Epistemology in Latin America

First published Thu Jul 12, 2018; substantive revision Tue Dec 6, 2022

After presenting the current situation of epistemological research in Latin America and part of its history, this entry will address six topics: skepticism (especially in its Pyrrhonian stripe), core epistemology, formal epistemology, Wittgenstein’s thought in connection with epistemology and skepticism, epistemology of law, and religious epistemology. It should be noted from the outset that the entry does not purport to provide a comprehensive account of epistemology in Latin America, but rather to paint a general picture of it by focusing on the main issues that have been discussed within that field.

We will take into consideration the work of those scholars who have written (in Spanish, Portuguese, or English) on epistemological issues independently of both whether they are currently based in Latin America and whether they have worked in a non-Latin American country for a considerable part of their careers. The touchstone for inclusion was not whether they were born in Latin America—although all but one of those who will be mentioned were born there—but whether they are of Latin American origin, earned a degree from a Latin American university, and worked for at least some time in Latin America, thus receiving (part of) their philosophical education in such a milieu. For this reason, there will be no mention of, e.g., Ernesto Sosa’s and Linda Martín Alcoff’s extensive and influential work in epistemology.[1]

1. Introduction

There is a growing interest in epistemological topics and problems among members of what may be called, somewhat artificially, “the Latin American philosophical community”. However, it should be noted from the start that, despite the large size of that community and its connections with philosophers and research groups particularly from the United States and the United Kingdom, on the whole epistemological investigation in Latin America significantly differs in approach, breadth, and originality from mainstream Anglophone epistemology—which at present can reasonably be taken as emblematic owing to its depth, precision, innovation, and fecundity.

Within Latin America, epistemology has traditionally been approached from a historico-exegetical rather than systematic perspective. Even today, it is not uncommon for an epistemology course in the philosophy department of a Latin American university to focus (almost) exclusively on the views on the nature and possibility of knowledge found in the works of Descartes, Hume, Kant, Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, or Ricoeur rather than on the main epistemological positions adopted in contemporary analytic philosophy. The reason is, at least in part, that most professors in charge of courses on the theory of knowledge have traditionally been historians of modern philosophy or phenomenologists influenced by the way philosophy has customarily been practiced in France, Germany, and Spain, thus following the tradition of so-called continental philosophy. In the Latin American academic milieu, philosophy in general has predominantly been approached either through the exegesis of philosophical texts or through the history of philosophical ideas, both with a markedly continental orientation.

Even though the history of analytic philosophy in Latin America starts in the 1950s–1960s (see Pérez & Ortiz-Millán 2010), one had to wait until the last two decades of the twentieth century for a strong and widespread trend of analytic philosophy to emerge. The seminal impetus for the production and dissemination in Latin America (particularly in Argentina, Brazil, and Mexico) of new work within the analytic tradition was the founding of research centers taking a distinctly analytic approach and the subsequent launches of their respective journals: the Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas (IIF, 1967) at the Universidad Autónoma de México (UNAM), with its journal Crítica (1967); the Sociedad Argentina de Análisis Filosófico (SADAF, 1972) with its journal Análisis Filosófico (1981); and the Centro de Lógica, Epistemologia e História da Ciência (CLE, 1976) at the Universidade Estadual de Campinas (UNICAMP) in Brazil, with its journal Manuscrito (1977). The founding in 2007 of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica (ALFA) reflects the sustained development of analytic philosophy in Latin American countries. The recent unprecedented impetus in what may be regarded as the analytic way of doing philosophy explains why, since the turn of the millennium, the primarily historico-exegetical and continental approach to epistemology has slowly started to be replaced by a systematic and analytic one.

With regard to the breadth of Latin American studies in epistemology, a considerable number of the subjects discussed in present-day analytic epistemology have not received the slightest attention, others have been addressed only superficially, and still others have been tackled by but a few researchers. This situation is not limited to relatively new areas such as the epistemology of testimony, the epistemology of disagreement, or collective epistemology (all falling within so-called social epistemology), but is a more general phenomenon. This may be due to the fact that, for some reason, in analytic-style Latin American philosophy, epistemology has received less attention than logic, philosophy of science, or philosophy of language.

Finally, even though original positions and arguments with regard to specific topics have been developed by Latin American scholars, it is safe to say that there is not a distinctively Latin American epistemology. The epistemological issues and problems currently examined in the work of those Latin American authors who adopt a systematic approach either have been discussed throughout the history of philosophy or have been “imported” from Anglophone scholarship. Nor is there a particular way of doing epistemology that could be identified as Latin American. For this reason, one may talk of “epistemology in Latin America” or “epistemology done by Latin Americans” rather than of “Latin American epistemology”.

A caveat is in order: the above is intended as a general description of the current situation in the Latin American philosophical community. The academic collaboration between research groups within and outside Latin America, the growing number of visiting scholars from Latin American countries at philosophy departments of North America and Europe where the best epistemological investigation is carried out, and the increase of financial resources in some of those countries will, one can reasonably expect, change the situation in the years to come by building on what has already been done in the field and opening up further research and debate. Within the next few decades, there will probably be a consolidated Latin American community working on epistemological issues, and one will perhaps even be able to start talking of a distinctively Latin American epistemology.

2. Skepticism

It is safe to say that skepticism is the main issue discussed by Latin American scholars working in epistemology, judging by the number of works devoted to it. In addition, in certain Latin American countries there is a short but strong tradition of scholarship on both the history and the philosophical significance of skepticism. This is why it is the first topic to be addressed in this entry.

As Cresto (2010a: 468) points out, the study of the history of skepticism is one of the lines of research to be considered when providing an overview of epistemological investigation in Latin America. But contrary to what she claims, it is hard to find any systematic epistemological discussion of skepticism in the numerous works in which Latin American scholars have dealt with the history of ancient or modern skepticism. Still, it is primarily in connection with the study of ancient Pyrrhonism that the field has seen the emergence of systematic discussions of the nature of skepticism and the epistemic challenges it raises. Pyrrhonism is the variety of skepticism most commonly dealt with in the works of Latin American academics, both in general and in connection with epistemological issues.

The Latin American tradition of scholarship on the history of ancient and modern skepticism started in the 1970s with Oswaldo Porchat Pereira (1933–2017) in Brazil and Ezequiel de Olaso (1932–1996) in Argentina, who were in close contact and co-organized two conferences on skepticism: one in Campinas (Brazil) in 1986 and one in Buenos Aires (Argentina) in 1992. Porchat pursued his undergraduate and graduate studies in philosophy at the Universidade de São Paulo (USP), obtaining a Ph.D. with a dissertation on Aristotle’s conception of science. He spent research periods in the United States, the United Kingdom, and France, where he was heavily influenced by French historians of philosophy. He was professor at USP and the founder of both the philosophy department and the Centro de Lógica, Epistemologia e História da Ciência (on which see Section 1) at UNICAMP.

De Olaso obtained his B.A. (Licenciatura) in philosophy from the University of Buenos Aires and his Ph.D. in the same field from Bryn Mawr College, with a dissertation on Leibniz and ancient skepticism. He taught at the Universidad Nacional de La Plata, the Universidad de Buenos Aires, and the Universidad de San Andrés, all in Argentina. He was also a researcher at the Consejo Nacional de Investigaciones Científicas y Técnicas (CONICET) of Argentina, and a founding member of the Centro de Investigaciones Filosóficas (CIF, 1965) and its journal Revista Latinoamericana de Filosofía (RLF, 1975). He also seems to have helped Porchat in the foundation of CLE.

While Porchat’s studies on skepticism (all but one, Porchat Pereira 2013, collected in his 2007 book) bear almost exclusively on the Pyrrhonism expounded in the extant works of the second-century physician Sextus Empiricus, de Olaso’s are concerned not only with Sextus’s Pyrrhonism (de Olaso 1983, 1988, 1992), but also with Hume’s and Leibniz’s discussions of skepticism, particularly in its Pyrrhonian variety (de Olaso 1974, 1977, 1978, 1980, 1984). Towards the very end of his life, de Olaso’s writings focused on epistemology as practiced in the analytic tradition: e.g., he offered an analysis of the concepts of certainty, knowledge, and skepticism, and of their relations, in both modern and contemporary philosophy (de Olaso 1999), but without making an original contribution to the present-day debates on those issues. While Porchat considered himself a skeptic, de Olaso did not, adopting a much more critical approach to skepticism. We will here focus on Porchat both because he claimed to adopt a neo-Pyrrhonian stance and particularly because it has been said that his writings offer significant epistemological reflections on skepticism. However, first, when discussing ancient Pyrrhonism in his published work, he seldom touches on, or proposes solutions to, the most complex interpretive and philosophical questions posed by Sextus’s presentation of Pyrrhonism, and he cursorily engages with only a tiny part of the vast specialist literature. We make this remark because some of those questions extensively discussed in the secondary literature concern intriguing epistemological problems: e.g., the epistemic challenge posed by the Five Modes of Agrippa, the attack on the criterion of truth, the Pyrrhonist’s stance on the standards of justification and norms of rationality, and the possibility of skeptical inquiry. And secondly, when proposing his neo-Pyrrhonism, he completely disregards the hundreds of epistemological studies on skepticism in general or on Pyrrhonism in particular published especially since the late 1970s. The reason is simply that Porchat does not engage in any systematic discussion of epistemological matters. (For a different appraisal of Porchat’s work, see Smith & Bueno 2016 and Smith 2018.)

It must nonetheless be observed that, unlike de Olaso’s, Porchat’s teaching and writings exerted a strong influence on his students, to the extent that several of them devoted their own work to the study of skepticism, creating in Brazil a relatively large community of academics interested in that philosophical movement. The work of those Brazilian scholars influenced by Porchat has been primarily exegetical and historical, with special focus on ancient and modern skepticism. A clear exception is Otávio Bueno (b. 1970), who after completing his B.A. and M.A. studies at USP, did his Ph.D. at the University of Leeds and is at present a professor at the University of Miami. Although Bueno’s main areas of research are the philosophy of science, the philosophy of mathematics, and logic, he has also discussed epistemological issues in connection with skepticism, particularly of a Pyrrhonian stripe. He has argued that it is mistake to claim that the Pyrrhonist is in the end committed to epistemic internalism, given that the latter’s arguments against epistemic externalism are merely dialectical (Bueno 2011). He has also rejected the view that the Pyrrhonist cannot induce the state of suspension of judgment on the basis of the Agrippan mode from disagreement alone (Bueno 2013). In other articles in which Pyrrhonism is also taken into account, Bueno has critically assessed Donald Davidson’s and Ernest Sosa’s responses to skepticism (Bueno 2005 and 2009, respectively). It is finally worth mentioning that he has defended a Pyrrhonian approach to contemporary science, in connection with Bas van Fraassen’s (1980) constructive empiricism (Bueno 2015, 2021).

Regarding Brazilian scholarship on epistemological skepticism, three other researchers may be mentioned: Plínio Junqueira Smith (b. 1964), Waldomiro José da Silva Filho (b. 1966), and Claudio Gonçalves de Almeida (1960).

Smith, who pursued his undergraduate and graduate studies in philosophy at USP, is probably the Brazilian scholar most influenced by Porchat’s teaching and writings. He is currently a professor at the Universidade Federal de São Paulo (UNIFESP) and the editor of the Brazilian journal Sképsis (2007)—one of the two journals devoted to skepticism (co-)edited in Latin America. Although his work bears mainly on the history of modern skepticism, Smith has recently written somewhat more epistemologically oriented papers devoted to Porchat’s skeptical stance (Smith 2015) and to what he regards as Barry Stroud’s neo-Pyrrhonism (Smith 2016).

Da Silva Filho obtained his B.A. in philosophy from the Universidade Estadual de Santa Cruz and his M.A. and Ph.D. in communication and contemporary culture from the Universidade Federal da Bahia (UFBA). Currently a professor at UFBA, he works in the fields of philosophy of mind and epistemology. In some of his publications, he has examined certain skeptical difficulties concerning self-knowledge (da Silva Filho 2007, 2008). Even though he was not one of Porchat’s students, he has also been influenced by Porchat’s skeptical stance.

De Almeida obtained his B.A. in social communication from the Pontifícia Universidade Católica do Rio Grande do Sul (PUCRS), his M.A. in philosophy from USP, and his Ph.D. in philosophy from McMaster University (Canada). Currently a professor at PUCRS, his main area of research is epistemology. He has written on epistemic closure and skepticism—arguing inter alia that neither knowledge nor epistemic justification are closed under logical implication and that this closure-failure does not affect Cartesian skepticism (de Almeida 2007, 2012)—and on Stroud’s influential interpretation of Cartesian skepticism, which de Almeida claims is crippled by a level confusion (de Almeida 2016).

As regards Argentina, one finds several researchers exploring skepticism in the context of contemporary epistemology, among whom one may mention Eleonora Cresto (b. 1971), Juan Comesaña (b. 1972), and Diego Machuca (b. 1976).

Cresto’s initial interest in skepticism arose under the influence of de Olaso, who supervised her B.A. thesis at the Universidad de Buenos (UBA). She later on pursued her M.A, M.Phil., and Ph.D. at Columbia University. Currently a researcher at CONICET and a professor at the Universidad Nacional de Tres de Febrero in Argentina, she works primarily in formal epistemology (on which see Section 4). In her first published papers, she critically examined both reliabilist and naturalistic anti-skeptical responses proposed in the literature, finding them unsatisfactory (Cresto 1996a, 1996b), but also put forward a reliabilist reply of her own to skepticism (Cresto 1997).

After pursuing his undergraduate studies at UBA, Comesaña obtained his Ph.D. from Brown University under Sosa’s supervision, and is at present a professor at Rutgers University. In Buenos Aires, he was a founding member of the influential but now-defunct Grupo de Acción Filosófica (GAF). Having published on various epistemological issues (on which see Section 3), he has devoted some studies to skepticism. He has offered useful overviews of both the so-called Pyrrhonian problematic and skepticism in general (Comesaña 2006a and 2009a, respectively). He has also explored whether the contemporary theories of contextualism and contrastivism can help Pyrrhonists offer a philosophically satisfactory reply to the traditional objection according to which they are reduced to inactivity because action requires belief and they claim to suspend judgment regarding either philosophico-scientific beliefs or all beliefs whatsoever. Comesaña’s verdict is negative (Comesaña 2011).

Machuca, who pursued his undergraduate and graduate studies in Argentina, obtaining his Ph.D. at UBA, is currently a researcher at CONICET and the editor (with Duncan Pritchard) of the International Journal for the Study of Skepticism (2011). Having initially devoted himself to examining Sextus’s Pyrrhonism and moral skepticism, he has more recently focused also on a systematic discussion of skepticism in relation to epistemological issues. He has looked at the relevance of Pyrrhonism to contemporary theories of knowledge and justification and, in particular, to the present-day debate over the epistemic significance of disagreement, defending a neo-Pyrrhonian stance (Machuca 2013b, 2015a, 2017a, 2022). He has also examined the connection between disagreement and skepticism in general, arguing inter alia that a radical disagreement-based skepticism cannot be dismissed out of hand as being patently untenable or absurd (Machuca 2015b, 2017b).

In other Latin American countries, one finds some epistemological studies on skepticism, and Pyrrhonism in particular, but interest in this topic is much more sporadic. We will here summarize the works of Pedro Stepanenko (Mexico) and Mauricio Zuluaga (Colombia) that are more epistemological in nature.

Stepanenko (b. 1960), a specialist on Kant, obtained a Ph.D. in philosophy at the Universidad Autónoma de México, where he is currently a professor and a member of the Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas (on which see Section 1). In Stepanenko (2011), he argues that, by using either a conditional or a disjunctivist interpretation of his appearance-statements, the Pyrrhonian skeptic can report on his own experiences without being epistemically committed to the beliefs one usually accepts when ascribing mental states to oneself.

Zuluaga obtained his B.A. and M.A. in philosophy from the Universidad de los Andes and the Universidad Nacional de Colombia, respectively, and his Ph.D. in the same field from the Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München (Germany). He is currently a professor at the Universidad del Valle (Colombia). Zuluaga has looked at Agrippa’s trilemma in the context of contemporary epistemological discussions of the regress argument, but his approach is merely expository: he limits himself to providing an overview of part of the literature on the trilemma and on the problems faced by foundationalism and coherentism (Zuluaga 2005). He has also written about contemporary reconstructions of Cartesian skepticism that are based on the closure principle (Zuluaga 2012), but his approach is again entirely expository.

3. Core Epistemology

Core epistemology is concerned basically with the systematic analysis of knowledge and justified belief. So, in this section we will refer to works that examine fundamental epistemological concepts—such as knowledge, truth, and justification—or that defend or attack certain general epistemological theories—such as reliabilism and fallibilism.

The Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas is where Luis Villoro (1922–2014) spent the bulk of his academic career. Born in Barcelona (Spain) to a Mexican mother and a Spanish father, and raised in Spain and Belgium, he settled in Mexico at the outbreak of the Second World War and became a Mexican citizen. He did his undergraduate and graduate studies at the Universidad Autónoma de México and spent research periods in France and Germany. In 1982, he published the first analytically oriented book on epistemology written in Spanish: Creer, saber, conocer (Villoro 1982), translated into English as Belief, Personal, and Propositional Knowledge (Villoro 1998). Villoro examined fundamental concepts such as belief, knowledge, truth, objectivity, and epistemic communities. He distinguished between saber and conocer, which roughly correspond to what may be called “propositional” and “personal knowledge”, respectively, the latter consisting in having direct experiences of a given object. S can assert that he has personal knowledge of x provided that he has the relevant personal experiences, but if S wants to justify to someone else the claim that he has such knowledge of x, S must show that he has propositional knowledge of his personal knowledge. Villoro seems to have defended a form of epistemic relativism inasmuch as he claimed that to know (in the sense of saber) that p is to believe that p, and to have objectively sufficient reasons to so believe—an objectively sufficient reason being one that is conclusive, coherent, and complete—but also maintained that what is considered as an objectively sufficient reason in one epistemic community may not be so considered in another. For this reason, he claimed that empirical knowledge is fallible: on the basis of the reasons that are objectively sufficient for any member of his epistemic community, S knows that p, but he cannot rule out the possibility that there might be contrary reasons available to a different epistemic community that would undermine his knowledge that p. Objectively sufficient reasons are our best guarantee of empirical truths, but they do not of necessity imply such truths (Villoro 1982: 180, 192). Villoro held that the view that all knowledge is socially conditioned is the only valid alternative to skepticism (1982: 164). He also proposed a surprising reform of the traditional concept of knowledge: the notion of truth should not be included in the definition of knowledge because, even though the notion of an objectively sufficient reason cannot be understood without the notion of truth, one may know that p even if p is not true, for truth is not a necessary condition for a reason to be objectively sufficient (1982: ch. 8). (For a fuller overview of Villoro’s book, see Cresto 2010a: 474–477.)

Villoro’s position has been criticized by Guillermo Hurtado (b. 1962), a professor at the Universidad Autónoma de Mexico who obtained a B.A. in philosophy at this university as well as a B.A. and a Ph.D. in the same field at the University of Oxford. Hurtado (2003) argues that Villoro’s epistemic relativism and his redefinition of the concept of knowledge are the result of the fact that Villoro grants the skeptic the unacceptable view that, in order to be able to claim that one knows that p, one must have an infallible criterion for knowing that one knows.

Eleonora Cresto (on whom see Section 2) has devoted some papers to examining core epistemological issues. For instance, adopting a moderately Peircean perspective, she has called into question the traditional picture of knowledge attribution according to which one can attribute knowledge of p to S only if p is true and S is epistemically justified in believing in p. Cresto maintains that epistemic justification (understood either in internalist or externalist terms) is not always viewed as a necessary condition for knowledge, and hence as a necessary condition for making a correct knowledge attribution, according to our pre-theoretical usage of standard epistemic terms (Cresto 2018; cf. Cresto 2012: 928–929).

There has also been some discussion of the concept of knowledge in terms of both reliability and fallibility. Let us begin with the former. Succinctly put, reliabilism holds that a belief is knowledge if it is true and if it was produced, or is sustained, by a reliable process that yields mostly true beliefs. Reliabilist theories of knowledge require a reliable mechanism for belief formation, but do not require that the epistemic agent be aware or have evidence of the mechanism’s reliability. For this reason, reliabilism is a form of externalism. Juan Comesaña (on whom see the previous section) has proposed an original theory of epistemic justification that combines elements of both reliabilism and evidentialism—which represent two competing approaches in contemporary analytic epistemology. This theory, which he calls “evidentialist reliabilism”, is intended to incorporate the best aspects of both positions while avoiding the most serious problems they face (Comesaña 2010). Comesaña has also argued that reliabilism is able to successfully deal with the so-called “generality problem” (Comesaña 2006b), and that the epistemological problems stemming from lotteries either are not peculiar to reliabilism or can be solved by appealing to a probabilistic account of reliability (Comesaña 2009b). He has as well referred to reliability in his discussion of “safety”. Several epistemologists (such as Ernest Sosa, Timothy Williamson, and Duncan Pritchard) have defended the view that safety is a necessary condition for knowledge. Roughly put, what that condition says is that S knows that p if and only if S would believe that p only if p were true. On the basis of a counterexample, Comesaña (2005) has argued that safety, as this notion has been defined by Sosa, is not actually a necessary condition for knowledge. The reason is that, whereas reliability is plausibly a necessary condition for knowledge, reliable reliability is not, and whereas knowledge is compatible with unreliably reliable beliefs, safety is not. Hence, one can have “unsafe” knowledge. Comesaña’s more recent work in collaboration with Matthew McGrath and Stewart Cohen has focused on the part played by false beliefs in epistemology. He has argued that false propositions can be part of one’s evidence or can be reasons to do something (Comesaña & McGrath 2014, 2016) and, against Williamson, that one can have rational or justified false beliefs (Cohen & Comesaña 2013a, 2013b, forthcoming).

As regards fallibilism, it is safe to say that nearly all present-day epistemologists are fallibilists: we sometimes make mistakes—occasionally even about those things we deem to be most evident—despite having good justification for our beliefs. More precisely, S fallibly knows that p in case, despite the good justification underlying one’s knowledge, S’s belief that p might have been false or might have been accidentally true (cf. Reed 2002). Hurtado (2000) rejects such a virtually unanimous position—which he defines as “the doctrine that any of our beliefs might turn out to be false”—on the grounds both that it is revisionist and that we lack good reasons to accept it. Fallibilism is revisionist because, he argues, it runs counter to common sense both by erasing the ordinary distinction between those beliefs that cannot be false and those that can, and by claiming that no evidence or no reasons can guarantee the truth of a given belief. And there are no good reasons to accept fallibilism because Hurtado claims to be able to refute what he describes as the historico-pragmatic, epistemological, and ethical arguments in its favor, and because he believes that fallibilism is dialectically weak against both skepticism and dogmatism.

It is also worth mentioning that Claudio de Almeida (on whom see Section 2) has devoted part of his work to the so-called Moore’s paradox, arguing that none of the most influential analyses of the paradox provides a successful solution to it, and proposing a solution of his own (de Almeida 2001, 2009). More recently, he has published on the defeasibility theory of knowledge, arguing that a fallibilistic version of this theory provides the correct solution to the Gettier problem (de Almeida & Fett 2016, de Almeida 2017).

We should finally refer to the work of Carlos Pereda (b. 1944), even though epistemology has not been the focus of his research. Born in Uruguay, he obtained a B.A. in philosophy and educational sciences from the Universidad de la República in his home country, as well as a M.A. and a Ph.D. in philosophy from Universität Konstanz (Germany). He pursued most of his academic career in Mexico, first at the Universidad Autónoma Metropolitana and then at UNAM’s Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas. His work is mainly concerned with the nature and purpose of argumentation (Pereda 1994a, 1994b), and it is in this context that he deals with certain epistemological subjects. For instance, he calls the rules that govern the way in which the argumentative game is to be played “epistemic virtues”, which are character traits or dispositions of those involved in a debate, such as coherence, rigor, and willingness to consider one’s rival theses. The exercise of the epistemic virtues is what makes argumentation possible and what enables us to resolve conflicts of beliefs. Pereda also discusses what he calls “the trilemma of knowledge” (el trilema del saber), which arises from the following three claims:

  1. We know (understood in the sense that many of our beliefs are knowledge).
  2. We are fallible (understood in the sense that any of our beliefs may turn out to be false).
  3. S knows that p iff (a) S believes that p, (b) p is true, (c) S is wholly justified in believing that p, and (d) between the fact p and the belief that p there is an appropriate causal connection and S correctly reconstructs such a connection in her justification.

The trilemma emerges because, given that (3) formulates the concept of knowledge as infallible knowledge, only two of (1), (2), and (3) can be held together: if (1) and (2) are true, then (3) is false (there is fallible knowledge); if (1) and (3) are true, then (2) is false (there is infallible knowledge); and if (2) and (3) are true, then (1) is false (there is no knowledge). Pereda maintains that the solution to the trilemma is not to abandon one of the claims, but to recognize that there is both a strong and a weak sense of the concept of knowledge. Pereda’s view has been criticized by Guillermo Hurtado (1996), who contends that the trilemma results from incorrectly analyzing (2), which should be understood not as the claim that any of our beliefs may turn out to be false, but as the claim that some of our beliefs may turn out to be false.

4. Formal Epistemology

Formal epistemology is concerned with the examination of traditional epistemological questions using the formal tools of logic and probability. There has been a small but important group of Latin American researchers working within this subfield of epistemology—sometimes in close collaboration with scholars from the United States, Europe, and Australia—particularly on such topics as belief change, Bayesian epistemology, and theory choice.

Argentina has been the main center of development of the subfield of formal epistemology in Latin America, beginning in the mid-1980s. The first central figure was the Argentinian Carlos Alchourrón (1931–1996), who obtained his B.A. in law and his Ph.D. in law and social sciences at the Universidad de Buenos Aires (UBA), where he taught until his death. He was one of the founders of the Sociedad Argentina de Análisis Filosófico (on which see Section 1). He also founded, at UBA’s philosophy department, a logic group that would eventually incorporate researchers working on artificial intelligence at UBA’s computer science department. The interdisciplinary group became a hotbed of formal epistemology.

Alchourrón’s main line of research concerned the theory of belief change, which basically deals with the question of how a belief set is to be updated in light of new information. In 1985 he published, together with Peter Gändenfors and David Makinson, a seminal article in which they advanced an axiomatic theory that has come to be known as “the AGM theory of belief change”, “the AGM account of the logic of belief change”, or “the AGM theory of belief revision” (Alchourrón, Gändenfors, & Makinson 1985; cf. Alchourrón & Makinson 1982, 1985, 1986). The AGM theory identifies three types of belief change: expansion, contraction, and revision, focusing on the last two. Roughly put, expansion consists in adding to a given belief set a new belief that does not conflict with the current beliefs of the set; contraction involves removing a belief from the set; and revision amounts to adding a new belief to the set and removing others from it so that the resulting set stays consistent. The AGM theory proposes six basic and two supplementary postulates for each of the two operations of contraction and revision that every appropriate belief-change method must satisfy. Since its appearance in 1985, the AGM theory has had a tremendous impact on subsequent discussions of belief change, becoming the predominant paradigm, even though some of its main assumptions have been questioned and several modifications or extensions of it have been proposed (for an overview, see Arló-Costa & Fermé 2010 and Hansson 2011; see also Fermé & Hansson 2011, which is a special issue on the occasion of the 25 years of the AGM theory). The theory has also had a considerable influence on research on artificial intelligence (on which see Carnota & Rodríguez 2010). Towards the end of his life, Alchourrón’s work focused on the logic of defeasible conditionals (Alchourrón 1993, 1995, 1996; see Fermé & Rodríguez 2006 for an analysis of his theory of conditionals).

A second key contributor to the development of formal epistemology, not only in Latin America but worldwide, was Horacio Arló-Costa (1956–2011). Born in Montevideo (Uruguay), he pursued his undergraduate studies at UBA, obtaining his B.A. in philosophy under the supervision of Alchourrón, and was a member of Alchourrón’s logic group since its founding. He later on obtained his Ph.D. in philosophy at Columbia University under the supervision of Isaac Levi, with whom he would collaborate in a number of publications. From 1997 until his death, he worked at Carnegie Mellon University, where he helped found the Center for Formal Epistemology. Arló-Costa made significant contributions to the study of the logic of belief change (Arló-Costa 1990, 2006; Arló-Costa & Levi 2006), conditionals (Arló-Costa 1995, 1999; Arló-Costa & Levi 1996), Bayesian epistemology (Arló-Costa 2001, Arló-Costa & Thomason 2001, Arló-Costa & Parikh 2005, Arló-Costa & Pedersen 2012), and rationality and decision theory (Arló-Costa 1996; Arló-Costa, Collins, & Levi 1995; Arló-Costa & Helzner 2010; Arló-Costa & Pedersen 2011, 2013). (For a brief presentation of Arló-Costa’s original contributions to those subjects as well as to modal logic, see Cresto 2011.)

Another former student of Alchourrón to be mentioned is the Argentinian Eduardo Fermé (b. 1964), who was also a member of Alchourrón’s group when it became interdisciplinary. Currently a professor at the Universidad de Madeira (Portugal), he obtained his B.A. and Ph.D. in computer science at UBA, and his Ph.D. in philosophy at the Royal Institute of Technology (Sweden). Fermé’s research has focused mainly on theory contraction and on epistemic entrenchment, extending or modifying in several of his publications the AGM theory (Fermé 1998, 2000, 2001; Fermé & Hansson 1999; Fermé & Reis 2013).

A leading international specialist in database theory, the Argentinian Alberto Mendelzon (1951–2005), also deserves a mention because of his key contribution to the theory of belief change. He obtained a B.Sc. from UBA as well as a M.S.E., a M.A., and a Ph.D. from Princeton University. From 1980 until his death, he taught at the University of Toronto. He also contributed to the creation of UBA’s computer science department in the early 1980s. In 1992 he published, together with Hirofumi Katsuno, a highly influential paper that addresses the issue of updating knowledge bases (Katsuno & Mendelzon 1992). They distinguished between two kinds of modification to a knowledge base: update and revision. While the former consists in bringing the knowledge base up to date when the world it describes changes, the latter consists in modifying the knowledge base when new information about a static world is acquired. Mendelzon and Katsuno claimed that the AGM postulates describe only revision and hence that, in order to describe update, the AGM theory should be considerably modified by adding new postulates. (On Mendelzon’s work on belief change, see also Katsuno & Mendelzon 1989 and 1991.)

Regarding formal epistemology in Argentina, one may finally refer to a number of works by Eleonora Cresto, who completed her Ph.D. under the supervision of Isaac Levi. Her first publications in the field were concerned with formal belief-revision theories (Cresto 2008, 2010b). She later on offered a defense of a moderate version of the so-called KK principle—according to which if S knows that p, then S knows that she knows that p—as a normative rather than descriptive epistemic principle. Her defense of such a principle of epistemic transparency is different from that traditionally proposed by epistemic internalists inasmuch as her argument is a formal one that appeals to lower- and higher-order probabilities (Cresto 2012). Cresto’s more recent research in the subfield of formal epistemology focuses on such topics as group knowledge and probability aggregation (Cresto 2015a, 2016, 2017).

Research in formal epistemology has also been important in Brazil, where several researchers from artificial intelligence and computer science have examined the application of belief-change theory to various areas. Among them one may mention Odinaldo Rodrigues (b. 1968) and Renata Wassermann (b. 1971).

Rodrigues, who has been teaching at King’s College London since 1998, obtained his B.Sc. in computer science at the Universidade de Fortaleza, his MSc in computer science at the Universidade Federal do Rio de Janeiro, and his Ph.D. in computing at Imperial College London. He has applied the principles of belief change to non-classical logics, software engineering, and social choice theory (Gabbay & Rodrigues 1996; Gabbay, Pigozzi, & Rodrigues 2006, 2007; Gabbay, Rodrigues, & Russo 2008; Gabbay, Rodrigues, & Pigozzi 2009).

Wassermann obtained her B.Sc. in computer science and her M.Sc. in applied mathematics at the Universidade de São Paulo (USP), and her Ph.D. in computer science at the University of Amsterdam. She is at present a professor at USP’s computer science department and a member of the research group “Lógica, Inteligência Artificial e Métodos Formais” (LIAMF), which was founded in 2000 at USP and is one of the most active Latin American groups working on belief change. Wassermann has published extensively in this field, examining local belief change and applying the AGM theory to non-classical logics and to computer science (Wassermann 1999; Chopra, Parikh, & Wassermann 2001; Hansson & Wassermann 2002; Ribeiro, Wassermann, Flouris, & Antoniou 2013; Wassermann & Ribeiro 2015).

5. Wittgenstein: Epistemology and Skepticism

Another line of epistemological research in Latin America concerns Ludwig Wittgenstein’s thought. The first scholar to be mentioned is Alejandro Tomasini Bassols (b. 1952). A member of the Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas at the Universidad Autónoma de México, he has devoted a considerable part of his work to interpreting Wittgenstein’s thought and endorses what he describes as “a radical Wittgensteinism”. Although from the vantage point of the numerous Anglophone specialists on Wittgenstein his writings might not offer original insights, they have contributed to the dissemination of the Austrian philosopher’s thought in the Spanish-speaking world. In his 2001 book, Tomasini Bassols examines the concept of knowledge, the problem of skepticism, and various issues concerning perception, memory, self-knowledge, personal identity, and truth by contrasting the “classical” and the Wittgensteinian approaches to each of those questions. Availing himself primarily of the epistemological considerations found in On Certainty, his main contention is that the type of grammatical analysis proposed by Wittgenstein shows that the traditional problems that classical epistemology intended to solve through the construction of elaborate theories are nothing but pseudo-problems arising from conceptual misunderstandings. For this reason, he contends, it is no longer possible to continue to practice epistemology the way it was practiced before Wittgenstein.

In Colombia, one finds several scholars interested in Wittgenstein’s philosophy, among whom one should mention Magdalena Holguín (b. 1950) and Raúl Meléndez (b. 1964). Holguín obtained her B.A. and M.A. in philosophy from Georgetown University, her M.A. in law from the Universidad de los Andes (Colombia), and her Ph.D. in philosophy from Columbia University. She taught at the Universidad de los Andes and the Universidad Nacional de Colombia. In her short 1997 book, she explores Wittgenstein’s stance on certain skeptical problems. After presenting Wittgenstein’s view that philosophy is not a theory or a doctrine but an activity, as well as the changes in his conception of philosophy over the different phases of his thought, Holguín examines the distinction between appearance and reality, the distinction between subjective and objective, and the idea, shared by skeptics and dogmatists but rejected by Wittgenstein as being based on confusion, that knowledge requires an ultimate foundation. (It should be noted that skeptics of a Pyrrhonian stripe suspend judgment about whether knowledge requires an ultimate foundation.)

Meléndez is a professor at the Universidad Nacional de Colombia, where he also obtained his Ph.D. in philosophy. In his 1998 book, he explores the notion of truth from the vantage point of Wittgenstein’s later philosophy, although he also takes into account the conception of truth defended in the Tractatus. Meléndez’s main aim is to call into question the attempts to construct a general theory of truth that would make it rest on an ultimate and unshakable foundation. In a later publication, he discusses Wittgenstein’s examination of the notions of justification, persuasion, and world-picture (Weltbild) in On Certainty, focusing on whether world-pictures are taken to be incommensurable and hence on whether Wittgenstein endorses a form of epistemic relativism (Meléndez 2014).

It should finally be pointed out that in Brazil there has been some discussion of the philosophical connections between Wittgenstein’s thought and Pyrrhonian skepticism—a comparison first made, to the best of my knowledge, by Richard Watson (1969) and Robert Fogelin (1981). Plínio Junqueira Smith (1993) has claimed that there are strong similarities between Wittgenstein’s later philosophy and the Pyrrhonism expounded in Sextus Empiricus’s surviving works. For instance, according to Smith, both reject the conception of philosophy as a theory that provides us with knowledge of the essence of things that lies beneath their surface, conceiving of it instead as an ability and a therapeutic practice whose function is negative and critical. Smith’s interpretation was later on called into question by Paulo Roberto Margutti Pinto—currently a professor at the Faculdade Jesuíta de Filosofia e Teologia—who maintained that, although there exist similarities, they are merely superficial while the differences are radical: e.g., while the Pyrrhonist accepts that there are philosophical problems to be solved, Wittgenstein dissolves them by appealing to the way in which words are used in ordinary language (Margutti Pinto 1996).

6. Epistemology of Law

We can also briefly refer to an area that has received some attention in recent years, namely, the epistemology of law. In this area, we can mention the work of Andrés Páez and Eleonora Cresto.

Páez obtained his B.A. in philosophy from the Universidad de los Andes (Colombia) and his M.A. and Ph.D. in philosophy from The City University of New York. He is currently a professor at the Universidad de los Andes. While in Páez (2014) he examines the relevance of the epistemological debate between reductionism and anti-reductionism about testimony to the problem of the reliability of testimonial evidence by focusing on both Colombian and American legislation, in Páez (2016) he explores the nature of legal reputation from the point of view of social epistemology by considering recent views on group beliefs.

We have already discussed Cresto’s work in epistemology in previous sections. Concerning the epistemology of law, while Cresto (2015b) outlines a theory of evidence in the legal context by focusing on a particular model of the inference to the best explanation that is based on elements of decision theory, Cresto (2016) proposes a solution to the problem of judgment aggregation that can be applied to the problem of opinion aggregation in the context of a court of appeals or a jury.

7. Religious Epistemology

There is at present an emerging interest in religious epistemology among Latin American scholars. Such an interest has been fostered by several projects funded by the John Templeton Foundation, especially “LATAM Bridges in the Epistemology of Religion” (2019–2023), directed by Luis Oliveira at the University of Houston. This religiously neutral project consists in a series of activities intended to create bridges between North American philosophers working in analytic epistemology of religion and Latin American philosophers interested in engaging in research in that domain: organization of seminars on religious epistemology in Argentina, Brazil, and Chile; selection of scholars for mentoring and research fellowships; and establishment of prizes to incentivize scholarly activity. The ultimate goal of the project is to train several dozen Latin American scholars to do serious work on religious epistemology in their own universities—thus increasing the number of classes taught on it and the number of majors and grad students introduced to it—and to help them develop academic relationships with the North American philosophical community.

Worth mentioning are also two editorial projects. One is the publication of the first companion to contemporary philosophy of religion in the Spanish-speaking world (Rossi & Garcia forthcoming), which will include a section on the epistemic status of religious belief. One third of the contributions to this volume will be written by Latin American scholars working in the philosophy of religion, while the rest will be authored by North American and European scholars and translated into Spanish. The companion is intended to contribute to the development of Latin American scholarship in analytic philosophy of religion.

The second project is the edition of a special issue of the journal Religious Studies (Alvarado & Portugal forthcoming), which will bring together some of the results of various recent research projects on the existence and nature of God and the rationality or justification of religious beliefs and practices that have been funded by the Templeton Foundation. These projects were supported by two large grants aimed to foster systematic research in analytic philosophy of religion in both Spanish- and Portuguese-speaking Latin America.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


For their comments, I am grateful to an anonymous reviewer, Otávio Bueno, and Edward Zalta.

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Diego Machuca <diegomachuca@gmail.com>

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