Denis Diderot

First published Wed Jun 19, 2019

Because of his public leadership of the philosophe party in eighteenth-century France, Voltaire stands today as the iconic example of the French Enlightenment philosopher. Denis Diderot (1713–1784) is often seen as Voltaire’s second in that role since it was around both men that the Enlightenment philosophes rallied as a movement after 1750. The epochal project, which Diderot jointly pursued with Jean le Rond D’Alembert, to “change the common way of thinking” through a comprehensive Encyclopedia, or Reasoned Dictionary of the Arts, Sciences, and Trades provided the emergent philosophe movement with the cause around which they would coalesce. Diderot also fought vigorously with Voltaire on behalf of the Encyclopédie project and its principles, becoming as a result a public leader of the Enlightenment philosophical party in France alongside Voltaire. He also worked, like Voltaire, as a writer and critical intellectual who willingly positioned himself against the grain of established authority, and one who used philosophy as a vehicle for political and social activism. Yet Diderot’s philosophy pursued many more agendas and dimensions than Voltaire’s. He also left behind a corpus of philosophical writings that marks him out as arguably the most sophisticated of all the Enlightenment philosophes, and as one of the great philosophical thinkers of the eighteenth-century.

Despite the obvious sophistication of Diderot’s philosophy, his legacy has suffered because of the historical differences separating his writings from the discipline of philosophy as it is practiced today. Enlightenment philosophie was something very different from what professional academic philosophers mean by that term today, and Diderot’s writings are often ignored by modern philosophers because they do not appear to be philosophy as they know it. Like many Enlightenment philosophes, Diderot also worked as an homme de lettres first and foremost, and only as a philosopher narrowly construed in certain instances. He also never authored any recognizable work of “systematic philosophy” if by that term we mean writing in the vein of his contemporaries such as David Hume in his Treatise or Immanuel Kant in his Critiques.

Yet Diderot made important contributions to modern philosophy, and if they are to be grasped, the historical differences separating his writing from philosophy today must be transcended, and his eclectic manner of working accepted and embraced. Diderot wrote works that we recognize today as philosophy, but he also wrote a great deal more than that, and the challenge presented by his eighteenth-century philosophie is to see the modern philosophy contained in all of it. For Diderot did not simply write plays, art criticism, prose fictions, and highly imaginative works of literature alongside his work in philosophy; he pursued philosophie through these ostensibly literary works as well. He experimented with genres, including philosophical genres, when crafting his thought, and his writing overall is redolent with a self-consciousness that makes any easy separation of his explicitly philosophical writings from his literary work well-nigh impossible. His publishing habits were similarly complex, for as a writer who suffered personally under censorship that made the traffic in illicit ideas a prosecutable offense in Old Regime France, Diderot often had very good reason to leave his work unpublished—and very often did. At the same time, censorship alone does not explain the peculiar mix of published and unpublished writings found in Diderot’s oeuvre.

This historical complexity has given rise to some difficulty in assessing Diderot’s writings according to the disciplinary canon of modern philosophy. Condillac, Helvétius, and d’Holbach are the Enlightenment philosophes most commonly studied within philosophy departments because their writings appear to conform better with conventional understandings of what philosophy should look like as a genre and a linguistic idiom. By contrast, the works of Diderot tend to be studied only in literature or history departments. This is unfortunate, for the treatment of Diderot’s philosophie as something different from modern philosophy has cut contemporary philosophers off from the work of one of the most sophisticated, subtle, and complex philosophical thinkers of the eighteenth century.

To some extent, the way in which Diderot’s philosophical work employs different genres but also, challenges the idea of genre itself, has made it seem (perhaps too easily) congenial to a more “Continental” philosophical tradition, and foreign to a more formally oriented “analytic” tradition. But that would ignore Diderot’s naturalistic commitments and the role the Encyclopédie played, e.g., in the self-image of philosophers of science in the Vienna Circle. Our entry seeks to go beyond such oppositions in dealing with Diderot as a philosopher.

Neither perspective alone fully grasps the richness of Diderot’s contributions to modern philosophy, so in order to fully situate his philosophie within philosophy writ large, a flexible and reflexive attitude regarding his writings must be adopted. Every text in Diderot’s oeuvre needs to be treated as a participant in both his philosophie and his philosophical work, and our conventional understanding of the boundaries isolating art and literature from science and philosophy also needs to be suspended because very often these modern distinctions do not apply in Diderot’s case. He also manifests an awareness of the new and emergent disciplinary taxonomy arising at the time, targeting his philosophie on many occasions at an interrogation of these developing epistemological divisions. This reflexivity often makes his thought even more relevant today than it was when it was written.

To capture the complexity of Diderot’s philosophie as philosophy, this article adopts this reflexive approach. It will proceed in two parts. An overview of Diderot’s life and major texts is offered in Part I so as to present his work and writings as particular episodes in a coherent eighteenth-century life and career. To simplify the reading of this biography, the text is offered in a two-level presentation. A short overview of the highlights of Diderot’s life and work is offered in Section 1 to give readers a schematic overview, but a more extensive presentation of his biography is available in the Biographical Supplement. A comprehensive analysis of Diderot’s major philosophical preoccupations as revealed in his writings is then offered in Section 2 so as to outline the contours of Diderot’s place within Enlightenment philosophie and modern philosophy overall. This is followed by brief concluding remarks in Section 3.

1. Diderot’s Life and Major Writings

Diderot’s long, varied, and eventful life can be presented in four distinct phases:

  1. a period of maturation amidst struggle in the 1730s–40s as the impoverished young Diderot sought to establish himself as a writer in Old Regime Paris through the pursuit of the highly precarious vocation of writing and publishing;
  2. a period of intellectual ascent after 1749 as Diderot used the new financial stability and intellectual notoriety acquired by editing the Encyclopédie to build a base for his mature career as an Enlightenment writer, critic, and philosophe;;
  3. a period of intellectual celebrity as the new freedom brought about by the completion of the Encyclopédie in 1765 allowed Diderot to produce some of his most important, if often unpublished, work;
  4. a twilight period begun in 1773 after his financial burdens were fully eliminated through Empress Catherine the Great of Russia’s lucrative patronage, when Diderot brought to completion the wider philosophical program established earlier, with an additional dimension of political radicalism.

1.1 Years of Formation and Struggle (1713–1749)

Born to an artisan cutler in 1713 in Langres, a city 300 kilometers southeast of Paris, Diderot began his life with very little pointing him toward his future as a world-renowned writer and intellectual. His first steps were supported by a university education under the supervision of the Jesuits and training in scholastic philosophy and theology through the M.A. level.

Having moved to Paris as a teenager to pursue his studies, Diderot began to forge his career as a piece writer in the vibrant but economically constrained world of Parisian publishing. D’Alembert would later romanticize the life of the poor but fully independent writer as an ideal to which all honnêtes gens de lettres should aspire, and Diderot actually lived the impoverished bohemian writer’s life in the flesh. During the 1730s, he struggled continuously to eke out a minimal existence through occasional work with his pen, especially finding work as a translator, and his financial hardship was increased after his marriage in 1743 to an equally poor woman and the arrival of a daughter soon thereafter.

In the 1740s, poor and still marginal, Diderot began to build the career as a writer and intellectual that would make him famous. In 1742, he met the young Jean-Jacques Rousseau, a key moment in the genesis of the philosophe movement, which Rousseau immortalized for posterity in his Confessions. Etienne Bonnot de Condillac also joined their circle at this time. Diderot further began to write and publish his own books in this period, establishing his name and reputation as a philosophical author, one who was perennially associated with the most radical and controversial ideas.

Key works from this period include a very loose translation of Shaftesbury’s An Inquiry Concerning Virtue and Merit, in which Diderot turns moral sense theory into a kind of aesthetics of Nature; Pensées philosophiques, a work of provocative philosophical propositions concerning matter, motion, nature and science; La Promenade du sceptique, a philosophical dialogue which was written in this period but only published a century later; and Les Bijoux indiscrets, which is best described as philosophical pornography.

The climax of Diderot’s prolific decade occurred in 1749 with the publication of Lettre sur les aveugles à l’usage de ceux qui voient, one of Diderot’s masterpieces and arguably his most sophisticated and complex philosophical text after Le Rêve de D’Alembert and Le Neveu de Rameau. The Lettre, which presents itself as a series of reflections on the blind mathematician Nicholas Saunderson, is perhaps best described by Diderot biographer Arthur N. Wilson as “disarming” (1972: 97).

Diderot’s public intellectual acclaim increased with each of these books, and by the time of the Lettre sur les aveugles he had become famous enough for Voltaire himself, already the public face of radical philosophie, to write to Diderot praising his books. But the same acclaim that attracted Voltaire’s attention also rendered Diderot suspicious in the eyes of the French authorities. A police file with Diderot’s name on it was opened soon after the Pensées philosophiques appeared, and this work was ordered to be publicly burned in July 1746. By 1749, the evidence pointing to Diderot’s authorship of these subversive (potentially or explicitly atheistic) works was conclusive, and after the publication of the Lettre sur les aveugles an order was issued ordering Diderot’s incarceration in Vincennes prison. He was imprisoned for three months starting in July 1749, before being released the following November.

1.2 Ascendance as Writer and Philosophe through the Encyclopédie (1750–1765)

When Diderot was released from prison in November 1749, he was already at work on a new project, the one that would launch him to global intellectual fame.

Begun in 1745 as a project to publish a complete French translation of Ephraim Chambers’ 1728 Cyclopedia, or Universal Dictionary of Arts and Sciences, the Encyclopédie, arguably the single most transformative work of the French Enlightenment, had become by 1749 something entirely new. Breaking free of the translation agenda, a new work was imagined, to be edited by Diderot and D’Alembert, that would serve as the vehicle promoting the new philosophie.

In November 1750, Diderot released a “Prospectus” for the Encyclopédie, inviting readers to subscribe to a new multivolume compendium. In this preview, Diderot began to reveal his conception of what the Encyclopédie would become. No longer a translation of someone else’s book, and even less a staid compendium of already established learning, Diderot imagined the Encyclopédie as a dynamic site of living thought, an engine for changing, not codifying, existing knowledge. These ideas were further developed in Diderot’s article “Encyclopédie”, which was published in volume V of the work in 1755.

The middle of the eighteenth century has appeared to many as a watershed moment in French intellectual history. As a nineteenth-century commentator put it, after this date “writings hostile to religion appeared and multiplied, and a war broke out between skepticism and faith” (Wilson 1972: 94–95, quoting an editor of Barbier 1857: vol. 4, p. 378, fn. 1). Whatever the prior preparation, the launch of the Encyclopédie at precisely this moment fueled this dynamic, and it quickly provoked a war between its editors and the religious authorities in France. At the heart of the struggle were the Jesuits, especially Guillaume-François Berthier, who used the Jesuit journal to attack the new encyclopedia project and its editors. Diderot responded with pamphlets, and this sparring continued as the first two volumes of the Encyclopédie appeared in print.

The tension with French clerical authorities worsened when the abbé de Prades, a friend of Diderot’s and contributor to the Encyclopédie—he wrote the entry “Certitude”—successfully defended what was later deemed to be a theologically suspect doctoral thesis. The controversy led the crown to temporarily suspend the publication privilège for the Encyclopédie, but thanks to the favor that Diderot and his partners enjoyed in higher places, publication was resumed and Volumes II–VI appeared without pause between 1751–1756 even though accompanied by ongoing criticism from the Jesuits.

New controversies over the Encyclopédie occurred in 1757, although the return of unrest had little overtly to do with philosophie. The trigger was an attempt on King Louis XV’s life by a house servant named Damiens, who stabbed the king with a small penknife. The act of regicide itself was less significant for the Encyclopédie than the perceived motivation for the crime, for authorities began to link Damiens’s purported madness to the unchecked spread of subversive philosophie. Provoked by these public fears, French authorities issued new edicts cracking down on allegedly subversive books, and new works critical of the Encyclopédie also appeared, generating the idea of an “Encyclopedist party” organized for the purpose of attacking morality, religion and government. When Volume VII appeared soon after Damiens’s attack, the tinder was therefore set for a new eruption of controversy.

The controversy grew intense, leading D’Alembert to resign as editor, putting Diderot in sole control of the project. The final blow against the Encyclopédie occurred in July 1758 when Claude-Adrien Helvétius published On the Mind (De l’Esprit), one of the most overtly materialist and heterodox works of the French Enlightenment. Although Helvétius was not technically an encyclopédiste, he certainly moved in the same circles, and his work fit comfortably with the imaginary template of subversive materialist philosophie that crystallized after the Damiens Affair. Accordingly, as the officials in charge of securing public order, morality, and the book trade—the three were one in absolutist France—began to crack down on Helvétius and De l’Esprit, the Encyclopédie found itself pulled into the courts as a supposed accomplice aiding and abetting its crimes.

Thanks to a secretive ad hoc agreement, however, work on the final ten volumes of the Encyclopédie was allowed to continue, leading to the full publication of the work in 1765 with each of the volumes falsely indicating a publication in Neuchâtel as a way of complying with the royal ban. During the same years, the volumes of accompanying plates appeared since they were not subject to the ban, and by 1772 the final volumes of the plates were published to accompany the seventeen volumes of text that were already in print. With that the entire Encyclopédie was brought to completion.

1.3 The Years of Celebrity (1765–1773)

In 1765, after the final appearance of all text volumes of the Encyclopédie, Diderot experienced a kind of liberation as his life was freed from the work that had occupied most of his time and energy over the previous fifteen years. During the 1760s, Diderot continued to do what was necessary to see the Encyclopédie project completed, ultimately authoring nearly six thousand articles himself. But he was also gradually able to step back, retreating in some respects to the background of the philosophe movement. With this liberation, a highly productive period in his life began as new and original books began to flow from his pen.

Diderot’s earliest writings from this period, pursued while the Encyclopédie project was still ramping up to full speed, continued the philosophical and literary explorations initiated in the 1740s. Taken as a whole they reflect his lifelong preoccupation with questions of life, liberty, purpose, and order within an Epicurean cosmos that may not be governed by a providential creator, along with his continuing interest in the epistemological problem of discerning the nature and principles of such a world, especially as they related to the emerging biological sciences of the eighteenth century. Key works in this vein include Lettre sur les sourds et muets à l’usage de ceux qui entendent et qui parlent, a continuation of sorts to his Lettre sur les aveugles, and Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature, a work that retains the episodic, propositional structure of his Pensées philosophiques while expanding the explanations within each section.

Scholars have also suggested, though never proven definitively, that Diderot contributed during these years to Baron d’Holbach’s Système de la Nature, first published in 1770, a book that stands alongside Helvétius’ De l’Esprit as one of the great masterpieces of French Enlightenment materialist philosophy. Diderot was certainly at the center of the D’Holbach’s coterie, and if the dry and programmatic systematicity of D’Holbach’s book lacks the lively play of Diderot’s best philosophical writing, it is certain that he and the Baron were kindred spirits.

One of Diderot’s great masterpieces, written during these years but only published posthumously, should be included as a part of the natural-philosophical corpus summarized above, even if it engages with these seminal questions of metaphysics and natural philosophy in an overtly literary manner, drawing more on Enlightenment epistolary novels and theater for its construction than the classical philosophical genres of antique philosophy (although one should recall that Plato wrote dialogues).

Called Le Rêve de D’Alembert (D’Alembert’s Dream), the work is in fact a trilogy of dialogues whose centerpiece provides the title. This complex text reveals some of Diderot’s most important thinking about metaphysics as it relates to biology and the life sciences. Although it was never published in Diderot’s lifetime, it was nevertheless one of his favorite works, and he gave one copy to Catherine the Great as a gift, together, significantly in terms of his understanding of the work, with a set of “Fragments” that he presented as belonging to his physiological writings. The dialogues would certainly have been considered a subversive work had they been published when they were written, and whatever Diderot’s motivations in producing it as he did, the creative complexity converges into what is without question one of the great masterpieces of Enlightenment philosophie.

The same combination of literature and philosophy, textual play and reasoned argumentation present in Le Rêve de D’Alembert is also present in Diderot’s other seemingly literary and artistic writings, which also contain much serious science and philosophy.

One important cluster concerns the theory and practice of theater. Diderot wrote scripts for plays that were staged in Paris, including Le Fils naturel in 1757 and Le père de famille in 1758. These were moralizing melodramas advocating the ethical value of the conjugal family and the virtues of thrift, domestic love and piety. His plays are not major touchstones in the history of theater, but his meta-theoretical writings about theater itself, which provide many interesting points of departure for his philosophy, are important contributions to aesthetic theory. Diderot’s novels and other works of overt fiction also partake in the aesthetic explorations that mark his best work on the theater. In both, Diderot manifests an interest in the nature and limits of representation itself, and a self-aware consciousness regarding the tenuous interaction between language, experience, and their ability to merge (or not) into coherent representations. These are issues that are present in all of Diderot’s most sophisticated thought, including his more explicitly framed philosophy.

Diderot displayed the same philosophical-literary tendencies in his art criticism. His work in this area began in 1759 when the journalist F.M. Grimm invited Diderot to contribute to his monthly journal Correspondence Littéraire with reflections on the art displayed at the biennial Parisian art salon. Staged in the Louvre, these shows allowed painters and sculptors to showcase their work in a setting that gave a broad public audience access to the work of the best artists of the day. Others had written commentaries about the exhibitions before, but no one before Diderot had provided anything like the critical philosophical assessment of the art of the salons.

A new academically centered art theory had developed in the seventeenth century, and by 1700 it was joined by a new persona, the connoisseur, who was helping collectors to hone their judgment when separating truly great art from mere craft. The bi-annual Parisian salons had already become a site of Enlightenment aesthetics and connoisseurship by 1750, yet before Diderot no one had brought together the job of the connoisseur and the aesthetician with that of the public writer reflecting on art in relation to ordinary human experience. In his “Salons”, as they came to be called, Diderot brought all of these agendas together into one discursive program, inventing as a result a new identity: the art critic sustained through contemporary art criticism. The result was also a new and pioneering notion of philosophy of art.

Diderot’s art criticism explored exactly the same dynamics between form and content, author and interpreter, subject and object—in short, the very problem of artistic representation itself—that his theater, his fiction, and his philosophy explored as well. The result was a general understanding of aesthetics and its relationship to ethics that was integrally connected to his philosophy overall.

Diderot’s art criticism joined with his theater criticism, his prose and other theoretical writings in offering readers reflections on deep metaphysical and epistemological questions concerning the power and limits of representation. From this perspective, it is appropriate that arguably Diderot’s greatest and most influential text is at once a literary fiction, a semi-autobiographical psychological memoir, a theatrical send-up of Parisian society, an intimate portrait of contemporary social mores, and a highly original and complex study of the nature of human perception, being, and their interrelation.

Called Le Neveu de Rameau, the text ostensibly narrates Diderot’s meetings and conversation with the nephew of the French composer Jean-Philippe Rameau. Yet the dialogue unfolds through a back and forth between characters named “Moi” and “Lui”, or me and him, continually turning a discussion between two discrete subjects into an inner monologue of one subject dialoguing with himself. Indeed, as the exchange carries on, the two characters are revealed to be different sides of a deep existential dialectic. At this point the external reality of the characters begins to dissolve, and “Moi” and “Lui” start to become two competing principles within an intractable universal ethical and metaphysical struggle.

Diderot did not publish Le Neveu de Rameau in his lifetime, but the text found its way to Germany where it was read by Schiller and Goethe. Goethe’s German translation, published in 1805, was a major influence on Hegel: the Neveu is the only modern work explicitly cited in his 1807 Phenomenology of Spirit. Indeed, its influence on the formation of Hegel’s own dialectical understanding of metaphysics and the nature of being is patent, and a line connects Diderot and the Neveu with all subsequent metaphysical understandings of the self as a singularity caught in a constant struggle with universal forces pulling the unity of being apart.

1.4 Twilight Years (1773–1784)

Further helping Diderot after 1765 was the generosity of Catherine the Great of Russia, and his trip to her court in St. Petersburg in 1773 marks the passage of Diderot into the final stages of his career.

Catherine watched the development of the Encyclopédie project with great interest and expressed affection for French Enlightenment philosophie overall. Fate provided her with an occasion to express her appreciation directly to Diderot when a financial burden forced him to sell his library. Catherine made the purchase, giving Diderot an annual pension in addition. This made him a wealthy man for the rest of his life. Diderot traveled to St. Petersburg to meet with Catherine in 1773–74, and this trip marks his entrance into a leisured retirement in Paris where he continued to write.

Diderot’s last writings continued themes pursued throughout his life, but one new interest was history. His Essai sur les règnes de Claude et de Néron, which turned interest in ethics and morality toward questions of politics, justice, and history, was one result, as were his contributions to the final edition of the abbé Raynal’s massive, nineteen-volume global history entitled Histoire philosophique et politique des établissements et du commerce des Européens dans les deux Indes.

The latter was produced by Raynal in a manner similar to the Encyclopédie, with numerous authors contributing. The resulting work was a pioneering world history defined by its argument that the transformations triggered by the Colombian Encounter were the decisive agent of world historical development. Diderot’s contributions included explorations of the role of commerce, conceived as an autonomous natural-historical force, in the shaping of political and social change, a theme that connects Diderot’s writing with the new sciences of Enlightenment political economy. The Atlantic slave trade also attracted his attention, and some of his most passionate contributions involve imagined dialogues about the horrors of the European imperial slave system spoken by oppressed Africans. Raynal’s Histoire was a massive bestseller, translated into many languages, and it was a direct influence on Hegel, Marx, and through both on modern world history more generally. Diderot’s contribution to this influence was as important as any.

Diderot’s contributions to Raynal’s Histoire have been described as proto-anthropological, and another provocative work from these years, his Supplément au voyage de Bougainville, was similarly conceived and influential. The text offers an imagined dialogue between Tahitians and Europeans about the different sexual, marital and familial mores of the two cultures, and Diderot anticipates through fiction the figure of the native ethnographer who asks comparative questions about the foundations of morality and civilization so as to generate universal cultural understandings through comparison.

In these texts, and others from these years such as his Observations sur le “Nakaz”, a commentary on Catherine’s Enlightened reform program for Russia, Diderot appears in a newly radical political guise as an aggressive egalitarian and democrat who has little patience with traditional justifications for hierarchy and top-down distributions of power. He is also a passionate abolitionist with no tolerance for the crimes of the Atlantic slave trade. Nature does not work through hierarchy, Diderot insists in these texts, and connecting politics with his natural philosophy he argues for a radical decentralization of political authority, and a fully bottom-up, egalitarian understanding of social order. These convictions are also manifest in his thinking about race and slavery. He rejected altogether the new anthropology promulgated by Kant and others that spoke of biologically and civilizationally distinct races, offering instead a monogenetic understanding of humanity where difference was a matter of degree rather than kind. Diderot was by nature a writer and thinker, not a political activist, and his political philosophy, while suggestive of emerging radical political trends, appears as the least developed aspect of his thought.

When revolution erupted in France in 1789, the memory of Voltaire and Rousseau led to their inclusion in the pantheon of revolutionary heroes worthy of immortal commemoration. Diderot, by contrast, was at best forgotten and at worst treated as a figure hostile to the new political movements afoot.

This combination of neglect and outright hostility pushed Diderot to the margins of French culture in the nineteenth century, and it would take another century before retrospective interest in his work would be renewed. Too systematically committed to his materialism, too vigorous in his irreligion, and too passionate and principled in his embrace of egalitarianism and universal democracy to be acceptable to anyone with the slightest worry about the rising tides of radical socialism and materialist freethought, Diderot became a pariah for many in nineteenth-century France and Europe. Only after 1870 was interest in his work revived, thanks in part to the new editions of his writings, which made him newly available to scholars and readers, and to the changing cultural and political climate. Soviet Marxists, for example, played a key role in reviving Diderot scholarship after 1900, and contemporary Diderot studies, which is thriving today, is largely a twentieth-century creation. Literary scholars led the way in establishing the contemporary scholarship, but recently scholars attuned to the very different character of philosophy and science in the eighteenth century have begun to return to Diderot’s work, finding in it the complex and sophisticated thinking that was his hallmark.

Diderot is now actively studied by both literary scholars and intellectual historians alike, and there was even a movement afoot as recently as 2013 to enshrine Diderot alongside Rousseau, Voltaire, and Condorcet in the Panthéon of French national heroes. Headlines worrying about “un homme dangereux au Panthéon?” revealed the continuing influence of his alleged infamy, yet the twenty-first century may be the moment when Diderot is finally recognized as the important eighteenth-century philosopher that he was.

For a more complete biography of Diderot, see the Biographical Supplement.

2. Major Themes of Diderot’s Philosophy

There are different ways of dividing up Diderot’s intellectual career, some which emphasize pure philosophical commitments, others focusing on particular projects or strands of his thought, and still others giving pride of place to politics. Of course, all of them acknowledge the central place of the Encyclopédie, not just because it was an enormous editorial project spanning many of the “best” years of Diderot’s productive life, but because it marked the invention of a new model of knowledge, collaborative in the literal sense as a compendium of individually authored articles, but also in the sense of joining disciplines, including the “arts and crafts”, as newly equal purveyors of theoretical knowledge along with “first philosophy”. The Encyclopédie is also an important resource if one is looking for Diderot’s sources, as he authored many long entries on Epicureanism, Hobbes, Locke, Leibniz, or rather Leibnizianism, along with texts on eclecticism, skepticism and other doctrines which reveal both his involvement with such ideas and the way he transforms them.

2.1 Skepticism, eclecticism and language

Aside from the early translation projects discussed in Part I, Diderot’s first philosophical writings, such as the Pensées philosophiques (1746, expanded in 1762) and the Promenade du sceptique (1747), play a complicated rhetorical game with deism (rather than overt materialism), skepticism, and natural religion. In the Pensées, Diderot even toys with a “design argument” using the classic example of the complexity of a butterfly’s wing (§ XVIII), although he seems to retract this a few years later, in the Apologie de l’Abbé de Prades (1752), writing that “I thought the wing of a butterfly brought me closer to divinity than a volume of metaphysics” (DPV IV: 361, translations always ours unless otherwise indicated). Even if he is not yet a materialist in these works, Diderot does speak of the necessity to “widen” or “enlarge” God (Pensées philosophiques, § XXVI), a phrase which has fairly strong Spinozist and/or deist overtones.

By the time of the Lettre sur les aveugles (1749), Diderot has launched upon a philosophical project, or a set of intersecting projects, which will endure to the end of his life: a radicalization of empiricism in the direction of a materialist metaphysics, which also remains at times skeptical or at least anti-foundationalist with regard both to the possibility of an intellectual system, and to the existence of order or totality in the universe.

Yet if Diderot’s philosophy needs to be understood in terms of his lifelong project to develop and refine certain clear metaphysical and epistemological commitments and arguments, it also needs be to understood in terms of his avowed “eclecticism”, in particular his hostility to overly binary dogmatic thinking. This reflects his deep awareness of the complexities of language itself, especially the immanent tendency for speech to refute itself and subvert its stated convictions. Diderot’s passionate love for irony, satire, humor, and the play of language as both a critical and subversive force often served him as a vehicle for capturing the infinite complexities of being that transcend stable finite human understanding, which means we his writing should also be read with the same attention to its linguistic complexity that he had when writing it.

Although the link it is not often noted, it is useful in this context to remember that Diderot was among the generation of French philosophers that were directly influenced by Nicolas Malebranche, whose influence upon French philosophy in the years 1690–1730, the precise years of Diderot’s maturation as a thinker, was immense and insufficiently recognized. This influence was not rooted in Malebranche’s specific doctrines such as occasionalism, but in the model his philosophy offered of how empirical skepticism could be sustained together with scientific, and especially mathematical rationalism. Diderot’s own affection for mathematics was rooted in these Malebranchian currents of French thought, as were his strong convictions about the limits of mathematics as well.

Malebranche’s philosophy has aptly been described as “Hume, but with Christian faith” in the sense that like Hume he offers a massive skeptical critique of the capacity for humans to produce certain knowledge as a result of the epistemological inadequacy of their senses and higher cognitive faculties, but unlike him Malebranche nevertheless offers a path forward toward such knowledge through a Cartesian understanding of divine reason as accessible to humans through the proper practice of mathematical reasoning. In brief, to reason like God is to reason like an advanced mathematician, especially one trained in the new analytical mathematics of the period, and to the extent that this kind of reasoning is adaptable to human language itself, it allows for human thinking to connect with the divine order of things through a proper practice of rigorous cognitive and linguistic discipline. Anchoring this understanding for Malebranche was a Christian faith in a rationally created cosmos accessible to the human mind, and while later Malebranchians followed Hume in discarding this Christian foundation, many nevertheless absorbed Malebranche’s lessons regarding the power of a properly constituted language (his model was advanced analytical mathematics) to serve as a bridge connecting limited humans with the infinitude of being. Diderot’s partner D’Alembert represented the explicitly mathematical strand of this tradition of thinking, but Diderot embodied another strand, more attentive to language in all its variety as the link joining finite human understanding with the infinite complexities of nature. Although Diderot was suspicious of D’Alembert’s Malebranchian conception of mathematics as the foundational model for all of science, his own interests in the empirical natural sciences were still rooted in the same preoccupation with how nature represents itself and is represented by humans in scientific work. He was especially attentive to the crucial role that language plays in rendering experiential phenomena suitable for human knowledge, and if he was critical of the over-emphasis upon mathematics as the supreme model for a fully rigorous scientific language, he was nevertheless Malebranchian in treating the relation between experiential phenomena, linguistic description, and human knowledge in all its variety as the epistemological zone that mattered most.

Diderot’s eclecticism from this perspective was not simply a negative reaction against dogmatism, even if in his important Encyclopédie article “Éclectisme”, he opposes eclecticism to sectarianism. He also explicitly ties eclecticism to an attention to language and discursivity in philosophy. Founders of discursivity are eclectics, distinct from syncretists (Diderot mentions Luther and Bruno as examples). However, he fully disapproves of the Alexandrian school of eclectics, while attaching himself to modern eclecticism (including Campanella, Hobbes, and Bacon, but also Descartes, a reference that makes most sense if read through Malebranchian Cartesianism): “The eclectic does not randomly gather together truths, nor leave them in isolation; even less does she force them into some determinate plan” (Enc. V: 270). Diderot presents both Bacon and Descartes as eclectics, which we might actually think of as meaning “empiricists”, in the sense of placing experience and experiment at the center of knowledge-gathering practices. But we should also see this in terms of language, remembering the link between Montaigne and his project of representing natural experience through his new genre of the essay, and Bacon’s own attachments to empiricism, experimentalism, and the genre of the essay, along with other forms of representational writing, including fictional storytelling and the use of aphorisms alongside other more recognizable philosophical genres.

Diderot’s eclecticism and materialism nevertheless remain in tension, since eclecticism is not conducive to foundational ontological commitments, while materialism, whatever the specific matter theory it bases itself on, seems to be a paramount case of a foundationalist ontology. What is real is matter, or perhaps, what the sciences of matter declare to be real (and this can vary widely, from the chemistry of mixts which Diderot was so fascinated by [Pépin 2012], to the nascent biology he seems to be calling for in the Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature, as we discuss below, to physics). And yet, as a series of propositional pensées offered to readers without any interconnecting discursive bridge between themes, this text also propounds eclecticism methodologically, in contrast to a systematically presented set of premises, arguments and conclusions. This play between imaginative possibility and demonstrative certainty, and between what rationally must be and what language is capable of capturing and conveying in human terms is characteristic of Diderot’s thought overall, and his philosophy cannot be shorn of this conceptual linguistic instability without destroying its power.

In the next three sections, we discuss his empiricism, his materialism and what we term his philosophical anthropology, namely, his ideas concerning features specific to human beings, such as aesthetics and ethics, although as we discuss, these are also located within Diderot’s overall commitment to naturalism.

2.2 Radicalizing empiricism

2.2.1 Empiricism, from epistemology to ontology

Diderot is heavily influenced by Locke and in general by a kind of empiricism that was “in the air”: our knowledge about the world is derived, either fully or at least in large part, from our senses. In the Lettre sur les aveugles and its companion piece, the Lettre sur les sourds et muets, as well as later pieces such as the Rêve, Diderot turns the question of the senses and how we know the external world on its head: the senses possess or carry with them their own respective metaphysics. It is a powerful kind of relativism. And there is a new hierarchy in which touch is fundamental, in direct opposition to classical philosophical doctrines in which sight received that honour: throughout his work, but especially in these two essays devoted to the metaphysics of the senses and his various aesthetic writings, Diderot insists on the primacy of touch, which he also describes as “the most philosophical of senses”; he deplores the fact that “the hands are despised for their materialism” (LSM; DPV IV: 15, 54). This is even given atheist overtones in the Lettre sur les aveugles when the blind mathematician Saunderson on his deathbed declares that “if you wish me to believe in God, you will have to make me touch him” (DPV IV: 48).

Diderot expresses his materialism in this work through the character of a blind man, also because he is like a living counterexample to the argument from design. Indeed, Saunderson says to his interlocutor, who is defending physico-theological design and order: “What did we do to God, you and I, so that one of us possesses this organ (of sight), and the other of us is deprived of it?” (DPV IV: 63). In a further twist, Diderot also equates the blind man with idealist metaphysics since it is also cut off from direct sensory engagement with the world. Here, empiricism is no longer just a doctrine about the sources of knowledge, i.e., an epistemology. The world of a blind man is different from that of a deaf man, and so forth. Further, an individual who possessed a sense in addition to our five senses would find our ethical horizon quite imperfect (DPV IV: 27).

A similar displacement of the “scope” of empiricism occurs in the companion Lettre sur les sourds et muets, with a rather different version of Condillac’s thought experiment of the statue:

My idea would be to decompose a man, so to speak, and examine what he derives from each of the senses he possesses. I recall how I was once concerned with this sort of metaphysical anatomy, and had found that of all the senses, the eye was the most superficial, the ear the most proud, smell the most pleasurable, and taste the deepest, most philosophical sense. It would be a pleasant society, I think—one composed of five people, each of whom only possessed one sense. They would undoubtedly call each other mad, and I leave you to imagine how right they might be. Yet this is an image for what happens to everyone: one only has one sense and one judges on everything. (DPV IV: 140)

The senses here are treated as producing “worlds” in which we live, not as epistemological sources of knowledge, which was the strict issue raised by Molyneux’s Problem (if a person born blind, with an understanding of basic mathematics, recovered their sight and saw a cube, would they instantly know what it was?), a problem that goes through considerable reconfiguration with the character of Saunderson.

2.2.2 Empiricism and experimentalism

Empiricism is further transformed by Diderot in accordance with his project to transform knowledge by inscribing it in the sphere of practice and “arts and crafts”, especially with the Encyclopédie. He sometimes refers approvingly to the manual labourer (manouvrier)’s production of an artisanal knowledge, notably in his 1753 Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature (§ XXX), which not coincidentally sounds Baconian and Lockean. But more surprisingly, he also equates this transformed, even “enhanced” vision of empiricism with a metaphysics. That is, on the one hand he is an empiricist advocating the experimental sources of new knowledge, sometimes presented as “experimental philosophy”:

Experimental philosophy does not know what its work will yield or fail to yield; but it works without pause. On the contrary, rational philosophy weighs the possibilities, makes pronouncements, and stops there. It boldly declares, light cannot be decomposed; experimental philosophy listens, and remains silent for centuries; then suddenly shows us the prism, and declares, light is decomposed. (IN, § XXIII; DPV IX: 43–44; his emphasis)

We can also see this anti-foundationalist and experimentalist attitude as challenging Descartes’ “chains of reasons” which extend to all our knowledge of things; Diderot begins the above work by explaining that he will let his thoughts follow the order in which objects presented themselves to his reflection (§ I). Such a view is also resonant with what we might term Malebranche’s quasi-sensationalism, which locates scientific thinking in the reduction of our stream of sensate observations to the rationalizing logics of mathematical analysis, if we consider that, aside from the “occasionalism” which has dominated his Anglophone reception, much of Malebranche’s Recherche de la verité is about how our bodily passions and our sensations produce errors in us, which makes Malebranche a sensationalist in recognizing that conception of the human subject as the start for any epistemological project of knowing. Diderot, from the Lettre sur les aveugles on, is a dedicated empiricist and sensationalist, although he expands the remit of these philosophical programs far beyond “epistemology”.

But on the other hand, Diderot treats the idea of experimental philosophy rather playfully, both endorsing it and going beyond it in a more speculative direction, as when he mockingly refers to the mathematician’s self-confident rejection of metaphysics by writing, “the metaphysician … is someone who knows nothing”, and comments that

chemists, physicians, naturalists and all of those engaged in experimental practices (l’art expérimental) … seem to me to be on the point of avenging metaphysics, and applying the same definition to the mathematician (IN, § III; DPV IX: 29–30)

avenging metaphysics, in the sense of turning the charge of being overly speculative back at the scientists!

2.2.3 An experimental metaphysics

Sometimes the empiricist and the metaphysical tendencies are encapsulated in a single formulation, as in the “experimental metaphysics” in the Bijoux indiscrets, by which he means an experience-based metaphysics, building up from the fact that “all is experimental in us” (SA; DPV XVI: 87); this formulation does not mean that we are the result of an endless series of trial and error attempts, but that all results from experience.

In his Encyclopédie article “Métaphysique”, Diderot also opposes an abstract metaphysics of time, space and being to a practice-based metaphysics: he suggests that practitioners such as musicians and geometricians be asked about the “metaphysics of their art”, which will yield promising results, just as in the Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature he lauded the figure he described as the “manouvrier d’expérience”, a kind of artisan-experimenter whose practice has yielded, over years of experience, an artisanal knowledge.

Contrary to a now-common idea that the opposition between rationalism and empiricism should be replaced with a more historically legitimate opposition between experimental philosophy and speculative philosophy (Anstey 2005), Diderot’s case suggests a blend between empiricism cum experimentalism, and speculation. He is often confronted with the need to continue his analysis of phenomena beyond the limits of strict empiricism: the nature of matter, the limits of animation or on the more internal scale, the functioning of the nervous system or the mechanics of generation. And here the need for metaphysical imagination comes into play, which is not the same as a strictly abstract metaphysics. Once again, Diderot’s criticisms of mathematical abstraction in favor of the greater concreteness of the life sciences, which he shares with Buffon, can be adduced here.

2.3 Materialism, science and living matter

Diderot was not a physician like La Mettrie, or a “working natural historian” like Buffon, although at one point he wrote that, “It is very hard to do metaphysics or ethics well, without being an anatomist, a naturalist, a physiologist, and a physician” (RH; DPV XXIV: 555). Nevertheless, one of his first publications was the translation of James’ Medicinal Dictionary (1745), and in addition to his enormous activity as the chief editor of the Encyclopédie, which heavily features medical entries, sometimes with his editorial interventions, he was also a serious student of chemistry, including “vital chemistry” (Pépin 2012). Later in life he declared that “there were no books I read more willingly than medical books” (EP; DPV XVII: 510).

Given this background, Diderot’s interactions with the life sciences of his time can be understood, obviously, as the activity of an educated individual with a strong interest in the implications for philosophy of new scientific discoveries and conceptual schemas, whether from medicine, biology, or natural history. But his articulation of all of these in a materialist project does not belong to or open onto an episode amongst others in the history of science. That is, his articulation of a unique kind of philosophical materialism is indeed in “dialogue with” or “influenced by” the sciences of his time, particularly the life sciences (which included chemistry for Diderot), but it is also a speculative project; materialism in Diderot’s time, like in ours, was not a monolithic concept (Springborg and Wunderlich [eds] 2016).

2.3.1 Vital materialism as “modern Spinozism”

Diderot opposed the novelty and conceptual significance of the life sciences to what he (incorrectly) judged to be the historical stagnation of mathematics:

We are on the verge of a great revolution in the sciences. Given the taste people seem to have for morals, belles-lettres, the history of nature and experimental physics, I dare say that before a hundred years, there will not be more than three great geometricians remaining in Europe. The science will stop short where the Bernoullis, the Eulers, the Maupertuis, the Clairauts, the Fontaines and the D’Alemberts will have left it…. We will not go beyond. (IN, § IV; DPV IX: 30–31)

Similarly, in a letter to Voltaire five years later (February 19 1758), he wrote clearly that “The reign of mathematics has ended. Tastes have changed, in favor of natural history and letters”. Diderot is opposing the new “taste” and interest for a set of preoccupations including two forms of “life science” (natural history and “experimental physics”) to the traditional prestige of mathematical science. In these passages, he is also squarely locating his materialist preoccupations within the former.

Diderot’s natural philosophy is deeply and centrally “biologistic”. As it emerges in the mid-eighteenth century, at a time before the appearance of the term “biology” as a way of designating a unified science of life, his project is motivated by the desire both to understand the laws governing organic beings and to emphasize, more philosophically, the uniqueness of organic beings within the physical world as a whole. Consider a little-known aspect of Diderot’s articulation of his project: his statement in favour of biological epigenesis within his short entry “Spinosiste” in the Encyclopédie. The entry does not bear his name, but large parts of the content occur elsewhere in his writings, and it is included in all editions of his works. Here he grafts new biological ideas such as epigenesis onto a Spinozist substance metaphysics (Wolfe 2014a), distinguishing between “ancient” and “modern” Spinozists and emphasizing that the latter specifically hold that “matter is sensitive”, as demonstrated “by the development of the egg, an inert body which by means of heat alone moves to the state of a sensing, living being”. For modern Spinozists, “only matter exists, and that it is sufficient to explain everything. For the rest, they follow ancient Spinozism in all of its consequences” (Enc. XV: 474).

Diderot is rather unexpectedly combining Spinoza’s metaphysics of substance with a new theory of biological development, epigenesis, according to which the embryo grows by the successive addition of layers of purely material substance. Why call the latter view “modern Spinozism”? The “ancient Spinozists” are substance monists and metaphysicians, while their modern descendants are also committed to biological epigenesis, and assert that matter is fundamentally living matter. Is this Spinozism or not? What possible relation could there be between Spinozism and epigenesis? Or how can a metaphysics of substance and modes, which says almost nothing about biological entities even if it is also a major statement of philosophical naturalism, also be a fashionable embryological theory of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries? In fact, very few commentators have asked why Diderot gives such an idiosyncratic definition of “modern Spinozism”.

To be sure, his convictions regarding living matter (or all of matter inasmuch as it is potentially living and sensing) are tied to his admiration for the metaphysics of a single substance composed of an infinite number of modes. As he states in the Rêve de D’Alembert, “There is only one substance in the universe” (DPV XVII, 107; Wartofsky 1952/1979, Deprun 1986, Bourdin 2008). But nowhere does Spinoza seek to connect his metaphysics to the life sciences; even if the notion of the conatus was frequently taken up in the generations after him to mean something like a survival impulse in living beings, this was not what he meant at all. Diderot is grafting “vitalist” elements onto a substance metaphysics, or at least, he is connecting an apparently empirical account of the self-organisation of matter with a new metaphysics. Epigenesis is not just one biological theory among others here, but rather, part of a revised metaphysics of matter, which Diderot presents in more overtly ideological terms in the Rêve:

Do you see this egg? With this you can overthrow all the schools of theology, all the churches of the world. What is this egg? An unsensing mass, prior to the introduction of the seed [germe]; and after the seed has been introduced, what is it then? Still an unsensing mass, for the seed itself is merely an inert, crude fluid. How will this mass develop into a different [level of] organisation, to sensitivity and life? By means of heat. And what will produce the heat? Motion. (DPV XVII, 103–104)

Matter for Diderot is self-organizing and endowed with vital properties. This implies that his brand of materialism is not synonymous with physicalism (admittedly, not a term or notion of the period). There were of course materialists such as Hobbes who can also be described as physicalists, but Diderot was quite explicitly a determinist, as we will discuss below (in section 2.4). This leads to two rather original consequences, which we examine in the following sections: Diderot’s metaphysics of vital matter is not strictly experimentally based, it is also speculative; and his is a specifically embodied materialism.

2.3.2 Matter theory and living matter

In the very first paragraph of Le Rêve de D’Alembert, the character D’Alembert, who is a partisan of substance dualism and is challenging the character Diderot—a materialist—to account for the existence of consciousness and thought, introduces the problem of sensibility (sensibilité, better translated “sensitivity”) as a property. Referring to a discussion that seems to have occurred before the text begins, he declares to Diderot, “this sensitivity … if it is a general and essential quality of matter, then stones must sense” (DPV XVII, 90). Diderot states, revises, emends and restates this materialism of living, sensing matter in a variety of works, both in the Rêve and in his more “empirically” oriented writings such as the Principes philosophiques sur la matière et le mouvement and the Eléments de physiologie.

Later, building on an explicitly chemical matter theory, Diderot will describe nature as perpetually “in action and reaction; everything being destroyed in one form and recomposed in another; sublimations, dissolutions and combinations of all kinds”, in the “general movement or rather fermentation of the universe” (PPMM; DPV XVII: 17–18). This short piece of “philosophy of physics” includes a polemic aimed at all those who define matter as inert and homogeneous (latter-day Cartesians). Diderot wants to establish in contrast that motion is inherent in matter by joining together translation and nisus. Indeed, matter possesses properties including sensitivity.

The key property of living matter, and of all matter potentially, is organic sensitivity. Diderot often suggests that “sensitivity or touch is common to all beings”, and he often attributes sensitivity to matter as a whole (EP; DPV XVII: 308). In “Leibnizianisme”, he brings together Aristotle’s entelechy, Leibniz’s monads, and sensitivity as a “general property of matter” (Enc. IX: 371); indeed, Leibnizian metaphysics and theories of generation had a great impact on eighteenth-century thought, and has been viewed as major influences in the formulation of Diderot’s materialism, albeit in naturalized form, e.g: “the monad, the real atom of nature, the true element of things” (Enc. IX: 374a). Elsewhere, such as the 1765 Letter to Duclos, Diderot denies that sensitivity can be a property of a molecule, specifically because it can only be a property of matter itself. He then complicates the issue further by introducing a distinction between “inert” sensitivity and “active” sensitivity.

Nevertheless, Diderot’s matter theory is very much one of a living, sensing, self-transforming matter, sometimes specified in chemical terms:

You can practice geometry and metaphysics as much as you like; but I, who am a physicist and a chemist, who take bodies in nature and not in my mind, I see them as existing, various, bearing properties and actions, as agitated in the universe as they are in the laboratory where if a spark is in the proximity of three combined molecules of saltpeter, carbon and sulfur, a necessary explosion will ensue. (PPMM; DPV XVII: 34)

The critique of mathematical abstraction in favor of a more empirically rich matter theory, whether this is presented as deriving from natural history, chemistry, medicine, physiology or other disciplines, is also a constant in Diderot. The point we would emphasize most, however, is that this is also a speculative metaphysics. The shift from inert to active sensitivity is not experimentally grounded. That Diderot’s materialism was not strictly an outgrowth of empiricism, and/or experimentally based, as one might expect given the usually close relation between scientific practice and materialist philosophy, is also apparent in the dimensions he sometimes is willing to allow to his cosmogony of universally living matter.

On one occasion, he wrote to Sophie Volland describing how such ideas led him to be teased, but he pushes them even further in the letter, in the direction of a materialist account of love. The result is not so much a reductionist explanation of the phenomenon of love as a romanticization of materialism itself:

The rest of the evening was spent teasing me about my paradox. People gave me beautiful pears that were alive, grapes that could think. And I said: Those who loved each other during their lives and arrange to be buried next to one another are maybe not as mad as one thinks. Their ashes may be pressed together, mingling, uniting. What do I know? Maybe they have not lost all feeling, all memory of their prior state. Maybe they have a remainder of heat and life, which they enjoy in their own fashion, at the bottom of the cold urn in which they rest. We judge the life of elements by the life of crude aggregates. Maybe they are entirely different entities…. When the polyp is divided into a hundred thousand parts, the primitive, generational animal is no longer, but all of its principles are still alive. O my Sophie, I then still have a hope of touching, sensing, loving, seeking you, uniting and melding with you, when we are no longer. If there were a law of affinity amidst our principles, if we were entitled to compose a common being; if, in following centuries, I were to comprise a whole again with you; if the molecules of your dissolved lover were to stir, to move about, and search out yours, scattered throughout nature! Grant me this chimaera. It is sweet to me. It would ensure my eternity in you and with you …. (letter of 15 October 1759, translation C. Wolfe)

This image of a kind of eternity in which “loving molecules” gradually return to one another, impelled by a residual consciousness of the love present in their “parent bodies”, resonates with the powerful rendition he gives in the first dialogue of the Rêve of the thought experiment of the statue. Recall that the character D’Alembert had challenged the character Diderot to show that matter could think, and the latter had retorted that if he could show that matter could sense the solution would be found. The character Diderot then proposed a thought experiment of a marble statue, ground into powder, mixed into the earth, out of which plants grow that are eaten by animals who are in turn eaten by us. He calls this process the “animalization” of matter. Thus framed, the difference between a piece of marble and a sensing, conscious creature is only a difference in the temporal stages of a portion of matter in transformation. Unlike Condillac’s statue, Diderot’s is no longer a strictly epistemological account of the genesis of our knowledge (and self-consciousness) through the accumulation of intermodal sensory information. Instead, it is an assertion of the animalization of inert matter, such that all matter is either actually or potentially alive.

2.3.3 Body and embodiment

But what of actual bodies in this universe of living matter? Diderot’s notion of body is quite different from, say, that of Descartes and Hobbes. “As a physicist”, Diderot writes, “one should never say the body qua body, because this is no longer physics, it is making abstractions which lead to nothing” (PPMM; DPV XVII: 16). As he wrote to Sophie Volland, “Have you ever thought seriously about what it is to live? … Life is not just motion, it is something else” (letter of 15 October 1759). Indeed, he may quite fairly be described as a theorist of embodiment.

His materialist notion of embodiment means that Diderot does not oppose the living body as a kind of subjectivity to the world of matter overall. As is particularly apparent with Saunderson in the Lettre sur les aveugles and the account of the nervous system in the Rêve de D’Alembert, Diderot “pit[s] the unity of sensibility against a Cartesian unity of subjectivity” (Gaukroger 2010: 416). However, this emphasis on embodiment is neither a “top-down”, emergent view of life (even if “life is not just motion”), nor an antireductionist position (contrast Kaitaro 1997). For Diderot, emphasis on the features of the living body and a deflationary and/or reductionist attitude go hand in hand. “The action of the soul on the body is the action of one part of the body on another”, he writes, “and the action of the body on the soul is again that of one part of the body on another” (EP; DPV XVII: 334–335). This was certainly reductionist in the eyes of defenders of an immortal and/or immaterial soul, but it is not per se eliminativist inasmuch as Diderot is saying that “mental processes” (if we take the language of “soul” here to be psychological language) are bodily processes, not that they are illusory or otherwise unreal. Similarly, commenting on the Dutch scientist Franz Hemsterhuis’ manuscript, he notes: “wherever I read soul I replace it with man or animal” (DPV XXIV: 340). This is a venerable trait of materialisms going back at least as far as Lucretius, and Diderot does not necessarily deploy this tradition to deny the existence of the soul, but rather to challenge the “animist” or the “idealist” claim “to explain anything without the body” (EP; DPV XVII: 334). Even more interestingly, this shift can also be seen in broader terms as a shift within reductionist strategies, which we can also classify as types of reduction.

One strategy for the early modern materialist was to deny the existence of a “higher-level” entity such as the soul (or free will, or thinking, etc.) in favor of a hypothetical “basic physics” or the properties of matter in general. Thus La Mettrie wrote, in his 1748 L’Homme-Machine, that

The soul is just a pointless term of which we have no idea and which a good mind should only use to refer to that part of us which thinks. Given the slightest principle of movement, animate bodies will have everything they need to move, feel, think, repent and in a word, behave in the physical realm as well as the moral realm which depends on it. (La Mettrie 1987, vol. I: 98)

In contrast, another strategy is to construe “soul” in functional terms, as not conflicting in any way with a basic materialist ontology, if it is not a substance of its own. Thus the materialist could be less overtly confrontational towards the concept of soul. For instance, because it has been naturalised, the soul can be treated, as La Mettrie suggests, as “but a principle of motion or a material and sensible part of the brain” (La Mettrie 1987, vol. I: 105). Here, as in Diderot, the status of the soul is displaced away from metaphysics towards the particular physiological site of the brain. Diderot’s Eléments de physiologie, as well as his supplementary remarks in the article “Âme”, stress both the complexity of the brain for any reductionist materialist project, and the “displacement” of the soul therein. The concept of the body which is at work in these materialist texts is, if not “ensouled”, certainly animated and vitalised, as in this remark of Diderot’s:

Whatever idea we initially have of [the soul], it is necessarily a mobile, extended, sensitive and composite entity. It grows tired just like the body, it rests like the body, it loses its control over the body just as the body loses its control over the soul…. Is the soul gay, sad, angry, tender, shy, lustful? It is nothing without the body. (EP; DPV XVII: 334)

He also presents the brain as the source of our identity, or of what it is for me to be me, although he sometimes thinks it is the whole organism which composes our individuality. He recognizes the brain as a very particular kind of organ, one in need of special attention, and, rather unusually for the period, he seems to call attention to its plasticity in a discussion of memory:

The soft substance of the brain [is] a mass of sensitive and living wax, which can take on all sorts of shapes, losing none of those it received, and ceaselessly receiving new ones which it retains. There is the book. But where is the reader? The reader is the book itself. For it is a sensing, living, speaking book, which communicates by means of sounds and gestures the order of its sensations. (DPV XVII: 470)

Diderot had been discussing several extremely lyrical cases of recalling landscapes both in nature and in painting, and then almost abruptly turns to cerebral-material explanations of such phenomena. What is unusual about this in the history of philosophical and early neurophysiological discussions of the brain is Diderot’s striking image of the brain as a book which reads itself, and the embodied brain-reader as self-organizing (Wolfe 2016b).

Even if Diderot’s conception of body and brain indicate that he is not treating them in terms of basic physics alone, he holds the existence of causal relations to be fundamental; as he writes, “‘Every cause is an effect’ seems axiomatic to me” (DPV XXIV: 309). Without this foundationally construed sense of causality, Nature would constantly be taking leaps, which he thinks is a mistaken vision of things. In other words, he is committed to a form of determinism.

2.4 Determinism and change

All forms of materialism are deterministic, but in different ways. Nothing compels the materialist to accept that the body and the passions are deterministic just like a simple machine. Unsurprisingly, a lot depends on how causes are understood, and how much weight they are meant to bear in both an ontology and an account of action (see entry on causal determinism). Thus it is quite possible to hold, like Helvétius, d’Holbach or Hobbes, that there is a fixed, stable and predictable relation between our sensory input, our mental life and consequently our “temper” and our actions. “As a being that is organized so as to think and to feel”, D’Holbach explained, “you must feel pleasure or pain; you must love or hate in accordance with the way your organs are affected by the causes surrounding you or within you” (D’Holbach 1770/1781: I.i [1990: 18]).

But the organismic elements in Diderot’s materialism and vision of the body lead him to challenge Helvétius’ program of reform, which asserts, on the basis of an empiricist and specifically sensationalist epistemology, that human beings really are fully modifiable “blank slates”, modifiable in terms of what we call stimuli and responses. Interestingly, it is by denying this “full modifiability” that Diderot can defend a certain notion of individuality. The fact that individuals differ from each other at the level of their organisation grants them a degree of self-determination. “Every day, I see men who prefer to die rather than to correct themselves” (DPV XVIII: 344). That is, what Diderot calls “modifiability”, which might better be termed “corrigibility”, has limits, and these limits do not just reflect some kind of blunt innatism (whether of genetic heritage or of character), but rather a degree of individuality, including at the level of agency. Biologically, Diderot often stressed the enormous variation of traits such as intelligence from one individual to another, noting that the difference between an “idiot” and a “genius” hinges on tiny shifts in “brain fibers”. There is more difference, he insists, between one individual and another in terms of intelligence than between a human being and an animal (DPV XXIV: 299). But there is no sharp divide between the biological and the personal, for Diderot.

Helvétius had described to Diderot how severely he was punished for De l’Esprit, with the consequence that he would “rather die than write another line again”. Diderot responds with a long tale about two cats he saw from his window, who fell from a roof. One died from the fall, but the other got up, bruised and bloodied, and said to himself,

I would rather die than ever climb on the roof again. What am I looking for up there? A mouse that is not worth the tasty morsel I could get from my mistress, or steal from the cook …

However, as soon as the cat feels better, he climbs back up on the roof again (RH; DPV XXIV: 542–543). Just like the cat is determined by his own constitution and drives, similarly, Helvétius has no choice but to go on writing.

Diderot’s determinism is also his way of extending core empiricist tenets such as nihil est in intellectu quod non fuerit in sensu (there is nothing in the mind that was not first in our sense), which acquires a determinist dimension: “there is only one operation in man, sensing. This operation is … never free” (OH; DPV XXIV: 300; cf. PC; DPV XX: 85) and

perception comes from sensation; from perception, we get reflection, meditation and judgment. There is nothing free in intellectual operations, or in sensation. (EP; DPV XVII: 335)

There is also a tension in Diderot’s approach to determinism between his acceptance of physicalism (“there is only one kind of cause … physical causes”: to Landois, DPV IX: 258) and causal closure (“the physical world and the moral world are one and the same”: PC; DPV XX: 53), and his insistence that agency, which for him covers the action of complex organisms overall and is not restricted to humans or even higher mammals, requires another, specific kind of causality: “I am a man, and I require causes proper to man” (RH; DPV XXIV: 523). Diderot is not defending free will or an unchallenged space of agency, yet there is a kind of residual anthropocentrism in some of his arguments, presented in the language of unified causality. As he explains:

Without regard for the sum of elements of which I am composed, I am one, and a cause only has one effect. I have always been one single cause [une cause une], thus I have never had more than one effect to produce; my duration is thus nothing more than a succession of necessary effects.

Diderot is neither asserting total interconnection (as in Laplacian determinism) nor defending the existence of freedom to act as “indifference” or “agent causation”, but an intermediate view (once known as the Hume-Mill thesis) according to which what it is to be “me” is to be a particular causal nexus.In that sense, I cannot “do otherwise than myself” or “be anyone other than myself” (JLF; DPV XXIII: 190, 28; on Diderot on individuality and selfhood, see Thiel 2015, Wolfe 2015).

However, in good Lucretian fashion, this unified causal loop we call “ourself” or “myself” is itself subject to what Diderot terms “vicissitude”, a term that connotes change and flux in this context.

In one and the same man, everything is in perpetual vicissitude… It is only by means of memory that we are the same individual to others and to ourselves. At my age, there may not be a single molecule in my body that I brought into the world at my birth; (DPD; DPV X: 423)

everything changes, everything passes … only the Whole remains. (RA; DPV XVII: 128)

Diderot wrote that

fruits, vegetables and animals are in perpetual vicissitude as regards their qualities, forms and constituents; an ancient from four thousand years ago or better, our nephews in ten thousand years will most likely recognize none of the fruits we have today;


we must be extremely careful in our judgments of the ancient historians and naturalists regarding the forms, virtues and other qualities of beings which are in perpetual alteration. (“Acmella”, Enc. I: 460a)

The instability in this continual movement between seemingly free and willful individuality and collective, biological/metaphysical determinism also sits at the heart of the perpetual dialectic between “Moi”and “Lui” in Le Neveu de Rameau.

Further, this emphasis on mutability, change and “vicissitudes” including at a specifically biological level can sound evolutionary to a post-Darwinian reader, and for Diderot, “to be born, to live, to die is merely to change forms” (RA; DPV XVII: 139), in the “ever-changing” “overall order of nature”: “Everything is in in fluxu et eterno et perpetuo et necessario” (OH; DPV XXIV: 317). He also explicitly uses the Lucretian phrase Rerum novus nascitur ordo. Should these passages be understood as anticipations of evolutionary science? In fact, contrary to a widespread tendency in older scholarship, it is mistaken to consider Diderot as either a predecessor or a speculative exponent of evolutionary doctrines. That he was an earnest disciple of Lucretius, fascinated with monsters and with the transience and mutability of the physical (particularly the living) universe overall, does not make him a “forerunner of Darwin”.

On the biological side, his fascination with monsters also feeds into his philosophy of nature overall. “On the entire surface of the earth”, he writes,

there is not a single man who is normally constituted or perfectly healthy. The human species is just a mass of more or less counterfeit, more or less sick individuals … What I say of man applies just as well to animals, plants or minerals. (EP; DPV XVII: 515)

This explains why, as he had written earlier,

the dissection of a monster … is more useful to the historian of nature [i.e., the experimental life scientist or biologist in modern parlance] than the study of one hundred individuals who resemble each other. (“Encyclopédie”; DPV VII: 242)

2.5 Diderot’s philosophical anthropology

2.5.1 Aesthetics

Diderot was a thoroughgoing naturalist and empirical scientist, but this did not mean that he neglected the aesthetic dimension of human knowing, or the artifice of representation itself that makes possible language, communication, and human knowledge. In his Encyclopédie entry on cabinets of natural history and their philosophical implications (“Cabinets d’histoire naturelle”), he reflects explicitly on the challenge for our finite intellects to seek to know infinite Nature as a whole, and recommends the construction of artificial environments such as these cabinets in order to study “parts of Nature”. At times, his vision of aesthetics is simply a kind of extension of his naturalism into other domains, arguing like Spinoza that our subjective notions of beauty and ugliness have no place in nature properly understood (in the article “Laideur”; also Salon de 1763; DPV XIII: 373–374), and argues for a naturalist poetics (“Encyclopédie”; DPV VII: 234). Yet he also held that aesthetics should not be reduced to crudely naturalistic concepts, reflecting at length on the subjective issues of aesthetic perception and judgment and the role of performance, including that found in visual art, literature, theater, and scientific experiments, in the production of perceived truths.

With respect to the ostensibly subjective side of human knowing, he invested considerable energy in articulating a concept of “perception of relations” (perception des rapports) which functions both as a theory of judgment (explaining why it is that we find certain kinds of symmetry and proportion pleasing) and a theory of cognitive functioning at a more basic level, one characterized by psychoneural relations, as it were. Countering that subjective emphasis, however, Diderot also warned against the “surfeit” of organic sensitivity as a source of hyper-reactivity, and of sensory stimulus as a ground for perception without any internal unifying principle. These reflections are also found in the character Bordeu in the Rêve who serves to ground the perceptions and queries from Mlle de Lespinasse regarding the ravings of the dreaming D’Alembert in a clear objective ground. Diderot describes the overly sensitive actor in the Paradoxe sur le comédien as suffering from a “weakness in their constitution”, and speaks ironically about the welter of emotions (“des sensibilités diverses”) on stage being incapable of forming a unified whole.

2.5.2 Philosophy of language and representation

Unifying these two aspects was the eclectic Malebranchian emphasis upon language as the bridge between the finite and the infinite, the material and immaterial, the human knower and nature as a whole. In his aesthetics, Diderot is continually preoccupied with the power of art to capture and represent natural experience and its limitation in the face of the infinitude, and often unrepresentable complexity, of life. In meta-works of what might be called his philosophy of theater such as Discours de la poésie dramatique and Paradoxe sur le comédien, and in his dialogue where he conversed out loud with his readers about the theatrical logic underlying his play Le Fils naturel, Diderot also pursued such themes by subjecting the “reality effect” of theatrical art to a systematic interrogation so as to unearth the rational structures of theater as a representative art form.

Diderot reflected famously and influentially on what he called the “fourth wall of the theatre”, that imaginary barrier that separates an audience from the three dimensions of the stage it faces. This is a barrier that for Diderot acts either as conscious division dividing the actors and the drama from its viewer (theatre as a consciously artificial way of representing and knowing) or as an invisible screen through which the two join together into the joint experience of the theatrical moment (theater as a staged naturalism). While still important in theatre theory today—Richard Sennett interprets Diderot as “the first great theorist of acting as a secular activity” and as the innovator who creates a theory of drama “divorced from ritual”—Diderot’s writings on theatre also offer yet another example of his wider metaphysical and physiological understanding of human beings and their embodied interrelation. They also highlight the role of language throughout his philosophy as a tangible yet permeable and sometimes fragile tether joining humans and their knowing together.

In a manner similar to his “philosophy of theatre”, Diderot’s art criticism is also very often a study of the continually recurring interplay between sensible human subjectivity and the natural world through the perceived empirical reality of natural representation. What happens when a viewer stands in front of a painting and experiences its imagery? In particular, what is the relationship between the reality of the viewer in the Louvre in the salon gallery in front of the paintings on display and the reality of the world represented by the image? What is it that happens exactly as we move between these two worlds and realities? And given the presence of both a painting and its artist at the center of this exchange, what is the role played by the painter, his material medium, his craft in manipulating matter into representations, and the viewing subject who both receives this artistic work in her own senses and then recreates it in her imagination in the making of a “natural experience”?

To combine all these dimensions into a coherent concept of art, as Diderot did in his art criticism, was to produce a general aesthetics exploring the capacity for human representations to render experience truthful and meaningful. Here, Diderot also explored the power and limitations of such practices as a form of human experience. In this way, the problem of viewing art and speaking about the experience of viewing art, or the question of judging artists that stage this experience, is akin to the problem of viewing and speaking about nature itself, and of judging the nature of the presentations put before us. Diderot’s “promenade Vernet” in the Salon de 1767 is something of a locus classicus for these investigations with its extended reflection on the presence of the viewer in front of a Vernet landscape painting and the being of that viewer in the natural world that the painting represents as well. His work in natural philosophy and the life sciences often manifests a similar subject-object preoccupation as well, and in this respect Diderot’s aesthetics and his natural philosophy have much in common.

The same combination is present in Diderot’s literary fiction as well in his continual, and often critical, exploration of the empirical reality of linguistic representation, and our capacities and limitations for experiencing and knowing the world through such representations. Jacques le fataliste, for example, is a kind of anti-novel that thwarts the arrival of naturalized realism and credible illusion at every turn even as it narrates a bawdy and frolicking story. Characters break with the scenes and dialogue of the story to talk directly to the reader, and the narrator himself is a self-conscious character in the work who often finds himself in a struggle with the fictions he is supposedly controlling and representing for his readers.

Le Rêve de D’Alembert is also concerned with the relation between author, textual characters, and the naturalistic and rational representation of thought in language and text, as is Le Neveu de Rameau, but while these dialogues organize the play between their various registers in a way that produces constructive philosophical investigation, Jacques le fataliste operates deconstructively, subverting the basic coherence of the novel as a form by repeating paragraphs verbatim on multiple pages and by intentionally distorting the book’s narrative coherence and flow. One entire page of the book is printed in complete black, for example, to call attention to the print characters that make all reading and linguistic communication possible. Diderot’s story Ceci n’est pas un conte also operates in this subversive and deconstructive way by prefiguring Magritte’s famous conundrum regarding the image of a pipe through a self-destructive recursion of a story that uses storytelling to deny the possibility of storytelling even as it narrates a story.

2.5.3 Ethics

One striking feature of Diderot’s moral thought is his self-described failure to write a work of moral philosophy. While Diderot wanted to write such a work in order to refute La Mettrian immoralism, especially its particularly bracing form of hedonism coupled with its cynical social theory, he ultimately did not succeed in this ambition. He interestingly described his failure, or rather reluctance, to write a work of ethics as stemming from his recognition that,

if I do not emerge victorious from this attempt, I shall become the apologist of wickedness, I will have betrayed the cause of virtue, and encouraged man towards vice. (RH: DPV XXIV: 589)

Diderot had no desire to use his writings to ensure “the immortality of the evildoer” (ibid.; ERCN II, 6; DPV XXV: 246–247), and at the same time he also considered normative moral philosophy to be a failure, a view he shared with such virtuous individuals as Locke. (In response to his friend Lady Peterborough’s request for advice on how to morally educate her son, Lord Morduant, Locke recommended, in a 1697 letter, that he should read Livy (for history), along with geography and the study of morality. But, he explained, “I mean not the ethics of the schools”, but rather Tully (i.e., Cicero), Pufendorf, Aristotle and “above all the New Testament”, wherein “a man may learn how to live which is the business of ethics, and not how to define and distinguish and dispute about the names of virtue and vice” (King 1829: 5–6). This is not a ringing endorsement of academic moral philosophy, and Locke reiterates this view in his Thoughts Concerning Education, § 185 and the Reasonableness of Christianity, §§ 241–242.)

Another crucial feature of Diderot’s ethics was his dislike for relativism or at least for some of its possible consequences. Diderot learned a great deal from Locke, Montaigne and other paragons of early Western cultural relativism. Montaigne and Locke paid close attention to the case of cannibals; Locke, when he takes up the case of cannibals in the Essay, uses it to support anti-innatist views with respect to what he calls “practical principles” (that is, moral principles of conduct): he points out that the Tupinamba tribe in the Amazon considers that a high form of virtue is eating one’s enemies, along with many other examples of “enormities practised without remorse”, in order to stress that “moral rules” are not innate but culturally specific and learned (Locke 1690 [1975: I.iii.9]). The challenge is not to morals per se but to “mores” and customs which we take to encapsulate morality. Diderot echoes these ideas notably in his Supplément au voyage de Bougainville, but contrary to widespread views, he did not think that such relativism had to entail libertinage, criticizing Hemsterhuis for reasoning “as if libertinage was a necessary consequence of materialism, which seems to me to match neither reason nor experience” (OH; DPV XXIV: 251). Unlike La Mettrie (and the Marquis de Sade after him), Diderot maintained a strongly social concept of self. “He who has studied himself”, he wrote, “will have advanced in the knowledge of others, given, I think, that there is no virtue which is foreign to the wicked, nor vice foreign to the good” (ERCN; DPV XXV: 226).While he did not develop a full-fledged theory of sympathy like Hume or Smith, Diderot was nevertheless acutely conscious of the role of the passions in cementing the social bond, and how this role should be promoted in any viable ethical theory.

Nevertheless, his hostility to immoralist versions of materialism did not mean that he reneged on his overall naturalism, since his account of our behavior, and of good and evil, also seeks to tie it to our physiological constitution (our organisation, in his terms).

Ethics is confined to the borders of a species … What is a species? A mass of individuals sharing a similar constitution. What, is this constitution the basis of ethics?… I believe so. (SA; DPV XVI: 206)

It is perhaps too naturalistic an ethics for some since “there is no rational goodness or wickedness, although there may be animal goodness or wickedness” (“Droit naturel”, Enc. V: 155b). By this Diderot means that we do not act in accordance with purely transcendent or immaterial principles in mind, but that we are determined by motives, affects, desires, instincts and so on. Yet at the same time, as we also saw regarding determinism, Diderot is concerned not only with the universe in its entirety but with specifically human chains of causal influence as well. “What is a human being?” he asks. “An animal? Undoubtedly, but dogs are animals too; so are wolves. Yet humans are neither wolves nor dogs” (SA; DPV XVI: 205).

Diderot explicitly eschews the natural ties that many see tying a materialist conception of human being directly and naturally with libertinism, hedonism, and a purely self-interested and solipsistic conception of morality. This stance was reinforced in other ways by his counter-conception of natural morality, an ethics which he often celebrated in his writings about aesthetic representation and its value. At the center of the naturalism that Diderot claimed for this ethics was an implicit set of claims about experience, feeling, and action in human life. The natural principles of sensibility spoke directly to humans about the division between virtue and vice, or so Diderot believed, and while the virtuous individual was the one who submitted to the natural passions inherent in us pushing us toward camaraderie and filial love, the vicious soul was a willful and arrogant rebel who chases selfish desire and self-gratification against the grain of what is naturally good and true.

This metaphysical and physiological understanding of morality was central to Diderot’s politics as well, and with respect to theater it led him to theorize the mechanisms by which human performance and theatrical display both supported and corrupted the pursuit of virtue. Rousseau, with similar ethical orientations, condemned theater outright as a false and corrupting medium, arguing that natural religion and virtue could only be practiced in a natural, i.e., non-artificial or non-theatrical way. Diderot’s view was much more complicated. While he recognized the corrupting power of artistic representation to deceive, he also recognized its power to provoke and sustain natural experiences that promoted moral virtue. His impassioned speeches written for imagined Africans oppressed by European slavery, which he included in his contributions to Raynal’s Histoire des deux Indes, illustrate well the fusion of theater and politics characteristic of Diderot. In these moments, Diderot used the full power of theatrical language and artificial representation to present an unequivocal statement about moral and political righteousness, one designed to move people to progressive and virtuous political action. Rousseau’s prize essay discourses produced in the 1750s were also influential upon Diderot in shaping his views, for like Rousseau Diderot developed an ideal of natural, egalitarian, communitarian virtue, which he found most fully developed in simple, rustic people who lived modestly and in close relation to their natural surroundings. Diderot also developed a countervailing conception of vice that was directly connected to wealth, especially wealth attached to elite privilege, and a morality that encouraged people to embrace basic organic foundations for life and to turn away from urban lives of selfishness and hedonism. The same morality infused his political economic writings as well, both in his celebration of the communitarian power of commerce to unite people into virtuous and prosperous polities, and in his critique of greed and commercial excess as a cause for social violence and political injustice.

2.5.4 “Man and world”

At the level of aesthetics, ethics or ontology itself, Diderot is a materialist concerned with utility, praxis, transformation and yes, agency (up to a point). Some commentators in earlier generations thought this spelled contradiction and the lack of any cogent philosophical position. More recently, it has been recognized that Diderot was precisely reflecting on this tension between the cosmos and time-scales stretching millions of years, and his love for Sophie Volland, or his desire to see goodness rewarded and wickedness punished. Indeed, he sometimes offers at least partial solutions to this old aporia. If it is true, on the one hand, that

The universe only presents to us particular beings, infinite in number, with hardly any fixed or determinate division. None can be termed the first or the last; everything is linked therein, and follows what came before by imperceptible nuances. In this immense uniformity of objects, if some appear which, like the tips of rocks, seem to pierce through the surface and dominate it, they only owe this prerogative to particular systems, vague conventions, and foreign events, not to the physical arrangement of beings and the intention of Nature (“Encyclopédie”, Enc. V: 641b)

so that there is no place for the human observer in this desolate landscape, it is also true, on the other hand, that the only thing that makes the existence of the spectacle of Nature interesting is the human presence itself:

One consideration above all must not be lost sight of, and that is that if man or the thinking, contemplating being is banished from the surface of the earth, this moving and sublime spectacle of nature becomes nothing but a sad and mute scene…. Everything changes into a vast solitude where unobserved phenomena occur in a manner dark and mute. (Enc. V: 641c)

Instead of losing himself in reveries about the poetics of ruins and our transitory existence on the face of the earth, however, Diderot instantly asserts the pragmatic, “constructivist” and artificialist conclusion: since “It is the presence of man that makes the existence of beings interesting”, “Why not make man the center of our work?” The anthropocentrism here is of course not one which appeals to a human essence, or special dignity including some purported superiority we might possess over animals. It is rather a pragmatic position according to which schemes like the Encyclopédie, but also the arts, sciences and technological pursuits narrated in that work, serve to make that “landscape” meaningful.

3. Conclusion

For Diderot, there is only one substance and it is material. Here, he is loosely aligned with Spinoza. But this substance is in perpetual flux (a more Lucretian element in his thought), so that the individual beings we encounter are merely temporary, provisional clusters of molecules in interaction with one another, in the midst of what he terms the general “vicissitude” of the cosmos (by which he means its change). In the entry “Immuable” (“Immutable”) he writes that “Nature is in a state of perpetual vicissitude. It follows from the general law of all bodies: either they are in motion, or they tend to be in motion” (Enc. VIII: 577).

Borrowing a Heraclitean motif and adding a now rather dated gender inflection, Diderot also describes Nature as a woman who enjoys disguises (IN, § XII, doubtless alluding to Heraclitus’ phusis kruptesthai philei, “Nature likes to hide”, frag. 208). This is also why there are no monsters in any real sense:

I speak of monstrosity relative to what they are at present, for there are no monsters relative to the whole …. If everything is in fluxu, which we can hardly doubt, all beings are monstrous, that is, more or less incompatible with their corresponding order. (OH; DPV XXIV: 317, 403)

The matter of which we, as well as all other entities in the universe, are composed, is heterogeneous: differing in terms of energy and sensitivity, and in perpetually evolving relation to the Whole:

The world is ceaselessly beginning and ending; it is at every moment at the beginning and at the end; it never had, and never will have any other. In this vast ocean of matter, not one molecule resembles another, not one molecule is self-identical for one moment. (RA; DPV XVII: 128)

That is, Nature is both fundamentally heterogeneous (the atoms which compose the natural world exist in a state of heterogeneity and agitation) and never entirely “specific”:

each thing is more or less specific (quelconque), more or less earth, more or less water, more or less air, more or less fire; more or less belonging to one kingdom or another … hence there is no essence of a particular being. (RA; DPV XVII: 138)

All beings

have an infinite number of relations to one another, according to the qualities they have in common; … it is a certain assemblage of qualities which characterizes them and distinguishes them (BI; DPV III: 183)

In this ever-changing Whole, there are provisional constructs and entities that are, like everything else, wholly material, but can be of greater or lesser significance to us, whether this is “cashed out” aesthetically, emotionally, ethico-politically or even in terms of nerve impulses (and Diderot, most of the time, is not wont to distinguish sharply between these).

Diderot invented a new form of materialism, drawing on a variety of sources including the Epicurean tradition, Hobbes and Locke, Spinoza and Leibniz. He also transformed doctrines, genres and nascent intellectual constellations (skepticism, the philosophical novel, and eclecticism, to name some instances). Even if he did not wish to contribute to the genre of systematic philosophy, his contribution to the Enlightenment (and its posterity) and to subsequent intellectual episodes is considerable, difficult to measure, and should be engaged with.


Primary Sources

Diderot’s Works

  • [DPV] Œuvres complètes, Herbert Dieckmann, Jacques Proust, and Jean Varloot (eds.), 33 volumes planned, 25 done; Paris: Hermann, 1975–.
  • Correspondance, G. Roth (ed.), 9 vols. Paris: Éditions de Minuit, 1955–1970.
  • [Enc.] Encyclopédie des arts et des métiers, 35 vols., with J. D’Alembert (eds.), Paris: Briasson, 1751–1780. Reprint, Stuttgart/Bad Cannstatt: Frommann, 1966. Different online versions exist, from Lexilogos to the more official ARTFL project and the new ENCRRE project.

Chronology of Writings

  • 1744, translation of Temple Stanyan, Histoire de Grèce
  • 1744–1748, translation of Robert James, Dictionnaire universel de médecine (in 6 volumes)
  • 1745, translation and commentary on Shaftesbury, Essai sur le mérite et la vertu
  • 1746, Pensées philosophiques (Additions written 1762, published 1770)
  • 1747, Promenade du sceptique
  • 1748, Mémoires de mathématiques (including on acoustics)
  • [BI] –––, Les Bijoux indiscrets
  • 1749, Lettre sur les aveugles
  • [LSM] 1750, Lettre sur les sourds et les muets (revised and published 1751)
  • –––, “Prospectus” of the Encyclopédie
  • 1751, Encyclopédie begins to appear (35 vols., 1751–1780)
  • –––, article “Âme” (additions by Diderot)
  • 1752, Suite de l’Apologie de l’Abbé de Prades
  • [IN] 1753, Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature / De l’interprétation de la nature; new edition in 1754
  • 1755, articles “Droit naturel”, “Encyclopédie”, “Epicurisme”
  • 1756, Letter to Landois (on determinism)
  • 1757(–1760), Cours de chimie de Mr Rouelle (Diderot’s notes from the three years he attended Rouelle’s chemistry lectures at the Jardin du Roi)
  • 1758, Sur “De l’Esprit” d’Helvétius
  • [DPD] –––, Discours de la poésie dramatique
  • 1759, Letter to Sophie Volland (on materialism, generation and love)
  • 1760, La Religieuse
  • 1761, first draft of the Neveu de Rameau
  • 1762, “Lui et Moi” (short story, embryo of Neveu de Rameau)
  • 1763, Salon de 1763
  • [EP] 1765?, Diderot begins the Eléments de physiologie (apparently unfinished, revised as late as 1780)
  • 1765, articles including “Hobbisme”, “Leibnizianisme”, “Locke” and “Spinosiste” in the volumes of the Encyclopédie that appeared all together in this year
  • 1766, Diderot begins work on the Histoire des deux Indes (pub. 1770)
  • –––, Essais sur la peinture
  • 1767, second draft of the Neveu de Rameau
  • [SA] –––, Salon de 1767 (including the “promenade Vernet”)
  • 1768, probable collaboration on a translation of Lucretius’ De rerum natura (by Lagrange, which Diderot later disavowed)
  • [RA] 1769, Le Rêve de D’Alembert
  • [PC] –––, Paradoxe sur le comédien
  • [PPMM] 1770, Principes philosophiques sur la matière et le mouvement; Additions aux Pensées philosophiques
  • –––, Diderot/Raynal, Histoire philosophique et politique des Deux Indes
  • [JLF] 1771, Diderot begins to write Jacques le fataliste (–1778)
  • 1772, two editions of Diderot’s works appear in Amsterdam (one containing Morelly’s Code de la Nature)
  • 1773–1774, Neveu de Rameau (final version)
  • [RH] –––, Réfutation d’Helvétius (revised 1774, 1775)
  • [OH] –––, Observations sur Hemsterhuis
  • –––, Mémoires pour Catherine II
  • 1774, Dialogues & Fragments (between the Rêve and the Éléments de physiologie: see DPV XVII)
  • [ERCN] 1778, Essai sur les règnes de Claude et de Néron (revised 1782)
  • 1784, Naigeon, Mémoires sur la vie et les ouvrages de Diderot (1784–1795)

Other Primary Sources

  • Barbier, Edmond Jean François, 1857, Chronique de la régence et du règne de Louis XV (1718–1763), ou Journal de Barbier, 8 volumes, Paris: Charpentier, 1857.
  • Buffon, Georges-Louis Leclerc, Comte de, 1749–1788, Histoire naturelle, générale et particulière, 36 vols. Paris: Imprimerie Royale.
  • Condillac, Étienne Bonnot de, 1947–1951, Œuvres philosophiques, G. Le Roy (ed.), 3 volumes, Paris: PUF.
  • Goethe, Johan Wolfgang von, 1799, Diderots Versuch über die Mahlerei, in Sämtliche Werke, vol. 10, Kunstschriften II, hrsg. von M. Hecker, Leipzig: Insel-Verlag, 1925.
  • Helvétius, Claude-Arien, 1758 [1988], De l’Esprit, Jacques Moutaux (ed.), (Corpus des Œuvres de philosophie en langue française), Paris: Fayard, 1988.
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Biographies and bibliographical studies of Diderot

  • Adams, David, 2000, Bibliographie des œuvres de Diderot, Ferney-Voltaire: Centre international d’Études du XVIIIe siècle.
  • Korolev, Serguei V., 2014, La Bibliothèque de Diderot, vers une reconstitution, Ferney-Voltaire: Centre international d’Études du XVIIIe siècle.
  • Spear, Frederick A., 1980–1988, Bibliographie de Diderot, 2 vols. Geneva: Droz.
  • Stenger, Gerhardt, 2013, Diderot. Le combattant de la liberté, Paris: Perrin.
  • Trousson, Raymond, 2007, Diderot, (Folio Biographies), Paris: Gallimard.
  • Venturi, Franco, 1939, Giovinezza di Diderot, 1713-1753, unpublished in the original Italian until 1988, Palermo: Sellerio. Translated 1939 to French as La jeunesse de Diderot (de 1713 à 1753), Juliette Bertrand (trans.), Paris: Skira; reprint, Geneva: Slatkine, 1976.
  • Wilson, Arthur M., 1972, Diderot, two volumes, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • The journal Recherches sur Diderot et l’Encyclopédie is dedicated to Diderot and the Encyclopédie, as its name indicates.

Other Internet Resources


The authors wish to thank Daniel Brewer, Andrew Curran, Kate Tunstall, and John Zammito for their helpful comments and criticisms.

Copyright © 2019 by
Charles T. Wolfe <>
J.B. Shank

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