Jean-Baptiste Du Bos

First published Tue Nov 19, 2019; substantive revision Tue Dec 5, 2023

Jean-Baptiste Du Bos (b. 1670, d. 1742) was a French antiquarian, historian, diplomat, polymath, and aesthetician. He participated in the Quarrel of the Ancients and Moderns, wrote on numismatics, delved into a variety of historical questions, and had an enduring love of the fine arts. Today he is primarily known as the author of Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting (1719) and as one of the founders of modern aesthetics. Deeply influenced by his friend John Locke, Du Bos made a major contribution to the spread of empiricism in France, both in aesthetics and other areas of philosophy. He influenced almost all eighteenth-century contributors to aesthetics, including Charles Batteux, Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten, David Hume, Gotthold Ephraim Lessing, Moses Mendelssohn, and Jean-Jacques Rousseau.

1. Life and works

Du Bos was born in Beauvais on 14 December 1670. Little is known of his family or childhood. He was educated in Paris, where he received a Master of Arts in 1688 and a Bachelor of Theology in 1692. Although later in life he was a titular abbé and canon, he seems to have had little interest in the ecclesiastical life. He was more interested in politics and in the life of a man of letters and he soon moved in leading intellectual circles. His friends included Nicolas Boileau-Déspreaux, an important poet and literary critic, Charles Perrault, another major poet, and Pierre Bayle, the famous philosopher. He was a friend of Jean Jacques-Rousseau though, as was often the case with Rousseau’s friendships, the friendship did not endure. Du Bos was particularly closely associated with Bayle, who had an important impact on Du Bos’s thought. Du Bos traveled extensively in Europe in his capacity as a diplomat and in order to meet the leading intellectuals of the day. Lombard (1913) remains the standard account of his life.

Du Bos’s first book was Histoire de Quatre Gordiens, prouvée et illustrée par les Médailles (History of the Four Gordians, Proven and Illustrated by Medallions) (1695). In this work, he argued, on the basis of numismatic evidence, that there had been four, not three Gordian emperors. His hypothesis was quickly refuted by historians.

Du Bos worked as a diplomat and was involved in negotiating a peace treaty between the Netherlands and France. In this connection, he wrote Les Interests de l’Angleterre mal entendus dans la guerre présente (England’s Interests in the Present War Misunderstood) (1703).

His next book was L’Histoire de la Ligue de Cambray (History of the League of Cambrai). This was a clear and engaging history of the alliance, including France, assembled by Pope Julius II to wage war against the Venetian Republic between 1508 and 1516. The book was praised by, among others, Voltaire.

Du Bos travelled to England in 1698 to meet John Locke at the request of their mutual friend Nicolas Toinard. Toinard wanted advice on the preparation of a translation of Locke’s Essay concerning Human Understanding. Locke and Du Bos became close friends and Locke asked his French friend to review the French translation of the Essay. The influence of Locke’s empiricism is evident throughout the Critical Reflections.

In 1719 Du Bos published Réflexions critiques sur la poésie et sur la peinture (Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting), the book on which his posthumous reputation depends. Further editions appeared in 1732, 1733, 1740, 1746, 1755, 1760, and 1770. The work was significantly expanded and revised for the 1740 and subsequent editions. It was translated into German, Dutch, and English. Largely on the basis of the Critical Reflections, Du Bos was elected to the Académie française in 1720. He became perpetual secretary of the Académie in 1723.

Du Bos’s final major work was the Histoire critique de l’établissement de la monarchie française dans les Gaules (Critical History of the Establishment of the French Monarchy in Gaul) (1734). The book’s thesis is that the Franks did not conquer Gaul. Rather, according to Du Bos, the Gauls invited them to become the rulers of what became France. The book won the praise of many, including Edward Gibbon, but it was effectively criticized by Montesquieu in The Spirit of the Laws.

By all accounts, Du Bos was a pleasant and charming man. Many affectionate remembrances were published in the wake of his death on 23 March 1742.

2. Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting

Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting begins with an investigation of the “striking pleasure (94)” that humans receive from the experience of poetry and painting. (All references to the Critical Reflections are to pages of Du Bos 1719/2021.) The book focuses on the two fine arts mentioned in the book’s title, but Du Bos also discusses sculpture, engraving, dance, and music. According to Du Bos, we receive pleasure from the fine arts because works of art are imitations of objects in the world. Presumably, on Du Bos’s view, the similarity between imitations and the objects imitated is responsible for the arousal of emotion. When we experience imitations, we receive emotions similar to, but less intense than, the emotions we feel when we experience the objects imitated. If these emotions are pleasing, Du Bos has an account of the pleasure that humans receive from experience of the fine arts.

Du Bos’s account of the striking pleasure that we receive from the fine arts commits him to the ancient view that the fine arts are imitative arts. This view is traceable to Plato and Aristotle and Du Bos acknowledges these ancient sources. Although the view that the fine arts make up a coherent ‘system’ is sometimes attributed to Charles Batteux (Kristeller 1951; 1952), Du Bos’s views clearly anticipate those of Batteux (Young 2015).

According to Du Bos, all arts are imitative, but the arts do not all represent in the same way. In the course of the Critical Reflections, Du Bos makes a contribution to philosophy of language by distinguishing between natural signs and the artificial signs found in language. Natural signs, such as those found in painting, sculpture, and music, represent because they resemble their objects. The artificial signs of language are arbitrary or conventional. They are employed in poetry (that is, literature).

Du Bos asks which of the arts is best able to arouse emotions. He believes that painting has an advantage over poetry on the grounds that natural signs affect us more effectively. He argues, however, that poetry when combined with music or acting (or both, as in opera) has an advantage over painting.

Du Bos is aware that his account of the pleasure we receive from art faces a serious objection. When the emotions we receive from viewing an imitation are positive, Du Bos’s account has a prima facie plausibility. Sometimes, however, as he recognizes, we receive unpleasant emotions from the experience of artistic imitations. Du Bos considers, for example, an imitation of the sacrifice of Jephthah’s daughter and Le Brun’s painting, Massacre of the Innocents. These works arouse negative emotions. Nevertheless, we willingly, even enthusiastically, experience the works. Our willingness to experience works that arouse negative emotions is often referred to as the paradox of tragedy.

Du Bos tries to resolve the paradox by making two points. He begins by saying that, although imitations of unpleasant events will arouse unpleasant emotions, these emotions are not as intense or as enduring as we receive from experience of the events themselves. This point cannot, by itself, resolve the paradox. Du Bos’s second point is that although the emotions aroused by imitations of unpleasant events are unpleasant, they are preferable to an emotion that we would otherwise feel. According to Du Bos, we are constitutionally subject to a feeling of deep ennui. This ennui is not merely boredom. Rather it is a weariness of the human condition.

In ‘On Tragedy,’ Hume endorses Du Bos’s solution to the paradox, at least up to a point. Hume notes that, according to Du Bos, “nothing is in general so disagreeable to the mind as the languid, listless state of indolence, into which it falls upon the removal of all passion and occupation.” Hume then adds that, when a work of tragic art arouses an emotion “Let it be disagreeable, afflicting, melancholy, disordered; it is still better than…insipid languor” (Hume 1757, 217). Some contemporary philosophers have also found merit in Du Bos’s approach to the paradox of tragedy (Livingston 2013).

Later in the Critical Reflections Du Bos returns to the paradox of tragedy and gives a rather different solution. This later passage is apparently influenced by Aristotle’s Poetics since Du Bos speaks of the purging of emotions. He means by this, however, something other than Aristotle meant. According to Du Bos, “The faithful depiction of the passions suffices to make us afraid and make us resolve to avoid them with all of the determination of which we are capable” (318). For example, we watch a performance of Medea and we are horrified by the passion for vengeance and resolve not to indulge in it.

The concept of sentiments is crucial to Du Bos’s thought. He seems to have been the writer who made talk of sentiments so commonplace in eighteenth-century aesthetics. Du Bos never precisely defines what he means when he speaks of sentiments. In what is, perhaps, the closest he comes to a definition he writes that, “The first ideas born in the soul, when it receives a lively stimulus,…we call sentiments” (237). According to Du Bos, sentiments are not produced by a special sort of aesthetic experience. Rather, they are, as already indicated, ordinary emotional responses. We can receive sentiments from experience of ordinary objects and from experience of the imitations found in art. The difference, as already noted, is that sentiments produced by art are fainter.

Despite believing that sentiments are ordinary emotions or fainter copies of them, Du Bos posits a sense of beauty. He writes that, “We have in us a sense intended to judge the value of works that imitate touching objects in nature” and calls this a “sixth sense” (519). Du Bos compares the sense of beauty to gustatory taste and seems to have been among the first writers to do so.

Since artistic imitations are intended to arouse emotions similar to those aroused by the objects imitated, Du Bos values what he calls vraisemblance (verisimilitude). Painters, for example, must “make a painting consistent with what we know of the customs, habits, architecture, and arms of the people that one intends to represent” (226). A work can, however, be vraisemblable without being an imitation of the real world and historical events. A work can be vraisemblable and yet be an example of what Du Bos calls “the marvelous”. An opera, for example, can be vraisemblable even though it depicts marvelous ancient Greek gods and goddesses. It must, however, depict them as existing in a way that gods and goddesses can exist. Vraisemblance is not an end in itself as it was for some earlier thinkers. The real goal of the arts is to arouse sentiments and vraisemblance is only a means of doing so.

According to Du Bos, we judge artworks by means of our sentiments rather than by means of reason. He rejects the rationalist school of criticism associated with writers such as Roland Fréart de Chambray (1606—76), the author of L’Idée de la perfection de la peinture demonstrée par les principles de l’art (1662) and Jean Terrasson, whose work Dissertation critique sur l’Iliade d’Homere appeared in 1715. Terrasson wrote that the “proper and natural principle by which we must judge a work of literature [belles lettres] is the real conformity that it must have with good reason and belle nature; this is philosophy” (Terrason 1715, iv). He adds that this philosophy comes from Descartes and “the spirit of our philosophy is not limited to works of natural science [physique]; the pulpit, the courts and even poetry feel it….[modern philosophy] submits everything to reason” (Terrason 1715, lxi). In a similar vein, Bosse wrote that the “noble art of painting must be based for the most part on correct and rule-governed reasoning, which is to say, geometrical and, consequently, demonstrative” (Bosse 1649, sommaire). Du Bos mocks these writers as ‘geometrical critics.’

He writes that the evaluation of art “is not left to reason. It must submit to the judgement that sentiment pronounces. Sentiment is the competent judge of this issue.” He goes on to compare the evaluation of an artwork to making a judgement about a ragout. Reason is of no use here. Rather, “We taste the ragout and…we know that it is good. It is the same with works of wit and pictures made to please us by touching us” (519).

In making sentiments the means by which artworks are judged, Du Bos gave rise to a question that he did not fully appreciate and certainly did not solve. This is the question of providing a standard of taste. Du Bos is a subjectivist. He makes the value of an artwork a response-dependent property. A work of art is valuable if it arouses certain valuable sentiments in audience members. Du Bos was aware that different works will arouse different pleasing sentiments in different people:

To want to persuade a man who prefers colour to expression, in accordance with his own feelings, that he is wrong, is to want to persuade him to take more pleasure in seeing Poussin’s paintings than Titian’s. The matter depends no more on him than it does on a man, whose palate is formed in such a way as to prefer champagne to Spanish wine, to change his taste and prefer the Spanish wine to French (345).

The problem, as Hume clearly recognized, was that not everyone receives the same sentiments from a work of art. This leads to the conclusion that a work has value for some people and not for others. However, as Hume also recognized, thorough-going subjectivism is counterintuitive. It seems that there is a fact that Milton is a greater poet than Ogilby, even if some people prefer Ogilby.

Du Bos was unaware of the full extent of the problem caused by subjectivism. Likely this was because he believed that everyone has very much the same sentiments. In fact, he believed that the general public was the best judge of the value of artworks because their taste was least corrupted by prejudice.

Du Bos also proposes the test of time. When a work of art repeatedly pleases audiences over a long period of time, this is conclusive evidence that it is a work of high value. Du Bos point out, for example, that the reputations of the best Greek and Roman poets are firmly established since they have pleased audiences through the ages.

Some writers, Du Bos was aware, believe that artworks can be valuable as a source of knowledge. At times Du Bos indicates that there is something to this, and that art is valuable as more than the source of valuable sentiments. In the end, however, his considered opinion is that, “We can acquire some knowledge by reading a poem, but this is scarcely the motive for opening the book” (244).

Du Bos speaks about audience members’ states of mind but he also speaks of the artist’s state of mind. Artists, he believes, feel the emotions that their works arouse in audience members. Indeed, the artist’s “goal is to make us share his sentiments” (354). The difference between the artist’s state of mind, and those of audience members, is that the artist’s sentiments are more intense. Artists must be in a state of “enthusiasm” if they are to create successful works of art. This enthusiasm can border on madness. Since Du Bos believes that artists convey their emotions to their audiences, he is an early advocate of an expression theory of the arts.

The Critical Reflections make a contribution to the Quarrel of the Ancients and Moderns. This was a long running debate about the relative merits of ancient and modern writers and artists. Du Bos’s contribution to the debate is judicious. He reaches the conclusion that modern sculptors have not surpassed their ancient counterparts. With regard to painting, he says that it is difficult to reach a judgement since so few ancient paintings have survived. Nevertheless, he thinks it unlikely that modern painters have surpassed the ancients. Ancient poets have a significant edge over modern ones. Du Bos allows that, in the natural sciences, modern scientists have eclipsed the ancients.

Much of Du Bos’s book is devoted to an explanation of artistic genius. He is particularly concerned to explain why certain eras (the Golden Age of Athens, the Rome of Augustus, the Italian Renaissance, and the era of Louis XIV) are more productive of geniuses. Although Du Bos says, in passing, that a “poet needs divine inspiration” (241), he decisively rejects the Platonic conception of genius. Instead, he believes that genius has physical causes. In part, genius is to be explained by physiological considerations. According to Du Bos, a genius has a well-formed brain and other physiological advantages over other people. Most importantly, he believes, genius is the result of certain environmental factors. These factors include climate, air quality, soil, and diet. For example, England is supposedly unable to produce painters of the first rank because the climate is too cold. Although highly influential in the eighteenth century, Du Bos’s views on genius have been supplanted. Nevertheless, Du Bos’s views on genius are noteworthy as an early effort to provide a scientific explanation of genius.

Although Du Bos was primarily concerned with poetry and painting, he made a significant contribution to philosophy of music. He was an advocate of the resemblance theory of musical expression. According to this theory, music is expressive of emotions because it resembles human expressive behavior. This view is found, in the contemporary world, in Davies (1994) and Kivy (1980). (See the article on Philosophy of Music, 3.1.) Music can resemble either vocal or non-vocal expressive behavior. It can resemble, for example, the plodding steps of a sad person or the joyful cries of a happy one. Because music resembles such expressive behavior, it is heard as sad, joyful, or expressive of some other emotion.

In the Critical Reflections, the resemblance theory is crucial in explaining how music can be, like painting and poetry, an imitative art. It does so by resembling and, consequently, imitating “natural signs of the passions”. Du Bos also believes that music can imitate sounds in nature. He writes that “There is truth in a symphony, composed to imitate a tempest, when the music of the symphony, its harmony and its rhythm, make us hear a noise similar to the tumult of the wind and the roaring waves, which clash with each other or break against the rocks” (323). (Here the word ‘symphony’ means instrumental music. It does not refer to a symphony in the modern sense of the word.) Notice that, on Du Bos’s view, even purely instrumental music can be imitative.

Unlike some modern advocates of the resemblance theory, Du Bos believes that the experience of musical imitations arouses emotion. Music arouses emotions in very much the same way that poetry and painting do. The emotion aroused will be the emotion that would be aroused by the object represented.

Du Bos’s prose is often execrable. Voltaire wrote, with reference to Du Bos and the Critical Reflections, that, “the judgement is good, the style bad. It is necessary to read him, but re-reading him would be tiresome” (Voltaire Correspondence, letter 3917). An English translation of the Critical Reflections was published in the eighteenth century. Thomas Nugent translated the book as Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting and Music (Du Bos 1748). Unfortunately, this translation is inaccurate and preserves all of the problems of the original French. A new translation (Du Bos 1719/2021) recently appeared.

3. Du Bos’s impact on the development of aesthetics

No single person deserves to be credited as the inventor of modern aesthetics. Several figures in the early eighteenth century independently made contributions to criticism and philosophy that would become modern aesthetics. In England, Shaftesbury’s Characteristicks of Men, Manners, Opinions, and Times (1711) and Joseph Addison’s Pleasures of the Imagination (1712) laid some of the groundwork for aesthetics. On the Continent, Jean-Pierre de Crousaz’s Traité de beau (1715) and Christian Wolff’s Rational Thoughts on God, the World, and the Soul of Man (1720) were pioneering contributions to aesthetics. All of these works appeared in the second decade of the eighteenth century, as did Du Bos’s Critical Reflections. Du Bos deserves to be recognized as among the originators of modern aesthetics and philosophy of art. His importance was widely recognized in the eighteenth century. Johann Georg Sulzer, in his General Theory of the Fine Arts (1771–74) described Du Bos as “the first of modern critics to construct a theory of art upon general principles” (Baker and Christensen 1995, 25).

The influence of Du Bos on aesthetics in France began with his impact on Voltaire (Williams 1966). He described Du Bos as “a very wise, very learned, and very esteemed man” and, according to Voltaire, “All artists read with profit his Reflections on poetry, painting, and music” (Voltaire 1877–85, vol. 3, 10; vol. 14, 66). Du Bos’s influence is found at a number of points in Voltaire’s writings. He adopts Du Bos’s subjectivism, writing that, “In order to judge poets, it is necessary to know how to feel” (Voltaire 1877–85, vol. 8, 319). Voltaire agreed with Du Bos that there have been four ages where the arts particularly flourished and he agreed with Du Bos’s assessment of which ages they have been. Voltaire also adopted one of Du Bos’s controversial views: the belief that national character is affected by matters such as climate.

Du Bos had a significant impact on the Encyclopaedia of Diderot and d’Alembert. Louis, chevalier de Jaucourt was the author of many of this work’s articles on the fine arts and he cites Du Bos in the articles on Painting, Modern Painting, Inscription, Landscape Painting, and Landscape Painter. In fact, a large chunk of the article on Landscape Painting is lifted wholesale out of Critical Reflections, vol. 1, chapter 6 (d’Alembert et al. 2003).

The influence of Du Bos on Jean Jacques Rousseau has long since been established (Jones 1974). This influence is particularly apparent in the Lettre à mr d’Alembert sur les spectacles (1758). Rousseau agrees with Du Bos that theatre does not aim to arouse in audience members the sentiment that the characters represented feel. Rousseau agrees that, on the contrary, theatre arouses quite opposed sentiments. For example, if a character in a tragedy is represented as feeling fear and despair, audience members will have pity aroused in them.

Du Bos seems to have been one of the important sources of the resemblance theory of musical expression in the eighteenth century. Batteux is known to have read the Critical Reflections and was apparently influenced by Du Bos when he wrote that gestures and sounds are “natural means of expression” that are “especially suited to the expression of emotion”. He adds that “music is half-formed in the words that express some emotion. It takes only a little art to turn the words into music ” (Batteux 1746/2015, 129; 133). These passages from The Fine Arts are little more than paraphrases of passages from the Critical Reflections.

Du Bos had a significant influence on aesthetics in Britain. His influence is found, for example, in James Harris’s Three Treatises, particularly in the second of these treatises, ‘A Discourse on Music, Painting and Poetry’ (Harris 1744). In fact, this treatise is little more than a brief reprisal of central themes from the Critical Reflections. Harris, like Du Bos, distinguishes between the fine arts according to their means of expression. Painting employs natural signs and poetry artificial ones. They agree that this gives painting an advantage when it comes to the arousal of emotion, but both believe that the power of poetry can be enhanced by music and staging to the point where it has the advantage over poetry. They agree that art owes its value to its capacity to arouse sentiments.

Since Jones (1982) it has been known that Du Bos had an impact on Hume’s thinking about art. Hume owned the 1732 edition of the Critical Reflections (Norton and Norton, 1996, 88). He must have acquired it soon after his move to France to begin writing his Treatise.

Hume’s discussion of Du Bos in ‘Of Tragedy’ has already been noted, but Jones (1982) argues that Du Bos’s influence is also apparent in ‘Of the Standard of Taste’. Hume’s views on art were influenced by several of his contemporaries, including Francis Hutcheson, and it can be difficult to disentangle their contributions to his thought. (See the article on Scottish Philosophy in the 18th Century, section 4 for a discussion of Hutcheson’s influence on Hume.) The difficulty is compounded by the fact that the views of Hutcheson and Du Bos are similar in certain respects. Nevertheless, Jones (1982) finds significance in the fact Hume, like Du Bos, believed that we have an internal sense of beauty. Both believe that this sense of beauty, not reason, is the means by which the beauty of work is determined. Moreover, there is an uncanny similarity between the ways in which they express these views. Du Bos, in the Critical Reflections, and Hume, in ‘Of the Standard of Taste,’ say that they are opposed to “geometrical” criticism. Both believe that rules of criticism can be given, but that they can be violated by great works of art. Both give Ariosto as an example of a poet who violates the rules of criticism.

Jones (1982) noted the impact of Du Bos on Hume’s essays, but did not remark on the impact of the Frenchman on Hume’s Treatise. Norton and Norton, in their edition of the Treatise (Hume 1739–40 [2007]) noted some passages where Du Bos influenced Hume, but many more passages have recently been identified (Mazza and Mori 2016; Young and Cameron 2018). Virtually every passage in the Treatise where the fine arts are mentioned shows signs of Du Bos’s influence. Young and Cameron (2018) have argued that several passages in the Treatise so closely resemble passages in the Critical Reflections that the similarity cannot be coincidental. For example, both Du Bos and Hume agree that poetry and painting arouse the same emotions that we feel in ordinary life, but that the emotions aroused by the arts are fainter. Hume, like Du Bos, believes that passions that are displeasing when experienced in daily life can be pleasing when aroused by art. A passage in the Treatise ( refers to Du Bos’s view that humans are plagued by ennui and they seek to escape it by gaming and other activities. On the other hand, Hume explicitly rejects Du Bos’s view on the influence of climate on national character. Goldhaber (2021) argues that Hume adopted a four humor psycholgy under the influence of Du Bos.

Lombard (1913) judged that Du Bos’s impact was greatest in Germany. Du Bos was responsible for a move away from a rationalist approach to criticism there as in France. His influence in Germany is found as early as Johann Jakob Breitinger’s Critische Dichtkunst (1740). Subsequently, Baumgarten, Herder, Lessing, Mendelssohn, and Winckelmann either adopted some of Du Bos’s views or argued against them. Lessing translated part of the Critical Reflections into German and was deeply influenced by him. For a study of the relationship between Du Bos and Lessing see Leysaht (1874).

4. Du Bos on epistemology and philosophy of science

Du Bos’s primary contributions to philosophy are in aesthetics but he also contributed to the revolt against Cartesianism in France. Cartesianism dominated French thinking about knowledge and science until well into the eighteenth century (Illiffe 2003, 269). Du Bos’s approach to philosophy of art was thoroughly empiricist and so was his attitude towards science. He deserves credit for applying Locke’s empirical account of knowledge to scientific hypotheses.

In the first instance, Du Bos applied empiricism to the study of art, as we have seen. According to Du Bos, judgements of works of art must be empirical. He writes that

Do we use reason to determine whether a ragout is good or bad? Did you ever, after having applied geometrical principles to the flavour, determine the properties that each of the ingredients contributes, go on to discuss the proportions preserved in their mixture, in order to decide whether the ragout is good? You never have. We have a sense that makes us recognize whether the cook has followed the rules of his art. We taste the ragout and, even without knowing these rules, we know that it is good. It is the same with works of wit and pictures made to please us by touching us (519).

Elsewhere Du Bos adds that

if there is some matter where reason should fall silent in the face of experience, it is certainly in questions that can be raised regarding the value of a poem. It is when we want to know whether a poem is pleasing or not; if, generally speaking, a poem is an excellent work or just average…there are few general principles to rely on regarding the value of a poem (531).

Du Bos stresses the importance of sentiments, that is, the feelings we have in response to works of art.

While Du Bos rejected rationalism in judgements about art, his empiricism did not end there. He was opposed to the a priori construction of scientific systems. He notes that

The two most famous philosophical organizations in Europe, the Academy of Sciences in Paris and the Royal Society in London, refuse to adopt or build a single general system of natural science. Agreeing with the view of Chancellor Bacon, they have espoused not a single one out of fear that having to justify it should draw attention from onlookers and make them see experiments not as they truly are, but as they should be, in order to give weight to an opinion they try to pass off as true. Our two famous academies rest content to verify facts and publish them in their journals, persuaded that nothing is easier according to reason and that they would stumble if they took two steps beyond what they acquired from experience. These two organizations expect a general system on the basis of first-hand experience (527).

In another passage, Du Bos discusses Harvey’s discovery of the circulation of blood and makes clear that it could only have been discovered a posteriori. People have accepted Harvey’s hypothesis, Du Bos writes, because

they know that it no longer relies on reasoning for its proof and that it is demonstrated by experience. To repeat, people have much more confidence in those who tell them “I have seen” than in those who tell them “I have concluded” (589).

This passage is clearly an endorsement of empiricism and a rejection of Cartesian rationalism.

Du Bos makes a related claim in a discussion of physicians. A physician may be a Cartesian while young, but he will end up as an empiricist. According to Du Bos,

At twenty-five, a doctor is as persuaded of the truth of his anatomical reasoning, which tries to discover the manner by which cinchona bark works to alleviate intermittent fevers, as he is by the effectiveness of the remedy. By age sixty, a doctor is persuaded by the truth of a fact that he has seen multiple times, but he does not put any faith in the explanation of the effect of the remedy than by the piling up of examples, if it permitted to use that expression. (530)

Experience will transform the wise physician into an empiricist. Elsewhere, Du Bos says something similar about engineering, navigation and related sciences. He considers four modern scientific discoveries (the discovery of air pressure, the invention of the compass, the development of the printing press, and the invention of the telescope) and observes that all of these discoveries were due to the acquisition of new experiences.

When Du Bos investigates any scientific matter, he proceeds in an empirical fashion. For example, he examines the question of why certain eras have produced more geniuses than other periods. He begins by considering the hypothesis that a social cause is responsible for the production of geniuses. In particular, he considers the hypothesis that the production of geniuses can be explained by reference to generous patrons. He refutes this hypothesis by giving examples of eras when patrons abounded but geniuses were scarce. Having empirically refuted this hypothesis, he considers the hypothesis that genius has a natural or physical cause. Du Bos supports this hypothesis by attempting to find a correlation between certain environmental, climatic, and dietary factors and the production of genius. Du Bos’s views on the origin of genius were widely accepted in the first two thirds of the eighteenth century. Herder, Montesquieu, Voltaire, and Winckelmann were among the important figures to adopt Du Bos’s views on climate and genius.

Du Bos held that scientific investigation always involves some uncertainty. He wrote that “I distrust physical explanations, since the imperfection of this science almost always makes guesswork necessary” (362). According to Du Bos, a scientific hypothesis is only probable to some extent or another. He illustrates this view by reference to Harvey’s hypothesis concerning the circulation of blood. Du Bos writes that, “Most scholars of his [Harvey’s] time were persuaded by his views. It was as firmly and widely established as a scientific truth as something that is not directly observed can be. That is, it was regarded as a view more probable than the contrary opinion” (588).


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