents a naturalistic account of consciousness that is precocious in so far as it points the way to just the kind of empirical, scientific inquiry into consciousness that characterizes contemporary neuroscience and (some) recent philosophy of mind” (586). Quoting 2p13s and 5p39s, Nadler argues that the feature that is being tracked by the mind in consciousness is the structural complexity of the body. 5p39s reads as follows:

[H]e who, like an infant or child, has a Body capable of very few things, and very heavily dependent on external causes, has a Mind which considered solely in itself is conscious of almost nothing of itself, or of God, or of things. On the other hand, he who has a Body capable of a great many things, has a Mind which considered only in itself is very much conscious of itself, and of God, and of things.

In this life, then, we strive especially that the infant’s Body may change (as much as its nature allows and assists) into another, capable of a great many things and related to a Mind very much conscious of itself, of God, and of things.

From these passages, Nadler concludes that “human or higher consciousness for Spinoza is nothing but the mental correlate of the superlative complexity of the human body” (587). The result is that consciousness, for Spinoza, is a matter of degree (as is suggested in the passage above). Nadler also suggests the possibility that this could be a threshold concept—that there is a minimum degree of complexity that must be satisfied before a mind could be conscious. But, citing Garrett’s appeal to Spinoza’s naturalism, he dismisses the threshold view. And so, consciousness comes in degrees, and all minds have it (contrary to the worries in the ideae idearum section).[11]

Don Garrett draws from the same texts as Nadler, but what he emphasizes in these passages is the difference in ability. Note in the above passage that Spinoza talks of the infant body as one “capable of very few things.” And so the underlying feature that consciousness tracks, according to Garrett, is the relative power of the body (23–24). The more power a body has, the greater the degree of consciousness in the mind.

The problem with this view, according to Nadler, is that “all that Garrett is warranted in concluding from his argument and the central passages in question is that degrees of consciousness and degrees of power of thinking in a mind vary proportionately, but not that consciousness is itself identical to power of thinking” (592–93). However, given Spinoza’s representational account of mind, the only two features that stand out as candidates for explaining consciousness are some features of the representations themselves (their complexity) or the causal efficacy of the ideas (their power). (Cf. Della Rocca 2008 108–118.)

Michael LeBuffe has argued that the central passages on which most scholars have developed their interpretations should not be read as proposing a theory of consciousness; rather, these passages are focused on “the epistemological status of certain elements of conscious experience.” Nevertheless, he does recognize that Spinoza requires a theory of consciousness and raises a particular problem for Garrett’s interpretation. On Garrett’s interpretation, the power of a mind and the power of its constituent ideas could diverge. That is, there could be a very powerful mind (which is conscious to a high degree) whose ideas are relatively less powerful (of which the mind is conscious to a very low degree). That is, on Garrett’s view, it is possible for a more powerful mind (as a whole) to have ideas all of which are less conscious than the ideas in a less powerful mind, in which case it would be odd to describe the more powerful mind as having a higher degree of consciousness (LeBuffe 2010, 557). LeBuffe argues to the contrary that Spinoza does not characterize the power of a mind (as a whole) in terms of its level of consciousness.

Eugene Marshall has proposed a development of Garrett’s interpretation, which reduces consciousness to “affectivity” (see Marshall 2014, chapter 4). “Affectivity” is the property an idea has when it increases, decreases, or fixes the power of the mind’s striving (its “conatus”) or when it moves the mind to act. Emotions such as joy or fear would be affective in this way, but so would certain rational judgments. Marshall argues that this provides a more developed account of how power is centrally involved in consciousness for Spinoza while avoiding some of the problems of Garrett’s proposal.

4. Developments in England

So far the discussion has centered on continental Europe. But there were similar developments towards a theory of consciousness in England.

4.1 Hobbes

At the beginning of the seventeenth century, we find Hobbes giving the traditional definition of consciousness:

When two, or more men, know of one and the same fact, they are said to be CONSCIOUS of it one to another; which is as much as to know it together. And because such are fittest witnesses of the facts of one another, or of a third; it was, and ever will be reputed a very evil act, for any man to speak against his conscience; or to corrupt or force another to do so…. Afterwards, men made use of the same word metaphorically, for the knowledge of their own secret facts, and secret thoughts; and therefore it is rhetorically said, that the conscience is a thousand witnesses. (Leviathan 7.4)

The etymological sense of consciousness of shared knowledge is preserved here and connected with the function of conscience as a witness. Indeed, it is important to Hobbes to preserve this public sense of consciousness/conscience, since he viewed the private judgments of conscience to be “repugnant to civil society” (Leviathan 29.7).

And yet, quite apart from the term consciousness, it seems that Hobbes has an account of phenomenal awareness:

[I]f the appearances be the principles by which we know all other things, we must needs acknowledge sense to be the principle by which we know those principles, and that all the knowledge we have is derived from it. And as for the causes of sense, we cannot begin our search of them from any other phenomenon than that of sense itself. But you will say, by what sense shall we take notice of sense? I answer, by sense itself, namely, by the memory which for some time remains in us of things sensible, though they themselves pass away. For he that perceives that he hath perceived, remembers. (De Corpore 25.1, p. 389; for some discussion of this text, see Frost 2005)

We must be cautious about attributing a theory of consciousness (in the modern day sense) to Hobbes here. In particular, we should be cautious of what is meant by sensing that we have sensed, since sensation is itself an appearance, which, presumably, one would be aware of. But these appearances are connected together into a single experience by memory. As Hobbes says in Leviathan, “much memory, or memory of many things, is called experience” (2.4). But phenomenal awareness seems to be a property of sensation itself, for Hobbes. Hobbes resists the implication of a higher-order account of consciousness in his objections to Descartes’s Mediations (cf. CSM II, 122–123 / AT VII 173; for discussion of the relation of Hobbes and Descartes on the topic of consciousness, see Ross 1988).

4.2 The Cambridge Platonists

The shifting use of conscientia has here been traced through the Cartesian line. However, a largely independent line developed through the Cambridge Platonists (as is argued in Thiel 1991), and in particular in the writings of Ralph Cudworth.

Cudworth developed his theory by reflecting on Plotinus’s Enneads, where Plotinus makes use of the Greek term synaisthesis (literally: “sensed with”) to distinguish lower natures from higher. Cudworth translates this into English as “con-sense” or “consciousness” (True Intellectual System 159). It is by working out a particularly Platonic metaphysical theory that Cudworth develops his account of consciousness.

Cudworth, along with other Cambridge Platonists, argued for “plastic natures,” which are immaterial sources of action in the world. These plastic natures are similar to minds or souls, but, pace Descartes, Cudworth allowed that there are non-conscious thoughts and non-conscious plastic natures. Against Descartes’s argument that all mental states are conscious, Cudworth argues as follows (True Intellectual System 160):

  1. Suppose, for reductio, that “cogitation” (or thought) is the essence of the soul.
  2. The essence of thought is consciousness (granted by both Cudworth and Descartes).
  3. The souls of men are sometimes in a deep, dreamless sleep (i.e., without consciousness).
  4. So, by (1) through (3), the souls of men sometimes cease to exist.
  5. But (4) is absurd.
  6. And so, (1) should be rejected: the essence of the soul is not thought.

And so there is much in the soul (and especially in other principles of life) that we know nothing about and cannot account for mechanically (ibid). Unlike Spinoza and Leibniz (below), Cudworth does not have the same interest in articulating a “natural” account of consciousness or mental activity, since the plastic natures themselves are sources of divine activity and providence.

Nevertheless, the role consciousness plays in Cudworth’s system is a similar awareness of one’s own thought that is distinct from the moral conscience. While consciousness does contain a reference to the subject of thought, for Cudworth, it does not do so immediately or explicitly. It takes a distinct act of reflection in order to provide the sort of self-reference necessary for making moral judgments about one’s own actions (Thiel 1991 92–24). (For more on Cudworth’s account of consciousness, see Thiel 1991 and Lähteenmäki 2010.)

4.3 Locke

John Locke famously makes use of consciousness in his theory of personal identity, separating personal identity from identity of substance or identity of matter. This is a purely psychological account of identity, which has implications for judgments of moral responsibility (which Locke does develop), but consciousness itself is not to be equated with the moral sensibility.

Locke’s definition of “person” contains in it a definition of consciousness:

[A person] is a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider it self as it self, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking, and as it seems to me essential to it: It being impossible for any one to perceive, without perceiving, that he does perceive. (Essay 2.27.9)

Here again we find commitments to the transparency of the mental and connections between consciousness and reflection. The identification of consciousness with “perceiving that [one] does perceive” raises again the specter of the higher-order interpretation.[12] But there are good reasons to think that a higher-order theory won’t work for Locke (see Coventry and Kriegel 2008 and Weinberg 2008). In just about every section of this entry, we have encountered someone as interpreting the relevant philosopher as a higher-order theorist. But repeatedly this suggestion is countered explicitly by the philosopher himself or implicitly by an obvious incoherence with other basic principles. One might hope that the frequent objections in the literature will put an end to such speculations.[13] While expressions of accounts of consciousness in the seventeenth century might sound a lot like today’s higher-order theories of consciousness, there are almost always alternative ways of construing the accounts that are more faithful to what’s going on at the time.

Rather, in Locke’s case, it seems that the analysis of consciousness allows only the inference that thoughts are self-intimating. “When we see, hear, smell, taste, feel, meditate, or will any thing, we know that we do so” (2.27.9). And yet there has been a long history arguing that Locke equates consciousness and reflection (for this history of this interpretation, see Kulstad 84–85). Of course, even if Locke’s account of consciousness necessarily involves reflection, we have seen that this doesn’t immediately entail a higher-order theory. But, as Mark Kulstad argues, there is good reason to think that Locke distinguishes consciousness from reflection. One can be conscious of something (namely, a sensible quality) without thereby reflecting on it (Kulstad 87–91).[14]

Further, like Descartes, Locke argues that this is the essence of thought—one can’t have a thought without “being conscious of it” (2.1.19). However, he will extend this idea only as far as experience will allow—it is not at all clear to him that “the soul always thinks,” since we often fail to have conscious experience while asleep. And so, as Locke says, “every drowsy nod shakes their doctrine, who teach that the soul is always thinking” (2.1.13; see 2.1.10–20 for the full argument). This argument resembles that offered by Cudworth, and, like Cudworth, Locke will conclude that thinking is not the essence of the soul. The soul can persist through a state in which there is no thinking—this is the beginning of his separation of the underlying substance from its psychological states. The consciousness of an individual bears no necessary relation to the substance it inheres in, and so the substance contributes nothing to the identity of the individual.

Shelley Weinberg has argued for an interpretation of Locke’s theory of consciousness that she thinks solves many of the most pressing problems of interpretation. According to Weinberg, for Locke,

Consciousness is self-consciousness. It is a non-evaluative self-referential form of awareness internal to all perceptions of ideas. It is the perception that I am perceiving an idea, or the perception of myself as perceiving an idea. (xi)

She takes Locke’s account to entail that every act of perception is a complex state involving ”at the very least, an act of perception, an idea perceived, and consciousness (that I am perceiving)“ (xi). Her defense of this view shows how such an account of consciousness helps make sense of Locke’s claims about the knowledge of one’s own existence, the knowledge of external objects, personal identity, and moral agency (Weinberg 2016).

5. Leibniz

Returning to the Continent, we find that Leibniz may be the first philosopher we’ll encounter that can properly be said to have a theory of consciousness. Leibniz is one of the first philosophers to make it very explicit that he is trying to work out an analysis for this new psychological account of consciousness. He even invents a new word for the concept: apperception, a nominalization of the French verb s’apercevoir de, to perceive. And along with this new term, he develops a theory of consciousness that he intends to be fully naturalized, which, in part, means that there are no unexplained gaps in the analysis that require recourse to brute explanation or miracle.

Further, Leibniz is one of the first to provide a theoretical grounding for non-conscious mental states, in contrast to the Cartesians we discussed above who defined thought in terms of consciousness. As Leibniz says,

[I]t is good to distinguish between perception, which is the internal state of the monad [i.e., simple substance] representing external things, and apperception, which is consciousness, or the reflective knowledge of this internal state, something not given to all souls, nor at all times to a given soul. Moreover, it is because they lack this distinction that the Cartesians have failed, disregarding the perceptions that we do not apperceive, in the same way that people disregard imperceptible bodies. This is also what leads the same Cartesians to believe that only minds are monads, that there are no souls in beasts, still less other principles of life. (“Principles of Nature and Grace” §4, AG 208)

Thus, Leibniz thinks he has diagnosed a significant error in the Cartesian philosophical system, and he has the solution in his account of consciousness. A couple of things stand out immediately from this passage, which connect to our discussion above:

  1. Leibniz’s theory of mind is a representational theory of mind. Perception is not understood in terms of awareness, but rather in terms of the substance’s “representing external things.”
  2. Some, but not all, “souls” are conscious.
  3. And those souls that are conscious can transition between conscious and non-conscious states. Indeed, as he argues elsewhere, there must be infinitely many petites perceptions in each mind of which they are unaware, even while they are conscious of some things. (See the preface to the New Essays.)
  4. Minds or mind-like substances are found throughout nature (in humans, animals, and other “principles of life”). But their fundamental properties are the same: they are by nature representational.

So, like Spinoza, Leibniz will have to provide a theory of consciousness in terms of representations, and, perhaps unlike Spinoza, he will have to demonstrate how this theory allows for transitions from conscious to non-conscious states. If he can do this, then, he thinks, his theory of mind will avoid many of the problems plaguing the Cartesian theory of mind. Further, he thinks it will be a fully natural theory, one that will open up a new science of the mind, which he calls pneumatology (cf. RB 56; the name pneumatology obviously didn’t catch on, but the science Leibniz envisioned would probably overlap significantly with today’s cognitive sciences).[15]

So, then, what was the account of consciousness Leibniz had to offer? Some have picked up on what Leibniz says in the quotation above (“…apperception, which is consciousness, or the reflective knowledge of this internal state”) and argue that consciousness, for Leibniz, is a matter of reflection. And, as we have seen, this is a popular option during the seventeenth century, but it is also an option for which it is not always clear what the underlying structure would be. Does reflection require a distinct second-order perception that takes the first-order perception as its object? Or is it rather like Arnauld’s suggestion of a virtual reflection (in contrast to an explicit reflection)? Many scholars believe that Leibniz is arguing for higher-order theory of consciousness, where consciousness is constituted by a first-order perception and a distinct higher-order perception. (For this sort of an interpretation of Leibniz’s theory of consciousness, see Kulstad 1990, Gennaro 1999, and Simmons 2001.)

In fact, Leibniz’s purported analysis of consciousness in terms of reflection isn’t entirely clear. If Leibniz is arguing that a perception becomes a conscious perception when it is accompanied by a second-order perception, then Leibniz has a philosophical problem. Margaret Wilson’s argument against Curley’s similar analysis of Spinoza’s theory of consciousness above applies even better to Leibniz. Leibniz’s theory of mind entails that every mind represents the universe (the “universal expression” thesis), which would always necessarily include a self-expression. All minds would have higher-order perceptions of themselves and their mental states, undermining Leibniz’s ability to distinguish among conscious/non-conscious substances or conscious/non-conscious perceptions within a single substance. All substances would be conscious, and all mental states would be conscious mental states. (For a development of these criticisms as well as an argument that a higher-order theory of consciousness would violate one of Leibniz’s basic metaphysical theses, see Jorgensen 2009. For a possible response (but not decisive) to some of these objections, see Jorgensen 2011a.)

Of course, it may be that Leibniz simply didn’t see this implication and so he held an incoherent theory of consciousness. But there is another candidate theory in the near neighborhood. Consider what Leibniz says about simple substances (or, as he calls them, “monads”) in the following passage:

[S]ince the nature of the monad is representative, nothing can limit it to represent only a part of things. However, it is true that this representation is only confused as to the detail of the whole universe, and can only be distinct for a small portion of things, that is, either for those that are closest, or for those that are greatest with respect to each monad, otherwise each monad would be a divinity. Monads are limited, not as to their objects, but with respect to the modifications of their knowledge of them. Monads all go confusedly to infinity, to the whole; but they are limited and differentiated by the degrees of their distinct perceptions. (“Monadology,” §60, AG 220–221)

Leibniz here starts by articulating the universal expression thesis—all simple substances represent “the whole.” What distinguishes them from one another is the relative “degrees of their distinct perceptions,” which track the things that “are closest, or…greatest with respect to each monad.” Combining what Leibniz says here with other similar texts, we see Leibniz articulating a broadly functional account of consciousness. Consciousness is a function of perceptual distinctness, which itself is a function of how things are represented in the individual monad.

To see how perceptual distinctness arises from a variety of representations, Leibniz provides his famous example of the sound of the ocean:

To give a clearer idea of these minute perceptions which we are unable to pick out from the crowd, I like to use the example of the roaring noise of the sea which impresses itself on us when we are standing on the shore. To hear this noise as we do, we must hear the parts which make up this whole, that is the noise of each wave, although each of these little noises makes itself known only when combined confusedly with all the others, and would not be noticed if the wave which made it were by itself. (RB 54)

Each tiny wave sound impresses itself on our sensory organs and are then combined into a more noticeable sound, one that will stand out from the rest of the background representations of the world. “Noticeable perceptions,” Leibniz says, “arise by degrees from ones which are too minute to be noticed” (RB 57).

The way in which distinct perceptions arise depends on the functional organization of the body. In the “Principles of Nature and Grace,” Leibniz says that when a simple substance has a body with “organs that are adjusted in such a way that, through them, there is contrast and distinction among the impressions they receive, and consequently contrast and distinction in the perceptions that represent them…then this may amount to sensation…” (AG 208). The contrast in noticeable perceptions arises because of the function of the body “confusing” (that is, fusing together) the representations of the external world in such a way that they become more distinctive. So, although they are confused, these perceptions stand out against the perceptual background—they are confused and distinct. When and how this occurs will depend on a variety of factors, including the ability and sophistication of the sense organs, the disposition of the individual, etc. Additionally, this will be a matter of degree—certain representations will stand out more than others. And so, for Leibniz, consciousness itself will be a matter of degree.[16]

However, in order for Leibniz to account for transitions in consciousness (whether it’s a mind becoming conscious or whether it is a transition in a mind becoming conscious of a particular object) it cannot be the case that just any degree of perceptual distinctness results in consciousness. Rather, Leibniz’s theory of consciousness appears to entail that there is a certain minimal threshold at which consciousness arises. And this threshold might itself be sensitive to context and the status of the mind—things that I’ll notice when I’m wide awake will go unnoticed when I’m in a sound sleep. Here is one example that Leibniz provides, along with his explanation:

[T]here are hundreds of indications leading us to conclude that at every moment there is in us an infinity of perceptions, unaccompanied by awareness [apperception] or reflection; that is, of alterations in the soul itself, of which we are unaware because these impressions are either too minute and too numerous, or else too unvarying, so that they are not sufficiently distinctive on their own. But when they are combined with others they do nevertheless have their effect and make themselves felt, at least confusedly, within the whole. This is how we become so accustomed to the motion of a mill or a waterfall, after living beside it for awhile, that we pay not heed to it. Not that this motion ceases to strike on our sense-organs, or that something corresponding to it does not still occur in the soul because of the harmony between the soul and the body; but these impressions in the soul and the body, lacking the appeal of novelty, are not forceful enough to attract our attention and our memory, which are applied only to more compelling objects. (RB 53–54)

Note that Leibniz here reaffirms that we are aware only of the perceptions that are “sufficiently distinctive” or are “forceful enough.” This suggests a certain level of perceptual distinctness or force that will “make themselves felt.” As in the case of the mill—you move in next door to the mill and can’t sleep because of the noise. But, over time, you become accustomed to the sound of the mill and no longer notice it. It is this sort of phenomenological fact, which we can all recognize, that Leibniz thinks he can explain in terms of the variations in perceptual distinctness. It’s not, as he says, that the noise no longer affects our sensory organs—the noise continues to be registered internally, but there is something about the lack of novelty that results in a transition in consciousness. We no longer notice the noise (or, at the very least, we don’t notice it nearly as much). What explains this? Leibniz thinks he can give a natural explanation of this in terms of the forcefulness of the impression. Somehow it becomes less forceful over time. (How does it do this? Leibniz doesn’t give us a full account here. This is where he thinks we will see the promise of his theory and then investigate the causes.)[17]

Thus, Leibniz may be seen as providing a fully naturalized philosophy of mind in which he advocates for a threshold theory of consciousness. This is a same-order theory of consciousness—for Leibniz, a conscious perception is a distinct perception. That is, at some level of distinctness, the perception stands out sufficiently to be noticed. All perceiving substances have perceptions that have some degree of distinctness, but not all perceiving substances have distinct perceptions. Rather, it requires some threshold degree of distinctness (relative to context) for a perception to be distinct. (For a full account of this position, see ch. 7 of Jorgensen 2019.)

Leibniz never uses the term “threshold” when discussing consciousness, but his examples all appeal to thresholds in one way or another. He says later in the New Essays:

I…prefer to distinguish between perception and being aware [apperception]. For instance, a perception of light or color of which we are aware is made up of many minute perceptions of which we are unaware; and a noise which we perceive but do not attend to is brought within reach of our awareness by a tiny increase or addition. (134)

Thus, at some level the noise will be noticed. Leibniz is silent on precisely how this threshold is determined. Although he frequently claims that differences in kind (although continuous with other kinds) arise at the infinite or the infinitesimal, this is in tension with many of the phenomena of consciousness which apparently arise at some mid-level degree of perceptual distinctness (as with the description of the difference between a conscious perception of light and an unconscious perception of light above). Here is another area where Leibniz is offering a theory and is optimistic that the relevant natural factors determining the threshold will be discovered in the science of pneumatology (and, indeed, cognitive science has made some progress in this direction).

But the overall transition has been made. The initial transition from a morally-laden concept to a fully psychological concept was made with Descartes and the Cambridge Platonists. And here, through the Cartesians and in Leibniz, we see an attempt to clarify the concept and to provide a coherent analysis of the concept. Leibniz’s account (and Spinoza’s account, insofar as he has one) treats consciousness as a natural phenomenon to be explained in natural ways, and so he endeavors to explain consciousness in terms of the underlying mental representations. This has obvious connections to representational and functional accounts of consciousness that continue to this day.

(For more on the topic of consciousness in Leibniz, see Barth 2011; Bolton 2011; de Gaudemar 2004; Furth 1967; Jorgensen 2009, 2011a, and 2011b; Kulstad 1990; Thiel 2011 (section 3 of chapter 9); and Simmons 2001 and 2011.)


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Other Internet Resources


I would like to thank Alison Simmons and Samuel Newlands for their helpful suggestions on the Descartes and Spinoza sections respectively.

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