The Philosophy of Dance

First published Mon Jan 12, 2015; substantive revision Tue Nov 19, 2019

What “counts” as philosophy is a perennial issue that has been debated both within and outside of the American Philosophical Association. Is interdisciplinary philosophy that incorporates not just insights from other fields but their methods, commitments, and forms of discourse still “philosophy”? This article assumes that it is, holding that a philosophy of something can make recourse to conversations and practices in all the domains that are relevant to what it is of (in this case dance) so long as doing so aids our thinking about the meaning of that domain. “Philosophy” is thus construed broadly here in keeping with how the term is used in the rapidly growing field of the philosophy of dance. The potential for dance philosophy is enormous, in part because dance itself is multifaceted enough to make it connect with many branches of philosophy. Indeed, dance has been practiced throughout history for artistic, educational, therapeutic, social, political, religious and other purposes. There are also types of dance on the margins of what many would consider dance proper, such as digital dance, or types of competition dance that have features that make them similar to aesthetic sports like gymnastics or figure skating, so what counts as “dance” is at issue in some cases as well.

Of course, philosophical approaches (once these are identified) provide just some of the many ways to approach dance in order to better understand what it is and why it matters to us. There are theories and insights offered by dance cultural theorists, sociologists, historians, educators, anthropologists, ethnographers, practitioners, dance critics, evolutionary biologists, cognitive scientists, psychologists and others, for example, that are relevant to the questions asked by philosophers but which rely primarily on the methods of analysis culled from those fields. The field known as “dance studies” typically makes use of cultural studies and history but often also includes one or more of the perspectives above, including all forms of philosophy (particularly applied and phenomenology). Recently the Congress on Research in Dance and the Society of Dance History Scholars merged to form the Dance Studies Association (see Franko 2014a for more on the field of dance studies). Dance studies research journals and books often provide good resources for academic philosophy and yet often philosophy students neglect to consult them, sometimes due to ignorance and sometimes due to a fear that they might learn to handle dance “non-philosophically” while they are being trained in traditional philosophic methods. This, among other things, has led to the misperception by some scholars that the field of dance philosophy is smaller than it in fact is.

An additional difficulty is that since the research domain of dance studies is more thoroughly interdisciplinary, and sometimes transdisciplinary, than that of those of us working under the constraints of philosophy departments and their research guidelines (where tenure is dependent on publishing in traditional philosophy journals, for example) it is not always easy to identify the philosophy and philosophy-relevant discourses within it. Indeed, it is often the case that dance philosophers who are multi-methodological, notably Sondra Horton Fraleigh and Maxine Sheets-Johnstone, have rich philosophical insights that are erroneously overlooked or misunderstood, especially in those places where their writing deviates from that of traditional philosophy (see also Erin Manning’s process philosophy [2013]). It is also the case that some scholars who work in dance rather than philosophy departments, like Anna Pakes, an analytic dance philosopher, do adhere to the disciplinary boundaries of academic philosophy and yet their work that is published in dance studies rather than philosophy books and journals can pass by unnoticed.

Philosophy students and others who are interested in dance philosophy are advised to take note of these research-relevant conditions and to consider the meta-philosophical question of both methodology and focus on inquiry when determining how they will write their own work and evaluate that of others. Analytic aesthetics philosophers, for example, might want to know what the “work” of dance as art is and this may not be a question of relevance to the continental, pragmatic, process or dance-studies integrated philosopher. Similarly, accounts of dance that focus heavily on the lived experience of dance for dance-makers and performers that answers to the truth of that experience for dance practitioners may be of interest to performance philosophers, pragmatists and phenomenological philosophers but may not be accepted as relevant by those analytic philosophers who are interested in the critical-appreciative stance.

These methodological choices by dance philosophers reflect normative as well as epistemic commitments (cf. McFee 2018 for another account of dance philosophy normativity). Issues of social power, oppression, and silencing of viewpoints, for example, may be of interest and concern to one group of dance philosophers while another group sees these concerns as external to questions that interest them (such as whether a triple pirouette counts as expert action, say). Finally, as the institutional field of philosophy in the U.S. and elsewhere expands to include non-Western and non-traditional sources of philosophy, such as that by philosophers whose viewpoints were marginalized or excluded for a variety of reasons, what “counts” as the philosophy of dance will need to expand with it. Noticing which domain or sets of domains or non-domains a dance philosopher is working in, which questions interest them, and what counts as evidence for them can go a long way towards avoiding misunderstandings and inapt criticisms of others’ work. This presents both the challenge of the Tower of Babel and the opportunity of a truly rich and multi-cultural dance philosophy world. (For more on the relation between philosophy and dance as well as questions of dance philosophy and interdisciplinarity see Boyce 2013 and forthcoming; Burt 2009; Carroll 2003; Challis 1999; Cohen 1962; Colebrook 2005; Conroy 2012; cf. Cull Ó Maoilearca 2018 [this focuses on philosophy and theatre but there are interesting parallels with dance]; Cvejić 2015b; DeFrantz 2005; Redfern 1983; Foster, Rothfield, and Dunagan 2005; Fraleigh 1999; cf. Franko 2014a [this discusses dance studies and aesthetics]; Friedman with Bresnahan forthcoming; Levin 1983; T. Lewis 2007; McFee 2013a; Pakes 2019; Sheets-Johnstone 1984; Shusterman 2005; Sparshott 1982a, 1982b, 1983, 1988, 1993, 1995, 2004; and Van Camp 1996a and 2009.)

1. Analytic Ontology of Dance as Art

The dance philosophy that is a subset of philosophical aesthetics is interested in the question, “what is the nature of dance as art?” Here one set of philosophical problems center on identifying what the art product of dance is—whether it is an object or structure of some or a more fluid process or event. Dance philosophers differ on which features of dance as art should have primary of place for purposes of ontology. Some philosophers with commitments to dancework structure and repeatability (notably Nelson Goodman (1976) and Graham McFee (1992b, 2011b, and 2018)) treat the art-relevant aspect of dance as its abstract structure, looking to an actual or in-principle score for guidance even if they deny (as McFee does) that this is an attempt to find a true definition or “essence” of dance. It is important to these philosophers that there be an object of appreciation that can be evaluated independently of any particular subjective experience or perspective of it, in this way hoping to identify something “true” about dance as art that is subject to the sort of rational appraisal, analysis, and what McFee calls “reconstruction” that analytic philosophy does well (see McFee 2018).

There are dance works of art that are relatively stable throughout dance history in terms of historical identification despite variations (the perennial Swan Lake, for example) and McFee points to these as support for his perspective on dance as a practice that creates dance works of are that are “performables” instantiated in repeatable performances. There are dance philosophers, however, who think that the art-relevant focus of dance might lie elsewhere than in the structure of the “dancework” treated as art object. Mark Franko, for example, points out that

contemporary thought on dance is frequently split between a concept of dance-as-writing and a concept of dance as beyond the grasp of all language, especially written language. (2011a: 322; see also Franko 2011b)

(For more on the idea of dance as texts see Franko 1993.) Other dance philosophers think that dance can be characterized by words and concepts but that these either apply to features of performance or to dance practices or events rather than to texts or structures. The non-structuralist dance philosophers observe that dances usually lack words or texts and are often developed without the use of a written plan, script or score of any kind (see Franko 1989 and 2011a; see also Franko 2017 for a recent anthology of dance and reconstruction, in particular the essay by Pakes [2017b] within it). They also note that even when there is a score, this score is not always used as an essential recipe for the performances but can instead just serve as the inspiration for a performance that is completely different (see Franko 1989). In addition, standardized notation forms are controversial, and no one form is universally accepted (see Franko 2011a and Van Camp 1998). Finally, there are dance philosophers who think that what makes dance special and worthy of philosophers’ interest lies in dance’s bodily, tactile, dynamic, felt, perceived and intuited aspects (sometimes referred to as its kinaesthetic or somatic elements). (See this entry’s Sections 2 and 3 for more on these latter aspects of dance. See Sections 1.1–1.2 below for more on focus on dance’s structural vs. non-structural features. See also Pakes 2006 for one account of the “mind-body” problem in dance.)

For more on the general question, “What is dance?”, see D. Carr 1987; Carroll 2003, Copeland and Cohen 1983; McFee 1998a and 2013a; Pakes 2019; Sparshott 1988; and Van Camp 1981. For more on meaning, expression, authenticity and communication in dance see D. Carr 1997; Best 1974; Franko 2014b; Hanna 1983 and 1979 [1987]; Martin 1933a, 1939, and 1946; and Van Camp 1996b.

1.1 Problem(s) of Identity and Reconstruction

As mentioned briefly in the section above, there are many problems of identity for dance that arise in analytic aesthetics (cf. Fraleigh 2004 for an alternative usage of the word “identity” for dance). One is that the moment that a dance is composed does not “fix” the dance for all time in that form. Dances are usually known by the name and date of their first performance but subsequent performances and casts can change the structural and other qualitative features that were present in the original performance. Further, as mentioned earlier, many dances have no notated score and, if they are preserved via video or other method, subsequent performances can still deviate from these frameworks in significant and perhaps identity-changing ways. In addition, even where there is a score, it may not result in performances from that score that are experientially identifiable as the “same” work of art. A dance notation might also function as the jumping-off point from which to make a radically new kind of dance rather than a limitation on innovation and changes to which a dance choreographer or set of performers must adhere. There is also the issue that what a dance “is” in practice or for appreciation, in its “essential” features (if there are any), may not be identical with what a dance “is” for purposes of numerical identity and historical preservation. In this way dance is not unlike music (for more on this S. Davies 1991). (See Armelagos and Sirridge 1978; D. Davies 2011b; Goodman 1976; McFee 2011b and 2018 for more on this particular debate. Cf. S. Davies 1991 for a relevant discussion in the philosophy of music and Meskin 1999 for an alternative view of dancework ontology that holds that dance audiences experience three works of art: 1) a choreographic-work, 2) a production-work, and 3) a performance-interpretation work.)

For more on the question of “What is Dance?” see D. Carr 1997; Cohen 1982; Conroy 2015 (who provides an account of dance as gestural fiction); McFee 1994 and 1998a; Rubidge 2000; Sparshott 1988 and 1995; Thomas 2018; and Van Camp 1981.

1.2 Dance as Ephemeral Art

One of the features of dance as a performing art that has been often noted is that it moves and it changes, both during the course of any given performance and over time. A catchall phrase for this sort of impermanence—reflecting the lack of entirely stable art “objects” in every case—has been to say that “dance is an ephemeral art”, although there are alternative versions of what this means (see Conroy 2012; see also Copeland and Cohen 1983 and Copeland 1993. This does not mean that dance is insubstantial or unserious. Instead, what it means is that there is something vital about dance performances and events that disappears as it is being performed. As noted in Section 3, above, this may or may not distinguish dance from theater or music, although dance does seem to rely less on recordings and written notations in the making and performing of dances overall.

Dance critic Marcia Siegel famously wrote that dance “exists as a perpetual vanishing point”, which means for Siegel that dance exists in “an event that disappears in the very act of materializing.” (1972: 1). Siegel posits that dance has escaped the mass marketing of the industrial revolution “precisely because it doesn’t lend itself to any reproduction…” (1972: 5). Conroy (2012: 158) acknowledges that the “safest” ontological interpretation of Siegel’s claim would suggest that dance performances are one-time, transient events. If this is the case it would mean that there is no enduring “type” that constitutes a dance work of art that is “tokened” by various instancing performances. This would mean that the “classical paradigm” discussed by D. Davies (2011b) and upheld by Goodman (1976) and by McFee (2011b and 2018) is wrong. If we hold that some dance performances are transient but not others, then the classical paradigm would still need to account for those performances that do not fit, much like the ontology of music has had to deal with the ontology of highly or entirely improvised jazz performances that seem to be “one-offs” and that are not preserved via recording. (See Anna Pakes’ forthcoming book, Choreography Invisible: The Disappearing Work of Dance, for more on this issue.)

McFee (2011b; also see 2018) believes that the instability of dance works of art is a problem that is due to poor preservation and reconstruction of dances rather than a feature that tells us something meaningful about the nature of dance. He also thinks that dance notation might be developed in the future to provide a workable way to preserve and reconstruct dances, something that Van Camp and Franko suggest may not be possible (the specifics of their claims here can be found in Section 2 of this entry, above). We can take this to be the negative view of the ephemerality of dance.

A positive version of dance as an ephemeral art, however, is one that holds that we ought to appreciate, rather than decry, dance’s ever-changing and disappearing nature as something that makes a live performance of a dance that will not happen again the same way into a vital experience for both the dance performers and the audience. The positive account celebrates the live nature of the dance performance and helps to explain why kinesthetic responses to dance performances are both relevant and powerful. It also suggests that ephemerality is an aesthetic value for dance that gives dance the ability to provide a “you had to be there” sort of event. (See Bresnahan 2014a for an account of improvisational artistry in live dance performance as a sort of agency that is consistent with this positive view.) Conroy agrees with McFee that the phrase “dance is an ephemeral art” does apply to the difficulty of preserving dances, but she also thinks it should be conceived as a statement of a danceworld value; as a way of conveying “a communal attitude of tolerance for change with respect to choreography that has been previously performed” (2012: 160).

2. Dance as Agency and Intentional Action

As mentioned in the introduction to this entry, dance philosophers vary in terms of where within dance practice and performance they would like to focus their attention. Many philosophers who focus on dance as agency and intentional action are looking at the expert action involved in dance as art, although some consider agency and intentionality in social or other forms of dance. It is also the case that when considering dance as a form of expert action (akin to sports, say) that often technical and athletic prowess as well as artistic skills like expressivity or grace are the focus on analysis (see, e.g., Montero 2016). Among these are philosophers of art who are interested in questions of dance work identity, for purposes of historical identification and reconstruction among others. These, like McFee (2018), treat dance-relevant actions as part of what is needed to create and instantiate a dance work of art (dancework) with the focus being on the structure created by these actions. (For more on McFee’s account of dance and action see McFee 2011b, 2018 and forthcoming.)

Another traditional way, besides those mentioned in Section 1, that dance philosophers in analytic aesthetics have considered the question “what is dance?” is to characterize dance as a particularly expressive form of art, or one that involves “action” in a particular way. Dance historian Selma Jean Cohen (1962) has held that expressiveness is present in all dance, for example, causing Monroe C. Beardsley (1982) to posit that expressiveness might be a necessary if not sufficient condition for dance as art. Borrowing from action theory, Beardsley says that one bodily action can, under the right circumstances, be sortally generated into another kind of action. Thus, the act of running, can, under the right circumstances, be expressive and part of the art of dance accordingly. We can also infer here that other conditions of dance as art might also apply (being on a stage in a theater, being offered for appreciation as a dance, conducted in ways that are part of a dance vocabulary, etc.). In making this claim, Beardsley rejects Haig Khatchadourian’s view (1978) that dance movements are not actions, crediting Van Camp’s Philosophical Problems of Dance Criticism (1981) for helping him to critique Khatchadourian in this way. (See Meskin 1999 for more on dances as action sequences rather than mere movements; See Carroll and Banes 1982 for a critique of Beardsley’s theory of dance as expressive action.)

Susanne K. Langer (1953b) holds that dance is an art that is in essence a symbol-making endeavor but she does not call this activity “action.” For Langer dance’s products are symbols but these are a sort of coalescence and transforming of real activities into a virtual (“artistic”) form. For Langer, dance’s special symbol or “primary illusion” is what she calls “virtual power” or gesture rather than virtual time (the symbol for music), virtual space (the symbol for the plastic arts) or the illusion of life (the symbol for poetry, when it is in words and for drama when it is presented in the mode of action). Thus, her view departs from Beardsley’s here significantly. Instead, it seems more in line with that of Graham McFee (2018), who holds that dance is “embodied meaning.” McFee is presumably following Arthur C. Danto’s 1981 account of art in The Transfiguration of the Commonplace here but since Danto was Langer’s student she may have been the ultimate genesis of this idea. (For McFee’s view of dance as action see Section 2 of this entry.)

Anna Pakes’ view of dance as action is in line with that of Beardsley and Van Camp, against Khatchadourian and Langer. She (2013) agrees that action is a necessary feature of dance. Both Aaron Meskin (1999) and Pakes suggest that it is the embodiment of dance in a physical, intentional event that makes dances better construed as action-structures than as eternal types. It is for this reason (among others) that they find dance to be ill-suited for analysis under a Platonic ontology of art in which the structure of the work of art is discovered rather than created. Sondra Horton Fraleigh (1996) can be placed on Pakes and Meskin’s side here, since she holds that dance is necessarily expressive and transitive action.

There are other contemporary dance philosophers, some working within the analytic tradition and some not, who treat the minded agency and action involved in either choreography, performing dance, or both, as primary areas of dance interest as well. Often these are connected to normative, epistemic and ontological commitments about what dance is and why it matters (David Davies (2004), for example, treats all art, including dance art, as performance). Many of these philosophers (such as Bresnahan 2014a, 2017a, and 2019b; Merritt 2015; and Montero 2016) use both traditional philosophy, in the forms of analytic philosophy and phenomenological philosophy, and insights from research in the cognitive sciences as aids in their analysis. (For more on dance philosophy and its connections to cognitive science see Section 4. See also Section 3.3 for a discussion of dance as expertise.)

There is also a great deal of literature on agency and intentional action in dance philosophy, which focuses on the thinking and embodied activities that take place in the studio or on the stage or other performance contexts as well as literature on the agency and activities of audience members or appreciators who are not also dancers and dance-makers. (For more dance philosophy literature on dance agency and intentional action see D. Carr 1987; J. Carr 2013; Bunker, Pakes and Rowell 2013; Noland 2009; and Sheets-Johnstone 1981, 1999, 2011, and 2012.)

2.1 Choreography, Authorship, and Copyright

Van Camp (1980) holds that, for purposes of artistic judgment and appreciation at least, it is the case that sometimes the dance performer “creates”, and not just performs and interprets, the dance. The dancer, for example, often supplies structural and stylistic elements of a dance during the course of rehearsing and performing the piece that were not specified or provided by the choreographer. If these contributions are significant then what the dancer provides might be better understood as “creation” rather than “interpretation”, she maintains.

This view is opposed by McFee (2011b, 2013c and 2018), who believes that dance works of art are created by choreographers and are performed by dancers to fulfill the choreographer’s intentions. Chris Challis (1999)’s work supports this account. On McFee’s choreographer-as-dancework-author view the dancer’s role is both instrumental and subsidiary to the choreographer’s vision and their expertise is in dancing, not in dance-art creation. It follows from this that dancers contribute the raw material for dance performances but are more like skilled technicians or artisans than author-artists. This view has been criticized for neglecting the performers’ role in making and performing dances in art-relevant ways by Lauren Alpert in an American Society for Aesthetics conference (2016), by Aili Bresnahan (2013 and at a dance philosophy conference at Texas State and in a work on interpretation in dance performing), and by Pakes (2019). (For more on creative decision-making and choreography in dance see Cvejić 2015a and 2017; Foster 2011; and Melrose 2017. For an article on video choreography see Salzer and Baer 2015. Cf. S. Davies 1991 for a discussion of whether creative additions to a “thin” work of art can “thicken” it.)

McFee bolsters this account with his idea that artistic authorship of dance works of art is and should be attributable only to those who bear “responsibility” for these works (2018). This comes close to and yet stops short of equating dance-making credit for dances with intellectual property rights, where it is by no means the case (particularly in the U.S.) that those who create art are the ones taking credit and who are granted legal copyright in them. (For more on issues of authorship in dance and copyright see Kraut 2010, 2011 and 2016 and Van Camp 1994. For a book on dance, disability and the law see Whatley et al. 2018.)

2.2 Dance Improvisation

“Improvisation” in dance often refers to the intentional agency and action of dance-makers and performers (who may or may not be the same people) rather than the result of that activity. Three types of improvisation in theater dance have been identified by Carter (2000: 182): 1) embellishments where set choreography persists, 2) improvisation as spontaneous free movement for use in set choreography and 3) improvisation for its own sake brought to a high level of performance. An example of 1) would be the situation in which a dance performer is allowed to amplify existing movements (doing a triple pirouette in place of a double, for example), or a stylistic flourish such as an extra flick of the wrist or tilt of the head. An example of 2) would be the case in which no choreography has been provided for eight bars of music and the dancer(s) is given the freedom to insert whatever he or she wishes in the open space. Finally, 3) would cover the situation that D. Davies (2011b) might call a “work performance”, where a work is choreographed by the dancers while dancing. It would also include the situation where either the whole performance or a substantial part of it is improvised from start to finish. Dances comprised of Steve Paxton’s “contact improvisation”, for example, would count as improvisation for its own sake (see Paxton 1975 and 1981).

Danielle Goldman (2010) provides a critical analysis of the idea of improvisational “freedom”, as represented in Carter’s improvisation type 2, above. She suggests that we examine social and historical constraints on the possibility of “freedom”, since such freedom cannot exist in oppressive conditions such as slavery where prohibitive social as well as physical barriers exist. Goldman thus suggests an alternative form of improvisation, one that is

a rigorous mode of making oneself ready for a range of potential situations…an incessant preparation, grounded in the present while open to the next moment’s possible actions and constraints. (2010: 142)

In “Taken by Surprise: Improvisation in Dance and Mind”, Susan Leigh Foster (2003) shares Goldman’s view that it is the moment right before an actual dance movement within a performance that matters to the special aesthetic experience of dance improvisation. She says, “it is this suspense-filled plenitude of the not-quite-known that gives live performance its special brilliance” (2003: 4). Her essay also contains a phenomenological account of the agency involved in improvisation, equating the lived experience of improvisation with a “middle voice”, in which a dancer finds herself in a flow of movement that takes the middle position between deliberative choices and passive direction.

Dance philosophers have also identified other forms of dance improvisation that do not fit within Carter’s three categories. Kent de Spain (2003), for example, brings our attention to a type of dance improvisation that is practiced by dancers in order to achieve a movement-based somatic state, what we shall call “somatic improvisation”. Somatic improvisation, or the results of these improvisational exercises, may be included in a theater performance for an audience but need not be. Constance Valis Hill (2003) includes “challenge dance” performances, stemming from the African-American tradition of dance “battles”, where the purpose is to win an ever-escalating competition of skill and style. Like somatic improvisation, challenge dance improvisation can be offered for audience appreciation in a concert context but need not be—it has taken place in social and street settings, for entertainment as well as for “artistic” purposes. Aili Bresnahan (2014a) has made the claim that all live dance performance involves improvisational artistry to at least some extent and that this can be seen as a kind of embodied and extended agency under embodied and extended mind theories, in particular that of Andy Clark in his book, Supersizing the Mind: Embodiment, Action, and Cognitive Extension (2011).

For more on improvisation in dance, see Albright and Gere 2003; Clemente 1990; De Spain 1993, 2014, and 2019; Kloppenberg 2010; Matheson 2005; Novack 1990 and 1988 [2010]; Pallant 2006; Paxton 1975 and 1981; Zaporah 2003; and The Oxford Handbook of Improvisation in Dance (Midgelow 2019). For more on improvisation in the arts, see the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism special issue on Improvisation in the Arts, Spring, 2000 [Hagberg 2000]; Alperson 1984, 1998, and 2010; Bresnahan 2015; Brown 1996; Hagberg 1998; G. Lewis 2014; the Oxford Handbook of Critical Improvisation Studies (2 volumes, Lewis and Piekut 2016/Piekut and Lewis 2016); and Sawyer 2000. Cf. Symposium, 2010, “Musical Improvisation” in The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism.

3. Dance, Lived Experience and Somatic Awareness

There are fields of philosophy, particularly in the Continental, pragmatic, and non-Western traditions, that treat art as both activity and as experiential phenomena. These phenomenological kinds of philosophy treat lived experience, including bodily and somatic experience, as something that can provide legitimate descriptive or causal evidence for philosophic claims. (See, e.g., Dewey 1934; Merleau-Ponty 1945 and 1964; along with Berleant 1991; Bresnahan 2014b; Foultier and Roos 2013 (Other Internet Resources); Johnson 2007; Katan 2016; Lakoff and Johnson 1999; and Merritt 2015 for work on dance following Dewey and Merleau-Ponty. For more on phenomenological approaches to dance see Albright 2011; Fraleigh 1996 [which also contains quite a lot of material on the history of dance in aesthetics], 2000, and 2018; Franko 2011b; and Sheets-Johnstone 1966 and 2015. Cf. Ness 2011 for an account of a shift in dance away from phenomenology with Foucault.)

Richard Shusterman has developed his own phenomenological theory, which he calls “somaesthetics”, in order to explain an embodied engagement with art, including dance, that includes a sort of kinesthetic awareness of interior, somatic processes (see 2008, 2009, 2011a, 2011b, 2011c and 2012). (For more on dance and somatic engagement see Eddy 2002; Fraleigh 2015; Weber 2019; and Williamson et al. 2014. See also LaMothe 2009; Pakes 2003, 2017a, and 2019; and Parvainen 2002 for work on the related field of dance, the body and epistemology.)

3.1 The Primacy of Practice

Those philosophers, some of whom are mentioned above, who treat lived experience as legitimate descriptive and explanatory evidence are firmly committed to the validity of practice in philosophy of dance. Analytic aesthetics philosophers, however (such as D. Davies and Montero), often find it necessarily to legitimize their recourse to practice in an explicit way. D. Davies’ view is that ontologies of art should operate under a “pragmatic constraint” that tethers their views to what can be demonstrated in practice (2009). Montero’s is that there is empirical evidence to support the idea that practitioners are experts in their domain of practice (see 2012, 2013, and 2016).

Julie Van Camp and Renee Conroy have argued that analytic dance aesthetics needs to be more reflective of and responsive to actual danceworld and artworld practice. Van Camp has proposed

that the identity of works of art [including dance] be understood pragmatically as ways of talking and acting by the various communities of the art world. (2006: 42)

Conroy (2013b) has instead of a definition provided an argument for what she calls three “minimal desiderata” for an adequate account of dancework identity, two of which require that any theory be responsive to and applicable in danceworld practice, and one that requires that criteria of metaphysical adequacy be met. (For an account of practice as dance research see Pakes 2003 and 2017a.)

3.2 Bodily (Kinaesthetic) Responses

In dance philosophy there is controversy about how to construe the felt, bodily responses that the audience can and often does have while watching a dance performance. These felt, bodily responses are often called “kinaesthetic”, with the alternate spelling of “kinesthetic” (combining the movement sense of “kinetic” with a physical sort of sense of the aesthetic as beautiful, or graceful and the like) and the mechanism by which these responses occur is one of the things that is debated. Two of the questions that arise here are the following: 1) What is the causal process by which kinesthetic responses are felt? and 2) To what extent, if any, does an understanding of this causal process inform a proper understanding of dance qua dance as art?

To take the first question first: Causal processes that can explain kinesthetic responses in dance are by no means well understood. It is not clear, for example, how “empathy”, understood in the broad sense as the ability to feel something based on what we perceive as someone else’s experience, like a dance performer’s, informs our kinaesthetic and other appreciative responses. (For more on empathy and the kinaesthetic aspect of performance see Foster 2008 and 2011.)

Some contemporary philosophers of dance such as Barbara Montero (2006a, 2006b, 2012, and 2013) use research in cognitive science and in neuroscience in order to ascertain the answers to why audience members report feeling kinesthetic responses such as a quickening heart rate and certain tensions along with more mysterious feelings in their muscles and nervous systems. (For more on how dance philosophy incorporates approaches from cognitive science in these and other areas see Section 4, below. See also Bresnahan 2017b; Reason and Reynolds 2010; Sklar 2008; and Smyth 1984 for more on kinaesthetic response to dance.)

3.3 Expertise

Montero’s view (2012) is that trained dancers have enhanced and more nuanced kinaesthetic responses than do persons with no dance training, something that she believes can contribute to a richer appreciative evaluation of dance (see Bresnahan 2017b for a fuller discussion of this view). Conroy agrees that Montero’s evidence shows that trained dancers might be able “to identify subtle discrepancies between multiple performances of canonical movement types” but denies that this necessarily translates into better appreciation of dance qua dance as art, where what matters is appreciation of aesthetic properties which may or may not depend on the kind of perception Montero’s evidence identifies in every case (2013: 205). McFee, as mentioned in Section 3.2, disagrees that dance training is ever relevant to the understanding of dance as art, which he seems to equate with critical appreciation. Van Camp (2019) lends support for this view.

Bresnahan has sided with Montero on this point (2017b). This is due to Bresnahan’s pragmatic perspective that the art-determining features of “art” lie in the experience of art, both as an appreciator and as a dancer and practitioner. Further, Bresnahan believes that there are some aspects of the experience of dance that are not available to the non-dance-trained appreciator or not available to the same extent. Bresnahan agrees that this is an empirical question but she sides with Montero, Carroll and Seeley in holding that answers to empirical questions can aid philosophic understanding. (For more discussion on the appropriateness of empirical support for philosophic inquiry in dance see Sections 3.2 and 4 of this entry. See He and Ravn 2018; Melrose 2017; Montero 2010, 2012, and 2013; Vass-Rhee 2018; and Washburn et al. 2014 for more on dance and expertise.)

4. Dance and Cognitive Science

The number of dance philosophers who are interested and involved in using empirical research in the cognitive sciences to help our understanding of the cognitive-physical components of making dance art in actions, events and performances is large and growing. These include Bläsing et al. 2012 and Bläsing et al. 2019; Bresnahan 2014a; Cross and Ticini 2012; Hagendoorn 2012; Katan 2016; Jang and Pollick 2011; He and Ravn 2018; Jola, Ehrenberg, and Reynolds 2012; Legrand and Ravn 2009; McKechnie and Stevens 2009; Merritt 2015; Montero 2006a, 2006b, 2010, 2012, and 2013; Seeley 2011 and 2013; Vass-Rhee 2018. Maxine Sheets-Johnstone’s body of dance philosophy work that incorporates research from the cognitive and other sciences is so extensive that they would require their own entry to list in full (see the ones in this entry’s bibliography for a start). See Bresnahan 2017a for an account of how dance training affects our temporal experience and Bresnahan 2019a for the view that expert dance movements are often experienced and perceived via subconscious processes before they are fully cognized. For a series of sustained arguments against the philosophical fruitfulness of using insights from cognitive science see McFee 2003, 2011a, and 2018.

Montero has written on how proprioception (the capacity that lets a person know their bodily position in space) might be construed as an aesthetic sense, how mirror neurons might be part of an audience experience of this sense, and how trained dancers might make better aesthetic judges at least in part due to some of these mechanisms. (See the discussion on expertise that precedes this discussion in Section 3.3.) Carroll is one philosopher who has followed Montero’s research (see Carroll and Moore 2011) in his thinking about how dance and music might work together to affect our kinaesthetic responses. He has also considered (see Carroll and Seeley 2013) how Montero’s research and other research in neuroscience might bolster dance critic John Martin’s theory of “metakinetic transfer” from dance performers to audience dances. (For more on Martin’s theory of “metakinetic transfer”, which he says is due to “muscular sympathy” and “inner mimicry” see Martin 1939 and Franko 1996.)

The philosophers who support the use of research on neurological processing of kinesthetic responses to dance in general hold that it is relevant to our proper understanding of dance qua the art of dance. Carroll and Seeley (2013) argue, for example, that one of the central features of understanding dance is to understand the nature of the experience of dance in all its aspects, cognitive as well as kinesthetic and felt. Thus, connecting this experience with causal explanations is elucidating and appropriate to a full and broad understanding of that experience in all of its aspects. This can be called the “moderately optimistic view”, following D. Davies 2013. D. Davies’ own answer to the question of how scientific research can be used in understanding and appreciating dance is what he calls the “moderately pessimistic” view (2013). He agrees with McFee that there are some questions relevant to philosophical dance aesthetics that cannot be answered by empirical research, no matter how accurate that research may be for answering certain scientific, causal questions. There are normative questions, for example, such as “what counts as proper appreciation of a work of art?” that science cannot answer. Empirical research, where used by dance and other philosophers, must, according to D. Davies, be applied carefully to the relevant questions (see 2011a and 2013; see also 2014).

D. Davies (2013) is only moderately pessimistic about empirical research, however, because he thinks that philosophy ought not to partition itself away from science and away from other disciplines that might inform our thinking. Here he suggests that we ought to follow the Quinean idea that philosophy ought to respond to and at least be cognizant of current science so that we know how our philosophic views fit into our web of other beliefs about the world. D. Davies (2013) is also sympathetic with the part of Seeley’s view (in Seeley 2011) that holds that empirical research can at least help us to avoid false assumptions pertaining to the arts that are tacitly or explicitly based on empirical misunderstandings. (For a full discussion of the various optimisms and pessimisms regarding how empirical research can affect our understanding of art here see Bullot et al. 2017.)

McFee (2011a, 2013b and 2018) denies that causal explanations about kinesthetic responses are ever relevant to dance appreciation. This view can be called (following D. Davies 2013) “the extremely pessimistic view”. McFee holds that causal accounts, particularly from the sciences, of the appreciation and experience of dance, either in terms of kinesthetic responses or anything else, are never relevant to understanding dance as art. He says that the idea that “our bodily reactions—our toe-tapping, sitting up straight, holding our breaths, tensing our legs, and so on” is relevant to dance appreciation “makes no sense” (2013b: 189, a view reinforced in 2018). His thought here is that dance appreciation happens at the level of a person who appreciates, someone with the cultural resources to understand dance as a form of art, not at the level of neurobiology. Montero, Carroll and Seeley would probably agree that kinesthetic responses cannot alone provide an appreciation of dance as art. The difference is that, unlike McFee, they think that neurobiologic studies can contribute to our understanding of dance as art in some ways. (For more on McFee’s view here see McFee 2003, 2013b, and 2018. For another neuroscientific approach to audience engagement with dance see Seeley 2013.)

5. Additional Dance and Philosophy Connections

This section is last and is sparse for the reasons mentioned in the introduction. The reader is encouraged to seek out sources beyond the few ones mentioned here and to look in the ancillary locations recommended within each section for additional information, along with doing searches in dance and performance studies journals. (See the entries in the Related Entries section below.)

5.1 Non-Western and Non-Traditional Philosophy and Dance

Here the reader is encouraged to consult sources that may not be called “philosophy” but something else, such as religious studies, ethnography, cultural anthropology, oral history, and the like, particularly in those traditions where philosophy and religious scholarship combines (as in Islamic philosophy and some forms of East Asian and Indian philosophy) or where the traditions of thought are communicated orally rather than in writing (as is often the case in the philosophy of native and indigenous peoples). There is also much of philosophy of dance interest to be found in the literature, poetry, and song of groups and peoples who are not a traditionally enfranchised part of the Western philosophical canon.

The bibliographic sources provided here on non-Western and non-traditional philosophy and/or non-Western forms of dance include S. Davies (2006, 2008, 2012, and 2017) on Balinese Legong, Fraleigh (2010 and 2015) on the Japanese form of dance known as Butoh, including asking whether Butoh is a philosophy, Friedman’s forthcoming essay on post-colonial African philosophical frameworks as applied to dance, Hall 2012 on Fanon’s view of dance, Osumare 2007 on Africanist aesthetics and hip-hop, Schroeder 2009 on Nietzsche and the Kyoto school, Welch 2019 on Native American dance and the phenomenology of performative knowledge, and Welsh-Asante 1990, who has published a piece on Cabral, Fanon and dance in Africa. See also Section 5.2 below, particularly for Western non-traditional philosophy, some of which is critical work that has been placed under the social-political category.

5.2 Dance, Ethics and Social-Political Philosophy

Here the reader is encouraged to consult ethics, social and political philosophy journals as well as those journals that highlight cultural and critical studies (such as gender, race, disability, ethnicity, LGBTQ+ and others), along with dance studies and dance history journals and books. For a subject-related entry that discusses the influence of post-structuralism and politics on dance philosophy see Pakes 2019. (Cf. Cull Ó Maoilearca 2012 for a Deleuzean account of the ethics of performance that might apply to dance.)

Additional sources one might consult here include Fiona Bannon’s book (2018) and dance and ethics, which among other things makes use of Spinoza and Martin Buber’s theories of ethics, Karen Bond’s comprehensive and multifaceted book, Dance and Quality of Life (which addresses among other things how dance contributes to what is good for human beings, which is why this work has been included under the ethics category), Bresnahan and Deckard 2019 and Hall 2018 on disability and dance, DeFrantz’s work on black dance and aesthetics (forthcoming and elsewhere), Eva Kit Wah Man’s new book on bodies, aesthetics and politics in China (2019) (which is not specifically on dance), Royona Mitra’s work on Akram Khan’s style of dance and choreography as a form of inter-culturalism (2015 and 2018), Eric Mullis’ forthcoming essay on dance and political power, Halifu Osumare’s powerful memoir, Dancing in Blackness (2018), and Sherman 2018 on dancers, soldiers and emotional engagement. See also the three-part essay on dance as embodied ethics in Bresnahan, Katan-Schmid, and Houston (2020).

5.3 Dance, Film and Digital Technology

Dance is developing in ways that include not just live, bodily performances on stage but dance that is in digital, filmic and other technological or technologically-enhanced forms. New dance philosophy (as philosophy of these new dance arts) is emerging accordingly. Besides the short list of sources mentioned below the reader is encouraged to conduct dance philosophy research in film and emerging technology journals.

Dance philosophers who write on dance in film (or on film or filmic dance) include Brannigan 2014; Carroll 2001; McFee 2018; and Salzer and Baer 2015. Hetty Blades (2015a and 2015b) has written on dance, virtual technology and scoring and her work centers on other forms of dance technology as well. For a piece on dance, ethics and technology see Mullis 2015. See also the section on dance and technology, with includes a number of entries on dance, film, and technology, in the forthcoming Bloomsbury Handbook to Dance and Philosophy edited by Rebecca Farinas and Julie Van Camp, with consultation by Craig Hanks and Aili Bresnahan.


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Other Internet Resources


In the original version of this entry, an attempt was made to canvass some of the history of the philosophy of dance as it existed and had developed in western philosophical aesthetics. In that domain dance is treated as a meaning-making and often communicative, expressive or representational theater or concert art that is practiced and performed for audience appreciation. The present version of the entry engages with constructive feedback and attempts to map out a broader terrain for a larger and more inclusive philosophy of dance. But it is still incomplete. This reflects, in part, limitations of space as well as the fact that the much of dance philosophy exists in locations disparate enough that often they are not (yet) in communication with one another. (See Pakes 2019 for an excellent overview of the field of philosophy of dance—it is my recommendation that this work be treated as a companion piece to this entry.)

To make room for this expanded account of the philosophy of dance, earlier sections of this entry on the history of dance in Western analytic aesthetics, comparisons with music and theater, on the concepts of representation and expression, and on dance criticism have been supplanted by new sections. Those readers who wish to review the philosophical aesthetics history will find it in the original version of this entry. See also the references to Plato, Nietzsche, Scott 2018, and Sparshott 1998 for additional historical sources.

Copyright © 2019 by
Aili Bresnahan

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