Disability and Health Care Rationing

First published Fri Jan 29, 2016

In the 1990s philosophers, in particular bioethicists, debated the broad question of the justice of health care resource allocation, and in particular the ethical pros and cons of the dominant rationing strategy based on cost effectiveness analysis (CEA) with benefit characterized in terms of “quality of life”. A dominant theme in this literature was whether a pre-existing health state, or resulting health outcome, should be taken into account when allocating health resources. More specifically, the debate centered on whether a person’s disability should be taken into account, or whether doing so would be discriminatory or unfair. As Dan Brock explained it, this concern was raised because of the confluence of two events—the then recent (1990) passage of the Americans with Disabilities Act (ADA), prohibiting discrimination on the basis of disability, and the 1992 Oregon Medicaid proposal for rationing services, which used both CEA and a quality of life outcome measure to prioritize treatments for persons with specific health conditions and which arguably systematically disadvantaged people with pre-existing disabilities (Brock 1995, 1999, 2004).

The ethics of health care allocation or rationing raises a raft of issues that are not directly dependent on the potential discriminatory impact on persons with disabilities. Yet, since it is difficult to clearly separate the general ethical issues from those raised by the focus on disability, we begin in Section 1 by surveying, first, general ethical concerns in health care rationing, and then the specific issues raised by CEA and quality of life as a metric of the “benefit” that health care resources provide. We then turn in Section 2 to review why it has been argued that disability poses a special set of ethical issues in health care rationing. The ethical issues of health resource rationing (or “prioritization” as it is sometimes called) can be exemplified either at the individual level of specific allocation decisions “at the bedside”, or more generally as a social policy of health care rationing. The ethical issues at the individual level are reviewed in Section 2, and social policy issues are considered in Section 3, including whether it makes any difference if access to health care is viewed as a human right. We conclude in Section 4 with the unsatisfactory result that we remain in a dilemma: refusing to consider disability in health care allocation seems irrational and unfair, but taking disability into account raises a range of, apparently, irresolvable philosophical issues.

1. The Ethics of Health Care Rationing

1.1 Rationing health resources

What are the principal ethical concerns involved in how we allocate scarce medical resources to people who can benefit from them? Health care resources (broadly construed to include treatments or interventions, medications, medical and rehabilitative devices, health care services and service providers, health care systems, clinics and other settings, and so on) are by their nature scarce resources. They are scarce both as a consequence of societal, macro-allocative decisions about how much social resources are put into health care (rather than, say, into education, scientific research or fighting foreign wars), and because some of these resources, such as transplantable organs, are intrinsically scarce.

Scarcity entails that health resource demands will always overwhelm supply, which in turn entails that some method of constrained allocation must take place. Rationing is the generic name for this and it comes in many forms: implicit or explicit, case-by-case or systematic, rational and fair or the opposite, overt, transparent and professionally-sanctioned, or hidden, unexamined and rationalized as something other than rationing. The key point is that rationing is unavoidable and always occurs. As health economists insist, since rationing of health care resources is inevitable, best it be open, transparently justified and understandable, based on good evidence and argument (Ubel 2000). The ethicist agrees, but adds the consideration of fairness.

A persuasive criterion of rationality in rationing is efficiency: since supply is not infinite we must ensure that every allocated resource is used to achieve the maximum benefit it can provide. While in some domains the nature of a “benefit” is controversial, here it is obvious: health resources produce health benefits, either incremental improvements in health or the prevention of worsening health and premature death. Understanding death (or premature death) as the worst health outcome, life-saving or life-prolonging is (usually) a clear health benefit. But so is improving bodily functioning, mitigating or ameliorating functional problems or preventing functional decline. Although death is not preventable, disease, injuries, and other challenges to an individual’s health can either be prevented or their impact lessened, either indefinitely or for some period of time. Health outcomes, in short, are either quantitative (number of years lost to a health challenge) or qualitative (extent of functioning lost).

If we define a “health need” as any decrement in health (either years to live or a less-than-optimal level of bodily functioning), health resource efficiency is a matter of using health resources to minimize ill-health in a manner that does not waste health care resources. In the case of a single individual, there is no issue: give the person the resources he or she actually requires and nothing more. But resource allocation is only an issue when there is more than one claimant to the same, scarce, resource. Resource allocation is a problem of fairness across populations. This leads us to the question of distributional fairness where, as we shall see below, there are various competing options besides CEA. At first glance, however, the general efficiency requirement that scarce health resources be used to maximize benefit or minimize need seems strongly intuitive.

The intuitive plausibility of the efficiency requirement is the motivation for the rationing strategy based on cost-effectiveness analysis (CEA). The health resource is a cost, the health improvement a benefit, and intuitively we should try to get as much benefit from the cost as possible. Alternatively put, CEA mandates that the lower the cost per unit of health improvement the more effective the use of the associated health resource. Although this strategy can in principle be applied to health resource usage at the individual level, CEA, reflecting its intellectual heritage as a form of utilitarianism, is standardly viewed as a societal strategy in which costs and benefits are aggregated over the population.

In practice, though, cost-effectiveness analysis in health care allocation faces a substantial methodological hurdle: there is a vast array of incommensurable health improvements—lowering pain levels in arthritis, improving muscle strength or respiration efficiency, controlling high blood pressure, adding a year to life, postponing the onset of dementia. Since CEA requires health improvements to be comparable between individuals and across the population, an underlying health improvement metric—what statisticians call a “latent trait”—needs to be identified that is (at least) ordinal and comparable, if not precisely measurable. We need to identify, in short, what every health improvement shares in common. That is the measure of a health improvement, and the benefit that factors into the CEA calculation.

The most commonly used metric is called “quality of life”—every health improvement, whatever else it accomplishes, incrementally improves the individual’s quality of life. Given that a health improvement is potentially either quantitative or qualitative (extending life or improving life), it is necessary to bring these two facets into a single measure (called, generically, a summary health measure). A common way of doing this is in terms of the econometric concept of quality-adjusted life year or QALY. Every health improvement produces a health state with an expected longevity (the number of years left to live) and level of functioning (the quality of living in that health state). These can be metrically joined into a single score by using the common metric of years lives and discounting the value of a year lived in a particular health state by the quality of life value of living in that state. If full health is represented by the value of 1, death by 0, then the quality of life values of all possible states of health a human can experience can be assigned a number between 1 and 0, and that number determines the quality of life impact of the health state on a person, in terms of some proportion of a full life year. The values for each state can be generated by a population ranking exercise (as was done in the Oregon example), by expert consensus, or by means of a variety of econometric “preference elicitation techniques” such as “standard gamble”, “willingness to pay” or “person trade off” (see Nord 1999 for the details of these techniques in the health domain).

Although the most commonly used in health resource prioritization, the QALY is not the only health benefit summary measure. The disability-adjusted life year or DALY operates similarly to the QALY, although conversely in terms of the burden of living with a disability, measured in life-years (see Murray 1996). Here 0 is again death and 1 full health and a DALY score measures a health state as a function of life-years lost to disability. To compare the two measures, if the quality-adjusted factor associated with a health state like spinal cord injury (SCI) is 0.4, then the quality of each year of life post-injury is 0.4 of a year lived in full health. If one is expected to live another 30 years, then the overall QALY is 12 years. DALYs work the same way, only in reverse: the person with the SCI would have the overall life burden of 0.6 times 30 years or 18 disability-adjusted life years. (There are other differences between the two measures that are more technical in nature and can be ignored in this discussion.)

While QALYs are most commonly used as measure of the benefit from health resources for CEA in health allocation strategies (e.g., UK’s National Institute for Health and Care Excellence (NICE) uses QALYs for quality of care determinations), DALYs have been extensively used by the World Health Organization and the World Bank—and the Institute of Health Metrics and Evaluation in Seattle, Washington—to determine the population burden of disease and injuries, primarily for public health applications, including especially national priority setting (Jamison et al. 2006, updated in Das & Samarasekera 2012).

The natural home of the CEA approach to allocation is at the institutional or meso-allocative level where decisions are made far from the individual bedside and are hidden from view in the form of hospital reimbursement policies and clinical guidelines. At the highest policy level of macro-allocation where overall national health budgets are developed, only the most technocratic of societies would have an explicit prioritization strategy based on CEA. In most democratic societies, health care budgets are determined by a complex interplay of politics and bureaucratic pressures. These forces tend to allocate more resources to urban areas, focus on curative rather than preventive services, and cater to special constituencies or those with the more highly paid lobbyists: all of which is demonstrably inefficient. Worse yet, in many countries, health care resource macro-allocation is governed by ability to pay, which is the most straightforwardly inefficient (not to say inequitable) allocation strategy there is.

At the level of meso-allocation—the distribution of health care resources across a single institution, such as a hospital or clinic—much of what is called “rationing at the bedside” is disguised as standard clinical practice (Ubel 2000). If a physician—whether motivated by pressures from hospital administrators, managed care organization or insurance company, or merely excising her or his professional expertise—decides to forego live-saving treatment for a patient on the grounds that the health benefits would not warrant the use of the resource, then the judgment clearly reflects, rough and ready, intuitive application of CEA. Or if a treatment is not provided because it is judged “medically futile”, that judgment is in effect a cost-benefit analysis. Treatments are said to be “futile” when in the physician’s judgment the expected health benefits do not sufficiently outweigh the costs of providing the care (Crossley 1995; Batavia 2002). Similarly, “Do Not Resuscitate” or DNR orders, while they may be equally motivated by futility or even compassion, are essentially CEA rationing techniques, although here the judgment is that the resource would have no benefit at all.

1.2 Ethical concerns with CEA and QALYs as a prioritization strategy

At least as compared to pure politics or the “free market”, using CEA with a metric such as QALY for rationing the use of health resources has the strongest claim to rationality. But what of its ethical acceptability? Even strong advocates of using CEA to ration health resources acknowledge that it suffers from at least five fundamental (and interconnected) ethical concerns. Some of these concerns only make sense at the population level of meso-allocations, but all affect, directly or indirectly, allocation decisions at the individual level (Daniels 1993, 1994, 1998; Brock 1995, 1998; Brock & Wikler 2006).

1.2.1 The aggregation problem

To calculate the effectiveness of care resource utilization at the population level requires both resource costs and quality of life benefits to be aggregated in terms of the expected number of uses of each resource. A low-cost and low-benefit, but widely used resource will tend to rank as more efficient than a high-cost and high-benefit, but rarely used resource. This can lead to counter-intuitive results. For example, when the Oregon government tried to put into place a plan to lower Medicaid costs using CEA and QALY they began by identifying treatment/condition pairs—that is, types of treatments provided to patients with different kinds of health conditions—and from these created a rationing priority list in terms of expected QALY benefits from treatment. One of the consequences of the plan was that the treatment of capping teeth was far higher on the priority list than appendectomy, even though no one would die from uncapped teeth while untreated appendicitis could be lethal. The reason was obvious: you could pay for many hundred instances of teeth capping for the price of a single appendectomy, and adding up all of the small but non-zero QALY benefits from the capping would trump the QALY benefits of the appendectomy. This result was widely viewed as profoundly counterintuitive (although some argued that our intuitions are not always as clearly opposed to favoring aggregated benefits [Kamm 1993; Nord 1999]).

1.2.2 The priority problem

One of the apparent ethical advantages of CEA is its commitment to equality and impartiality: everyone’s health needs are considered equally, irrespective of race, gender, or income level. But as the aggregation problem suggests, we intuitively believe that saving a person’s life is ethically more important than improving their appearance. More generally, it is an open ethical question whether we should skew our distribution of health resources towards those who are worst off or whose health needs are more significant or urgent; and if we do so, it is not clear how much extra weight these considerations should have in our assessment. An additional open question, to which we will return below, is whether the “worst off” should be defined in terms of health state or some other disadvantage as well. One version of the underlying intuition at work here is the often cited “rule of rescue”: since saving a life is arguably of infinite or at least indefinite benefit, we should always rank allocations that save a life the highest. For example, if a community spends a substantial part of its yearly health care budget on rescuing a small child who has fallen down a well, this is ethically justifiable, according to the rule of rescue, although patently inefficient (see the debates in Hadorn 1992; Jonson 1986; Cookson & Dolan 1999: Nord 1999; and Ubel 2000).

The priority problem need not be characterized in terms of who is worst off so much as who most deserves the resource. For example, should it matter, all things being equal, whether a resource is provided to an elderly person who will not benefit as much from the resource as a younger person? In general, should the age of the recipient matter? CEA tends to favor highly efficient resource users, who will normally be younger, and some non-utilitarian philosophers have argued that as long as we ensure everyone a normal lifespan—or “fair innings” as Williams (1997) calls it—then ranking older recipients lower is not unfair. Alternatively, it has been strongly argued that, benefit notwithstanding, people who live unhealthy lives and are responsible for their health needs should be downgraded or lose their priority (Moss & Siegler 1991; Wikler 2002; Cappelen & Norheim 2006). (Although the examples used for this argument tend to be drug addicts, smokers, drinkers, and other discreditable risk takers, the argument, if successful, would also apply to athletes and heroes who risk their lives.)

1.2.3 The democracy problem

The Oregon prioritization scheme based its QALY evaluations on a general resident’s survey in order, it was claimed, to capture “community values”. But why should these values determine which treatments are funded, since (as was demonstrable in the actual rankings that resulted) these values may reflect cultural or racial biases or just profound misunderstandings about health problems and what it is like to live with a disability (Asch 2001; Doyal 1998)? On the other hand, it is the public who pays for these health resources so why should some group of elites, however knowledgeable, pre-empt majoritarian decisions (Brock 2002)?

1.2.4 The indirect benefits problem

Since CEA weighs benefits against costs, it is natural to ask whether benefits should be restricted to health benefits alone, or should include other, more indirect benefits such as the economic benefit to the individual from returning to work or the financial benefits to employers from reducing lost work time due to employee illness (Brock 2003). Economists would favor the broader conception of benefit since it provides a better calculation of the societal value of a health care prioritization scheme. More finely-gained benefit assessment would also allow us to make more ethically sensitive judgments about where money should be spent: e.g., it would be ethically justifiable to favor the health of mothers of children who need their care. On the other side, not only is it extremely difficult to quantify these benefits, it has also been argued that it is unfair to prioritize health care resources to favor patients whose improved health has greater indirect benefits to themselves or society since that is to treat people and their health as means to social ends. Economic or other benefits and health improvements are in “separate spheres” and merging them will make our health prioritization strategy both ethically compromised, and practically unworkable (Brock 2003).

1.2.5 The fair chances vs. best outcomes problem

The final concern is actually at the heart of all of the above concerns since it points to the underlying ethical tension between aggregate goodness and fairness—between the utilitarian approach of CEA and the deontological or egalitarian concern for fairness. The aptly named “fair chances” approach is grounded on our basic intuition that people deserve equal concern and respect, and so an equal chance at benefiting from an allocation scheme. If two people need a heart transplant to live, and one will live twenty more years with the new heart but the other only two years, is it really fair to use CEA and give the heart to the first? Is that truly giving both people an equal or fair chance to the health resource? Or again, if two people need a surgery to repair a torn cartilage in their knees, and one of these also has serious asthma, is it fair to prioritize the surgery to the first because the overall QALYs benefit of the person with asthma is lower?

On the other side, the egalitarian “fair chances” approach can hardly be the whole story since the only allocation strategy that fits a purely egalitarian approach is random allocation or a lottery. A lottery is vaguely fair when the two potential beneficiaries incur the same costs and benefits, but not when the benefits accrued from a resource are hugely different, or when other considerations, such as urgency, enter into the calculation. Some egalitarians have backtracked from pure randomness of a lottery (so that the asthmatic in the above example would have a somewhat lower chance of being successful—see Brock 1988; Broome 1988, 2004). Others have argued that considerations like urgency, the level of overall health need, or age should affect the proportional chances of success (Kamm 1993). Yet others have insisted that the asthmatic has already lost the “natural lottery” by having a serious health condition, so there is no need to run another lottery (Menzel 1989). These attempts aside, the lottery approach is not greatly favored, except as a last resort.

1.3 Current state of debate on health resource prioritization

The philosophical debate on health resource prioritization has been somewhat muted in recent years. A fragile truce has been reached in which it is admitted that we cannot accept either a purely utilitarian CEA approach unalloyed with considerations of fairness, or a purely egalitarian lottery approach unaffected by intuitions concerning the significance of ineffective use of valuable resources. In part this is because of an intractable dilemma that dominates the rationing debate, which we will describe more specifically for the case of disability in the next section. We seem to be stuck between two extremes: allocate in terms of a “neutral” consideration such as “first come first serve” or pure lottery, or open the door to an unlimited number of potentially ethically relevant considerations that, together, make the allocation decision overwhelming difficult and cumbersome. The first option seems irrational, the second impractical.

Another reason for the stalemate is the aggregation problem as applied to the “benefit” side of the CEA calculation. Some have argued that we should abandon the QALY and DALY, summary health measure technology entirely (Anand & Wailoo 2000), while most agree with Dan Brock that health care prioritization without any reference to quality of life is a non-starter (Brock 1995). There have been some attempts at finding a workable multi-criteria approach in which health benefits are disaggregated into separate components (Baltussen & Niessen 2006), but such suggestions open the door to the so-called “indexing problem” (discussed later in the context of disability) of trying to sum up disparate and incommensurable benefits (income, happiness, social productivity, creativity) in a way that would allow us to compare two health outcomes. Attempts at direct head-to-head comparisons between health outcomes require the dubious methodological assumption that health is unidimensional: walking out of the hospital with one surviving hand is obviously better than with none; but is being left partially sighted better, or worse, than ending up in a wheelchair? How do we compare various domains of human functioning that, together, make up the state of health?

This then is the general ethical backdrop against which the special moral concern about the impact of disability on health resource prioritization must be placed. We begin with why it is that disability—of the myriad of differences between people that might matter in how we decide to allocate health care resources—is different.

2. Why does disability pose a problem for health care rationing?

2.1 The difference disability makes

The situation of persons with disabilities is a special ethical concern for health care allocation because disability is not just any human difference—like age, gender or ethnicity—or any social disadvantage—like poverty, gender discrimination, or minority marginalization. Disability is both a difference and a disadvantage that is conceptually linked to a person’s health state, and therefore health needs. All disability theorists these days agree that the physical, social and attitudinal environment in which a person with a health problem or functional impairment lives will make a huge difference to their perceived “disability” the person will experience (WHO 2001). Although there are a few hold-outs of the so-called “social model” that insist that disability is a pure “social construction” that has nothing to do with the state of a person’s health (see Oliver 1990), the Consensus is that disability is conceptually linked to health: without an underlying health problem or impairment there is no disability.

While the actual health needs of persons with disabilities, even severe disabilities, varies enormously, the conceptual link to health and human functioning means that health is not merely contingently related to disability, as gender, poverty or even quality of life are. Moreover, disability is not merely conceptually linked to health, it is linked to some problem with or decrement in health. This explains why the case of disability raises the priority problem in clear relief: every person with a disability is potentially a less-efficient health care resource user since they have an ex ante (pre-allocation) health problem.

It is important to note, however, that disability is not conceptually linked to (lower) quality of life. Unfortunately, there is good evidence that it is commonly believed that people with disabilities suffer from a lower quality of life associated with their level of functioning or premature mortality, and that ex ante decrement in quality of life may not be fundamentally altered by the health resource (Albrecht & Devlieger 1999). This empirical fact is the source of the democracy problem as it applies to disability since if the general public is laboring under a general prejudice about what it means to live with a disability, then they will be more easily persuaded that disability is an additional cost, or limits the benefit received (or both).

To be sure, there can be no doubt that disability incurs additional personal and social costs in the form of impairment-related resources such as assistive technology (wheelchairs, hearing aids, and augmented communication devices); changes to make their world more accessible (curb cuts, audible stop lights, elevators, accessible toilets and disability parking); and social services such as income maintenance, disability pensions and vocational rehabilitation. By the same token the health care needs of persons with disabilities may be more costly to provide, given potential complications and co-morbidities as well as the accommodations that may be required to ensure access to health care (for example, that examination tables can accommodate persons with complete lower body paralysis). Because of this, however, people with disabilities will always have to face the converse of the indirect benefits problem: as a population, they incur health and non-health costs that, if factored into the cost of the health improvement associated with a health resource, would tilt the CEA efficiency calculation against them.

2.2 Disability and individual, head-to-head allocation

Taking all this together the result is, from the perspective of CEA reasoning, that disability seems to be a salient consideration for resource allocation. For the rest of this section, we will review what has been said about how disability impacts the ethics of health care allocation, and in particular how the five problems mentioned above play out in the case of disability.

There are two perspectives in which these intuitions can be tested: at the level of individual, head-to-head allocation contests and at the level of social policies or strategies about health care allocation across the population. In the first case we presume a head-to-head comparison between a person with and another without a disability, both of whom require the medical treatment or resource that, for whatever reason, can only be available to one of them. We will have occasion below to question the philosophical value of head-to-head allocation scenarios, but there is no doubt they have emotional power and put the impact of disability into stark relief. Interestingly, although the impact of disability on rationing was initially raised legally in terms of rationing policy (the Oregon rationing experiment mentioned above), despite creative legal academic discussions (Garvey 1992; Peters 1995; Orentlicher 1996; and Crossley 2000), United States courts were reluctant to move from the individual case to the policy level in the rationing debate because they were impressed by the argument that prioritization of health resources was simply unavoidable and so not discriminatory as a general policy. We return to this point below in the context of human rights and the impact of disability.

2.3 Problematic scenarios at the individual level

In this section we explore the ethical issues involved in health resource rationing involving disability at the individual level (leaving the ethics of rationing policy for the next section). For concreteness, we look at allocation scenarios commonly used in the literature to highlight the impact of disability on the allocation strategy of CEA using the QALY metric to define health resource use benefit, or to test other intuitions about non-utilitarian, egalitarian principles of fair distribution. There are many, many different variations on these examples that can be imagined to test our intuitions, but these will give a flavor of this form of philosophical analysis. The cases are divided naturally into those in which life itself is at stake and those in which some non-fatal health outcome involving an improvement in functioning (stabilization of functioning, or prevention of further functional decline) is at stake.

Note: For all the examples below, let A represent a person with a disability and B and C persons without. We make no assumption about what kind or severity of disability is involved, except to remind ourselves that the underlying impairments may be trivial (a congenital port wine stain on one’s face), although socially stigmatizing, or moderate (arthritic pain affecting mobility), or extremely severe (life-threatening blood pressure or compromised lung function). We assume that A, B, and C ex post (before the resource is administered) all have roughly the same health needs with respect to the proposed treatment or resource use, although A may have other health needs associated with her pre-existing disability.

Life-saving cases:

  1. A has a shorter life expectancy, post-treatment than B, but the treatment will save the lives of both A and B.
  2. A and B have the same life expectancy post-treatment, but B will have a higher quality of life.
  3. A’s disability is such that the chances that the life-saving treatment will be wholly effective, or its potential for positive effect, are greatly diminished in comparison with B.
  4. Neither C nor B have pre-existing disabilities, but post-treatment we have good reason to believe that C will acquire a disability and B will not, and that disability will either lessen C’s life expectancy, or quality of life, or both.

In all of these scenarios, the CEA and QALY allocation strategy would prima facie favor the non-disabled individual B. Both the priority and the indirect benefits problems are at work here. Although this result seems intuitively acceptable for case (iii), since the treatment to A would be a total waste of a scarce resource, and unfair if B could benefit from it. But it is far less clear what we would say if the effectiveness of the treatment was less obviously compromised by the disability. As for cases (i), (ii) and (iv) the CEA analysis is at least troubling because the preference is based exclusively on A’s (or for case iv), C’s) disability, or ex ante quality of life. We might not think it relevant what kind of life a person would live after a medical treatment, and differences in life expectancy would only be relevant if they were very stark—say A would only live a few weeks, but B several decades.

Health improvement cases:

  1. A’s disability acts like a co-morbidity and reduces the efficacy of the proposed treatment so that the treatment has a less quality of life-enhancing outcome for A than it does for B.
  2. A’s disability makes the treatment more complex, extended and more costly than it is for B, even though the resulting outcomes may be identical.
  3. C and B have no pre-existing disabilities, but we know that C will acquire one post-treatment and because of this the quality of life-enhancing outcome will be less for C than for B.

For cases (i) and (iii), primarily because of the use of QALY as a metric for benefit, the standard strategy for health resource allocation would favor B over A or C: because of their disabilities, ex post or ex ante, individuals A and C have worst health resource use outcomes than B. As with the life-saving cases, our intuitions seem to depend on how great the gap in quality of life is between A (or C) and B. Should A and C experience an extremely low quality of life after the treatment, while B experience very high quality of life, then we are tempted to favor B; but when the differences are minimal, then favoring B over A seems arbitrary and unfair. The case of (ii) puts the disadvantage on the cost rather than the benefit side, with the result that CEA would favor B. Again, our intuitions here seem to be affected by magnitude: if the cost difference is trivial, then it seems unfair to favor B; if the differences are enormous, then our utilitarian intuitions seem more dominant and we would favor B. In general, once the subtleties of proportional benefit or proportional cost are considered, our intuitions are actually very fluid.

2.4 What do head-to-head examples really tell us?

Francis Kamm has relied almost exclusively on individual head-to-head examples such as these to explore intuitions about the ethical significance of disability in allocation decisions (Kamm 1993, 2004, 2009a and b). Although her examples are vivid and the discussions often ethically illuminating, at the end of the day, one is left with the sense that relying on our intuitions about these scenarios (and their infinite variations) is a troublingly and indeterminate exercise. The unrealistic simplicity of the cases might create skepticism about how the debate has been framed. Surely, no health care decision, at the individual level, would ever be this stark and devoid of uncertainties. We are never completely sure whether our treatments will improve functioning, even save lives, or whether unintended side effects will end up making the outcome worse. In addition, measuring benefit in terms of QALYs is not an exact science, and the measurement of cost is extremely difficult, especially if, in addition to the direct costs from the provision of the resource, we add indirect costs and opportunity costs. Although the method of testing our intuitions on artificial scenarios, making increasingly nuanced changes in the case to highlight salient considerations, is philosophical illuminating, it may arguably be somewhat artificial.

Our intuitions seem both stable and reliable for ex ante examples, where a decision is made to allocate the resource to the non-disabled individual solely or automatically in terms of the presence of a disability in the other candidate, without any consideration of relative cost or benefit or the most rudimentary use of CEA. Surely such a decision would be the very essence of prejudicial and unfair. But even here our intuitions are not completely secure since it may make a difference how the allocation decision is framed.

Suppose we are asked to decide between a person in a wheelchair and someone without a severe disability. If the issue is framed crudely in term of “lives worth living” and we decide on stereotypical and ungrounded assumptions about the abject misery of living in a wheelchair, ex ante, then a case could be made that our decision to favor the person without a disability was irrational, unfair, and discriminatory. By contrast, suppose we cast the situation as one in which unavoidable scarcity necessitates a choice that, however it goes, will be regrettable and unfortunate (sometimes called a “tragic choice”: see Calabresi & Bobbitt 1978 and Nussbaum 2000). So framed, we might seem far more ethically justified in appealing to disability, or indeed any other real difference between the two individuals that is, at least in principle, relevant to our judgment. Disability, as we have seen, is an a priori relevant consideration to health care allocation. We might argue that, after all, we have no option but to choose someone (choosing no one would be both wasteful and unfair to both). Against this it might be argued that fairness in such a circumstance can only be achieved by a purely random choice.

3. Disability as a systematic rationing consideration: ethical concerns

3.1 The dilemma created by CEA

The individual allocation scenarios just described are powerful “intuition pumps” (Dennett 2013) because they emphasize a direct competition between two individuals over the same required health resource. Yet if the only lesson we can draw from the life-saving and health improvement scenarios is that our intuitions about whether disability matters are clearer the starker the contrast in benefit or cost, this does not seem to advance the debate very much. Given that there is already a concern about the unrealistic simplicity of the individual cases, perhaps we can get a better result by asking whether, and in what way, disability is a relevant ethical consideration as a general social policy or allocation strategy that will be consistently and neutrally applied to everyone, without exception.

If we are considering a social policy or population strategy for allocation, we are seemingly bound by basic principles of procedural fairness that pre-empt special-pleading and other exceptions. These principles are also principles of rationality, and in the case of allocation policy they obviously apply. But there are also special presumptions about an allocation policy that also tap into our intuitions about the rationality of a general policy, but concern the specific nature of an allocation policy. There appear to be three presumptions about such a policy that cannot be sensibly challenged: A) the rationing or prioritizing policy is necessary because health resources are scare; B) resource use effectiveness, if not the end of the story, is at least part of it; and C) some ordinal measure of health outcomes must be used to compare outcomes.

Effectiveness, as we saw, is both a matter of the costs of using a health resource and the benefits accrued. At the policy level it is far more important to be clear about what range of costs are relevant (should we include indirect and lost opportunity cost?) as well as what constitutes a relevant benefit (should we include enhanced employment prospects, a more financially secure family situation, and so on?). The cost side of the equation is rarely considered by bioethicists, which is a clear gap in the debate. The benefit side has been considered, as noted above, by Brock and others under the wider rubric of the “separate spheres” problem (Brock 2003; Broome 2004). We can ignore these complications in what follows and restrict the issue of effectiveness, as is usually done in this literature, to a single criterion: the capacity to benefit directly from a health resource.

Whatever our intuitions may suggest at the individual level, when we turn to a general allocation policy, it is clear that disability has a potential impact both on cost and the capacity to directly benefit, and a blanket refusal to take disability into account would be both irrational and unfair. Importantly, ignoring disability is irrational and unfair for everyone, including people with disabilities. If the presence of a disability makes a medical treatment ineffective, extremely impractical or vastly expensive, it would be foolish to ignore this fact. It would be unfair to those without a disability who need and could benefit from the treatment; but it would also be unfair for a person with a disability to ignore the fact that some of his or her needs would be unsatisfied, and some medical treatment of no use to him or her (or potentially harmful). This means that disability is not only ethically relevant at the policy level, but in fact it needs to be factored into the selection of resource or treatment and of the mode, method, and context by which the resource is delivered.

But if disability intrinsically affects costs of delivery and capacity to benefit, allocation policy appears to be trapped in a dilemma: CEA systematically disadvantages people with disabilities in health resource prioritization, but it is both irrational and unfair (to everyone, including people with disabilities) to ignore disability-related differences in costs and capacity to benefit when prioritizing health care resources.

3.2 Resolving the dilemma: first attempts

Some disability advocates argue that there is no real dilemma here since “capacity to benefit” is merely a cloak for the prejudice that the life of disabled person, like that of the elderly, is of intrinsically less value and deserving of less effort to preserve or improve (Asch 2001). These advocates have a point since precisely this view can be seen in the pronouncements of respectable bioethicists who do assert that the “disabled life” is fundamentally inferior (Kuhse & Singer 1985; Singer 1983; McKie et al. 1998). In the case of disability, for some writers, lower capacity to benefit is not an empirical conclusion, but an a priori assumption (Veach 1986; Harris 1986; Anand & Hanson 1997; Arneson & Nord 1999; Rock 2000; Koch 2000). CEA systematically disadvantages people with disabilities because it is intrinsically discriminatory.

Although Asch and others are certainly not attacking a straw person position, the response might be that there is an empirical basis for the claim that disability adversely affects the capacity to benefit from a health resource, namely the evidence that people with disabilities tend to enjoy less quality of life improvement from these resources than those without disabilities. The strength of this rejoinder, however, depends very much on what is meant by “quality of life”. If understood as a subjective assessment or evaluation of one’s life—now more often called “subjective well-being” (Kahneman, Diener & Schwarz 1999)—then there is good empirical evidence that disability does not negatively affect capacity to benefit. People with disabilities tend to be happier, and assess their lives to be of considerably higher value than would be objectively assumed—a phenomenon called the “disability paradox” (Albrecht & Devlieger 1999).

This may be granted, but it remains true that bioethicists who rely on the notion of “quality of life” in this context tend to assume, usually without argument, that quality of life is an objective phenomenon that incorporates autonomy, accomplishments and a reasonable array of opportunities to live a full life (see, e.g., Brock 1995, 2005). It is, of course, this objective sense that QALYs was intended to quantify by means of evaluations of health states, either by population or expert ranking, or by means of preference elicitation techniques. Invariably these ranking exercises show that quality of life decreases directly with the severity of the disabling condition.

The disability advocate might respond that QALYs and similar measures are simply not valid since the rankings are done by people who do not themselves have first-hand experience with what it means to live with a disability. Indeed there is some evidence that third-party assessments of the objective quality of life of people with impairments—either by health professionals or the general public—are systematically lower than self-assessments by people with impairments (Ubel et al. 2003), and that this bias may well be the result of distortion from cultural and other prejudices (Amundson 2010).

Against this it might be argued that whether or not a person with a disability is in an epistemically-privileged position concerning the experience of disability, this privilege need not extend to an objective assessment of the actual physical and other burdens of living with the disability (Brock 1995). Quite the contrary, because of the psychological dynamics of adaptation and adjustment, especially after a traumatic injury, a person with a disability may well be in a worse position to assess his or her life objectively. Once adjusted, the disabled person may grossly overestimate the value of living with the disability, which, while perhaps not a bad thing, in this context has the effect of distorting the individual’s health and social needs (Murray 1996; Menzel et al. 2002).

Even if this debate about how QALYs should be developed is resolved, this may have little impact on the dilemma mentioned. If disability objectively reduces quality of life, then the expected overall benefit of a health resource will tend to be adversely affected and CEA will disadvantage persons with disabilities; but on the other hand, if not, and disability does not impact on the capacity to benefit from a health resource, then people with disabilities will be disadvantaged by the provision of these resources that do not take their disabilities into account. As Amaryta Sen helpfully explains the point, the value of any resource is not constant across a population since some differences between people affect their ability to “convert” the resource into what is value, either objectively, or to them alone (Sen 1999; Ruger 2010). There are differences between people that make a difference to the value extracted from the same resource, and disability is perhaps the clearest example of such a difference.

The QALY metric, however, is problematic for another reason. When evaluators are asked to rank the impact of a disability on quality of life they are asked to consider the overall “burden” of living with that decrement in health or functioning. Undoubtedly, part of that burden is the result of the social stigma, discrimination and lack of opportunities that characterizes the disabled life, in all cultures. People with disabilities typically have as a group the lowest employment and education participation rates of any sub-population (WHO 2011, Chapter 8), a fact that profoundly affects their quality of life, but which has as much to do with failed policy to combat stigma and lack of accommodation as it does with the underlying health condition. Yet the fact that the burden of living with a disability is caused as much by the social environment suggests that the QALY metric, even if it accurately describes the burden of disability, is unfair as a basis for resource allocation (Wasserman, Asch, Bickenbach 2008). In effect we are saying to the person with a disability that because stigma and failed policy make your life less valuable, we are not going to improve your life by giving you access to needed resources.

One of the most robust defenses of how the CEA approach deals with disability comes in the form of Michael Stein’s general defense of utilitarianism against forms of resource egalitarianism (Stein 2006). Stein argues that only utilitarianism, by relying on the greater benefit criterion of distributive justice, can handle our intuitions about disability when it comes to health care allocation. He acknowledges that disability is conceptually related to ill-health or functional decrement (impairment), and, as a utilitarian takes that to mean that disability also reduces welfare—and proportionately: the more severe the disability, the greater the welfare loss. Because of this relationship, he argues that the utilitarian can precisely determine—in welfare terms—the impact of a health benefit and this makes utilitarianism, overall, a far better decision-making method for health care allocations. Unfortunately, on his own utilitarian terms, Stein’s argument is flawed. For, as we have said, as long as welfare is a subjective notion, there is no reason to think that there is a strict correlation between health and welfare deficit. Moreover, for a utilitarian consequentialist, there is no a priori reason to think that a person without a disability always experiences less welfare benefit than a person with disability—since there are domains other than health that impact welfare. On the other hand, if we are concerned about maximizing welfare, rather than health, then we need to take into account all consequential welfare advances that are linked to health improvements (opportunity to develop talents, better job prospects, or a more stable family life) and once that door is open, there is no reason to think that disability will matter since these benefits may, overall, greatly overwhelm the negative impact of disability (Bickenbach 2008).

3.3 Resolving the dilemma: moving beyond CEA

The dilemma created by the cost-effectiveness strategy, or more generally a utilitarian approach, may be argued to reflect the perennial conflict in distributive justice between “fair chances” and “best outcomes”. Although there are diehard utilitarians like Stein, most philosophers are drawn to the view that we must in light of these problems find compromise positions in which cost efficiency is moderated by some countervailing principle of fairness. Although the debate is about how to construct a social policy of health care allocation—which potentially affects everyone, so that everyone’s interests need to be taken into account—this does not mean that the three presumptions mentioned above are rejected. No participant in this debate would argue that costs do not matter, that effective use of resources is irrelevant, or that health care outcomes are wholly subjective and incommensurable. Instead, we need to make allocation decision-making more complex by taking account of egalitarian “side constraints” that might modify our CEA results.

Thus some philosophers have argued that the debate needs to be infused with the basic egalitarian principle of equal concern and respect, a principle that may from time to time trump CEA considerations. Sometimes, that is, “best outcomes” needs to be moderated by “fair chances”. Dan Brock, who was the first to raise the question of how disability impacts on health care allocation, argued that the best way forward is to structure health resource allocation to secure, to the greatest extent, equality of opportunity for all (Brock 1995). Relocating the center of gravity of health care allocation to equality of opportunity was extremely appealing since it accorded with the a prominent view about the nature of health, and the value of health care, most clearly articulated by Norman Daniels (1985, and further developed in Daniels 2008). Health, Daniels argued, has a special moral significance for us because it facilitates and enhances our full range of opportunities in life, so ensuring that equality of health care is one of society’s most effective means of ensuring equality of opportunity across the board.

Yet it was not clear how a renewed emphasis on “fair chances” helps to resolve the dilemma that CEA purportedly creates. Even if a purely “best outcome” approach disadvantages people with disabilities, focusing on “fair outcomes” would not mean that we ignored differences in costs and capacity to benefit created by disability. One might argue that, as abstracted individuals, everyone should have an equal opportunity to benefit from health care resources, ceteris paribus. Yet, as it is irrational to ignore issues of cost and benefit, it is clear that disability is just the paradigm example of a consideration that disrupts the ceteris paribus assumption. People with disabilities cannot fairly be denied the opportunity to benefit from health care, but on rational and relevant grounds of cost and prospect of benefit, they can fairly be denied health care, at least on a case by case basis. Brock came to realize that the move to egalitarian equality of opportunity could not resolve the dilemma posed by the relevance of disability in health care rationing. After nearly three decades of work he acknowledged that the problem of seemingly justifiable disability discrimination “represents a deep and unresolved problem for resource prioritization” (Brock 2002) and “there is much work still to be done” (Brock 2009).

For his part, Daniels has argued that when it comes to health resource decisions our fundamental intuitions are permanently at odds and egalitarian theory cannot help. Our only solution is to ensure that our health resource allocation policy is formalized so that all decisions are firmly grounded on fair deliberative processes, in which every voice and argument is heard and decisions are made by a fair and neutral arbiter (Daniels, et al. 2000; Daniels 2008).

Searching for an egalitarian allocation principle that might avoid the dilemma, some philosophers have gone back to the priority problem mentioned above and noted that, depending on the severity of the disability, a person with disabilities may have a greater need for health resources than a non-disabled individual, or that the health resource may have a more profound impact on securing equality of opportunity for the disabled person. Making the case for allocation in terms of who is “worst off” reflects the version of egalitarianism called prioritarianism (see Parfit 1997; Arneson 2000) in which the distribution of a resource is guided by the intuition that the worst off have more to gain and should be given priority, not, like in the utilitarian approach in terms of great welfare benefit, but because of greater need.

The prioritarian, however, has two impressive hurdles to overcome: how to determine, in health terms, who is “worse off”, and secondly a version of the indirect benefits problem: why should we restrict our focus on health when health resources have knock-on benefits that go far beyond the sphere of health, including becoming a productive member of society. Both issues turn in part on whether health is an intrinsic or an instrumental good (or both). If purely instrumental, then the value of a health improvement—and so an estimate of how worse off a person would be without that improvement—can only be determined by looking at the resulting consequences for the individual and society. Moving in this direction a wide range of considerations—social position, income level, innate talents and good luck—would be determinative, even though they have very little to do with the health benefit itself. If health is only intrinsically valuable, then we would need a direct, unidimensional and comparative metric of health-related disadvantage. This is a formidable challenge since, once again, it would require answers to imponderable questions such as “Is a person who is blind ‘worse off” than a person who is deaf?’

Recently, Greg Bognar, recalling a version of “luck egalitarianism” (see Arneson 2000) has suggested another tactic that might avoid this tangle (Bognar 2010, 2011). Trading on the distinction between the value of a life and its moral worth, he has argued that we are uncomfortable with the quality of life measure, not because it is irrelevant to the capacity to benefit from a health resource, but because it tells us nothing about whether the individual deserves or merits the scarce resource. He suggests that in general we should ignore disability in the allocation of health resources. Disability is only relevant, he claims, when it diminishes the capacity to benefit from the health resource and the individual is responsible for the disability. Thus, while it would be unjust to deny a person a hip and knee replacement just because he or she is blind because of bad luck, it would not seem to be unjust if the person was voluntarily obese: being overweight contributed to the need for the replacement surgery in the first place, and would in any event reduce the benefit that the person would receive from the surgery.

Although an intriguing theoretical take on the problem, Bognar’s solution, like all forms of luck egalitarianism, is fraught with a very practical problem of distinguishing causal responsibility from moral responsibility. We may feel confident blaming the excessive drinker for the medical need of a liver transplant, but only if we are equally confident that drinking was a choice, rather than a genetically predisposed behavior. And how far back in the causal history do we need to go to determine innocence or guilt? Most traumatic spinal cord injuries are the result of risky behaviors, and the soldier who voluntarily enlists surely understands the risks. Even assuming that these investigations into blameworthiness could conceivably be resolved, and resolved in a timely and inexpensive manner, Bognar is not offering a feasible solution to healthcare allocation in practice since ignoring blameworthy disability when allocating resources is not only unfair, but impractical since disabilities need to be taken into account in order to ensure that treatments and other medical interventions are as appropriate and beneficial for people with disabilities as for those without.

3.4 Health resource prioritization and the human right to health care

Is the ethical character of health care rationing fundamentally altered if we posit a human right to health care for persons with disabilities, as has been recently done by the United Nations Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (UN 2007: Articles 25 and 26)? Does human rights discourse strengthen the argument that health resource rationing cannot disadvantage persons with disabilities? Does it put more pressure on the need to ethically justify the application of cost effectiveness to allocation decision making? Does it help us resolve the dilemma that disability poses for health care allocation?

The Convention explicitly asserts that all of its specific substantive rights—to health care, education, employment and so on—are rooted in the protection of equality (or prohibition of discrimination) and human dignity. This would suggest that if health resource allocation was prejudicial or discriminatory against people with disabilities, it would be a clear human rights violation. This assessment would hold whether the people with disabilities were disadvantaged directly and individually from “bedside allocation” or indirectly because of the application of otherwise disability-neutral private or public health care funding arrangements, or health care allocation policies or strategies.

Unfortunately, the language of human rights adds little to the disability advocate’s already strong argument against ex ante prejudice or stigma in rationing decision-making, an argument that has no impact on the larger problem posed by the dilemma of whether disability should matter, and if so, how it should matter. In the case of the UN Convention, the human rights posited are not special rights restricted to persons with disabilities, rights that would, for example, directly impact health resource allocation so as to favor, or not disfavor, persons with disabilities. On the contrary, the right to health resources is explicitly said to be a right to “the same range, quality and standard of care as provided to other persons”. As long as persons with disabilities are treated equally with everyone else in a rationing scheme—subject to the same strategy of CEA or egalitarian principle and augmented with the same measure of benefit—then, arguably, no human right has been violated. In the context of international human rights, in short, equality of worth, dignity and respect demands, not special treatment or even equal treatment, but treatment as an equal. It would be as unfair, from this perspective, to say that the disability is determinative of health resource allocation as it would to say that disability is irrelevant. The dilemma, in short, remains.

4. A persistent dilemma?

Currently, the dilemma posed by whether, and how, disability should be taken into account for health allocation remains unsolved, although it frequently appears in the distributive justice literature as a test case for some variant of egalitarianism or a refined version of CEA. Even if the dilemma is resolved, additional problems arise. If we decide that disability is always a relevant allocation consideration, then on the way to tackling the larger question of what the impact of disability should be the question of comparability of varieties of disability looms larger. It has recently been suggested that the so-called “indexing problem” created by the incommensurable components of human disadvantage (Woff and De-Shalit 2007), which prevents any meaningful comparison between people experiencing very different forms of social disadvantage is compounded when trying to compare people with different disabilities. Comparing lower body paralysis with deafness is hard enough, but two people both of whom are paraplegic may experience it in vastly different ways depending on the availability of wheelchairs and accommodations such as accessible public buildings (Riddle 2014). If we decide that disability should never matter, then it is difficult to see why any consideration of either cost or benefit, unrelated to disability, could also be justified. If so, then the only survivable allocation procedure would be random allocation, which is highly counter-intuitive as a solution to head-to-head individual allocation decisions, let alone a general allocation policy.


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Jerome Bickenbach <jerome.bickenbach@paraplegie.ch>

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