Dreams and Dreaming
Dreams and dreaming have been discussed in diverse areas of philosophy ranging from epistemology to ethics, ontology, and more recently philosophy of mind and cognitive science. This entry provides an overview of major themes in the philosophy of sleep and dreaming, with a focus on Western analytic philosophy, and discusses relevant scientific findings.
- 1. Dreams and epistemology
- 2. The ontology of dreams
- 3. Dreaming and theories of consciousness
- 4. Dreaming and the self
- 5. Immorality and moral responsibility in dreams
- 6. The meaning of dreams and the functions of dreaming
- 7. Conclusions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Dreams and epistemology
1.1 Cartesian dream skepticism
Dream skepticism has traditionally been the most famous and widely discussed philosophical problem raised by dreaming (see Williams 1978; Stroud 1984). In the Meditations, Descartes uses dreams to motivate skepticism about sensory-based beliefs about the external world and his own bodily existence. He notes that sensory experience can also lead us astray in commonplace sensory illusions such as seeing things as too big or small. But he does not think such cases justify general doubts about the reliability of sensory perception: by taking a closer look at an object seen under suboptimal conditions, we can easily avoid deception. By contrast, dreams suggest that even in a seemingly best-case scenario of sensory perception (Stroud 1984), deception is possible. Even the realistic experience of sitting dressed by the fire and looking at a piece of paper in one’s hands (Descartes 1641: I.5) is something that can, and according to Descartes often does, occur in a dream.
There are different ways of construing the dream argument. A strong reading is that Descartes is trapped in a lifelong dream and none of his experiences have ever been caused by external objects (the Always Dreaming Doubt; see Newman 2019). A weaker reading is that he is just sometimes dreaming but cannot rule out at any given moment that he is dreaming right now (the Now Dreaming Doubt; see Newman 2019). This is still epistemologically worrisome: even though some of his sensory-based beliefs might be true, he cannot determine which these are unless he can rule out that he is dreaming. Doubt is thus cast on all of his beliefs, making sensory-based knowledge slip out of reach.
Cartesian-style skeptical arguments have the following form (quoted from Klein 2015):
- If I know that p, then there are no genuine grounds for doubting that p.
- U is a genuine ground for doubting that p.
- Therefore, I do not know that p.
If we apply this to the case of dreaming, we get:
- If I know that I am sitting dressed by the fire, then there are no genuine grounds for doubting that I am really sitting dressed by the fire.
- If I were now dreaming, this would be a genuine ground for doubting that I am sitting dressed by the fire: in dreams, I have often had the realistic experience of sitting dressed by the fire when I was actually lying undressed in bed!
- Therefore, I do not know that I am now sitting dressed by the fire.
Importantly, both strong and weak versions of the dream argument cast doubt only on sensory-based beliefs, but leave other beliefs unscathed. According to Descartes, that 2+3=5 or that a square has no more than 4 sides is knowable even if he is now dreaming:
although, in truth, I should be dreaming, the rule still holds that all which is clearly presented to my intellect is indisputably true. (Descartes 1641: V.15)
By Descartes’ lights, dreams do not undermine our ability to engage in the project of pure, rational enquiry (Frankfurt 1970; but see Broughton 2002).
1.2 Earlier discussions of dream skepticism and why Descartes’ version is special
Dream arguments have been a staple of philosophical skepticism since antiquity and were so well known that in his objections to the Meditations, Hobbes (1641) criticized Descartes for not having come up with a more original argument. Yet, Descartes’ version of the problem, more than any other, has left its mark on the philosophical discussion.
Earlier versions tended to touch upon dreams just briefly and discuss them alongside other examples of sensory deception. For example, in the Theaetetus (157e), Plato has Socrates discuss a defect in perception that is common to
dreams and diseases, including insanity, and everything else that is said to cause illusions of sight and hearing and the other senses.
This leads to the conclusion that knowledge cannot be defined through perception.
Dreams also appear in the canon of standard skeptical arguments used by the Pyrrhonists. Again, dreams and sleep are just one of several conditions (including illness, joy, and sorrow) that cast doubt on the trusthworthiness of sensory perception (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers; Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism).
Augustine (Against the Academics; Confessions) thought the dream problem could be contained, arguing that in retrospect, we can distinguish both dreams and illusions from actual perception (Matthew 2005: chapter 8). And Montaigne (The Apology for Raymond Sebond) noted that wakefulness itself teems with reveries and illusions, which he thought were even more epistemologically worrisome than nocturnal dreams.
Descartes devoted much more space to the discussion of dreaming and cast it as a unique epistemological threat distinct from both waking illusions and evil genius or brain-in-a-vat-style arguments. His claim that he has often been deceived by his dreams implies he also saw dreaming as a real-world (rather than merely hypothetical) threat.
This is further highlighted by the intimate, first-person style of the Meditations. Their narrator is supposed to exemplify everyone’s epistemic situation, illustrating the typical defects of the human mind. Readers are further drawn in by Descartes’ strategy of moving from commonsense examples towards more sophisticated philosophical claims (Frankfurt 1970). For example, Descartes builds up towards dream skepticism by first considering familiar cases of sensory illusions and then deceptively realistic dreams.
Finally, much attention has been devoted to several dreams Descartes reportedly had as a young man. Some believe these dreams embodied theoretical doubts he developed in the Discourse and Meditations (Baillet 1691; Leibniz 1880: IV; Cole 1992; Keefer 1996). Hacking (2001:252) suggests that for Descartes, dream skepticism was not just a philosophical conundrum but a source of genuine doubt. There is also some discussion about the dream reports’ authenticity (Freud 1940; Cole 1992; Clarke 2006; Browne 1977).
1.3 Dreaming and other skeptical scenarios
In the Meditations, after discussing the dream argument, Descartes raises the possibility of an omnipotent evil genius determined to deceive us even in our most basic beliefs. Contrary to dream deception, Descartes emphasizes that the evil genius hypothesis is a mere fiction. Still, it radicalizes the dream doubt in two respects. One, where the dream argument left the knowability of certain general truths intact, these are cast in doubt by the evil genius hypothesis. Two, where the dream argument, at least on the weaker reading, involves just temporary deception, the evil genius has us permanently deceived.
One modernized version, the brain-in-a-vat thought experiment, says that if evil scientists placed your brain in a vat and stimulated it just right, your conscious experience would be exactly the same as if you were still an ordinary, embodied human being (Putnam 1981). In the Matrix-trilogy (Chalmers 2005), Matrixers live unbeknownst to themselves in a computer simulation. Unlike the brain-in-a-vat, they have bodies that are kept alive in pods, and flaws in the simulation allow some of them to bend its rules to their advantage.
Unlike dream deception, which is often cast as a regularly recurring actuality (cf. Windt 2011), brain-in-a-vat-style arguments are often thought to be merely logically or nomologically possible. However, there might be good reasons for thinking that we actually live in a computer simulation (Bostrom 2003), and if we lend some credence to radical skeptical scenarios, this may have consequences for how we act (Schwitzgebel 2017).
Even purely hypothetical skeptical scenarios may enhance their psychological force by capitalizing on the analogy with dreams. Clark (2005) argues that the Matrix contains elements of “industrial-strength deception” in which both sensory experience and intellectual functioning are exactly the same as in standard wake-states, whereas other aspects are more similar to the compromised reasoning and bizarre shifts that are the hallmark of dreams.
1.4 Descartes’ solution to the dream problem and real-world dreams
At the end of the Sixth Meditation, Descartes suggests a solution to the dream problem that is tied to a reassessment of what it is like to dream. Contrary to his remarks in the First Meditation, he notes that dreams are only rarely connected to waking memories and are often discontinuous, as when dream characters suddenly appear or disappear. He then introduces the coherence test:
But when I perceive objects with regard to which I can distinctly determine both the place whence they come, and that in which they are, and the time at which they appear to me, and when, without interruption, I can connect the perception I have of them with the whole of the other parts of my life, I am perfectly sure that what I thus perceive occurs while I am awake and not during sleep. (Meditation VI. 24)
For all practical purposes, he has now found a mark by which dreaming and waking can be distinguished (cf. Meditation I.7), and even if the coherence test is not fail-safe, the threat of dream deception has been averted.
Descartes’ remarks about the discontinuous and ad hoc nature of many dreams are backed up by empirical work on dream bizarreness (see Hobson 1988; Revonsuo & Salmivalli 1995). Still, many of his critics were not convinced this helped his case against the skeptic. Even if Descartes’ revised phenomenological description characterizes most dreams, one might occasionally merely dream of successfully performing the test (Hobbes 1641), and in some dreams, one might seem to have a clear and distinct idea but this impression is false (Bourdin 1641). Both the coherence test and the criterion of clarity and distinctness would then be unreliable.
How considerations of empirical plausibility impact the dream argument continues to be a matter of debate. Grundmann (2002) appeals to scientific dream research to introduce an introspective criterion: when we introspectively notice that we are able to engage in critical reflection, we have good reason to think that we are awake and not dreaming. However, this assumes critical reasoning to be uniformly absent in dreams. If attempts at critical reasoning do occur in dreams and if they generally tend to be corrupted, the introspective criterion might again be problematic (Windt 2011, 2015a). There are also cases in which even after awakening, people mistake what was in fact a dream for reality (Wamsley et al. 2014). At least in certain situations and for some people, dream deception might be a genuine cause of concern (Windt 2015a).
2. The ontology of dreams
In what follows, the term “conscious experience” is used as an umbrella term for the occurrence of sensations, thoughts, impressions, emotions etc. in dreams (cf. Dennett 1976). These are all phenomenal states: there is something it is like to be in these states for the subject of experience (cf. Nagel 1974). To ask about dream experience is to ask whether it is like something to dream while dreaming, and whether what it is like is similar to (or relevantly different from) corresponding waking experiences.
2.1 Are dreams experiences?
Cartesian dream skepticism depends on a seemingly innocent background assumption: that dreams are conscious experiences. If this is false, then dreams are not deceptive experiences during sleep and we cannot be deceived, while dreaming, about anything at all. Whether dreams are experiences is a major question for the ontology of dreams and closely bound up with dream skepticism.
The most famous argument denying that dreams are experiences was formulated by Norman Malcolm (1956, 1959). Today, his position is commonly rejected as implausible. Still, it set the tone for the analysis of dreaming as a target phenomenon for philosophy of mind.
For Malcolm, the denial of dream experience followed from the conceptual analysis of sleep: “if a person is in any state of consciousness it logically follows that he is not sound asleep” (Malcolm 1956: 21). Following some remarks of Wittgenstein’s (1953: 184; see Chihara 1965 for discussion), Malcolm claimed
the concept of dreaming is derived, not from dreaming, but from descriptions of dreams, i.e., from the familiar phenomenon that we call “telling a dream”. (Malcolm 1959:55)
Malcolm argued that retrospective dream reports are the sole criterion for determining whether a dream occurred and there is no independent way of verifying dream reports. While first-person, past-tense psychological statements (such as “I felt afraid”) can at least in principle be verified by independent observations (but see Canfield 1961; Siegler 1967; Schröder 1997), he argued dream reports (such as “in my dream, I felt afraid”) are governed by different grammars and merely superficially resemble waking reports. In particular, he denied dream reports imply the occurrence of experiences (such as thoughts, feelings, or judgements) in sleep:
If a man had certain thoughts and feelings in a dream it no more follows that he had those thoughts and feelings while asleep, than it follows from his having climbed a mountain in a dream that he climbed a mountain while asleep. (Malcolm 1959/1962: 51–52)
What exactly Malcolm means by “conscious experience” is unclear. Sometimes he seems to be saying that conscious experience is conceptually tied to wakefulness (Malcolm 1956); other times he claims that terms such as mental activity or conscious experience are vague and it is senseless to apply them to sleep and dreams (Malcolm 1959: 52).
Malcolm’s analysis of dreaming has been criticized as assuming an overly strict form of verificationism and a naïve view of language and conceptual change. A particularly counterintuitive consequence of his view is that there can be no observational evidence for the occurrence of dreams in sleep aside from dream reports. This includes behavioral evidence such as sleepwalking or sleeptalking, which he thought showed the person was partially awake; as he also thought dreams occur in sound sleep, such sleep behaviors were largely irrelevant to the investigation of dreaming proper. He also claimed adopting a physiological criterion of dreaming (such as EEG measures of brain activity during sleep) would change the concept of dreaming, which he argued was tied exclusively to dream reporting. This claim was particularly radical as it explicitly targeted the discovery of REM sleep and its association with dreaming (Dement & Kleitman 1957), which is commonly regarded as the beginning of the science of sleep and dreaming. Malcolm’s position was that the very project of a science of dreaming was misguided.
Contra Malcolm, most assume that justification does not depend on strict criteria with the help of which the truth of a statement can be determined with absolute certainty, but “on appeals to the simplicity, plausibility, and predictive adequacy of an explanatory system as a whole” (Chihara & Fodor 1965: 197). In this view, behavioral and/or physiological evidence can be used to verify dream reports (Ayer 1960) and the alleged principled difference between dream reports and other first-person, past-tense psychological sentences (Siegler 1967; Schröder 1997) disappears.
Putnam noted that Malcolm’s analysis of the concept of dreaming relies on the dubious idea that philosophers have access to deep conceptual truths that are hidden to laypeople:
the lexicographer would undoubtedly perceive the logical (or semantical) connection between being a pediatrician and being a doctor, but he would miss the allegedly “logical” character of the connection between dreams and waking impressions. […] this “depth grammar” kind of analyticity (or “logical dependence”) does not exist. (Putnam 1962 : 306)
Nagel argued that even if one accepts Malcolm’s analysis of the concept of dreaming,
it is a mistake to invest the demonstration that it is impossible to have experiences while asleep with more import than it has. It is an observation about our use of the word “experience”, and no more. It does not imply that nothing goes on in our minds while we dream. (Nagel 1959: 114)
Whether dream thoughts, feelings or beliefs should count as real instances of their kind now becomes an open question, and in any case there is no conceptual contradiction involved in saying one has experiences while asleep and dreaming.
2.2 Dreams as instantaneous memory insertions
To ask about dream experience is also to ask whether there is something it is like to dream during sleep as opposed to there just being something it is like to remember dreaming after awakening. Dennett’s (1976, 1979) cassette theory says dreams are the product of instantaneous memory insertion at the moment of the awakening, as if a cassette with pre-scripted dreams had been inserted into memory, ready for replay. Dennett claims the cassette theory and the view that dreams are experiences can deal equally well with empirical evidence for instance on the relationship between dreaming and REM sleep. The cassette theory is preferable because it is more parsimonious, positing only an unconscious dream composition process rather than an additional conscious presentation process in sleep. For Dennett, the important point is that it is impossible to distinguish between the two rival theories based on dream recall; the question of dream experience should be settled by independent empirical evidence.
While Dennett shares Malcolm’s skepticism about dream experience, this latter claim is diametrically opposed to Malcolm’s rejection of a science of dreaming. For Dennett, the unreliability of dream recall also is not unique, but exemplifies a broader problem with memory reports: we generally cannot use retrospective recall to distinguish conscious experience from memory insertion (Dennett 1991; see also Emmett 1978).
An earlier and much discussed (Binz 1878; Goblot 1896; Freud 1899; Hall 1981; Kramer 2007:22–24) version of Dennett’s cassette theory goes back to Maury’s (1861) description of a long and complex dream about the French revolution that culminated in his execution at the guillotine, at which point Maury suddenly awoke to find that the headboard had fallen on his neck. Because the dream seemed to systematically build up to this dramatic conclusion, which in turn coincided with a sudden external event, he suggested that such cases were best explained as instantaneous memory insertions experienced at the moment of awakening. Similarly, Gregory (1916) described dreams are psychical explosions occurring at the moment of awakening.
The trustworthiness of dream reports continues to be contentious. Rosen (2013) argues that dream reports are often fabricated and fail to accurately describe experiences occurring during sleep. By contrast, Windt (2013, 2015a) argues that dream reports can at least under certain conditions (such as in laboratory studies, when dreams are reported immediately after awakening by trained participants) be regarded as trustworthy sources of evidence with respect to previous experience during sleep.
2.3 Empirical evidence on the question of dream experience
Unlike Malcolm, many believe that whether dreams are experiences is an empirical question; and unlike Dennett, the predominant view is that the empirical evidence does indeed support this claim (Flanagan 2000; Metzinger 2003; Revonsuo 2006; Rosen 2013; Windt 2013, 2015a).
A first reason for thinking that dreams are experiences during sleep is the relationship between dreaming and REM (rapid eye movement) sleep. Researchers in the 1950s discovered that sleep is not a uniform state of rest and passivity, but there is a sleep architecture involving different stages of sleep that is relatively stable both within and across individuals (Aserinsky & Kleitman 1953, 1955; Dement & Kleitman 1957). Following sleep onset, periods of non-REM (or NREM) sleep including slow wave sleep (so called because of the presence of characteristic slow-wave, high-voltage EEG activity) are followed by periods of high-frequency, low-voltage activity during REM sleep. EEG measures from REM sleep strongly resemble waking EEG. REM sleep is additionally characterized by rapid eye movements and a near-complete loss of muscle tone (Dement 1999: 27–50; Jouvet 1999).
The alignment between conscious experience on the one hand and wake-like brain activity and muscular paralysis on the other hand would seem to support the experiential status of dreams as well as explain the outward passivity that typically accompanies them. Reports of dreaming are in fact much more frequent following REM (81.9%) than NREM sleep awakenings (43%; Nielsen 2000). REM reports tend to be more elaborate, vivid, and emotionally intense, whereas NREM reports tend to be more thought-like, confused, non-progressive, and repetitive (Hobson et al. 2000). These differences led to the idea that REM sleep is an objective marker of dreaming (Dement & Kleitman 1957; Hobson 1988: 154).
Attempts to identify dreaming with mental activity during REM sleep have not, however, been successful, and many now hold that dreams can occur in all stages of sleep (e.g., Antrobus 1990; Foulkes 1993b; Solms 1997, 2000; Domhoff 2003; Nemeth & Fazekas 2018). In recent years there has been renewed interest in NREM sleep for the study of dreaming (Noreika et al. 2009; Siclari et al. 2013, 2017). This suggests the inference from the physiology of REM sleep to the phenomenology of dreaming is not straightforward.
A second line of evidence comes from lucid dreams, or dreams in which one knows one is dreaming and often has some level of dream control (Voss et al. 2013; Voss & Hobson 2015; Baird et al. 2019). The term lucid dreaming was coined by van Eeden (1913), but Aristotle (On Dreams) already noted that one can sometimes be aware while dreaming that one is dreaming.
Scientific evidence that lucid dreaming is real and a genuine sleep phenomenon comes from laboratory studies (Hearne 1978; LaBerge et al. 1981) showing lucid dreamers can use specific, pre-arranged patterns of eye movements (e.g., right-left-right-left) to signal in real-time that they are now lucid and engaging in dream experiments. These signals are clearly identifiable on the EOG and suggest a correspondence between dream-eye movements and real-eye movements (as predicted by the so-called scanning hypothesis; see Dement & Kleitman 1957; Leclair-Visonneau et al. 2010). Retrospective reports confirm that the dreamer really was lucid and signalled lucidity (Dresler et al. 2012; Stumbrys et al. 2014).
Signal-verified lucid dreams have been used to study muscular activity accompanying body movements in dreams (Erlacher et al. 2003; Dresler et al. 2011), for advanced EEG analysis of brain activity during lucid dreaming (Voss et al. 2009), and imaging studies (Dresler et al. 2011, 2012). Eye signals can also be used to measure the duration of different activities performed in lucid dreams; contrary to the cassette theory, lucid dreams have temporal extension and certain dream actions even seem to take slightly longer than in waking (Erlacher et al. 2014). There have also been attempts to induce lucidity through non-invasive electrical stimulation during sleep (Stumbrys et al. 2013; Voss et al. 2014). The combination of signal-verified lucid dreaming with volitional control over dream content, retrospective report, and objective sleep measures has been proposed to provide controlled conditions for the study of conscious experience in sleep and a new methodology for investigating the relationship between conscious experience and neurophysiological processes (Baird et al.2019).
A third line of evidence (Revonsuo 2006: 77) comes from dream-enactment behavior (Nielsen et al. 2009), most prominently in patients with REM-sleep behavior disorder (RBD; Schenck & Mahowald 1996; Schenck 2005; Leclair-Visonneau et al. 2010). Due to a loss of the muscular atonia that accompanies REM sleep in healthy subjects, these patients show complex, seemingly goal-directed outward behaviors such as running or fighting off an attacker during REM sleep. Retrospective dream reports often match these behaviors, suggesting that patients literally act out their dreams during sleep.
While persuasive, these lines of evidence might not satisfy skeptics about dream experience. They might worry that results from lucid dreaming and dream enactment do not generalize to ordinary, non-lucid dreams; they might also construe alternative explanations that do not require conscious experience in sleep. There are also methodological concerns, for instance about how closely sleep-behaviors actually match dream experience. A key issue is that to support the experiential status of dreams, evidence from sleep polysomnography, signal verified lucid dreams, or sleep behavior requires convergence with retrospective dream reports. This means trusting dream reports is built into any attempt to empirically resolve the question of dream experience – which then invites the familiar skeptical concerns. Again, an anti-skeptical strategy may be to appeal to explanatory considerations. In this view, the convergence of dream reports and objective polysomnographic or behavioral observations is best explained by the assumption that dreams are experiences in sleep, and this assumption is strengthened by further incoming findings. This strategy places dream reports at the center of scientific dream research while avoiding the contentious claim that their trustworthiness, and with it the experiential status of dreams, can be demonstrated conclusively by independent empirical means (Windt 2013, 2015a).
2.4 Dreams and hallucinations
Even where philosophers agree dreams are experiences, they often disagree on how exactly to characterize dreaming relative to wake-state psychological terms. Often, questions about the ontology of dreaming intersect with epistemological issues. Increasingly, they also incorporate empirical findings.
The standard view is that dreams have the same phenomenal character as waking perception in that they seemingly put us in contact with mind-independent objects, yet no such object is actually being perceived. This means dreams count as hallucinations in the philosophical sense (Crane & French 2017; Macpherson 2013). Even if, in a particularly realistic dream, my visual experience was exactly as it would be if I were awake (I could see my bedroom, my hands on the bed sheets, etc.), as long as my eyes were closed during the episode, I would not, literally, be seeing anything.
There is some controversy in the psychological literature about whether dreams should be regarded as hallucinations. Some believe the term hallucination should be reserved for clinical contexts and wake-state pathologies (Aleman & Larøi 2008: 17; but see ffytche 2007; ffytche et al. 2010).
The view that dreams involve hallucinations is implicit in Descartes’ assumption that even when dreaming,
it is certain that I seem to see light, hear a noise, and feel heat; this cannot be false, and this is what in me is properly called perceiving (sentire). (Descartes 1641: II.9)
It also lies at the heart of Aristotle’s (On Dreams) assumption that dreams result from the movements of the sensory organs that continue even after the original stimulus has ceased. He believed that in the silence of sleep, these residual movements result in vivid sensory imagery that is subjectively indistinguishable from genuine perception (see also Dreisbach 2000; Barbera 2008).
The assumption of phenomenological equivalence between dream and waking experience can also be found in Berkeley’s (1710: I.18) idealist claim that the existence of external bodies is not necessary for the production of vivid, wake-like perceptual experience. Similarly, Russell defended sense-data theory by noting that in dreams,
I have all the experiences that I seem to have; it is only things outside my mind that are not as I believe them to be while I am dreaming. (Russell 1948: 149–150)
Elsewhere, he argued dreams and waking life
must be treated with equal respect; it is only by some reality not merely sensible that dreams can be condemned. (Russell 1914: 69)
Hume was less clear on this matter, proposing that dreams occupy an intermediate position between vivid and largely non-voluntary sensory impressions and ideas, or “the faint images of previous impressions in thinking and reasoning” (Hume 1739: 126.96.36.199). On the one hand, as mere creatures of the mind, Hume wanted to categorize dreams as ideas. On the other hand, he acknowledged that in sleep, “our ideas can approach the vivacity of sensory impressions” (Hume 1739: 188.8.131.52). Dreams do not fit comfortably into Hume’s attempt to draw a dichotomous distinction between impressions, including perception, and ideas, including sensory imagination (Ryle 1949; Waxman 1994; Broughton 2006).
Phenomenologists often focus not so much on the quality of dream imagery as on the overall character of experience, noting that dreams are experienced as reality; as in waking perception, we simply feel present in a world. This also sets dreams apart from waking fantasy and daydreams (Husserl 1904/1905; Uslar 1964; Conrad 1968; Globus 1987: 89.
At its strongest, the hallucination view claims that dreaming and waking experience are identical in both the quality of sensory imagery and their overall, self-in-a-world structure (Revonsuo 2006: 84). This claim is central to the virtual reality metaphor, according to which consciousness itself is dreamlike and waking perception a kind of online hallucination modulated by the senses (Llinás & Ribary 1994; Llinás & Paré 1991; Revonsuo 2006; Metzinger 2003, 2009).
This seems to be empirically supported. Neuroimaging studies (Dang-Vu et al. 2007; Nir & Tononi 2010; Desseilles et al. 2011) show that the predominance of visual and motor imagery as well as strong emotions in dreams is paralleled by high activation of the corresponding brain areas in REM sleep, which may exceed waking; at the same time, the cognitive deficits often thought to characterize dreams such as the loss of self-awareness, the absence of critical thinking, delusional reasoning, and mnemonic deficits fit in well with the comparative deactivation of frontal areas (Hobson et al. 2000). Hobson (1988, Hobson et al. 2000) has argued that the vivid, hallucinatory character of dreaming results from the fact that in REM sleep, the visual and motor areas are activated in the same way as in waking perception, the sole difference being dreams’ dependence on internal signal generation. Horikawa and colleagues (2013) used neuroimaging data from sleep onset to predict the types of objects described in mentation reports, which they took to support the perceptual equivalence between dreaming and waking.
Generally, versions of the hallucination view that suggest dreams replicate all aspects of waking perception are too vague to be informative. Especially for subtle perceptual activities (such as visual search), we might not know enough about dream phenomenology to make any strong claims (Nielsen 2010). Specifying points of similarity leads to a more informative and precise, but likely also more nuanced view. Dreams are heterogeneous, and some might be more perception-like while others resemble imagination (Windt 2015a). There might also be differences between or even within specific types of imagery. For example, visual imagery might be quite different from touch sensations, which tend to be rare in dreams (Hobson 1988). Visual dream imagery might overall resemble waking perception but lack color saturation, background detail and focus (Rechtschaffen & Buchignani, 1992). Classifying dreams as either hallucinatory or imaginative is further complicated by the fact that there is strong overlap in cortical activity associated with both visual imagery and perception (Zeidman & Maguire, 2016). This means even a strong overlap in cortical activity between, say, visual dream imagery and visual perception does not necessarily set dreaming apart from waking imagination.
This is also true for evidence on eye movements in dreams. LaBerge and colleagues (2018) recently showed that eye tracking of objects is smooth in lucid dreaming and perceiving, but not in imagining. Drawing from this evidence, Rosen (forthcoming) suggests many dreams mimic the phenomenology of interacting with a stable world, including eye movements and visual search. Others argue we should not analogize dream imagery to mind-independent, scannable objects and that eye movements might instead be implicated in the generation of dream imagery (Windt 2018).
2.5 Dreams and illusions
Another way to make sense of the claim that dreaming has the same phenomenal character as waking perception is to say some kinds of dream imagery are illusory: they involve misperception of an external object as having different properties than it actually has (cf. Smith 2002; Crane & French 2017). The illusion view disagrees with the hallucination view on whether dreams have a contemporaneous external stimulus source.
The illusion view has fallen out of favor but has a long history. The Ancients believed dreams have bodily sources. This idea underlies the practice of using dreams to diagnose illness, as practiced in the shrines at Epidaurus (Galen On Diagnosis in Dreams; van de Castle 1994). Aristotle (On Dreams) thought some dreams are caused by indigestion, and Hobbes adopted this view, claiming different kinds of dreams could be traced to different bodily sensations. For instance, “lying cold breedeth Dreams of Feare, and raiseth the thought and Image of some fearfull object” (Hobbes 1651: 91).
Appeals to the bodily sources of dreaming became especially popular in the 19th and early 20th centuries. Many believed specific dream themes such as flying were linked to sleeping position (Macnish 1838; Scherner 1861; Vold 1910/1912; Ellis 1911) and realizing, in sleep, that one’s feet are not touching the ground (Bergson 1914).
There were also attempts to explain the phenomenology of dreaming by appealing to the absence of outward movement. The lack of appropriate feedback and of movement and touch sensations was thought to cause dreams of being unable to move (Bradley 1894) or of trying but failing to do something (Gregory 1918).
Some proponents of the “Leibreiztheorie” (or somatic-stimulus theory) of dreaming attempted to go beyond anecdotal observations to conduct controlled experiments. Weygandt (1893) investigated the influence of various factors including breathing, blood circulation, temperature changes, urge to urinate, sleeping position, and visual or auditory stimulation during sleep on dream content (see Schredl 2010 for details). Singer (1924) proposed experiments on stimulus incorporation in dreams can inform claims on the ontology of dreaming: If dreams are sensations, a particular auditory stimulus should increase the frequency of dreams in nearby sleepers as well as the frequency of sound in their dreams, and it should decrease the range of quality and intensity of these dreams, making them overall more similar and predictable.
Newer studies provide evidence for the incorporation of external stimuli in dreams, including light flashes, sounds, sprays of water applied to the skin (Dement & Wolpert 1958), thermal (Baldridge 1966), electrical (Koulack 1969), and verbal stimuli (Berger 1963; Breger et al. 1971; Hoelscher et al., 1981), as well as blood pressure cuff stimulation on the leg (Nielsen et al. 1995; Sauvageau et al. 1998).
Muscular activity also often leaves its mark on dreams. It occurs throughout sleep but is especially frequent in REM sleep, mostly in the form of twitching but occasionally also in the form of larger, seemingly goal-directed movements (Blumberg 2010; Blumberg & Plumeau 2016). The relation between outward and dream movements is complex: in some cases, outward movements might mirror dream movements, while in others, sensory feedback might prompt dream imagery (Windt 2018).
Generally, it seems external and bodily stimuli can be related to varying degrees to dream and sleep onset imagery (Nielsen 2017; Windt 2018; Windt et al. 2016). Some of these cases appear to fit the concept of illusion, as in when the sound of the alarm clock is experienced, in a dream, as a siren, or when blood pressure cuff inflation on the leg leads to dreams of wearing strange shoes (Windt 2018; for these and other examples, see Nielsen et al. 1995). In other cases, such as when blood pressure cuff stimulation on the leg prompts a dream of seeing someone else’s leg being run over, describing this as illusory misperception might be less straightforward.
Saying that dreams can be prompted by external stimuli and that in some cases these are best described as illusions is different from the stronger claim, sometimes advanced by historical proponents of somatic-stimulus theory, that dreams generally are caused by external or bodily stimuli. As an example of the stronger claim, consider Wundt’s proposal that the
ideas which arise in dreams come, at least to a great extent, from sensations, especially from those of the general sense, and are therefore mostly illusions of fancy, probably only seldom pure memory ideas which hence become hallucinations. (Wundt 1896: 179)
This claim is likely too strong. It is also likely that appeals to external or bodily stimuli on their own cannot fully explain dream imagery, including when and how external stimuli are incorporated in dreams. Sensory incorporation in dreams is often hard to predict and indirect; associated imagery seems related not just to stimulus intensity, but also to short- and long term memories. A full explanation of dream content additionally has to take the cognitive and memory sources of dreaming into account (Windt 2018; Nielsen 2017; cf. Silberer 1919).
2.6 Dreams as imaginative experiences
The most important rival to the hallucination view is that dreams are imaginative experiences (Liao & Gendler 2019; Thomas 2014). This can mean dream imagery involves imaginings rather than percepts (including hallucinations or illusions; McGinn 2004), that dream beliefs are imaginative and not real beliefs (Sosa 2007), or both (Ichikawa 2008, 2009). An important advantage is that by assimilating dreams to commonplace mental states such as waking fantasy and daydreaming, rather than a rare and often pathological occurrence such as hallucinations, it provides a more unified account of mental life (Stone 1984). However, the reasons for adopting the imagination view are diverse, and dreams have been proposed to resemble imaginings and differ from perception along a number of dimensions (e.g. McGinn 2004, 2005a,b; Thomas 2014). This issue is complicated by the fact that there is little agreement on the definition of imagination and its relation to perception (Kind 2013).
One way is to deny dreams involve presence or the feeling of being in a world, which many believe is central to waking perception. Imagination theorists compare the sense in which we feel present in our dreams to cognitive absorption, as when we are lost in a novel, film, or vivid daydream (Sartre 1940; McGinn 2004; but see Hering 1947; Globus 1987). Some argue that reflexive consciousness or meta-awareness (as in lucid dreams) interrupts cognitive absorption and terminates the ongoing dream (Sartre 1940), essentially denying lucid dreams are possible.
Another issue is whether dreams are subject to the will (Ichikawa 2009). Imagination is often characterized as active and under our control (Wittgenstein 1967: 621, 633), involving “a special effort of the mind” (Descartes 1641: VI, 2), whereas perception is passive. Because dreams just seem to happen to us without being under voluntary control, they present an important challenge for the imagination view. Ichikawa (2009) argues lucid control dreams show dreams are generally subject to the will even where they are not under deliberate control.
Dreams are widely described as more indeterminate than waking perception (James 1890: 47; Stone 1984). In scientific dream research, vagueness is regarded as one of three main subtypes of bizarreness (Hobson 1988; Revonsuo & Salmivalli 1995). An example are dream characters who are identified not by their behavior or looks, but by just knowing (Kahn et al. 2000, 2002; Revonsuo & Tarkko 2002). Dreams are also attention-dependent and lack foreground-background structure (Thompson 2014); while it is tempting to construe the dream world as rich in detail, there is no more to dreams than meets the eye, and many think dream experience is exhausted by what is the focus of selective attention (Hunter 1983; Thompson 2014).
Indeterminacy is also related to the question of whether we dream in color or in black and white. Based on a review of historical and recent studies, Schwitzgebel (2002, 2011) argues there has been a shift in theories on dream color that coincides with the rise first of black-and-white and then color television. He argues it is unlikely that dreams themselves changed from colored to black and white and back to colored, proposing that a change in opinion is a more plausible explanation. Maybe dreams were either black and white or colored all along; or maybe they are indeterminate with respect to color, as may be the case for imagined or fictional objects; were this the case, it would strengthen the imagination view (Ichikawa 2009). Schwitzgebel’s main point is that reports of colored dreaming are unreliable and our opinions about dreams can be mistaken (but see Windt 2013, 2015a). This relates to Schwitzgebel’s (2011; Hurlburt & Schwitzgebel 2007) general skepticism about the reliability of introspection.
The issue of dream color has led to a number of follow-up studies (Schwitzgebel 2003; Schwitzgebel et al. 2006; Murzyn 2008; Schredl et al. 2008; Hoss 2010). They suggest most people dream in color and a small percentage describe grayscale or even mixed dreams (Murzyn 2008) or dreams involving moderate color saturation (Rechtschaffen and Buchignani 1992). Indeterminacy is rarely reported.
The imagination view has consequences for Cartesian dream skepticism. If dream pain does not feel like real pain, there is a fail-safe way to determine whether one is now dreaming: one need only pinch oneself (Nelson 1966; Stone 1984; but see Hodges & Carter 1969; Kantor 1970). As Locke put it,
if our dreamer pleases to try, whether the glowing heat of a glass furnace, be barely a wandering imagination in a drowsy man’s fancy, by putting his hand into it, he may perhaps be wakened into a certainty greater than he could wish, that it is something more than bare imagination. (Locke 1689: IV.XI.8)
If dreaming feels different from waking, this raises the question why we tend to describe dreams in the same terms as waking perception. Maybe this is because most people haven’t thought about these matters and they would find the imagination view plausible if they considered it (Ichikawa 2009). Or maybe
it is just because we all know that dreams are throughout unlike waking experiences that we can safely use ordinary expressions in the narration of them. (Austin 1962: 42)
Some authors classify dreams as imaginings while acknowledging they feel like perceiving. For example, Hobbes describes dreams as “the imaginations of them that sleep” (Hobbes 1651: 90), and imagination as a “decaying sense” (Hobbes 1651: 88). Yet he also uses the concepts of imagination and fancy to describe perception and argues “their appearance to us is Fancy, the same waking, that dreaming” (Hobbes 1651: 86).
In the scientific literature, the imagination view is complemented by cognitive theories. Foulkes (1978: 5) describes dreaming as a form of thinking with its own grammar and syntax, but allows that dream imagery is sufficently perception-like to deceive us. Domhoff’s neurocognitive model of dreaming (2001, 2003) emphasizes the dependence of dreaming on visuospatial skills and on a network including the association areas of the forebrain. The theory draws from findings on the partial or global cessation of dreaming following brain lesions (cf. Solms 1997, 2000), evidence that dreaming develops gradually and in tandem with visuospatial skills in children (Foulkes 1993a, 1999; but see Resnick et al. 1994), and results from dream content analysis supporting the continuity of dreaming with waking concerns and memories (the so-called continuity hypothesis; see Domhoff 2001, 2003; Schredl & Hofmann 2003; Schredl 2006; see also Nir & Tononi 2010).
2.7 Dreaming and waking mind wandering
A number of researchers have begun to consider dreaming in the context of theories of mind wandering. Mind wandering is frequent in waking and involves spontaneous thoughts that unfold dynamically and are only weakly constrained by ongoing tasks and environmental demands (Schooler et al. 2011; Smallwood & Schooler 2015; Christoff et al. 2016). Based on phenomenological and neurophysiological similarities, dreams have been proposed to be an intensified form of waking mind wandering (Pace-Schott 2007, 2013; Domhoff 2011; Wamsley 2013; Fox et al. 2013). This basic idea seems to have been anticipated by Leibniz, who noted that the spontaneous formation of visions in dreams surpasses the capacity of our waking imagination (Leibniz, Philosophical Papers and Letters, Vol. I, 177–178).
The analogy between dreams and waking mind wandering has been discussed in the context of cognitive agency. Metzinger (2013a,b, 2015) describes dreams and waking mind wandering as involving a cyclically recurring loss of mental autonomy, or the ability to deliberately control one’s conscious thought processes. Dreams and waking mind wandering are not mental actions but unintentional mental behaviors, comparable to subpersonal processes such as breathing or heartbeat. Because dreaming and waking mind wandering make up a the majority of our conscious mental lives, he argues that cognitive agency and mental autonomy are the exception, not the rule.
This raises the question of how to make sense of lucid control dreams, which involve both meta-awareness and agency. Windt and Voss (2018) argue that in such cases, spontaneous processes including imagery formation co-exist alongside more deliberate, top-down control; they also argue metacognitive insight and control themselves can have spontaneous elements. This suggests spontaneity and control are not opposites, but a more complex account is needed. Possibly, certain dreams and instances of waking mind wandering can be both spontaneous and agentive.
The analogy with mind wandering might help move forward the debate on the ontology of dreaming. In this debate, a common assumption is that dreams can be categorized as either hallucinatory or imaginative. Yet the application of these terms to dreams quickly runs into counterexamples and it is unclear they are mutually exclusive. One option is pluralism (Rosen 2018b), in which some aspects of dreaming are hallucinatory, others imaginative, and yet again others illusory. Another is that dreams are sui generis, combining aspects associated with wake states such as hallucinating, imagining, or perceiving in a novel manner without mimicking them completely. Windt (2015a) proposes that mind wandering, which describes a range of mental states loosely characterized by their spontaneous and dynamic character, might be particularly suitable for the characterization of dreaming precisely because that term leaves open more specific questions on the phenomenology of dreaming, allowing for variation in control, determinacy, and so on. This might be a good starting point for describing what is unique about dreaming while also acknowledging continuities across sleep-wake states and capitalizing on the strengths of the hallucination, illusion, imagination, and cognitive views.
2.8 The problem of dream belief
The second strand of the imagination view argues that dream beliefs are not real beliefs, but propositional imaginings. This may or may not be combined with the claim that dream imagery is imaginative rather than perceptual (Sosa 2007; Ichikawa 2009).
Denying that dream beliefs have the status of real beliefs only makes sense before the background of a specific account of what beliefs are and how they are distinguished from other mental states such as delusions or propositional imaginings. For instance, Ichikawa (2009) argues that if we follow interpretationist or dispositionalist accounts of belief, dream beliefs fall short of real beliefs. He claims dream beliefs lack connection with perceptual experience and fail to motivate actions; consequently, they do not have the same functional role as real beliefs. Moreover, we cannot ascribe dream beliefs to a person by observing them lying asleep in bed. Dream beliefs are often inconsistent with longstanding waking beliefs and acquired and discarded without any process of belief revision (Ichikawa 2009).
This analysis of dream beliefs has consequences for skepticism. If dream beliefs are propositional imaginings, then we do not falsely believe while dreaming that we are now awake, but only imagine that we do (Sosa 2007). It is not clear though that this protects us from deception. If dream beliefs fall short of real beliefs, this might even make the specter of dream deception more worrisome: in mistaking dream beliefs for the real thing, we would now be deceived about the status of our own mental states (Ichikawa 2008).
It is also not clear whether the same type of argument extends to mental states other than beliefs. As Lewis points out, a person might
in fact believe or realize in the course of a dream that he was dreaming, and even if we said that, in such case, he only dreamt that he was dreaming, this still leaves it possible for someone who is asleep to entertain at the time the thought that he is asleep. (Lewis 1969: 133)
Mental states other than believing such as entertaining, thinking, or minimally appraisive instances of taking for granted might be sufficient for deception (Reed 1979).
The debate about dream beliefs is paralleled by a debate about whether delusions are beliefs or imaginings (see Currie 2000; Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; McGinn 2004; Bayne & Pacherie 2005; Bortolotti 2009; Gendler 2013). Both debates might plausibly inform each other, especially as dreams are sometimes proposed to be delusional (Hobson 1999).
3. Dreaming and theories of consciousness
3.1 Dreaming as a model system and test case for consciousness research
Dreams are a global state of consciousness in which experience arises under altered behavioral and neurophysiological conditions as compared to standard wakefulness; unlike other altered states of consciousness (such as drug-induced or deep meditative states) and pathological wake states (such as psychosis or neurological syndromes), dreams occur spontaneously and regularly in healthy subjects. For both reasons, many regard dreams as a test case for theories of consciousness or even an ideal model system for consciousness research (Churchland 1988; Revonsuo 2006).
Existing proposals differ on the phenomenology of dreaming: referring to dream bizarreness, Churchland describes dream experience as robustly different from waking, whereas Revonsuo argues dreaming is similar to waking and the purest form of experience:
the dreaming brain brings out the phenomenal level of organization in a clear and distinct form. Dreaming is phenomenality pure and simple, untouched by external physical stimulation or behavioural activity. (Revonsuo 2006: 75)
Revonsuo argues dreaming reveals the basic, state-independent structure of consciousness to be immersive: “dreaming depicts consciousness first and foremost as a subjective world-for-me” (Revonsuo 2006: 75). This leads him to introduce the “world-simulation metaphor of consciousness”, according to which consciousness itself is essentially simulational and dreamlike. This is taken to support internalism about conscious experience.
This latter claim is also contentious. Noë (2004: 213) argues that phenomenological differences between dreaming and waking (such as greater instability of visual dream imagery) result from the lack of dynamic interaction with the environment in dreams. He proposes this shows that neural states are sufficient for dreaming but denies they are also sufficient for perceptual experience.
A possible problem for both views is their reliance on background assumptions about the phenomenology of dreaming and its disconnection from environmental stimuli and bodily sensations. Windt (2015a, 2018) argues both internalism and externalism mistakenly assume dreams to be isolated from external sensory input and own-body perception; she believes both the phenomenology of dreaming and its correlation with external stimuli are complex and variable. She argues the analysis of dreaming does not clearly support either side in the debate on internalism vs externalism (but see Rosen 2018a). Generally, in the absence of a well worked out theory of dreaming and its sleep-stage and neural correlates, proposals for using dreaming as a model system or test case run the risk of relying on an oversimplified description of the target phenomenon (Windt & Noreika 2011).
Recent accounts appealing to generative models and predictive processing (Clark 2013b; Hohwy 2013) suggest a new, unified account of perception, imagination, and dreaming. In these accounts, different mental states, including perception and action, embody different strategies of hypothesis testing and prediction error minimization. Perception is the attempt to model the hidden external causes of sensory stimuli; action involves keeping the internal model stable while changing the sensory input. Clark argues that on such a model,
systems that know how to perceive an object as a cat are thus systems that, ipso facto, are able to use a top-down cascade to bring about the kinds of activity pattern that would be characteristic of the presence of a cat. […] Perceivers like us, if this is correct, are inevitably potential dreamers and imaginers too. Moreover, they are beings who, in dreaming and imagining, are deploying many of the very same strategies and resources used in ordinary perception. (Clark 2013a: 764)
Predictive processing accounts have also been used to explain specific features of dreaming. Bizarreness has been associated with the comparative lack of external stimulus processing, implying dream imagery is relatively unconstrained by prediction errors (cf. Hobson & Friston 2012; Fletcher & Frith 2008; Bucci & Grasso 2017). Windt (2018) suggests a predictive processing account of dream imagery generation that links bodily self-experience to own-body perception and subtle motor behaviors such as twitching in REM sleep (Blumberg 2010; Blumberg & Plumeau 2016). She argues that movement sensations in dreams, in relation to REM-sleep related muscle twitching, involve a form of bodily self-sampling in which coordinated muscular activity contributes to the generation and maintenance of a body model. This is important because in predictive processing accounts neither the bodily nor the external causes of sensory inputs are known; at the same time, having an accurate body model is a prerequisite for action, requiring the system to disambiguate between self- and other generated changes to sensory inputs. Especially in early development, sleep might provide the ideal conditions for exploring one’s own body via subtle but coordinated muscular activity while processing of visual and auditory stimuli is reduced.
Dreams have also been suggested as a test case for whether phenomenal consciousness can be divorced from cognitive access (e.g., Block 2007; but see Cohen & Dennett 2011). Sebastián (2014a) argues that dreams provide empirical evidence that conscious experience can occur independently of cognitive access. This is because during (non-lucid) REM-sleep dreams, the dorsolateral prefrontal cortex (dlPFC) as the most plausible mechanism underlying cognitive access is selectively deactivated (see also Pantani et al. 2018). This would challenge theories linking conscious experience to access, such as higher-order-thought theory (Sebastián 2014b). However, both the hypoactivation of the dlPCF in REM sleep and its association with cognitive access have been debated. Fazekas and Nemeth (2018) suggest that certain kinds of cognitive access may be independent of dlPFC activation, necessitating a more complex account.
3.2 Dreams, psychosis, and delusions
Dreaming has been suggested as a model system not just of waking consciousness in general, but also of psychotic wake states in particular. The analogy between dreaming and madness has a long philosophical history (Plato, Phaedrus; Kant 1766; Schopenhauer 1847) and finds particularly stark expression in Hobson’s claim that “dreaming is not a model of a psychosis. It is a psychosis. It’s just a healthy one” (Hobson 1999: 44). Gottesmann (2006) proposes dreaming as a neurophysiological model of schizophrenia. There is a rich discussion on the theoretical and methodological implications of dream research for psychiatry (see Scarone et al. 2007; d’Agostino et al. 2013; see Windt & Noreika 2011 as well as the other papers in this special issue) and a number of studies have investigated differences in dream reports from schizophrenic and healthy subjects (Limosani et al. 2011a,b).
Rather than likening dreaming to waking in general or specific wake states such as psychosis, there have also been attempts to compare specific dream phenomena to wake-state delusions. Gerrans (2012, 2013, 2014) focuses on character misidentification in dreams and delusions of hyperfamiliarity (such as the Frégoli delusion, in which strangers are mistakenly identified as family members, and déjà vu) to argue that anomalous experience and faulty reality testing both play a role in delusion formation. Rosen (2015) analyzes instances of thought insertion and of auditory hallucinations, which are key symptoms of schizophrenia, to raise broader questions about the altered sense of agency in dreams as compared to waking.
3.3 Beyond dreams: Dreamless sleep experience and the concepts of sleep, waking, and consciousness
Philosophers have focused almost exclusively on dreaming, largely leaving to the side questions about dreamless sleep including whether it is uniformly unconscious. In recent years there has been a surge of interest in the possibility of dreamless sleep experience and foundational issues about the definition of sleep and waking. This has been paralleled by growing interest in dreaming in NREM sleep.
Conceptually, interest in dreamless sleep experience has been facilitated by the precise definition of dreaming offered by simulation views (Revonsuo et al. 2015). If dreams are immersive sleep experiences characterized by their here-and-now structure, it makes sense to ask whether this is true for all or just a subset of sleep-related experiences and whether non-immersive sleep experiences exist. By contrast, if dreaming is broadly identified with any conscious mentation in sleep (Pagel et al. 2001), there is no conceptual space for dreamless sleep experience.
Following Thompson's (2014, 2015) discussion of dreamless sleep in Indian and Buddhist philosophy, Windt and colleagues (2016; see also Windt 2015b) introduce a framework for different kinds of dreamless sleep experience ranging from thinking and isolated imagery, perception, or bodily sensations, where these lack integration into a scene, to minimal kinds of experience lacking imagery or specific thought contents. A possible example of minimal phenomenal experience in sleep are white dreams, where people report having had experiences during sleep but cannot remember any details. Taken at face value, some white dream reports might describe experiences that lack reportable content (Windt 2015b); others might describe forgotten dreams or dreams with degraded content (Fazekas et al. 2018). Another example are reports of witnessing dreamless sleep, as described in certain meditation practices. This state is said to involve non-conceptual awareness of sleep, again in the absence of imagery or specific thought contents, and loss of sense of self (Thompson 2014, 2015). Some schools in Buddhist philosophy explain claims of deep and dreamless sleep by saying we never fully lose consciousness in sleep (Prasad 2000, 66; and Thompson 2014, 2015).
Empirically, interest in dreamless sleep experience is paralleled by increasing interest in experiences in NREM sleep (Fazekas et al. 2018). Most researchers now accept that dreaming is not confined to REM sleep, but also occurs at sleep onset and in NREM sleep. The deeper stages of NREM sleep are particularly interesting as they involve roughly similar proportions of dreaming, unconscious sleep, and white dreams (Noreika et al. 2009: Siclari et al. 2013, 2017). In the search for the neural correlates of dreaming vs unconscious dreamless sleep, this makes comparisons within the same sleep stage possible and avoids confounds involved in comparing presumably dreamful REM sleep with presumably dreamless NREM sleep. Findings suggest that activity in the same parietal hot zone underlies dreaming in both NREM and REM sleep (Siclari et al. 2017).
Where sleep and dream research have traditionally tried to identify the sleep stage correlates of dreaming, newer research suggests local changes occurring independently of sleep stages might in fact be more relevant. Traditionally regarded as global, whole-brain phenomena, there is now increasing evidence that sleep itself is locally driven, and local changes in sleep depth might be associated with changes in sleep-related experience (Siclari & Tononi 2017; Andrillon et al. 2019). While sleep and dream research are often considered as separate fields, changes in how sleep in general and sleep stages in particular are defined appear closely associated with changes in the theoretical conception of dreaming and its empirical investigation.
Historically, discoveries about dreaming have precipitated changing conceptions of sleep (for an excellent history of the study of sleep and dreaming, see Kroker 2007). Following Aristotle (On Sleeping and Waking), sleep was traditionally defined in negative terms as the absence of wakefulness and perception. This is still reflected in Malcolm’s assumption that “to a person who is sound asleep, ‘dead to the world’, things cannot even seem” (Malcolm 1956: 26). With the discovery of REM sleep, sleep came to be regarded as a heterogeneous phenomenon characterized by the cyclic alteration of different sleep stages. REM sleep was now considered as “neither sleeping nor waking. It was obviously a third state of the brain, as different from sleep as sleep is from wakefulness” (Jouvet 1999: 5). The folk-psychological dichotomy between sleep and wakefulness now seemed oversimplified and empirically implausible. At the same time dreaming, which had previously been considered as an intermediate state of half-sleeping and half-waking, came to be regarded as a genuine sleep phenomenon, but narrowed to REM sleep. Today, the framework for describing dreams and other sleep-related experiences is more precise, but dreaming has also been cast adrift from REM sleep.
A closely associated issue is how to define waking. Crowther’s (2018) capacitation thesis casts waking consciousness as a state in which the individual is fully switched on to their environment, but also to their own epistemic (cf. O’Shaugnessy 2002) and agentive potential; the waking individual is empowered to act and think in certain ways, though this potential need not be actualized. By contrast, dreaming is an “imagining-of consciousness” (O’Shaughnessy 2002: 430) and consciousness is conceptually tied to wakefulness. Because in lucid dreams, the epistemic and agentive profile of waking is at least partly realized, they might, according to Crowther, be regarded as closer to waking than nonlucid dreams.
This account of waking and sleep may also have consequences for the imagination model of dreaming and dream skepticism (Soteriou 2017). As in the imagination model, dreaming would be passive and action, including cognitive agency, would be tied to waking. If dreaming nonetheless involved passive episodes of imagining oneself to be active, one would be unable to tell that one were dreaming and imagining, as this insight would require the exercise of real agency. The sceptical consequence would be that when dreaming, one would lose agency as well as the capacity to gain insight into one’s current state. Yet our ability to know we are waking when waking would be unscathed; according to Soteriou, waking would thus have an epistemic function connected to the capacity to exercise agency over our mental lives.
Finally, definitions of consciousness themselves are bound up with conceptions of sleep and dreaming. As dreaming went from a state whose experiential status was doubted to being widely recognized as a second global state of consciousness, consciousness sometimes came to be defined contrastively as that which disappears in deep, dreamless sleep and reappears in waking and dreaming (Searle 2000; Tononi 2008). In light of dreamless sleep experience, such definitions are problematic (Thompson 2014, 2015; Windt 2015b; Windt et al. 2016). Dreamless sleep experience has been proposed to be particularly relevant for understanding minimal phenomenal experience, or the conditions under which the simplest kind of conscious experience arises (Windt 2015b). The investigation of dreamless sleep might thus shed light on the transition from unconscious sleep to sleep-related experience.
4. Dreaming and the self
We almost always have a self in dreams, though this self can sometimes be a slightly different (e.g. older or younger) version of our waking self or even a different person entirely. Dreams therefore raise interesting questions about the identity between the dream and waking self. Locke (1689) invites us to imagine two men alternating in turns between sleep and wakefulness and sharing one continuously thinking soul (Locke 1689: II.I.12). He argues that if one man retained no memory of the soul’s thoughts and perceptions while it was linked to the other man’s body, they would be distinct persons. His position is that personal identity depends on psychological continuity, including recall: in the absence of recall, as illustrated by the toy example of two people sharing one soul, continuous conscious thinking does not suffice for identity. Locke also rejects the possibility of unrecalled dreams and the idea that we dream throughout sleep, remembering only a small proportion of our dreams (Locke 1689: II.I.19).
Valberg distinguishes between the subject of the dream (i.e., the dream self) and the sleeping person who is the dreamer of the dream and recalls it upon awakening (Valberg 2007). He argues that awakening from a dream involves crossing a chasm between discrete worlds with discrete spaces and times; it does not make sense to say that “the ‘I’ at these times [is] a single individual who crosses from one world to the other” (Valberg 2007: 69). According to Valberg, this is relevant to dream skepticism because there is no simple way to make sense of the claims that it is I who emerge from a dream or that I was the victim of dream deception.
Vicarious dreams, or dreams in which the protagonist of the dream seems to be a different person from the dreamer, are particularly puzzling with respect to identity. They may even raise the question of whether the dream self has an independent existence (Rosen & Sutton 2013: 1047). Such dreams are superficially similar to cases in which we imagine being another person, but according to Rosen and Sutton require a different explanation: in the case of dreaming, the imagined person’s thoughts are not framed as diverging from one’s own and one does not retain one’s own perspective in addition to the imagined one; in nonlucid dreams, only the perspective of the dream’s protagonist is retained.
The dream self is also at the center of simulation views of dreaming, which define dreaming via its immersive, here and now character as the experience of a self in a world. This leads to further questions about the phenomenology of self-experience in dreams and how it is different from waking self-experience. Different versions of the simulation view focus on different aspects of self- and world experience in dreams, ranging from social simulation (Revonsuo et al. 2015) to the typical features of selfhood in dreams (Revonsuo 2005, 2006, Metzinger 2003, 2009) to the minimal conditions for experiencing oneself as a self in dreams and what this tells us about minimal phenomenal selfhood in general (Windt 2015a, 2018). Yet these different versions of the simulation view are largely complementary and together have forged unity in a field that was previously hampered by lack of agreement about the definition of dreaming. They also integrate the philosophy of dreaming and scientific dream research.
As so often in debates about dreaming, there is disagreement about basic phenomenological questions. Revonsuo (2005) describes self-experience including bodily experience in dreams as identical to waking, whereas Metzinger (2003, 2009; see also Windt & Metzinger 2007) argues that important layers of waking self-experience (such as autobiographical memory, agency, a stable first-person perspective, metacognitive insight, and self-knowledge) are missing in nonlucid dreams. He argues this is due to the cognitive and mnemonic deficit that characterizes nonlucid dreams (cf. Hobson et al. 2000). Windt (2015a) analyzes the range of cognitive and bodily self-experience in dreams, both of which she describes as variable. She argues that in a majority of cases, dreams are weakly phenomenally embodied states in which bodily experience is largely related to movement sensations but a detailed and integrated body representation is lacking; instead, bodily experience in dreams is largely indeterminate (for an attempt to test this empirically, see Koppehele-Gossel et al. 2016). She proposes this is because dreams are also weakly functionally embodied states, in which the specific pattern of bodily experience reflects altered processing of bodily sensations (as in the illusion view). She also analyzes instances of bodiless dreams, in which dreamers say they experienced themselves as disembodied entities, to argue that self-experience can be reduced to pure spatiotemporal-self-location (Windt 2010); she proposes these cases can help identify the conditions for the emergence of minimal phenomenal selfhood (Blanke & Metzinger 2009; see also Metzinger 2013b).
5. Immorality and moral responsibility in dreams
How the phenomenology of dreaming compares to waking and what to say about how the dream self relates to the waking self bears on questions about the moral status of dreams. For Augustine (Confessions) dreams were a cause of moral concern because of their indistinguishability from waking life. What particularly worried him about dreams of sexual acts was their vividness, as well as the feeling of pleasure and seeming acquiescence or consent on the part of the dreamer. He concluded, however, that the transition from sleep to wakefulness involves a radical chasm, enabling the dreamer to awaken with a clear conscience and absolving them from taking responsibility for their dream actions.
What exactly Augustine thought the chasm between dreaming and waking consists in allows for different interpretations (Matthews 1981). Firstly, if the dream and waking self are not identical, then waking Augustine is not morally responsible for dream-Augustine’s actions. Secondly, actions performed in dreams might be morally irrelevant because they did not really happen. And thirdly, assuming that moral responsibility requires the ability to act otherwise, dreams provide no grounds for moral concern because we cannot refrain from having certain types of dreams.
The issue of dream immorality may also present a choice point between different accounts of moral evaluation. Where internalists assume the moral status of a person’s actions is entirely determined by internal factors such as intentions and motives, externalists look beyond these to the effects of actions. Driver (2007) argues that the absurdity of dream immorality itself should count against purely internalist accounts; yet she also acknowledges this absurdity is not a necessary feature of dreams.
Central to the question of dream immorality is the status of dreams as actions rather than mere behaviors. Mullane (1965) argues that while we don’t have full control over our dreams, they are not completely involuntary either; as is the case for blushing, considerable effort is required to attain control over our dreams and in some cases they can even be considered as actions. That lucid dream control is, to some extent, a learnable skill (Stumbrys et al. 2014) lends some support to this claim.
6. The meaning of dreams and the functions of dreaming
6.1 The meaning of dreams
Philosophical discussions of dreaming tend to focus on (a) dream deception and (b) questions about the ontology of dreaming, its moral status, etc., that tend to intersect with dream skepticism. By contrast, the main source of interest in dreams outside of philosophy traditionally has been dream interpretation and whether dreams are a source of knowledge and insight. Historically, the epistemic status of dreams and the use of prophetic and diagnostic dreams was not just a theoretical, but a practical problem (Barbera 2008). Different types of dreams were distinguished by their putative epistemic value. Artemidorus, for instance, used the term enhypnion to refer to dreams that merely reflect the sleeper’s current bodily or psychological state and hence do not merit further interpretation, whereas he reserved the term oneiron for meaningful and symbolic dreams of divine origin.
The practice of dream interpretation was famously attacked by Aristotle in On Prophecy in Sleep. He denied that dreams are of divine origin, but allowed that occasionally, small affections of the sensory organs as might stem from distant events that cannot be perceived in waking are perceptible in the quiet of sleep. He also believed such dreams were mostly likely to occur in dullards whose minds resemble an empty desert – an assessment that was not apt to encourage interest in dreams (Kroker 2007: 37). A similarly negative view was held by early modern philosophers who believed dreams were often the source of superstitious beliefs (Hobbes 1651; Kant 1766; Schopenhauer 1847).
In Freudian dream theory, dream interpretation once more assumed a prominent role as the royal road to knowledge of the unconscious. This was associated with claims about the psychic sources of dreaming. Freud (1899) also rejected the influence of external or bodily sources, as championed by contemporary proponents of somatic-stimulus theory.
In the neuroscience of dreaming, Hobson famously argued that dreams are the product of the random, brain-stem driven activation of the brain during sleep (Hobson 1988) and at best enable personal insights in the same way as a Rorschach test (Hobson et al. 2000). Dennett (1991) illustrates the lack of design underlying the production of dream narratives through the “party game of psychoanalysis”, which involves an aimless game of question-and-answer. In the game, players follow simple rules to jointly produce narratives that can seem symbolic and meaningful, even though no intelligent and deliberate process of narration was involved.
Even if we grant that dreams are not messages from a hidden entity in need of decoding, this does not imply that dream interpretation cannot be a personally meaningful source of insight and creativity (Hobson & Wohl 2005). Whether and under which conditions, and following which methods, dream interpretation can lead to personally significant insights is an empirical question that is only beginning to be investigated systematically (see Edwards et al. 2013).
Finally, throughout history, views on the epistemic status of dreams and the type of knowledge to be gained from dream interpretation (e.g., knowledge about the future, diagnosis of physical illness, or insights about one’s current concerns) often changed in tandem with views on the origin and sources of dreaming, which gradually moved from divine origins and external sources, via the body, to the unconscious, and finally to the brain.
6.2 The functions of dreaming
Different theories on the functions of dreaming have been proposed and the debate is ongoing. An important distinction is between the functions of sleep stages and the functions of dreaming. Well-documented functions of REM sleep include thermoregulation and the development of cortical structures in birds and mammals, as well as neurotransmitter repletion, the reconstruction and maintenance of little-used brain circuits, the structural development of the brain in early developmental phases, as well as the preparation of a repertoire of reflexive or instinctive behaviors (Hobson 2009). Yet none of these functions are obviously linked to dreaming. An exception is protoconsciousness theory, in which REM sleep plays an important role in foetal development by providing a virtual world model even before the emergence of full-blown consciousness (Hobson 2009: 808).
Numerous studies have investigated the contribution of sleep to memory consolidation, with different sleep stages promoting different types of memories (Diekelmann et al. 2009; Walker 2009). However, only a few studies have investigated the relationship between dream content and memory consolidation in sleep (for a review, see Nielsen & Stenstrom 2005). Dreams rarely involve episodic replay of waking memories (Fosse et al. 2003). The incorporation of memory sources seems to follow a specific temporal pattern in which recent memories are integrated with older but semantically related memories (Blagrove et al. 2011). Nielsen (2017) presents a model of how external and bodily stimuli on one hand and short- and long-term memories on the other hand form seemingly novel, complex, and dreamlike images at sleep onset; he proposes these microdreams shed light on the formation and sources of more complex dreams. There is also some evidence that dream imagery might be associated with memory consolidation and task performance after sleep, though this is preliminary (Wamsley & Stickgold 2009, 2010; Wamsley et al. 2010).
Prominent theories on the function of dreaming focus on bad dreams and nightmares. It has long been thought that dreaming contributes to emotional processing and that this is particularly obvious in the dreams of nightmare sufferers or in dreams following traumatic experiences (e.g., Hartmann 1998; Nielsen & Lara-Carrasco 2007; Levin & Nielsen 2009; Cartwright 2010; Perogamvros et al. 2013). Based on the high prevalence of negative emotions and threatening dream content, threat simulation theory suggests that the evolutionary function of dreaming lies in the simulation of ancestral threats and the rehearsal of threatening events and avoidance skills in dreams has an adaptive value by enhancing the individual’s chances of survival (see Revonsuo 2000; Valli 2008). A more recent proposal is social simulation theory, in which social imagery in dreams supports social cognition, bonds, and social skills. (Revonsuo et al. 2015).
An evolutionary perspective can also be fruitfully applied to specific aspects of dream phenomenology. According to the vigilance hypothesis, natural selection disfavored the occurrence of those types of sensations during sleep that would compromise vigilance (Symons 1993). Dream sounds, but also smells or pains might distract attention from the potentially dangerous surroundings of the sleeping subject, and the vigilance hypothesis predicts that they only rarely occur in dreams without causing awakening. By contrast, because most mammals sleep with their eyes closed and in an immobile position, vivid visual and movement hallucinations during sleep would not comprise vigilance and thus can occur in dreams without endangering the sleeping subject. Focusing on the stuff dreams are not made of might then be at least as important for understanding the function of dreaming as developing a positive account.
Finally, even if dreaming in general and specific types of dream content in particular were found to be strongly associated with specific cognitive functions, it would still be possible that dreams are mere epiphenomena of brain activity during sleep (Flanagan 1995, 2000). It is also possible that the function of dreams is not knowable (Springett 2019).
A particular problem for any theory on the function of dreaming is to explain why a majority of dreams are forgotten and how dreams can fulfill their putative function independently of recall. Crick and Mitchinson (1983) famously proposed that REM sleep “erases” or deletes surplus information and unnecessary memories, which would suggest that enhanced dream recall is counterproductive. Another problem is that dreaming can be lost selectively and independently of other cognitive deficits (Solms 1997, 2000).
Some of the problems that arise for theories on the functions of dreaming can be avoided if we do not assume that dreaming has a specific function, separate from the function(s) of conscious wakeful states. This depends on the broader taxonomy of dreaming in relation to wakeful states. For example, if dreaming is continuous with waking mind wandering, imagination, and/or own-body perception, we should not expect it to have a unique function, but rather to express a similar function as these wakeful states, perhaps to varying degrees. Nor should we expect dreams to have a single function; the functions of dreaming might be as varied and complex as those of consciousness, and given the complexity of the target phenomenon, the failure to pin down a single function should not be surprising (Windt 2015a).
Questions about dreaming in different areas of philosophy such as epistemology, ontology, philosophy of mind and cognitive science, and ethics are closely intertwined. Scientific evidence from sleep and dream research can meaningfully inform the philosophical discussion and has often done so in the past. The discussion of dreaming has also often functioned as a lens on broader questions about knowledge, morality, consciousness, and self. Long a marginalized area, the philosophy of dreaming and of sleep is central to important philosophical questions and increasingly plays an important role in interdisciplinary consciousness research, for example in the search for the neural correlates of conscious states, in conscious state taxonomies, and in research on the minimal conditions for phenomenal selfhood and conscious experience.
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I want to thank Regina Fabry and two anonymous reviewers for helpful comments and constructive criticism on an earlier version of this manuscript. And as always, I am greatly indebted to Stefan Pitz for his support.