Notes to Animal Consciousness

1. See Varner (1999, pp. 51-54) for a discussion of the phylogenetic distribution of the mechanisms underlying pain. However, caution is recommended with respect to his table on p. 53 which suggests that the presence of specialized nociceptive neurons is limited to vertebrates. The existence of nociceptors seems to be well established in marine molluscs. (See E. T. Walters [1992] “Possible clues about the evolution of hyperalgesia from mechanisms of nociceptive sensitization in aplysia,” in Hyperalgesia and Allodynia, W. D. Willis, Jr. (ed.), New York: Raven Press.)

2. While the locution “feel pain” suggests conscious experience to most readers, it does not do so for all. For instance, Carruthers (1998b) maintains that although animals do in fact feel pain, they do not feel pain consciously — or, as Carruthers somewhat paradoxically puts it, he denies that the feeling feels like anything. Many philosophers would, however, charge that the concept of an unconscious pain is conceptually incoherent, pain being essentially conscious.

3. Because of the importance of animal sentience to ethics, some of the most explicit statements of the evolution-reinforced similarity argument can be found in the animal rights and animal welfare literature (e.g., Singer 1975/1990; Regan 1983; Andrews 1996; Varner 1999).

4. It is interesting to note that many species, especially among the cetaceans and migratory birds, have been determined to sleep with each hemisphere of their brains independently. This adaptation enables marine mammals to avoid drowning and birds to keep flying. We do not know of any systematic study of how perceptual and cognitive capacities are affected when half the brain is in a sleep state.

5. This problem goes under many names; Allen & Bekoff (1997) refer to this as “the other species of mind problem” and Prinz (2005) calls it “The Who Problem”.

6. The evidence for this is somewhat ambiguous, however. For example, Güven Güzeldere (1995) reports private correspondence from David Armstrong who wrote:

… following Locke and Kant, I think the introspective awareness is perception-like. For instance, it is very like proprioception, and seems not to involve any linguistic capacity. Perhaps chimpanzees and even dogs have such consciousness. [G. Güzeldere (1995, fn. 22), “Is consciousness the perception of what passes in one’s own mind?”, in Conscious Experience, Thomas Metzinger (ed.). Paderborn: Schöningh/Imprint Academic, 1995, fn. 22.]

And Lycan, commenting on Carruthers (1998a) in his contribution to the Psyche symposium on animal consciousness writes:

Even if I am right about human beings, of course it does not follow that other animals exhibit a comparable degree of computational complexity. Perhaps some do and some do not; perhaps few if any do. I would continue to maintain that an animal has phenomenal-consciousness in the strong sense if and only if that animal has HOEs [Higher Order Experiences]. So I would at least provisionally conclude that if many animals (including very young human children) lack the computational complexity needed for HOEs, those same many animals lack phenomenal-consciousness in the strong sense. Carruthers would not disagree with that.

These are hardly ringing endorsements by higher-order experience theorists for animal consciousness.

7. Hauser, Chomsky, and Fitch (2002) argue that comparative language studies have been hampered by a failure to distinguish three separate dimensions for comparing the human faculty of language in the broad sense (FLB) to other forms of animal communication. They label these three dimensions “sensory-motor”, “conceptual-intentional”, and “FLN-recursion” (FLN= faculty of language, narrow). Their article provides a useful review of evidence for considerable evolutionary homology and homoplasy in the first two dimensions. In a follow-up study to investigate the third dimension, Hauser & Fitch (2004) found that while their tamarin monkeys could discriminate strings conforming to a simple finite state grammar which allows arbitrary repetitions of a simple pattern (e.g., ABn), but they could not master a phrase structure grammar (such as AnBn). However, Gentner et al. (2006) found that starlings could discriminate AnBn patterns (although these authors may have over-interpreted this as mastering a recursive rule, since phrase structure grammars do not require full recursion). See also Allen and Saidel (1998) and Trout (2001) for discussions by philosophers of alternative possible evolutionary relationships between human language and animal communication, and Anderson (2004) for a linguist’s perspective.

8. This argument is very reminiscent of Davidson’s (1975) argument against animal thought on the grounds that one must have the concept of thought to be able to think. We are not aware that Davidson was ever tempted to turn this into an argument against animal sentience.

Copyright © 2016 by
Colin Allen <>
Michael Trestman <>

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