Theories of domination are primarily attempts to understand the value of justice, freedom, and equality by examining cases where they are absent. Such theories seek to clarify and systematize our judgments about what it is to be weak against uncontrolled strength, i.e., about what it is to be vulnerable, degraded, and defenseless against unrestrained power.
- 1. Domination: The Basic Idea
- 2. Who, or What, Can Dominate?
- 3. Does Domination Require the Exercise of Power?
- 4. What Kind of Power Is Domination?
- 5. Domination and Applied Ethics
- 6. Conclusion
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1. Domination: The Basic Idea
There is, of course, considerable disagreement about what domination really is. Even so, theorists of domination tend to agree about this much: domination is a kind of unconstrained, unjust imbalance of power that enables agents or systems to control other agents or the conditions of their actions. We can call this “the basic idea” of domination. The basic idea has the following components:
- Domination is a kind of power, and usually social power—that is, power over other people.
- Domination involves imbalances or asymmetries in power. The English domination comes from the Latin dominus. A dominus is a master, and mastery represents an extreme of social power. Masters usually have all but complete control over how their slaves will act or over the conditions in which they act. As a result, the master/slave relation is often treated as the most obvious case of domination.
- Domination has many forms. Traditional Roman republicanism recognized a distinction between imperium and dominium—domination by the state contrasted with domination by private parties (Pettit 1997; 31; 2001: 152ff). The power a master has over a slave may be the clearest case of domination, but it is not necessary to have a literal dominus in order to be dominated. For example, tyrants over their subjects and men over women in patriarchal societies are also common examples of domination. Combined with the master/slave, these examples are so common in the literature that we can refer to them together simply as the Paradigms. Failure to explain why the Paradigms count as domination is sometimes considered reason enough to reject a theory of domination (see Lovett 2010, Blunt 2015, and McCammon 2015). Other examples may not manifest the extremes of power we see in the Paradigms; but it is generally agreed that domination comes in degrees, and that someone may be dominated even if nobody has total power over them.
- Dominating power is in some sense unconstrained. It is up to masters how they will or will not use their power. Such power is often described as arbitrary or discretionary; or, perhaps, unlimited by the interests of those under its sway; or, perhaps, projects only the vision of the world most favorable to the empowered while preventing the subjugated from seeing themselves or the world on their own terms. However it is characterized, that claim that domination counts as such because of the absence of some limit recurs in many theories.
- Domination is an unjust or morally illegitimate form of social power. Whatever domination turns out to be, it is morally serious. It is a complaint (Pettit 2005). To be dominated is typically to have cause for indignation and resentment against the dominator or against institutions that dominate or make domination possible.
Much contemporary disagreement about domination involves competing answers to three questions: (1) Who, or what, can dominate? (2) Is it possible to dominate merely by having power with a certain structure, or is domination an exercise or an abuse of power? (3) Exercised or unexercised, what kind of power is domination? The remainder of this entry will address each of these questions in turn, then conclude with a survey of how the idea of domination has been used in recent applied ethical theory. It will become clear as we examine competing answers to these three questions that different theorists have very different ideas of why, exactly, we need a theory of domination. There may be wide agreement that we need the idea of domination to make sense of unjust power relations, but unjust power relations are wildly varied, and theorists of domination disagree not only about which varieties most need to be understood, but about how theorizing domination helps us to understand them.
Another word of qualification before proceeding: what follows is a survey of work almost entirely from Anglophone political philosophers and political theorists, broadly within the Analytic tradition. For theories of domination from the Continental tradition, see the entry, feminist perspectives on power.
2. Who, or What, Can Dominate?
2.1 Domination by Agents, Group Agents, and Groups
The neorepublican tradition (i.e., the tradition of thinking about domination associated primarily with the historical scholarship of Quentin Skinner and the political theory of Philip Pettit) tends to present domination as a relation between agents; only agents can dominate or be dominated (Pettit 1997: 52), though the agent/agents might be a group or collective. Domination by groups may not require that they do so as a group agent (List & Pettit 2011: 19–41). The metaphysics of group agency usually require shared beliefs or joint intentions among the members of the group; but, dominating power may be grounded in group membership (white people in Western racialized hierarchies, men in patriarchy) even if that group, or some of its members, do not meet the metaphysical requirements for group agency. At least for those who think unexercised power is sufficient for domination, a man who rejects the patriarchy of his society may still dominate women because of what he is in a position to do—e.g., have his testimony in court taken more seriously than a woman’s—even if he explicitly rejects and tries to undermine patriarchal institutions.
A minority position in the literature sees domination fundamentally as a relation between groups, where any domination between individuals is parasitic on group membership. If this is true, the domination of one individual by another counts as such only because one belongs to a dominant group and the other belongs to a subordinate group (Wartenberg 1990).
2.2 Can Non-Agents Dominate?
That agents alone can be dominated is rarely disputed; but can agents alone dominate? What about non-agents like institutions or systems or ideologies? Vaclav Havel’s (1991: 136–138) example of a grocer in Soviet-era Czechoslovakia recurs in the literature as a possible example of domination by a system, where particular agents are merely conduits (Lovett 2010; Krause 2013; Blunt 2015). The grocer posts slogans favorable to the regime in the window of his shop. By posting the slogans, he both signals his cooperation with power and extends its reach. Similarly, Sharon Krause (2013: 194) recalls her mother’s insistence that she take smaller, more “ladylike”, steps and overcome her natural stride. Perhaps the ideology Krause’s mother both obeys and enforces is what dominates, rather than any particular agent or agents (see also Foucault 1975 [1977: 26–27]). Workers who have deeply imbibed the values of capitalism might be another example (see Thompson 2013, 2018): e.g., someone who accepts whatever meaningless work is available because their sense of self-worth depends on not being a “slacker”. While it may be that the values of capitalism are a social construct produced over time by agents for their own benefit, if what motivates the worker is their own corrupted sense of self-worth, it makes sense to think that they might be dominated by an ideology rather than other agents.
The central question is whether we can understand possible examples of domination by systems or ideologies as instances of domination by agents through systems or ideologies. An affirmative answer is more often assumed than argued for in the literature, but Frank Lovett tries to motivate it with this example:
Imagine a society in which the law of property recognizes the possibility of ownership in human beings, but in which it just happens that there are as yet no slaves. After some time, however, slaves are imported, and the law duly supports their masters’ rights of ownership. Later still, the masters repent, and manumit their slaves. (2010: 48–49)
Lovett thinks we will agree that domination occurs only during the period after slaves are imported and before their manumission: the legal system that allowed property in slaves enabled domination but did not dominate.
The proposed lesson of another thought experiment—this one from Gwilym David Blunt (2015: 17–18)—is that domination without agents is conceivable but impracticable, at least in the near term. Suppose, a legislator organized a dominating regime and died soon after, but not before programming “a series of automatons … that cannot be reprogrammed” to enforce his will against a subordinate group in the name of a privileged group. If this is domination, it cannot be domination by the deceased legislator (on the assumption that the dead have no agency), or by the automatons (who are assumed to be not sophisticated enough to count as agents), or by the privileged population (who did not write the laws and cannot control the automatons); therefore, it must be the system itself that dominates.
In general, the disagreement about whether agents alone dominate tracks the division between theories directly influenced by neorepublicans and those descended from other traditions. The neorepublican preoccupation with the master/slave relation makes it natural to focus on domination by agents: to be dominated by a master is, obviously, to be dominated by an agent. Working from this central example, the republican tradition tends to see institutions, systems, and ideologies as sources of power that make mastery possible rather than as standalone sources of domination without agents. If, instead, our attention is focused on the ways power can shape the consciousness of those under its sway, domination by, e.g., patriarchy itself becomes more plausible, even without the looming presence of particular patriarchs.
3. Does Domination Require the Exercise of Power?
3.1 Domination as a Power Structure
One of the most persistent recent disagreements concerns whether or not domination requires the exercise of power. Neorepublicans tend to link domination to what agents are in a position to do or have the capacity to do rather than what agents actually do. This is mostly because of the role domination plays within neorepublican ideas of freedom. The classical liberal theory of freedom—the neorepublican’s primary competitor and foil—is supposedly defective just because it identifies freedom with the absence of actual choice-interference. Neorepublicans say their advantage is the way they highlight how potential interference reduces freedom. This is the point of the most famous example from the republican tradition: the slaves of a kind or lazy master are slaves nonetheless, and so are paradigmatically unfree even though their master is too kind or lazy to interfere with them.
What does it look like to have power that counts as domination even though unexercised? In addition to the language encountered above highlighting the “capacities” of the powerful, neorepublicans emphasize what Lovett (2010) calls the structure instead of the outcome of dominating power relations. Whether or not an employer can fire their employees at will is about how the employer/employee relationship is structured; whether or not an employer actually fires an employee, or whether or not the employee manages not to starve because they have the job, manifests the outcome of the relationship. This way of examining social relationships looks away from how empowered agents exercise their power to the nature of that power itself. We do not stop objecting to paradigmatic dominators merely because they promise to make kind and judicious use of their powers; emancipation seems to require that they cease to have that kind of power. This highlights neorepublican doubts about whether self-regulation by the powerful can reduce domination (Lovett 2010: 97). At an extreme, Pettit has said that domination persists without “external checks that remove or replace the interference option or put it cognitively off the menu”; that domination is reduced only by “exogenous” forces; or, if internal, forces that “disable” in the manner of deep-seated neuroses (2012: 63).
3.2 Does Character Matter after All?
There are two primary lines of objection to the claim that only a change in how power relations are structured can check domination, rather than changes to the outcome of the relation or to the character of the empowered. The first is that it fails to capture realities of what the dominated really object to; the second is that it leads to significant over-generalization.
No one denies that victims of power object to the outcomes of its use, and not merely to their initial vulnerability to that power. (Certainly, neorepublicans want to say that both are objectionable.) But if we insist that domination refers properly only to the structure of a power relation, and not to outcomes of that relation, we may have a difficult time explaining the standard use of domination to refer to overwhelming power wielded against the defenseless. Suppose Columbus had merely sailed around the margins of the “New World” without making landfall, and that his power to exploit and destroy native cultures was never exercised. Is this counterfactual history still a story of European domination? If not, it is tempting to identify European domination with the actual harm inflicted on people who were not equipped to resist them (Katz 2017).
There is reason to think, too, that the dominated sometimes have complaints specifically about the character of the powerful. This issue has been revisited in the work of Christopher Lebron (2013) and Melvin Rogers (forthcoming). Rogers especially insists that theories of domination influenced by neorepublicanism overplay the irrelevance of character to dominating power. His recent work on black American republicans like Martin Delany (1852 ), Hosea Easton (1837 ), Maria W. Stewart (1987), David Walker (1829 ), reveals a contrasting emphasis on the “comportment” of white Americans. Opposing race-based systems of domination requires not just “freedom from the arbitrary power” of white Americans, but a “transformation of the system of cultural value in which blacks occupy a lower position of worth” (Rogers, forthcoming). This transformation requires not only the external checks on domination achievable by legal reforms, but a transformation in the hearts of white Americans. Rogers argues that neorepublican theories of domination are formed by resistance to political slavery, where the essential humanity of the slave is not in question; unlike chattel slavery, which was built on and maintained by an ideological commitment to white supremacy and black inferiority. Legal reforms may be sufficient to counter political slavery: they represent a turn of the legal order toward closer alignment with the already acknowledged value of the enslaved. However, legal reforms alone, while necessary, are not enough when this value is systematically denied.
3.3 Over-Generalization Problems for Structure-Based Accounts
Over-generalization worries are the most common objection to neorepublican approaches to domination. If domination is just the capacity for arbitrary interference, and given that such capacities seem ubiquitous, domination may be ordinary to the point of triviality. Even when sitting around minding their own business, physically strong people have the capacity to overpower weaker people; even if they never do, people with a natural gift for persuasion have the capacity to talk the gullible out of their savings (Friedman 2008: 251). Also, if the primary function of the state is to minimize domination, neorepublicanism suggests that the state should try to make people less strong or less persuasive in order to reduce their capacity for arbitrary interference. That is unsavory. An obvious fix is to insist that only “actual or attempted arbitrary interference” dominates (Friedman 2008: 252).
For some feminists, the over-generalization worry is specifically that neorepublicans make relationships of care and dependency unreasonably suspect. A caregiver who would not dream of harming their charges nevertheless has the capacity to: infecting wounds instead of cleaning them, throwing someone down the stairs instead of helping them up (Friedman 2008: 254). Pettit acknowledges this feature of his theory when he claims that caring and uncaring mothers—and presumably caring and uncaring fathers—alike dominate their children in a state of nature (Pettit 1999: 119–120). The alternative is to insist that though care providers may stand in a relationship of unequal power with a vulnerable dependent, unless this power is abused it does not dominate. Domination, instead of mere power, requires active violation of moral standards and/or compromising the best interests of others (Kittay 1999: 33–34).
The attractiveness of this alternate depends on how we understand powers or capacities. If A has a power or capacity to interfere so long as it is possible in any sense for A to do so, as Pettit sometimes suggests, criticism focusing on the value of care is damaging: clearly, it is [e.g.] physically possible for caregivers and parents to interfere with their dependents. If, however, A does not have the power to interfere so long as appropriate penalties are in place for such interference, the objection may not be so potent. In other words, it’s not mere possibility that matters, but social or legal possibility—roughly, what it is possible to do without risk of sanction from other members of your social group or by agents of the state (see List & Valentini 2016). A hallmark of feminist ethics and political philosophy has been the insistence that power relations inside the home often manifest domination, even though the home can be a center of loving care and dependence, and that legal regulation—against spousal abuse or child neglect—might reduce that domination (Costa 2013: 928). Such laws, of course, do not make interference impossible simpliciter; instead, it makes interference risky and potentially costly.
Also, shifting from domination as mere power to domination as abuse of power may lead to other unattractive results, especially given broadly feminist commitments. If domination requires actual or attempted interference, women who avoid interference by “seduction, ingratiation, [or] avoidance” will not count as dominated (Costa 2013: 926). This feature of neorepublican accounts—the insistence that domination is the “mere condition of being vulnerable”—may be exactly what makes the concept useful for feminist philosophy (Laborde 2008: 152).
There are other proposed counter-examples to the claim that the “capacity to interfere … at will” dominates (Shapiro 2016: 21). What about “a playground bully” who is “able to beat up any of the smaller children but is widely known only to beat up black children”? Does the bully dominate the white children just as much as the black children? What about someone like 1950s American senator Joseph McCarthy? He had the same power to interfere in the lives of right-wing and left-wing Americans; but citizens on the left had far more reason to fear him. Perhaps the intuitive judgment here is that the bully only dominates the black children, and that McCarthy only dominates left-wing citizens. (Both examples are from Ian Shapiro 2012: 324; 2016: 21). It should be noted, however, that the persuasiveness of these examples depends in part on whether we think domination is the sole political evil, at least in the sense that all other political evils can be addressed most effectively by minimizing domination. The black children and the left-wing citizens in Shapiro’s examples are obviously worse off than the white children/right-wing citizens. If we diagnose their condition only by appeal to the evil of domination, Shapiro’s examples are damaging to the idea that domination can be an unexercised power. This is true even though there may not be much practical space between Shapiro’s account of domination and Pettit’s, given that Shapiro speaks of complaints against domination as complaints against a “power relationship”. Interestingly, Shapiro emphasizes the possibility that someone may be vulnerable to domination without being dominated, and that vulnerability to domination—like domination itself—is morally significant and represents an injustice (2016: 22). While the idea of domination as vulnerability recurs in the neorepublican literature, there is relatively little examination of this intermediate category: those who are vulnerable to domination without being dominated. (Perhaps the closest consideration in Pettit’s work is his brief discussion of “virtual domination” in 1997: 54.)
The controversy about whether completely dormant power can dominate continues, but there is broad consensus that you can be dominated even if nobody is actively dominating you at the moment. Even if there is no domination without an actual display of power over you or people like you at some time, domination might persist when unexercised precisely because of its previous exercise. As Wartenberg (1990) says, the actual exercise of power can “condition” a social relationship in a “longstanding” manner. If power has been exercised over you in the past, or over someone like you (perhaps because you are both members of a subordinated social group), this will affect how you relate to those in power. For example, suppose you know that the boss can fire you at will. He has not fired you or even threatened to do so, and so has not actually exercised his power over you. Even so, you have seen him exercise this power over other employees. As a result, you do whatever you’re told for fear of what the boss can do to you and has done to others. This motivates the view that your domination does not require the active exercise of power against you even though it might require the active exercise of power against someone relevantly like you. Of course, this leads to further questions: e.g., How recent must active exercises of power be in order to condition ongoing social relationships where power is dormant? Such questions have received relatively little attention thus far (but see Hirschmann 2003).
4. What Kind of Power Is Domination?
Exercised or unexercised, what kind of power is domination? If domination is about how social relationships are structured, what is A in a position to do if A dominates B? If domination requires the exercise of power, how does A use their power when they dominate B?
Along one dimension, we can sort answers to these questions into the moralized vs. the non-moralized. For a moralized theory, identifying domination requires us to settle more foundational questions about what is morally right or wrong, just or unjust. For example, if we say that dominating power is the power to violate human rights, our theory of domination depends on a theory of human rights—obviously a moral theory. Non-moralized theories hold that we can identify domination without reference to theories of the right or the good. For example, if we say that dominating power is power over the means of production, our theory of domination will depend on a [plausibly] descriptive theory of what counts as the means of production.
Of course, those who insist that domination can be defined without making moral judgments aren’t usually committed to what Ian Carter calls “value-independence” about the phenomenon, or “the complete detachment of our analysis from all ethical concerns” (2015: 280–281). Contributions to the contemporary discussion of domination from all-comers are generally motivated by profound ethical concerns.
Sorting is also required along another dimension. In addition to questions of moralization or non-moralization, there is the question of how domination relates to the use of power to dictate norms and rules, or the use of power to claim authority. Is domination always an attempt to rule? Does domination always involve a claim—however mistaken—by dominators that their power is legitimate? Does domination always involve an attempt by the powerful to demand that the dominated conform to norms? If you answer any of these questions in the affirmative, you advocate a norm-dependent theory of domination.
Confusion is easy here, given that moralized theories often appeal to norms and rules. The difference between such moralized theories and non-moralized but norm-dependent theories depends on the difference between correct moral norms/rules as distinguished from just any norm or rule. Norm-dependent theories say that domination always involves power exercised through norms and rules that some regard as legitimate—perhaps the dominator, perhaps the dominated, or perhaps both. As we will see, for theories that are not just norm-dependent but also moralized, domination always involves a failure to respect the moral status of agents as sources of the norms that govern them. For a merely norm-dependent theory, the domination of a patriarch might be essentially connected to the patriarch’s claim that he deserves obedience from his family. Obviously, whether or not someone claims or doesn’t claim to deserve obedience is a merely descriptive matter; as a result, such a theory is not moralized. The legitimacy of the patriarch’s authority is merely sociological, not moral. If a theory of domination says instead that the patriarch dominates because his demand for obedience unjustly undermines the right of his spouse and children to shape the norms that govern them, that theory is both norm-dependent and moralized. A theory that depends in part on an account of unjust infringements is clearly moralized.
It is not always easy to sort theories into these categories. The sorting is complicated by the fact that whether a theory is moralized or norm-dependent is sometimes a matter of active controversy. (This is particularly true of Pettit’s theory of domination.) In what follows, theories will be sorted to reflect the intentions of the theorist—at least as far as these intentions can be discerned.
Once we recognize the distinction between moralization and norm-dependency, we end up with four kinds of answer to the question “What kind of power is domination?” Assuming for now that only agents (represented here by A and B) can dominate or be dominated:
|Non-Moralized||If A dominates B, A has or exercises uncontrolled power over what B is in a position to do.||If A dominates B, A has or exercises sociologically legitimate power over what B is in a position to do.|
|Moralized||If A dominates B, A has or exercises power over what B is in a position to do by violating B’s rights or undermining B’s interests with impunity.||If A dominates B, A has or exercises power over what B is in a position to do that is both sociologically legitimate and unconstrained by institutions designed to protect B’s rights and interests.|
This section will examine theories from each division, with their basic motivations and primary exemplars.
4.1 Non-Moralized, Norm-Independent Theories
Theories identifying domination with even unexercised power tend away from moralization and norm-dependence. If A has a great deal of power over B, A will be well positioned to wrong B, or to force B at least to act like A has authority. Non-moralized/norm-independent theories maintain that this is not essential to domination. What is essential? Roughly, that A has an unchecked or uncontrolled power to impose their will on B, to shape the framework of choices available to B so that B is highly likely to cooperate with A. The disagreements among non-moralized/norm-independent theorists are about the kind of checks or control that might prevent domination, and about how imposition works.
Most non-moralized/norm-independent theories follow in the wake of neorepublicanism, and share its basic approach—theorizing domination in two movements: identifying a kind of power manifest in domination but also in non-dominating social relationships; then identifying the feature of domination that separates it from the power manifest in those non-dominating relationships. Usually, the second movement describes the controls or checks present in non-dominating social relationships and absent from the dominating ones. These two motives will be treated in order below:
First, what kind of social power is of interest to a theory of domination? Neorepublicans like Pettit focus on the capacity to interfere with an individual’s choices, by replacing, removing, and/or misrepresenting these choices. A can interfere with B’s choices by removing potential objects of choice: suppose A runs over B’s bicycle, destroying it. This removes the option of riding B’s bike. Suppose instead A knifes the tire: this replaces B’s option of riding their bike with another option: riding the bike after the tire is replaced or repaired. Removal and replacement are both objective forms of choice interference: mind-independent alternatives been removed or replaced. Misrepresentation of options is cognitive: e.g., A lies to B and says that only idiots have bikes like B’s. If B is credulous and refuses to ride their bike from embarrassment, A manages in this way to interfere with B by misrepresentation (see Pettit 2012).
This general emphasis on choice is what provokes the over-generalization worries already introduced (Shapiro 2012; Friedman 2008; Blunt 2015; McCammon 2015). Some choices clearly have more weight than others. Nobody thinks having no choice about where to sit in a café matters compared to having no choice about where to live. Connecting the former as well as the latter to dominating varieties of choice-interference, because both might represent, e.g., the removal or replacement of an option, seems to exaggerate the idea of domination. If, however, we want to keep domination and the reduction of freedom conceptually connected, there is reason to see domination in all power to interfere, at least when that power is outside the control of the interferee.
While Pettit analyzes domination in terms of choice-interference, his favorite heuristic focuses directly on dominated agents, and the way they are social related to their dominators. To be dominated, for Pettit, is to fail “the eyeball test”: i.e., you cannot “look others in the eye without reason for the fear or deference that a power of interference might inspire” (2012: 84). Other theories share this emphasis on domination as a kind of power within a social relationship and tend to prefer it to talk of choice-interference (Lovett 2010; McCammon 2015).
What is a social relationship? A’s social relatedness to B, first of all, seems to require strategic relatedness, in the sense that what B is likely to do is a function, at least in part, of what A does. To get from social relatedness to domination has other requirements. It is difficult to see how A could dominate B unless A has more power over B than B has over A within their social relationship. Further, for A to have power over B plausibly requires that B cannot easily exit the relationship. If someone can easily get a new job just as good as the one they have already, their “exit costs” are low, and they will have a correspondingly low dependence on the social relationship—probably too low for domination to occur (Lovett 2010). It may be that A’s power over B, and B’s exit costs from their social relationship, are not really separate conditions, that A’s power over B is a function of A’s control of resources B cannot access except through A (see Pansardi 2013).
A capacity for choice-interference, or social relatedness however rendered, is necessary but not sufficient for domination on a non-moralized/norm-independent theory. To get domination, something more is required than mere choice-interference or power within a social relationship.
Neorepublicans first referred to this “something more” as the arbitrariness of dominating power, and still do with some regularity, but Pettit himself now favors the language of control or the absence of control (2012: 57–58). This move was an attempt to emphasize the non-moralized nature of his theory. (For criticism connected to this shift in Pettit’s presentation, see especially Christman 1998, Costa 2007, and McMahon 2005.) The terminological shift was probably wise, given the natural tendency to contrast arbitrary power with power backed by good reasons or power put to good purpose. Arbitrary power, for neorepublicans, has never been merely unreasoned power. Though Pettit earlier emphasized the connection between arbitrary power and power that fails to track the “interests” of those subject to it, he measured interests not by an independent notion of the objective good or objectively reasonable, but by appeal to what interests are “avowed” or “avowal-ready” (2006: 275–276). The language of control also has echoes in his earlier work. For example, in Republicanism he says that an act is arbitrary “by virtue of the controls—or more precisely the lack of controls—under which it materializes” (1997: 55). This shift toward domination as uncontrolled power follows Pettit’s more recent attempts to contrast domination with well-constructed democracy, but the opposition of democratically constrained power and dominating power reflects his earlier insistence that we cannot know when power is arbitrary except “by recourse to public discussion in which people may speak for themselves and for the groups to which they belong” (1997: 56). Here, too, he connects his own theory to Iris Young’s account of domination in Justice and the Politics of Difference. Young says that domination is the “opposite” of “thorough social and political democracy” and defines life within structures of domination as living under others who
can determine without reciprocation the conditions of [the dominated person’s] actions, either directly or by virtue of the structural consequences of their actions. (1990 [2011: 38])
Of course, for a non-moralized theory, identifying domination as anti-democratic must involve a non-moralized account of democracy. This is not necessarily a problem, given that we can describe political institutions as “democratic” in a merely descriptive sense. (e.g., someone who says, “The expansion of the franchise leads to a more democratic society” might simply mean that a larger percentage of the population gets to vote and think that is a terrible idea and a reason not to expand the franchise.) What is more difficult is showing how even broadly democratic states are non-dominating if we think the absence of domination involves literal control of the state by those it governs. It is clear that the vast majority of individual citizens do not control their state in any meaningful way; given the enormity of contemporary states, it is unclear how they could. We might say that they should rest content with a fair share of control, or with a fair chance at control. But to say that we avoid domination when we have a fair share of control looks very much like a way of moralizing the theory, since fairness is clearly a moral notion. (Pettit’s primary attempt to explain non-domination in terms of democratic political arrangements can be found especially in the final three chapters of On the People’s Terms. For more interpretation and criticism of Pettit’s idea of control, see Arnold & Harris 2017, Mayer 2015, Schink 2013, Sharon 2015, Simpson 2017, and Kolodny forthcoming.)
Frank Lovett argues that avoiding domination does not require democracy, but instead subjecting the powerful to reliably enforced and widely known rules. Perhaps democracy does, in fact, most effectively reduce domination, but this should follow from substantive argument, not from the mere analysis of concepts (Lovett 2010). Also, there is reason to think that subordinate groups are less dominated whenever their overlords must abide by reliably enforced and widely known rules, even when those rules do not express the will of the subordinated in any way. Lovett uses the following case to make his point:
Suppose that for various historical, economic, and cultural reasons, one group in some society manages to acquire a preponderance of social power, which it wields over the other groups in that society directly and without constraint, much to its own benefit. Since the subordinate groups are in no position to challenge directly the preeminence of the powerful group, they instead demand only that the various rights and privileges of the latter be written down, codified, and impartially enforced by independent judges. In time, let us suppose, the powerful group accedes to this demand, on the view that since the rules will be designed to benefit them, after all, there will be no significant cost in their doing so. (2012: 147)
If power is organized and systematized in law, it does sound odd to call it arbitrary. After all, it may be entirely predictable in such circumstances. Lovett tacks closer to the commonsense idea that what is arbitrary is unpredictable, unreasoned, and unfettered by rules. He even claims that “real-world systems of domination” like Jim Crow and South African apartheid might cease to be dominating in possible worlds where they managed “strict adherence to explicit rules and procedures” (2010: 101). That such regimes would remain oppressive is obvious, but he believes this should be explained by the presence of other political evils than domination. Instead of a substantive account of arbitrary power—where power dominates when it isn’t forced to track the will of those subject to it—he recommends proceduralism: power dominates because it isn’t “reliably constrained by effective rules, procedures, or goals that are common knowledge to all persons or groups concerned” (Lovett 2010: 96–97; 2012; for more treatment of the debate between Pettit and Lovett about the nature of arbitrary power, see the section on “What Counts as Arbitrary Power?” in the entry on republicanism.)
Lovett’s arguments for proceduralism have provoked several clarifications of what substantivism requires. Proceduralism highlights what Gwilym David Blunt (2015) calls “sources” of domination that are personal as opposed to social, and “sites” of domination that are interactional as opposed to systemic. Widely known and reliably enforced checks on power, of the kind emphasized by proceduralism, really do reduce domination enabled by personal sources of power like A’s possession of more guns or guile than B, especially when this power is expressed in the interactions of A and B as individual agents. If A and B are neighbors, and A has a huge stockpile of weapons and B has none, it makes sense to think of B’s complaint against A as a matter of their intense vulnerability to power constrained only by A’s whims. Substantivism may be better equipped to recognize domination in what Blunt calls social “sources” and systemic “sites”. In actual systems of domination, A often has power over B not because A alone has more power (e.g., by having more guns of their own), but because A and B both live within a system intended to advantage A’s group and disadvantage B’s. Often, in such cases, A has power to adjust the system, or access to such power, while B does not.
There is another way to account for proceduralism’s insistence that reliably enforced, common-knowledge rules reduce domination even without democratic constraints. When A alone decides whether and how to harass B, A’s power to harass B is checked only by A’s sense of what is best or what should be done. Suppose A lives in a society that introduces a reliably enforced, common-knowledge rule that A can harass B only by putting B in the stocks but may not whip B. This changes the situation both for A and B. Now, A alone does not decide whether and how to harass B: now, A is not checked simply by what A thinks they have reason to do. In this way, A’s power is less “deliberatively isolated” (McCammon 2015). If this is right, domination can be reduced even by non-democratic reforms. However, laws and other limits on individual power may be formed by whole groups in a deliberatively isolated manner, as under Jim Crow and apartheid, if the members of A’s group have input into the rules, but the members of B’s group do not. Empowered groups often dictate the terms of their dealings with subordinated groups based only on their own sense of how things should be, and the deliberatively isolated power of groups may be strengthened by measures that reduce the deliberative isolation of individuals.
4.2 Moralized, Norm-Independent Theories
Norm-independent, moralized theories of domination are less influential than non-moralized varieties. Even so, their appeal is easy to see. There is straightforward reason to moralize domination: i.e., dominators use their power to do bad things. Slave masters rape and assault their slaves. Men within patriarchy rape and assault women. Domination allows evil deeds go unpunished. This impunity is perhaps what matters most to those who think of domination in a moralized way. To be sure, not that every act of moral wrong manifests domination. When a master tortures his slave, this is domination; but when a slave gets the drop on his master and tortures him it may not be, even on the assumption that both cases of torture are wrong. Why? The difference is in what the master will face as a consequence for torturing the slave, as opposed to what the slave will face for torturing the master. The master wrongs the slave with impunity; the slave wrongs the master only at grave risk from the enforcers of the system that enslaves him. To get domination instead of wrongdoing, it is necessary to include a requirement like this: as a first pass, A dominates B just because A can wrong B in the context of an asymmetric power relation favoring A. If A can wrong B with impunity, and B knows this, A will be well-positioned to exercise control over B. B will know that refusal to comply with A may result in violation of B’s rights or interests.
The most common approaches to moralization without norm-dependence couch domination in terms of violating “basic” or “best” interests. Allen (1999), Lukes (2005), and Wartenberg (1990) are primary advocates of a “basic” interests approach. Kittay (1999: 34), Laborde (2013: 285), and Shapiro (2012: 310; 2016: 23) share an emphasis on “best” interests. Shapiro looks to local custom for guidance about the standard for legitimate power, unless those customs dramatically undercut the interests of the less powerful. For example, he is happy to leave judgments of legitimate parental power to parents, except for those who would deny their children education and healthcare. The baseline is what is necessary to live as “a normal adult” in the context of contemporary democracies (2012: 294). Laborde moralizes basic interests by appeal to what “we have reason to value” (2013: 285), as opposed to what people might actually value. A non-moralized account of basic interests, of course, might connect interests to what people actually value, regardless of what they have reason to value. But this would leave us in the awkward position of being unable to recognize domination in brainwashed slaves who value their subordination.
4.3 Non-Moralized, Norm-Dependent Theories
When we take a hard look at the most obvious cases of domination—masters, tyrants, patriarchs—we’ll probably notice that they all claim authority. The Paradigms all typically think of themselves as the ones who make the rules, and that their subjects have an obligation to comply. To say that dominators, as such, always claim this kind of authority is to endorse a norm-dependent theory: that A dominates B by virtue of having a kind of socially legitimate power over them. Not all social power operates in this way—or doesn’t seem to. The neighborhood mob boss who comes by your shop demanding protection money almost certainly does not expect you to think of his command, “Pay up or else!”, as an expression of legitimate authority backed by sanctions. Plausibly, the typical mob boss cares only that you recognize him as a source of credible threats and comply. According to most norm-dependent theories, this means that the mob boss does not dominate. Domination is always power “under color of right”. The mob boss acts under no such colors. The patriarch, by contrast, believes that his commands create obligations for those within his household; and this - not merely his power to interfere with choice—is why he dominates. Here, norm-dependent theories part company from their norm-independent competitors: the latter will tend to see both the mob boss and the patriarch as sources of domination.
As canvassed above, norm-dependence and moralization are separate issues. We don’t need a theory of the right or the good to tell us whether someone has power legitimized by local social norms or laws. Of course, we do need a moral theory to tell us if social norms or laws are right or just or truly legitimate. As we will see in the next section, the most influential norm-dependent theories of domination tie it to a specific failure to respect the actual moral authority of the dominated, and so offer a moralized as well as norm-dependent theory.
Why prefer norm-dependence to norm-independence? Often, the move to norm-dependence is motivated by familiar worries about over-generalization. The world may be full of uncontrolled powers of choice interference, but it is less common for one agent to regard someone else as a source of binding norms. I may have an uncontrolled power to interfere with your choices whenever I can take the last seat in a café before you can get to it; this obviously has nothing to do with any kind of authority over you. The latter power seems less ubiquitous and more serious.
Also, norm-dependent, non-moralized conceptions are perhaps best equipped to diagnose domination where the dominated have internalized justifications for their status. Neorepublicans often highlight how victims of domination don’t have enough power to contest their position, but what about cases where victims of domination are unwilling to contest because they accept a worldview that justifies their domination? Michael Thompson calls such unwillingness a manifestation of constitutive domination: the way
norms, institutions, and values of the community shape the rationality of subjects to accept forms of power and social relations and collective goals as legitimate forms of authority. (2018: 44)
In so doing, he resists standard neorepublican talk of “arbitrary” power. Domination is constitutive just because it is not regarded as arbitrary by those under its sway. Instead, he claims, domination is the expression of widely rationalized and internalized norms. Certainly, if we agree that all power necessarily involves legitimacy claims (see Azmanova 2012: 49–50), it makes sense to think that intense varieties of social power, like domination, will go hand-in-hand with thoroughgoing acceptance of legitimacy claims.
According to Marxist and Marxist-inflected theories like Thompson’s, neorepublicans are misled by their paradigms. Neorepublicans get their touchstones of domination from slavery and traditional despotism—varieties supposedly more prevalent in pre-modern societies, where the threat of violence was the primary currency of domination. Instead, according to Marxist theories, we should see domination in the ideologies that make violence and coercion less necessary: for example, when the redistribution of pubic goods to private elites is widely accepted as natural or as the result of free exchange, even by many who suffer as a result.
The internalization by the dominated of norms supposedly legitimizing their domination is not the only way to connect domination to internalized norms. Christopher Lebron points to another possibility: perhaps what is necessary isn’t that the dominated accept a rationalization of their condition, but that the dominators do so. The difference between domination and more benign hierarchies, he claims, is that dominators control “legitimizing myths” that hide their domination. The simple fact that a worker has a boss does not indicate domination; it may instead indicate only a mutually beneficial arrangement (Lebron 2013: 56). A boss comes to dominate by accepting and promoting myths that justify their ascendance. What matters, on this account, is that the dominating group imbibe such myths, that their consciousness is shaped, e.g., so that their power is mistaken for a feature of nature, or a result of their innate merits or just deserts, not that the dominated manifest a consciousness so altered.
The norm-dependent theories encountered so far look to institutions and systems to embody and promote social norms. Regardless of whether institutions and systems themselves dominate, standard norm-dependent theories tend to see the existence of institutions as a necessary condition for domination through norms: e.g., the patriarch’s power to project authority in his family depends on widely accepted attitudes about the place of fathers in the institution of the family; the slave master’s power to project authority to his slaves depends on an economic and political system permitting property in human lives. Gwilym David Blunt’s theory stands apart by being norm-dependent without requiring background institutions. According to Blunt, even the mob boss has power over norms: in the language introduced above, this is an interactional site of domination drawn from a personal source: i.e., power between agents drawn from the mob boss’ personal control of guns and muscle. Unlike norm-independent theorists such as Lovett, Blunt claims that all social relationships involve norms. Insofar as the mob boss and the shop owner are socially related, this involves more than non-normative elements like strategic relatedness or exit costs. The asymmetry of power that matters is an asymmetry in the power to define the status of other parties in a social relationship. The mob boss has power enough to assign the shop owner an inferior place in their social relationships, and set up himself as the one who makes the rules in the relationship. In this way, Blunt believes he can preserve the standard neorepublican intuition that powerful agents like the mob boss can be dominators within a norm-dependent framework.
4.4 Moralized, Norm-Dependent Theories
It doesn’t look like we must appeal to moral concepts to say whether a powerful person can or cannot dictate social norms; but, for an influential cluster of theories, the norm-dependence of domination is constructed in specifically moral terms. This is an understandable move. After all, if we think domination is always expressed through norms, and we think that domination is morally illegitimate even when socially legitimate, it makes sense to think of domination as a specific failure to reckon with morally legitimate norms. For theories of domination that are moralized as well as norm-dependent, we diagnose domination not just as power expressed through authority claims, but as a specific kind of morally illegitimate authority.
Given that the most influential moralized/norm-dependent theories—Henry Richardson’s and Rainer Forst’s—developed either within or in direct response to neorepublicanism, it is not surprising to find here a similar two-movement approach to domination; first giving an account of power manifest in domination but also in benign forms of power, and second, giving an account of what makes domination distinct and unjust. For Richardson, the broader category of benign or even legitimate power is the power to “modify the rights and duties of others” (2002: 34). An agent may have this power without dominating anyone; dominators exercise an unauthorized variety of this “normative power”. Richardson here is motivated again by the desire to steer around what he thinks are neorepublican false positives: criminals like the mob boss do not, he claims, dominate. If an uncontrolled capacity to interfere with choice dominates, we are dominated by the mere possibility that our neighbors will slash our tires in the night. Secret tire-slashing may be arbitrary choice-interference, but it serves no obvious role in wielding normative power.
Forst favors the language of reasons in identifying the broader category of power of which domination is a subset. All social power, he says, is power “within the space of reasons”—specifically justifying reasons. This is why he calls his account of power noumenal: power is not based merely on the control of material resources, but instead on influence over what other agents see as justified thought or action. That you have a lot of some material resource—say, money—is irrelevant from the perspective of power unless you can use it to alter what others think they have most reason to do. In general, Forst says, power is “the capacity of A to motivate B to think or do something that B would otherwise not have thought or done” (2015: 115). It is clear enough that such power has innocent varieties: when a teacher shows a student a new way to solve a math problem, they motivate them to think and do in ways they would not otherwise. Gentle persuasion between friends manifests the same power.
So, both Richardson and Forst try to situate domination within a broader, essentially normative phenomenon, the power to place others under [supposed] duties or the power to affect what others regard as justified. What, then, makes domination distinct and unjust? For both Richardson and Forst, domination involves a violation of our rights relative to the normative domain. Dominators claim authority or power within the space of reasons that properly belongs to the dominated. Domination is power unbound by the moral standing of its victims as co-authors of the norms that bind them. For Richardson, who focuses specifically on power in the political context, the arbitrariness of normative power manifests itself along several moralized dimensions: dominating power fails to express “fair” deliberative processes among “free and equal citizens” that respect “fundamental rights and liberties” (2002: 52). The slave master dominates because he takes for himself a power that belongs properly to his slaves: we have a moral right to decide together what our political rights and duties will be. He is able to do this because his role as a master of slaves has institutional support. If one of his slaves runs away, he can call on the state to track the slave down and return them. This is how real dominators are distinct from deluded claimants to normative power. Imagine a mob boss who comes to believe that he speaks for God. He might believe that he has a power to create rights and duties; even so, without social and legal backing analogous to what a tyrant or slave master or patriarch can depend on, the mob boss will not succeed even in creating illegitimate rights and duties—and so will fail to dominate on a theory like Richardson’s.
Similarly, Forst measures dominating power against an explicitly moralized baseline—power dominates to the extent that it is exercised outside a structure of democratic institutions designed to secure and respect the equal authority of each citizen to offer and receive adequate justifications (Forst 2013). Noumenal power within social relationships becomes domination when agents within that relationship are denied their right to justification: i.e., their right to participate as free equals in the space of reasons (2015: 116–117). Interestingly, Forst’s theory, like Blunt’s non-moralized theory and unlike Richardson’s, apparently allows for domination outside official structures of authority. Dominators, Forst says, “seal off” the space of reasons by denying our right to receive and offer adequate justifications, but there are many ways to do this. One way is simply through the threat of violence. If a mob boss has all the guns and muscle, he will be able to crowd the shop owner completely out of the justificatory space. What the shop owner might believe about what they have reason to think and do is irrelevant, given the price they will pay for non-compliance.
Again, if we understand the power required for domination as a kind of authority, it makes sense to diagnose the presence or absence of domination in terms of illicit authority. When illicit normative authority counts as such because it is claimed by a powerful few, we are pushed firmly in the direction of a reckoning with the normative authority of all. Of course, once this reckoning has begun, it is natural to diagnose domination in broadly Kantian terms as the absence of institutions securing respect for our autonomy. (See Bohman 2004 for a similar approach applied to international relations.)
Norm-dependent or moralized theories identify domination with some varieties of unrestrained asymmetric power and not others, whether it be power to dictate the norms of a social relationship, to establish legitimizing narratives, to alter the shape of our supposed rights and duties, to close us off from the space of reasons, to violate our basic interests, or to do us wrong. This makes them more vulnerable to the possibility that domination can take some form not captured by any of these specific powers. Lovett—an advocate of a non-moralized, norm-independent theory—worries that moralized or norm-dependent theories tend toward a kind of historical or cultural myopia, seeing domination only in whatever “forms of social power happen to be the predominant instruments of domination” here and now or in time gone by (2010: 92). He recommends we see some of the powers highlighted by moralized or norm-dependent theories as varieties of domination, but remain alert to other forms it might assume. Of course, devotees of moralization or norm-dependency may respond that the leading non-moralized/norm-independent contenders see domination where there is none, fail to see its specific threat, or cry “domination” where some other social evil is really the problem.
5. Domination and Applied Ethics
Because power asymmetries persist in other contexts outside the traditionally political, the idea of domination has been marshaled beyond political philosophy in applied ethics. Anti-domination approaches have an ecumenical appeal. Few deny that the paradigms are examples of injustice; thus, to show that some power structure or use of power resembles these paradigms goes a long way toward motivating a verdict against them. Awareness of domination also draws our attention to the ways moral wrong can be manifest outside the limits of individual actions. Aside from questions about which individual actions are wrong, other questions become important. Who is empowered to act in what ways? How are potential victims empowered to resist? Who is vulnerable even if not actually victimized? However benevolent, who makes the rules? Who obeys or refuses to obey, and what does their compliance (or refusal) cost them? How do the actions of those with more power construct the space where the less powerful or the powerless must act?
Medical care (or the failure to provide it) is rife with potential for domination. The sick are vulnerable to those who control what they need to get well (O’Shea 2017, 2018). The disabled choose and act in a world constructed almost entirely for the benefit of and controlled by others (De Wispelaere & Casassas 2014). Workers often have little say in the conditions or culture of their workplaces (Gourevitch 2011; Breen 2015; Anderson 2017). Migrant and immigrant populations usually exist in political limbo where they are deeply vulnerable to exploitation and have no legal standing to contest their treatment (Honohan 2014; Costa 2016; Sager 2017). The consumption habits of wealthy nations shape a global environment in which all humans now and for the foreseeable future will make their choices (Bohman 2011; Nolt 2011; Smith 2012; Smith 2013; Katz 2017).
Most deployment of anti-domination arguments applies neorepublican theories of domination, but there are important exceptions. In addition to the departures from neorepublican accounts noted above in Friedman’s and Kittay’s work on caregivers and families, other attempts to use domination beyond the traditionally political have yielded revisionary results. For example, Tom O’Shea worries that the standard neorepublican focus on choice interference, and the worsening of an agent’s choice situation, leaves us ill-equipped to see the possibility for “assistive arbitrary power” in medical care. In these cases, the sick may be vulnerable to domination not because someone acts intentionally to interfere with their choices—e.g., by raising the price of a drug beyond what they can afford—but by failing to provide a benefit, as when no one will provide transportation to someone with impaired mobility. In a more dramatic departure, Corey Katz argues that the tendency of mainstream neorepublicanism to ground domination in social relatedness and the possibility for choice interference makes it unfit to diagnose the domination of those yet to be born (2017). If we want to think of intergenerational injustice as a variety of domination, Katz insists, we must shift to an outcome-based conception that focuses on unjust harm done to future generations, who are unable to resist that harm.
Nothing is less surprising than persistent disagreement in philosophy, but the persistence of disagreement about domination is connected to an interesting question about where the discussion should go from here: What do we want a theory of domination to do? Is our theory of domination supposed to tell us when people are free and when they are not? Do we want our theory of domination to give us insight into the nature of social injustice? To diagnose political misrule? To motivate a theory of democracy? To describe the underclass in late capitalist societies? To capture the complaint of racial minorities in oppressive racialized hierarchies? All of the above? All theories of domination are not equally suited to each of these tasks; as a consequence, the appeal of individual theories may differ according to which we find most pressing.
A related question, at present under-explored in the literature, is how domination does or does not relate to other concepts often used to describe power-related injustices: for example, exploitation, oppression, and subjugation. Young (1990 ) distinguishes between domination and oppression, identifying the former with asymmetric power over action and the contexts of action, and the latter with the more diffuse and sometimes unconscious shaping of institutions in ways that deny some social groups the capacity to understand and express themselves except from the perspective of the privileged. Unfortunately, few have followed her in working out a similar division of labor between these concepts. (For an interesting exceptions, see Bellamy 2007: 151–152.) More common is the neorepublican assumption that concern for injustices like oppression can be folded into concern for domination (Pettit 1997: 80). Just as all theories of domination are not equally suited to every task we might put them to, it may be that attention to domination itself should be supplemented by attention to other varieties of injustice. If nothing else, recent work on domination has dramatically sharpened our understanding of such injustice, even if all its varieties cannot usefully be diagnosed as manifestations of this single ill.
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Other Internet Resources
- Pettit, Philip, 2003, Republicanism, the first entry on republicanism in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2003 Edition).
Many thanks to the participants in The Philosophical Underclass. Without your help, it would have been very much more difficult to gather the literature I needed to write this.