Hasdai Crescas

First published Wed Jan 4, 2012; substantive revision Wed Feb 7, 2024

Rabbi Hasdai Crescas (ca. 1340–1410/11) was the head of the Jewish community of Aragon, and in some ways all of Hispanic Jewry, during one of its most critical periods. Crescas was one of the leading rabbinic authorities of his time,[1] the political leader of the Jews of Aragon, and a philosophical polemicist against Christianity. As one of the main medieval Jewish philosophers, Crescas critiques the radical Aristotelian philosophy of Maimonides and some of his philosophical heirs. He denounces the different Aristotelian opinions as contradicting not only the Jewish tradition, but also the true empirical and rational understanding of the world. Crescas assembles traditional Jewish opinion, the diverse Aristotelian sources, the neo-platonic thought of the apostate Abner of Burgos and the new science of scholastics of the 14th century to create an original philosophical opinion and critique of Aristotelianism known to the medieval period. His philosophical book Or Hashem was an important oeuvre of both Judaic thought and of the criticism of Aristotelian science which spurred the growth of the new science of the modern period, which arguably started in the 14th century. Until recently this book hadn’t been translated completely in any occidental languages, though it had influenced general occidental philosophy, especially via thinkers like Pico della Mirandola and Spinoza.

1. His life

Crescas was born in Barcelona to a revered family of merchants and rabbis around 1340. In the first period of his life (i.e. before 1391) Crescas lived in Aragon during a relatively quiet period for the Jews. He learned in the yeshiva (Jewish academy) of the town, which was headed by Rabbi Nissim of Gerondi. In this yeshiva, Crescas learned not only the traditional Jewish corpus of Bible, Talmud, and the other parts of the Oral Law, but also Kabbala, science, and philosophy, including the Jewish philosophy of Maimonides and his followers as well as classical philosophy and perhaps even Christian scholastics.[2]

We know that by the year 1370 Crescas was a proficient young scholar, a Talmudist, and a judge in Barcelona. Following the death of Rabbi Nissim of Gerondi, Crescas and his friend Rabbi Isaac bar Sheshet (Ribash) became the main Jewish authorities of Aragon, and possibly of all Spain. People from all over the occidental Jewish World would ask them legalist questions (Harvey 2010, 20). In 1387, Pierre the Fourth of Aragon died, and his son Juan became the new king. This king and his French queen, Violant de Bar, loved culture, and their palace in Saragossa became the center of culture and science. In this palace Crescas could have met Bernard Matege, a humanist employed as the court scribe. Through him, Crescas may have become aware of the humanist movement in Italy, and indeed Warren Harvey has speculated that there was a considerable amount of mutual influence between the two intellectuals.[3] In 1389, Crescas left Barcelona and became the rabbi of the capital of the crown of Aragon: Saragossa. A year later the King and Queen appointed him as the highest judge of all the Jews in the crown, and bestowed him with a high degree of authority over the Jewish community.

The pogroms of 1391 had a decisive influence on the life of Crescas and on the entire Spanish Jewish community.[4] In those pogroms thousands of Jews perished and around a hundred fifty thousand converted to Christianity. The pogroms began in Castilla, but the rioters crossed the Aragon border. Almost half of the Jews of Spain after 1391 became Christian. Aragon’s major Jewish communities in Barcelona, Valencia and Gerona disappeared. A son of Crescas died in Barcelona, and the yeshiva of Barcelona, one of the most important in the Middle Ages, disappeared. In the Crown of Aragon, the King and Queen tried to save the Jews and to prevent the pogrom, but they were successful only in Aragon, whereas the communities of Valencia, Catalonia and the Baleares Island were destroyed. Amongst the reasons for the success of the pogrom in Castilla was the fact that the king was a child at the time and the Castilian government was inefficient.

After these events, Crescas became the leader of the Spanish community in its fight to survive. With the help of the King and Queen of Aragon, he tried to restore the Jewish community of Barcelona (without success). He helped converso Jews who wanted to come back to Judaism to leave Spain for Muslim countries in North Africa. He ultimately wanted to find a safer place for the Spanish Jews, possibly in the Kingdom of Navarre.

The turning point of 1391 influenced the literary activity of Crescas. He probably wrote fewer philosophical works (and certainly fewer Talmudic and legal works), while most likely writing more polemical books against Christianity than he had planned to before the pogrom.

Until his death late in 1410 or in January of 1411, Crescas remained the spiritual head of Spanish Jewry. As a part of his role, he tried to build a new generation of Jewish leaders. After the pogrom, Crescas continued to teach Torah, Talmud, science, and philosophy. His star pupil in philosophy was Rabbi Josef Albo, while his star pupil in Talmudic studies and law was Rabbi Josef Ibn Haviva. Crescas also influenced the polemical works of Profiat Duran (Efodi). Crescas requested the translation from Arabic to Hebrew of the work of Abraham Ibn-Dahoud Ha-Emunah ha-Ramah by Solomon ben Levi. The second translation of this work under the title Ha-Emunah Nissa’ah by Samuel ibn Motot is probably based on the first one. The original Arabic text is now lost, so it is likely thanks to Crescas that this important philosophical work has survived.

2. His works

2.1 Earlier work

There is a controversy about the attribution of a small commentary on the secret of the Kaddish (a Jewish prayer praising God, recited between sections of the daily prayer services and on behalf of departed relatives)to Crescas. According to Harvey 2010 and Ofir 2001 Crescas wrote it when he was a young student in Rabbi Nissim of Gerondi’s yeshiva. In this first work we can see the influence of the Kabbalistic school of Gerona. According to Ackerman 2013b, this text is not from Crescas and so there is no indication that the Kabbalah had any influence on Crescas.

2.2 Passover Sermon

In this short book, which is a based on a sermon that Crescas probably gave on the night of Passover, he explores his opinion about some philosophical questions regarding the subject of the basis of belief in miracles.[5] These questions arise because of the description of the different miracles experienced by the Jews in Egypt. The first question asksif belief is an act of free will, or if the miracle in fact obliges the believer to believe in it (and in the idea that the miracle worker wants to prove through the miracle). After this question, Crescas addresses the subject of the essence of miracles, the essence of free will, and the relation between free will and reward and punishment. The sermon’s conclusion is also the only legalist work of Crescas in our possession.

In this book, Crescas deals with the subject of free will in a less profound manner than in his philosophical magnus opum Or Hashem, but his opinions here do not contradict his opinion in Or Hashem. The difference between the two books on this subject can be attributed to the development of the thought of Crescas. According to one view, the sermon represents an anterior stage of Crescas and Or Hashem a posterior one (Sermon on the Passover, pp. 34–68). Another explanation of these differences could be the difference of style between the two books (a sermon versus a profound philosophical tract). The difference between the two books is clearer with regard to the question of the essence of miracles. Crescas’s opinion in his sermon is that miracles by themselves don’t oblige people to believe in something (as opposed to rational proofs that oblige belief). The reason for inherent doubt in the validity of any given miracle is that the people cannot be sure that God and not a human is the author of the miracle. In Or Hashem (P. 312) Crescas asserts the opposite position. Humans cannot do miracles by themselves.[6] This is the reason that Crescas claims that the miracle is the best way to verify if a prophet is a true one or an impostor.[7] This difference between the two works is a very good argument for the opinion that the sermon is anterior to Or Hashem. Ravitzky has said that in the sermon, Crescas followed the ideas of Rabbi Nissim Girondi, his teacher who believed in the possibility of men performing miracles, while years later, in Or Hashem, Crescas retreated from this opinion and now held that only God could perform miracles.

2.3 Refutation of Christian Principles

The book known by the name “Refutation of Christian Principles” (we don’t know the original name of this work). This book was originally written in Catalan around 1397–1398, and is available only in the medieval Hebrew translation of Rabbi Josef Ibn Shem Tov[8] and in modern English and Spanish translations of the Hebrew. The target audience of the Catalan work is probably the Jews of Aragon who didn’t read Hebrew, and the Jewish descendants of the conversos of 1391. In his book, Crescas critiques ten principles of the Christian faith: 1. Original sin. 2. The liberation from this sin. 3. The Trinity. 4. Incarnation. 5. The virginity of Maria. 6. Transubstantiation. 7. Baptism. 8. The coming of the Messiah. 9. The new laws. 10. Demons.

In these topics Crescas demonstrates a good understanding of the Christian theology of his time. In the majority of these subjects he uses philosophical and logical arguments against Christian dogma and not quotations from the Bible. This book was probably one of the more philosophical works of the Jewish critics of Christianity.[9] Interestingly, Crescas utilizes in his polemical book some of the very Aristotelian opinions that he himself critiques in his philosophical oeuvre Or Hashem. The reason for this contradiction is probably that the aim of Crescas in his polemic works is to convince Jews not to convert to Christianity, and Jewish apostates to return to Judaism. The most effective method of attaining this goal was to utilize the most popular science in his time, and not necessarily what he considered to be closest to the truth. We can summarize that in his polemic works Crescas has a polemical goal, and in his philosophical works he has a philosophical goal.[10] The Hebrew translator explains that the reason for this divergence was that the philosophical works were written before the polemical ones, but after writing Or Hashem, Crescas returned to Aristotelian science. But this explanation doesn’t accord with the chronological order of the writing, and we don’t have any reason to suppose that Crescas retreated from his anti-Aristotelian critiques.

2.4 Or Hashem (The Light of the Lord)

This is without a doubt the major philosophical work (and indeed the magnum opus) of Crescas.[11] This book was supposed to be the first part of a two-volume work that Crescas intended to write. The set was to be named Ner Elohim (Candle of God). The second book was to have been a work on Jewish law. The original aim of Crescas’s project was to counter the two major works of Maimonides by writing: I. A philosophical book against Maimonides’ Guide of the Perplexed. II. A legal book against his Mishneh Torah, in which Crescas would critique Maimonides’ legal method, and especially his lack of citations from earlier authorities. In fact, probably in part because of his communal role after 1391, he only had time to write the first book of the series, along with the general introduction to both volumes.

We know that Or Hashem was written over a long period of Crescas’s life – no less than fifteen years, and perhaps more. Because of his communal activity, Crescas didn’t finish the final edition of the book himself. Due to the extended period of writing, we can see the development of his thought in the different parts of the work. In some cases, as with the attributes of God, there are some contradictions between the different layers of the book’s development. Additionally, the pupil who edited the last edition of the book introduced some changes and additions with the goal of unifying Crescas’s seemingly opposing positions while moderating his openly radical opinions.[12] Examples of these kinds of additions are clearly visible in the question of free will, and are found especially in the Florence manuscript.

The structure of Or Hashem is based on a hierarchical arrangement of Jewish dogma opposed to the Maimonides thirteen principles of faith.[13] Crescas separates his book into four different essays:

  1. The existence of God (and relevant topics like his unity, his attributes, etc.). This is the foundation of all religious belief.[14]
  2. The six foundations of the law, without which the existence of the Torah (and in general of all revealed law) is impossible (Or Hashem, 123). These six foundations are:
    1. God’s knowledge of all things in existence (including all particulars)
    2. God’s providence
    3. God’s power
    4. Prophecy
    5. Free will
    6. The purpose of the Torah
  3. Obligatory beliefs. The existence of the Torah is possible without them, but if someone denies them he is a heretic. There are eight general beliefs in the obligatory category:
    1. The creation of the world
    2. The survival of the soul after death
    3. Reward and Punishment (as per degree of conformity to the divine commandments)
    4. Resurrection
    5. The eternity of the Torah
    6. The prophetic stature of Moses
    7. The Urim and Tumim (a mystical tool of the High Priest through which he could ask God questions)
    8. The Messiah
    There are three specific obligatory beliefs related to special religious obligations:
    1. Prayer and the priestly benediction
    2. Repentance
    3. Rosh Hashana, The Fast of Kippur and the three pilgrimage festivals.
  4. Fourteen beliefs for which the Torah does not clearly establish what the correct opinions are. Regarding these beliefs Crescas explores the different options and tries, using the interpretation of the traditional Jewish sources together with philosophical enquiry, to establish the correct view.

3. God’s existence and attributes

3.1 God’s existence:

In the introduction of the second part of the Guide of the Perplexed, Maimonides summarizes twenty-five premises of Aristotelian science (and one more that Maimonides attributes to the philosopher: the eternity of the world). In the first chapter of the second part, Maimonides gives philosophical (i.e., [neo-]Aristotelian) proofs of the three principal beliefs relating to God: his existence; his unity, and his immateriality. In the first part of the first essay, Crescas explains these twenty-six premises and the six proofs offered by Maimonides on behalf of the Aristotelians. In the second part of this essay, Crescas critiques fourteen of the premises of Aristotelian science. Afterwards he argues against Maimonides’ six proofs of the existence of God, his unity, and his immateriality.

In the third part of the second essay, Crescas analyzes the true meaning of these three beliefs and asks whether we can prove them. He comes to the conclusion that he can prove the existence of God. In his opinion the only way to prove the existence of God is via the need for a first cause. If every single thing in the universe is caused, their existence is only possible (just as is their inexistence) and so we need a first cause that necessitates their existence as opposed to their non-existence.[15]

In Crescas’s opinion, we can also prove the simplicity of God, but we cannot prove the uniqueness of God. We can summarize this philosophical enquiry by saying that Crescas thinks that philosophy can prove the existence of a simple cause of the world, but it cannot arrive at the uniqueness God of the Bible. On this point Crescas comes to the conclusion that the only way to know the true essence of the divinity is to learn it from the divine revelation (the Torah and the tradition).

This philosophical development is very important for the comprehension of the relation between philosophy and revelation in the thought of Crescas. The major trend of Jewish philosophers, and chiefly Maimonides, was to prove that people can come closest to the true understanding of God through philosophy. These philosophers wanted to put philosophy on the same level of truth as the Torah. In their opinion, one must interpret the Torah according to science, and the Torah does not teach anything that philosophy cannot access on its own. In Crescas’s opinion, the true meaning of the Torah (and the tradition) cannot go against philosophy, but philosophy by itself cannot reveal the entire truth that the Torah contains. One of the goals of God’s revelation is to give us some true beliefs that philosophy (and human speculation alone) cannot discover. This development elevated the Torah and the tradition to a higher level of truth than that of philosophy. There are some questions in which philosophy and revelation provide the same answers, but there are also beliefs that pure philosophy cannot claim, such that only revelation can tell us what the truth is.

3.2 God’s attributes

In the early stage of his writing[16] Crescas accepted the opinion of Maimonides that the attributes of God do not have any relation to the attributes of humans, and indeed Crescas defended this position against the arguments of Gersonides. But in the later stage Crescas constructed a new opinion. This final opinion serves as an exemplar of Crescas’s use of compilation from different sources with the goal of constructing a new and original theory.[17]

The major elements of this synthesis are:

  1. The opinion that human attributes and divine attributes are common in essence but divergent in quantity. Crescas’s most probable source here is Gersonides.[18]
  2. The infinity of the divine attributes both in number and in strength. His source here is probably Duns Scotus.
  3. The differentiation between the indefinable essence of God and the attributes that are related to that essence. His source for this position is the apostate Abner of Burgos.

The three elements of this approach existed before Crescas in the writings of different thinkers, but no one had put them all together. In Crescas’s opinion, humans cannot understand the true essence of God, and nor can they speak of him but negatively (like the opinion of Maimonides). But according to Crescas, there is another kind of attribute: those that are relative to the divine essence. These attributes do not describe the divine essence, but they do describe things that always accompany the divine essence, in much the same way a flame accompanies a live coal. These attributes have the same essence as human attributes, but they are infinite in both number and strength. With this position Crescas pulls together the Aristotelian anti-Maimonidean opinion of Gersonides, Duns Scotus’s Franciscan critique of Aquinas’s understanding of Aristotle, and the Neo-Platonic opinion of Abner in his formulation of a new anti-Aristotelian critique of Maimonides (Sadik 2011).

4. Critiques of Aristotelian science

One of the more important contributions of Crescas to the history of philosophy is his critique of Aristotelian science.[19] This critique takes place in the second part of the first essay in Or Hashem. Crescas’s opinions regarding natural science are influenced by the new Christian physics of the 14th century, and especially by thinkers like Ockham, Buridan, and Oresme (Pines 1967). Another source of Crescas’s science appears to be the lost book of Abner, The New Philosophy. But in this case, as in others, Crescas weaves together different sources and utilizes them freely in his goal to build one unified opinion. This original thought influenced occidental philosophy, finding its way via translation into Pico della Mirandola’s book Examen Vanitas Doctrinae Gentium, and later into Spinoza. Some of his most well known opinions include the existence of the void, the existence of infinitude of worlds, and the existence of time without movement.

Now we will look at a few examples of the new physics of Crescas in more detail.

4.1 The definition of infinite

In Aristotle’s opinion, the infinite does not exist in practice but only in potential (like the infinite potential division of a fixed distance and the infinite number of people living throughout history in an eternal world). Regarding the question of mathematics, Aristotle denied the possibility of a distinction between different kinds of infinite (some bigger than others) and of the possibility of adjoining something to an infinite number. On the basis of this definition (and other physics theories) the Greek philosopher denied the existence of an infinite body in practice, and hence he denied infinite voids and expansions as well.

Crescas holds three original opinions regarding the infinite:[20]

  1. The possibility of adding something to the infinite
  2. The possibility of including an infinite within another infinite
  3. Mathematical applications derived from the difference between an infinite in potential and an infinite in practice.

In the philosophy of Crescas, two infinites are not automatically the same. There are differences between various infinite things. We know two very different categories of infinite: the infinite that is limitless without qualification, and the infinite that is limitless in one entire dimension but limited in other dimensions. For example, we can imagine a line that is infinite in both directions (the first category of infinite) and a line that is infinite in only one direction, i.e. a ray (the second category of infinite). The differences between the two categories are of course more apparent (and more complex) in the case of spatial planes and volumes. Crescas accepts the existence of the second category and draws the conclusion that in such cases we can add something to an infinite. If we have two distinct infinite rays starting at the same point, and I add some dimension (A) to the finite end of one of them, the consequence of this act is that I have now two infinite rays that are different in their dimensions, for one is smaller (only infinite) and one bigger (infinite + A). The same is true regarding the question of an infinite that can include another infinite. If, for example, we posit two infinitely long rectangles before us, with one being 10-meters high and the other being 1-meter high, then in Crescas’s opinion the first one is ten times bigger than the second despite the fact that both squares are infinite in area.

Another original definition of infinite in the thought of Crescas is his utilization of the difference between the infinite in practice and the infinite in potential. One of Aristotle’s methods of affirming the non-existence of the infinite was to claim that the existence of an infinite dimension forbids some of the laws of geometry. Crescas refutes this kind of argument by the differentiation between the infinite in practice versus the infinite in potential. The argument goes thus: Even if I have an infinite dimension, all the real points in this dimension are a finite distance from one another. All of Aristotle’s arguments are based on the distance between different points, and this response cancels these arguments. We have to note that Crescas’s explanation is only a development of Aristotle’s response to Zeno’s paradox of the distance between two points.

This treatment of the infinite by Crescas and the (metaphoric) opinion that God is the place of the world, a point Crescas considered as one of God’s attributes, helped Spinoza build his original view that extension is also an attribute of God.[21]

4.2 The definition of matter

In Aristotle’s opinion, all actual matter exists with certain properties like dimension, quality (cold, warm, humid and dry) and weight. Crescas distinguishes between the different properties. In his opinion there are three different levels of material existence.[22] Matter in and of itself has no properties. The body is the unification of matter and dimensionality (i.e. matter in corporeal form). It is possible that a pure body without any other quality has actual existence. The third level of material existence is the unification of the corporeal form (matter) with some other unique form. This latter unification affords matter the additional properties of weight and quality.

One example of the way that Crescas uses this new definition is to refute the proofs of Aristotle against the existence of infinity. In Aristotle’s opinion, two bodies cannot share the same space because of the property of dimension. The Greek philosopher concludes from this observation the impossibility of the existence of a void. The definition of a void is dimensional space without matter inside. Now if matter can fill a void, and matter itself has dimensions, then it follows that the dimensions of the matter can go inside the dimensions of the void. Aristotle concludes that this cannot be, for if dimensions can be shared, then we have to assume that two physical bodies could be in the same place at the same time — an absurdity that would lead to other apparent absurdities, such as the entire world fitting inside a grain of mustard.

Crescas refutes these proofs with his new definition of the different levels of material existence. In his opinion, only the common existence of matter and dimension cause the impermeability of the body. A body (matter and dimension) can go inside a void (only dimension), but not inside another body. In this argument we see Crescas utilize the work of the Jewish apostate Abner. Abner explained the birth of Jesus (and transubstantiation) by the argument that Jesus is body without dimension and can go inside other bodies. Abner separated the different properties of a body from the body itself for both a philosophical goal (to prove that infinity exists) and a theological goal (to strengthen certain Christian dogmas). Crescas refutes this possibility by explaining the difference between a body that has both matter and dimension and therefore cannot go inside another such body and pure matter. Crescas distinguishes all properties only from matter and not from bodies. In this way, Crescas can utilize Abner’s critiques of Aristotelian science without accepting the theological implications. (See Sadik 2008 for Abner’s opinions.)

4.3 The definition of place

In the thought of Aristotle the definition of place is ‘the limit of the encompassing body’. In his opinion, place has an important role in movement. The definition of a natural movement is the movement of a body to its natural place in the world. Aristotle explains that the natural place attracts the body, while the body moves naturally to its natural place.

Crescas opposes this definition. In his opinion, place is the part of dimension that a body occupies within the infinite expanse of the universe; dimension without matter is only place in potential.[23] Crescas also denies the influence of natural place on movement. In his opinion, the movement of fire is caused by the diverse weights of the different bodies that are aflame, and not by the existence of a natural place.

It is important to note too that in the thought of Crescas, the universe does not have any corporeal place. The universe is an infinite void containing an infinite number of worlds separated from one another by part of the void.

5. The question of choice and free will

Crescas devotes the sixth part of the second essay to the question of free will.[24] Crescas begins this sixth part by explaining why the lack of choice can be so problematic for pious Jews: The Torah is based on the commandments of God to man, yet these commandments do not seem to make any sense if humans do not have control over their actions. After all, why should God tell humans what to do if He knows that they have to break the law? It would seem that a robust freedom of choice is essential to maintaining the significance of God’s commandments. Nevertheless, the pious Crescas does not accept this reasoning. To refute the above supposition while maintaining the relevance of the commandments, Crescas uses the first four chapters of Part Six to develop an uncompromising determinism that lives in harmony with human choice and a system of reward and punishment that are restricted to the realm of personal feelings and self-judgment. Ironically, in developing his theory of choice, Crescas quotes frequently from Abner’s book Ofrenda de Zelos (without citing him by name).

It is worth examining how Crescas develops his position in more detail. After introducing the issue of free choice vis a vis the Torah, Crescas in the first two chapters describes the different arguments (both rational and theological) for and against freedom of choice. Crescas then reaches the conclusion that the decision making process is fundamentally deterministic, though people voluntarily choose the attitudes and feelings behind their own actions. For example, if we isolate a person hesitating between two options from the causes that influence him, such as his education and the influence of society, then we might think that this person truly chooses to do either of the two options. But upon closer analysis, if we take in to account all of the causes that influence his will, we reach the conclusion that these causes determine his will to choose only one of the two options. In Crescas’s opinion, humans are like bronze. A piece of bronze can be made into a lot of different things: a ball, a sword, etc. However, someone (i.e. an external cause) fashions the bronze into one of these options and so determines the present form of the bronze. The same is true of people: they themselves can choose between different possible options, but their relation to external causes determines their choices. We can see how Crescas views strong determinism through the way he likens human functioning to an inanimate object like bronze. It is important to note too that Crescas defines the will of man as an accord between the attractive force and the imagination — two forces that are common to humans and beasts.

Continuing into the middle chapters of Part Six, Crescas similarly explains the notion of possibility and accident. Things are only possible in their relation to themselves.

This deterministic description of the world (based on rational arguments) resolves the theological problem of the contradiction between the free will of man and the foreknowledge of God. In Crescas’s opinion, free will, in the sense of an originative cause that is itself uncaused, to decide and act does not really exist. God is the first cause and knows all the laws of the world. Therefore, He knows the entirety of that which He has determined.

But this deterministic description leads to two theological problems:

  1. why God sent commandments to people that do not really have the choice to observe or violate them
  2. how people can receive reward and punishment for actions that they cannot control

Crescas solves the second problem by saying that the forbidden things are naturally bad. The punishment of the sinner is not a special act of divine providence to punish him, but rather the natural consequence of the sinner’s bad actions. At this point we can solve the first problem: according to Crescas, the goal of the Torah is to influence people to do right. The only way to influence someone to do something is to give him enough causes to do it. The Torah is only another cause that tries to influence humans to do good. It is also the reason why God punishes only the actions that are under the control of one’s choice and the will of humans. The aim of the retribution is to guide people towards doing what is right. According to this, aiming to punish other actions that are not under the control of humans will be inappropriate.

Regarding the two latter chapters of Part Six, my opinion differs from that of most scholars. In these chapters Crescas tries to answer the question of whether there is a difference between people that sin happily and those who are forced to sin and feel sad about doing their evil actions. Crescas also addresses the question of the obligation of various beliefs. These chapters are not based on the determinist book of Abner, and Ravitzky thinks that they are anterior to the other chapters and exist almost verbatim in the Passover sermon.[25]

Some scholars understand these chapters as a departure from the deterministic opinion of Crescas.[26] According to their interpretation, Crescas describes the true conscience of man, wherein the inner self can observe the actions of the deterministic external person and either be happy or unhappy with his or her actions. If the external person does something bad and the inner self is unhappy, it is not truly a sin because the true person does not want to sin. Instead, a deterministic process has coerced the external person into performing the act of sin against his conscience and his true will. According to this interpretation, the inner will of humans is under their control, but the regular will that decides their actions is the conclusion of a deterministic psychological process. Such is the usual interpretation, and in and of itself this interpretation is accurate. However other scholars understand these chapters as Crescas is that Crescas is not concerned here with finding a morsel of free choice in a highly deterministic world, but is rather addressing a very different problem: He only wants to answer the question of external obligation and the parallel issue of culpability. Back in the fifth chapter, Crescas had described punishment as a natural consequence of sin. After this rational assertion, it would seem that there is no logical difference between a voluntary and involuntary sin in terms of punishment.[27] However, such a lack of moral distinction is unacceptable to Crescas. Therefore, in these chapters he wants to tell us, indeed reassure us, that an externally forced man doesn’t have any punishment for his sin (it is for certain that he is speaking to and about the Jews that were forcibly converted in 1391). According to these scholars in these chapters Crescas is not speaking about how man is ultimately distinct and free of determinist processes of the soul, but rather about how man through this determinist process wants to do good, yet due to some cause, external to the determinist psychologist processes, is forced to sin, and hence is not culpable — if indeed there was such a negative external cause that led to his sinning. Crescas thinks that the retribution of humans is a function of the interior psychological process of choice. If this process exists the man can be reattributed for his act. However if this process does not exist there is no retribution. The fact that choice and will are entirely deterministic in the view of Crescas has nothing to do with retribution. According to this opinion Crescas thinks that the use of will and choice are the criteria for retribution but are not free at all.

It is probable that the major sources of Crescas‘s determinism are the writings of Muslim thinkers whom he interpreted according to the understanding of the apostate Abner of Burgos. This deterministic understanding of the world no doubt ultimately influenced Spinoza’s opinion.

Regarding the question of astrology,[28] Crescas holds a very moderate opinion: On one hand, the stars have a general influence on humanity, but on the other hand, it is quite easy to free ourselves from their influences. Human choice and divine providence are both superior to the influence of the stars.

6. The essence of the soul and life after death

Crescas devotes an important portion of the sixth part of the second essay to the question of the soul’s essence.[29] The general subject of this part is the goal of the Torah, which is for Crescas also the goal of humanity and of the entire world. In this discussion, Crescas speaks of the different goals that the Torah fulfills. The Torah helps people to fulfill their different worldly goals, such as their relation to themselves (health, morality, etc.), to their family, and to their country. In this part of the essay, Crescas’s explanation is close to Maimonides’ rational explanation of the divine commandments. But the Torah also helps humans to get a spiritual reward in the hereafter. On the subject of the essence of the soul along with reward and punishment after death, Crescas builds a philosophical critique of the Maimonidean-Aristotelian opinion and proposes instead a more traditional view.

Regarding the topic of soul’s essence, Crescas holds a platonic opinion: The soul naturally continues its life after its separation from the body. The reason for this immortality of the soul is that the soul is a spiritual substance with a potential for knowledge. As a spiritual substance, the soul has no opponent between its different parts and any causes of loss. In his proofs that this definition of the soul is right, Crescas critiques the different opinions of Aristotelianism. The main stream of the medieval Arab Aristotelian opinion on this topic (apart from Ibn Sina) is that only human knowledge can survive the death of the body. But there are very different opinions in the Aristotelian school about this subject. An example of this divergence is the opinion of Gersonides, who understands that the knowledge of immaterial law accords the possibility of life after death for the individual. In spite of this, Averroes (as Crescas understand his view) claims that no individual immortal existence is possible after death (all the knowledge of all people returns to its source in the active intellect). In his critique of the Aristotelian opinions, Crescas uses the different arguments[30] that diverse Aristotelians attack each other with to ultimately refute all Aristotelian opinions.

Crescas tries to prove that the soul and not the mind holds the potential for knowledge. After this step he argues that the true goal of the soul is not rational knowledge but the love of God. In this argumentation, Crescas criticizes the opinion of Maimonides that love of God is a function of knowledge. According to Crescas, love is related to the will, which itself is the concordance of the appetitive and imaginative parts of the soul and is not related to the mind (itself an Aristotelian doctrine of animal volition, as mentioned above). Moreover, the true essence and the true goal of the soul is not to acquire knowledge but to delight in loving God. This opinion goes together with the view that the principal attribute and motive of God is not intellectual knowledge but love.

According to Crescas, the easiest way to express love for God is to fulfill obligations to him and to do what He commands. It is the reason why the Torah and particularly the commandments that are integral to it are the best way to attain spiritual reward after death. The Torah gives the easiest way to achieve our spiritual goals. After the separation of the soul from the body, the soul stands by it and naturally wants to express its true essence (loving God). If the soul loves God in this world, it becomes joyous and can now love him more (because the temptations of the body don’t distract it). This rapture is the reward of the just in the hereafter. But if a person does not fulfill the love of God in this world, the soul becomes despondent at his or her rebellion against God in the corporeal world, an error that it plainly understands after the death of the body. This profound sadness is equivalent to the fire of hell.

In his critique of the Aristotelian position on these subjects, Crescas tries to construct a philosophical defense of what he considers to be the traditional Jewish view. He first tries to prove that the opinions of the Aristotelians are philosophically mistaken, and then goes on to argue that what he considers to be the traditional view is philosophically true. This critique of the Jewish Aristotelian opinion is one of Crescas’s more important . In the Jewish orthodox community, fulfillment of the commandments is the most important aspect of religious life. In the opinion of Maimonides, the majority of the commandments (and all of the practical commandments) are only intermediaries to achieving philosophical knowledge, which is the supreme goal of human endeavor. This opinion is one of the more problematic aspects of Maimonides from a traditional point of view. Through his critique of the Aristotelian view, Crescas builds a defense of what he considers to be the traditional view of the commandments as the way to achieve the highest religious and spiritual goals.

7. Crescas and the Conversos’s Question

In the aftermath of the tumultuous events surrounding the 1391 riots against the Jews in Spain a considerable portion of the Jewish population in Spain underwent conversion to Christianity. From the early 15th century until the Expulsion of 1492, the Spanish Jewish community coexisted with the conversos, marking a unique period in which a Jewish community lived in close proximity to a population of converts. Crescas emerged as the inaugural Jewish philosopher and community leader to grapple with this inherently challenging new circumstance. It is evident that some of his original philosophical tenets bear profound implications for the relationship between the Jewish community and the conversos. Crescas posited that the primary criterion for religious perfection resides in human decision and sentiment, specifically, the love of God. This characterization of religious perfection as independent of human actions, such as adherence to commandments (as posited by Rabbi Yehuda Halevi) or acquisition of knowledge (as proposed by Maimonides and his adherents), offers conversos the prospect of achieving religious perfection as Jews even while outwardly living as converts. Given the constraints faced by conversos in adhering to Jewish commandments and engaging in an in-depth study of Jewish sources and philosophy, the assertions by prominent Jewish thinkers predating Crescas that religious perfection is contingent on the observance of commandments (Halevi) or the pursuit of knowledge (Maimonides) may have been disheartening for conversos. Such individuals may have perceived an insurmountable barrier to leading a profoundly religious life as Jews, potentially resulting in discouragement and a proclivity towards Christianity, especially for those unwilling or unable to relocate to a setting where they could openly practice Judaism. Even the more devout Jewish conversos likely lost incentive to transmit any semblance of Jewish identity to their offspring. Moreover, Crescas emphasized that the performance of a few Jewish commandments by conversos would yield significant religious reward, considering the associated costs and dangers. Conversely, the obligatory observance of Christian rituals is deemed by Crescas and his student Albo to lack meaningful religious significance. With this perspective, which is likely to resonate with the majority of conversos, Crescas also articulated a stern critique of those conversos who embraced Christianity (Sadik 2021).

8. Reception and influence

We can distinguish between the influence of Crescas on Jewish philosophy and his influence on general occidental philosophy.

Jewish philosophy: As has been pointed out, Crescas was considered the major leader of the Jewish community of Aragon and to a certain extent all of Spanish Jewry (It should be noted that at the time, the Spanish Jewish community was the biggest in the Jewish world.). He was both the most important political leader and one of the major legal authorities of his time. A significant proportion of the major rabbis in Aragon in the generation following Crescas were in fact his immediate pupils or people within his circle of scholars.[31] Crescas was also one of the most original Jewish philosophers in the Middle Ages. His critiques of Aristotelian science and of the Maimonidean integration of Aristotelianism into Judaism have an honored place in the history of the disintegration of the influence of Aristotle – a disintegration that laid the groundwork for the development of a new science. These kinds of critiques were very popular in the Renaissance and at the beginning of the modern period. Additionally, in the majority of the subjects that Crescas deals with, his opinion is closer to the traditional point of view than is Maimonides’ opinion. But contrary to what we might have expected from this situation, Crescas did not create an important Jewish current of thought as did Maimonides and the Kabbala. The majority of his direct students and of the people in his circle came back to either a different kind of Aristotelian view or else a regular traditional point of view, and did not continue Crescas’s philosophical project.

Modern scholars have given a number of explanations for this phenomenon, most prominent of which is the disintegration of Spanish Jewry caused by the pogrom of 1391 and the persecutions at the beginning of the 15th century. Because of this disintegration, the Spanish Jewish community did not integrate the new and original mode of thinking of Crescas, and instead went back after his death to different more traditional opinions. Another explanation is that his opinions were ahead of their time, and people (including his own pupils) did not completely understand them. Another explanation attributes the general rejection of Crescas to his citation of Christian scholars, and especially the apostate Abner of Burgos. According to this opinion, the Jewish community knew Abner’s ideas and was dismayed by Crescas’s utilization of the apostate’s views.[32] Some scholars also claim that the major goal of Crescas was to refute the Aristotelian interpretation of Judaism, so following the collapse of this interpretation, caused by the general fall of Aristotle, there was simply no more need for Crescas’s critiques. Perhaps the most probable explanation is that Crescas did not realize his original project of writing another legalistic book against the Mishneh Torah of Maimonides. If Crescas had written this book, he probably would have become not only one of the major Jewish philosophers, but also one of the major legal authorities of both his generation and succeeding generations. The combination of legal works, philosophical tracts, and political leadership was undoubtedly of great help to the philosophical reception of Maimonides within Judaism.

Yet another reason for the relative lack of influence of Crescas on posterior Judaism is his intermediate position between philosophy and tradition. Maimonides was not only the most important Jewish philosopher, but also the Jewish philosopher par excellence, such that the majority of orthodox Jewish philosophers see themselves as continuators of Maimonides. For the majority of Jewish philosophers, Crescas is too traditional, while for the majority of traditionalists he is too philosophical. Ultimately, however, and in spite of all the aforementioned factors, the influence of Crescas on Jewish thought is palpable. Or Hashem is found today in a large majority of the libraries of the different yeshivot (Jewish academies), and rabbis from all the different streams of Judaism have studied his book throughout the modern period. In universities and the research world there is a relatively large amount of interest in his original philosophy, and a substantial number of scholars of medieval Jewish philosophy consider Crescas to be the second most important medieval Jewish philosopher after Maimonides.

8.1 Influence on general occidental philosophy

Crescas is not a part of the very limited group of medieval Jewish philosophers whose major philosophical works have been translated into Latin (in particular Maimonides, Rabbi Isaac Israeli, and Rabbi Shlomo Ibn Gabirol). The non-Jewish occidental philosopher had no possibility of direct access to any of his works until the very recent translation of Or Hashem into French. Despite this fact, his philosophical opinions influenced occidental philosophy, especially through their adoption by two important authors: Pico della Mirandola and Spinoza. Pico translated some of Crescas’s critiques on Aristotelian science in his book Examen Vanitas Doctrinae Gentium, and it is possible that Crescas may have influenced some of the Italian philosopher’s other opinions as well. The main influence of Crescas on general occidental philosophy is undoubtedly via his influence on Spinoza. Spinoza, himself Jewish, probably studied Or Hashem as a young student, for Crescas’s book had a profound influence on his opinions. Indeed, Crescas is one the few medieval philosophers that Spinoza quotes with sympathy.[33] There is some controversy among Spinoza scholars regarding the subject of the influence of Jewish thought on Spinoza’s opinions, but it is very probable that Crescas had a significant influence on at least two of his most important views: the essence of God and determinism. We can conclude that in spite of the lack of direct influence, Crescas definitely had an important indirect influence on occidental philosophy, especially via his influence on Spinoza.


Primary Sources

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  • –––, 1989, ‘On A. Ravitzky Crescas’ Sermon on the Passover’, Tarbiz, 58: 531–535 (in Hebrew).
  • –––, 1988, ‘Crescas versus Maimonides on knowledge and pleasure’, in A Straight Path: Studies in Medieval Philosophy and Culture. Essays in Honor of Arthur Hyman, R. Link-Salinger and J. Hackett (eds.), Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press, pp. 113–123.
  • –––, 1985, ‘Comments on the Expression “Feeling of Compulsion” in Rabbi Hasdai Crescas’, Jerusalem Studies in Jewish Thought, 4: 275–280.
  • –––, 1983, Hasdai Crescas’s critique of the theory of the acquired intellect, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1980, ‘The term “hitdabbekut” in Crescas’ definition of time’, Jewish Quarterly Review, 71: 44–47.
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  • –––, 1986, Dogma in medieval Jewish thought: from Maimonides to Abravanel, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 1988, ‘Original Sin and its Atonement According to Hasdai Crescas’, Daat, 20: 127–135 (in Hebrew).
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  • Sadik, S., 2008, ‘Crescas’ critique of Aristotle and the lost book by Abner of Burgos’, Tarbiz, 77: 133–155 (in Hebrew).
  • –––, 2010, ‘Human Choice and Animal Will in Jewish Philosophy at the end of the Middle Ages’, Jewish Studies Internet Journal, 9: 181–203.
  • –––, 2011, ‘The definition of Place in the Thought of Abner of Burgos and Rabbi Hasdai’, Jerusalem Studies in Jewish Thought, 22: 233–246.
  • –––, 2021, ‘The Status of the Tormented Heretic according to Rabbi Hasdai Crescas and his Relation to Abner of Burgos’, Jerusalem Studies in Jewish Thought, 26: 77–95 (in Hebrew).
  • –––, 2022, ‘Philosophy and Religion in R. Crescas’s “Light of the Lord”’, Journal of Textual Reasoning, 12: 1–10.
  • Schweid, E., 1970, The Religious Philosophy of Rabbi Hasdai Crescas, Jerusalem: Mekor (in Hebrew).
  • Stav, Avrahamm, 2018, ‘The Secrets of Rabbi Hasdai Crescas: The Meaning of “Sod HaTefillah” and “Sod HaBitachon” in the work Or Hashem’, in Association for Jewish Studies Review, 42: 1–15.
  • Touati, Ch., 1971, ‘La providence divine cher Hasday Crescas’, Daat, 10: 15–31.
  • –––, 1983, ‘Hasday Crescas et le problême de la science divine’, Revue des études juivres, 142: 73–89.
  • Wolfson, H.A., 1916, ‘Crescas on the Problem of Divine Attributes’, Jewish Quarterly Review, 7: 1–44, 175–121.
  • –––, 1929, Crescas Critique of Aristotle, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1934, The Philosophy of Spinoza, New York: Schocken Books.
  • Zonta, M., 2000, ‘Due note sulle fonti ebraiche di Giovanni Pico e Giordano Bruno’, Rinascimento, 40: 143–153.
  • –––, 2001, ‘The Influence of Hasdai Crescas’s Philosophy on some Aspects of Sixteenth-century Philosophy and Science’, in Religious Confessions and the Sciences in the Sixteenth Century, J.Helm and A. Winkelmann (eds.), Leiden: Brill, pp. 71–78.

Other Internet Resources

  • Or Hashem (in PDF), edited by Rabbi S. Fisher, Jerusalem 1990 (in Hebrew).


Section 2 on the life of Hasdai Crescas is based on Harvey (2010).

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Shalom Sadik <navitshalom@hotmail.com>

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