Supplement to Environmental Ethics

Biodiversity Preservation

The diversity of life on earth has long been thought to deserve attention, and respect. John Muir used a version of Christianity in his attempt to argue that species deserve our respect: “Again and again, in season or out of season, the question comes up, ‘what are rattlesnakes good for?’ as if nothing that does not rightly make for the benefit of man had any right to exist; as if our ways were God’s ways” (Muir 1916: 98–99). Despite this, and similar remarks from other early writers, it was only in the 1980s that sustainability came to the fore as a focus of environmental policy, and in this section, we look at the notion of biodiversity, one that was hardly a central concern of biologists or ecosystems theorists in the 1980s (Tilman 2000). Nonetheless, a significant number of books and papers by biologists and philosophers have long sounded a warning about the loss of species, the possible impact of such losses on ecosystem functions and the reduction in value – both moral and economic – that was likely as a consequence of the reduction in natural variety (Norton 1986 and 1987; Wilson 1992).

The work of scientists and philosophers fed into the publication in 1992 of the United Nations Convention on Biological Diversity (UN 1992). The preamble to the document refers explicitly both to the utility of nature, and also to its intrinsic value, echoing themes from both economics and philosophy. The contracting parties, it explains, are conscious “of the intrinsic value of biological diversity and of the ecological, genetic, social, economic, scientific, educational, cultural, recreational and aesthetic values of biological diversity and its components”. They are also “conscious of the importance of biological diversity for evolution and for maintaining life sustaining systems of the biosphere” (UN 1992: 1).

A question that arises in discussions of how best to preserve the diversity of life concerns how biodiversity is to be measured. Related to this is the puzzle of whether the biodiversity of an area – however it is calculated – reveals something about its “natural” value? Debates over these questions go to the heart of discussions on biodiversity. A further question is whether the ethics of conservation has a specific focus on preservation of wilderness as such, or at least a focus on landscapes and populations that are natural. In fact, high biodiversity, by some measures, can be associated with human use and occupation, as when adding a farming system to a desert raises local diversity. Hence, not all natural systems maximize biodiversity when left undisturbed (see Brennan and Lo 2010: 113–37 for discussion of what is meant by “natural”). In some temperate forest systems, it is disturbance to the forest – including human land clearing activities – that provokes an increase in diversity in tree species (Brennan 2014: 92–108). On the other hand, many highly prized wild places are not particularly rich in natural variety (Sarkar 2005: 21–44). In some places, wilderness and biodiversity are indeed closely related, as in those set-aside wild areas that are also hotspots of biodiversity. There seems to be no doubt that management and preservation of natural variety is easier in the presence of low human population density (Mittermeier et al. 2003). Nonetheless the protection of biodiversity is quite a different issue from the preservation of wilderness. Some critics of current conservation practices urge that while protection of wilderness is a demanding goal in a world of ever-increasing human influence, the protection of biodiversity sets the bar too low if it simply aims at “the preservation of viable populations of species in their natural surroundings” (Mathews 2016, 141). Such viability, it can be argued, is compatible with the conservation of only minimal remnants of once abundant species and a consequent reduction in natural value.

A persistent complication is that there continues to be no single agreed measure of biodiversity (Maier 2012: 115–20). For example, the concept of species itself is capable of being defined in a variety of different ways. This is a complicating factor in any discussion about policies dealing with species numbers and diversity. One everyday understanding of the concept is the biological species concept, namely that, for sexually reproducing plants and animals, a species is a population of organisms that closely resemble each other genetically and are capable of interbreeding so as to produce fertile offspring. But there are other accounts. For example, according to certain genealogical or phylogenetic species concepts, two individuals are members of the same species if they both belong to the smallest group of individuals that share a common ancestor. A problem now arises: those who adopt the phylogenetic species concept will count species numbers differently from those who adopt the biological species concept. For example, one study claims that adopting the phylogenetic concept rather than one of the others would lead to large increases in the numbers of species to be found in various places. Looking at eighty-nine published studies on species populations, the study found that adopting the phylogenetic concept led to nearly a 50 per cent increase in the number of species identified in the various studies. Using the same concept resulted in a nearly 260 per cent increase in the number of lichen species identified and an 87 per cent increase in the number of mammal species (Agapow et al. 2004). If species are the fundamental units both of evolution and of biodiversity, then it is important to get the species concept sorted out. As one author puts it, “If our species counts are problematic, so will be our assessments of biodiversity” (Richards 2010: 10). This problem may be lessened if a unified species concept is successfully developed, one that is suitable for use in biodiversity studies (Freudenstein et al. 2017).

Alongside biodiversity, field research has concentrated on two other features: ecosystem stability and biological productivity. The problem of measuring biodiversity is compounded by ones involved in measuring both stability and productivity, leading to extended controversy among theorists in the 1990s (described in Sarkar 2005: 106–44). While some authorities once regarded high levels of biodiversity as correlated with high systemic productivity and high stability, this view was at odds with the observation that many of the world’s most highly productive systems are not very species-rich. However, some consensus has emerged that moderately diverse systems have high productivity and that extra diversity within such systems may yield insurance against external perturbations that might lead to a reduction in productivity. The arguments here are highly technical (for summary, see deLaplante and Picasso 2011). They point to the conclusion that conservation and rehabilitation efforts are best focused on whole systems, not individual populations. What matters is not so much defending or restoring individual species, but rather maintaining clusters of species making up landscape, forest or river systems.

For the most part, the ecosystem services which satisfy a large number of human preferences are supplied by relatively simple, non-diverse systems, such as salt marshes (useful for water filtration), and the low-diversity agricultural systems in which food is produced. These facts are consistent with the view that the strongest arguments for the preservation of biodiversity may actually not be based on its utility for human beings. In fact, Norton’s observation (Norton 1988) that cost-benefit analysis in terms of human interests alone does not support biodiversity has a striking parallel in arguments about human value. Consider, for example, the view that the strongest reason for governments to protect the welfare of their citizens should come from the moral notion of human dignity – an inherent worth possessed by each person which is to be respected regardless of the person’s circumstances and relations, including the person’s cost-and-benefit-relations to others (cf. Brennan and Lo 2007). If the government of a state has no intrinsic moral concern for the dignity and well-being of its citizens and its reason for raising or enforcing standards of health and security, for example, is merely that a healthier population and safer streets will generate a higher gross domestic product, more revenues for the state and more money and power for those running it, then it is unlikely that such a government will be motivated to protect those citizens who are considered too weak, too aged, or otherwise unfit to be productive in economic or other instrumental terms. In a parallel fashion, many endangered species have already become functionally marginal to the ecosystem in which they are found. Someone who takes a purely cost-benefit perspective could argue that the negative impacts of the demise of those species on the system’s productivity might well be negligible or otherwise acceptable in anthropocentric terms, since the resources that would be required to preserve or restore populations of those species could be used to promote human benefits in other ways. Just as in the human case, cost-benefit perspectives on nature do not seem to provide a compelling reason for protecting many endangered species. This argument is complicated by the findings about cascading species extinctions, which may also be a factor in the conjectured worldwide reduction in vital insect species – a reduction which threatens human food supplies (Van der Sluijs and Vaage 2016). Such findings suggest that biodiversity may be of significant benefit to human life. Some writers have gone on to criticize biocentric positions – like Aldo Leopold’s – that appear to endorse the intrinsic value of natural things and communities. Such positions, it is argued, provide no better support for biodiversity preservation than enlightened anthropocentrism (Norton 1991, 93–102; Newman, Varner and Linquist 2017, ch.10).

But, apart from its potential importance to human beings, is biodiversity an intrinsic good worth protecting as an end-in-itself regardless of the instrumental values that it may or may not have for humans? The answer seems to depend on answers to at least two further questions: first, whether all living things – irrespective of species – are intrinsically valuable; and second, whether a world with diversity in intrinsic values is better than a world homogeneous in intrinsic values. Take the second question first. In terms of mere preference or liking, people often prefer having a variety of things they like to just having more of the same thing they like. The same pattern of appraisal may actually be true of values as well. Suppose people generally prefer an assembly of good things of different kinds to a bigger collection of good things of the same kind, and suppose this preference for diversity in good things can survive sustained reflection and scrutiny by people across time and culture, then, diversity in good things is of itself also a good thing. Thus, if one starts with the moral biocentric outlook that each and every life form is intrinsically valuable, then it will be natural as well as correct for one to accept the further proposition that biodiversity – that is, the diversity in biological forms of life – is also something intrinsically valuable. In short, if life is a good thing, and if a world containing good things of more different kinds is better than a world containing good things of fewer kinds, then higher biodiversity is better than lower biodiversity.

So what appears to be critical to the ethics of biodiversity is the first question: Is each and every living thing – irrespective of species – really valuable in itself? Taylor’s argument for the core thesis of biocentrism has already been reviewed: every living organism is intrinsically valuable because each has interests and goods of its own and each is capable of flourishing. The underlying idea is that if a being is able to fare better or worse, it is prima facie morally better if it fares better rather than worse. Still, there is a sceptical challenge which calls into question the moral relevance of biological interests. What reasons could there be for us to respect or give moral weight to the biological interests (if any) of a tapeworm (cf. O’Neill 1992: 131–132) or, to take a more fanciful example, of the lethal creatures in sci-fi movies like the Aliens series? To this request for reasons, the biocentrist’s best reply may be a further question: what good reasons do we have for thinking that members of the human species are more worthy than members of other species on Earth?

Many traditional arguments for attributing intrinsic value in a significantly higher degree, if not exclusively, to human beings have a common structure: they appeal to the fact humans have certain traits, such as self-consciousness, rationality, the capacities for language, for moral decision, for aesthetic creation and appreciation, and many other abilities and skills that are considered as meritorious or otherwise worthy, traits which no other life form on Earth has, or has to nearly such a great extent that humans have them. The underlying idea is that since these traits are the most valuable and morally relevant, creatures who possess them to a greater extent are more worthy than creatures who possess them to a lesser extent or lack them altogether. As critics have pointed out, however, these arguments setting out to compare the moral worth of different species do not actually start off from neutral ground. Instead, the set of traits identified, and assumed by the arguments to be the most morally relevant and worthy, are none other than exactly those traits characteristically and typically possessed by members of our own species (Taylor 1986, Plumwood 1993). As the history of interspecies comparisons in science and medicine has shown, researchers have faced constant challenges in maintaining the gap between the value they place on humans on the one hand and the animal research subjects with which they interact, on the other (Mason, Dentinger and Woods 2018).

If we are not to beg the question in favour of human superiority, it can be noted that objective comparisons can be made of different individuals of the same species regarding their species specific merits (that is, those capacities and skills required for living a good life relative to the species) – for example, over whether a certain antelope is better in detecting and escaping from dangers than another antelope, or whether a certain bear has better skills in catching fish than another bear. But if there is no one single standard of the good life that is applicable across all species, then we might argue – going further than Taylor – that it would not even be conceptually coherent or sensible to compare the merits of individuals belonging to different species. For example, it would not make sense to ask whether an antelope who has the capacities and skills to live a good antelope life is ‘better’ than a bear who has the capacities and skills to live a good bear life. If this is right, then the same logic should apparently apply when evaluating those arguments that seek to attribute superiority to humans over other living things: it would likewise not make sense to say that a human being who has the capacities and skills (e.g., self-consciousness, rationality, language, moral freedom, aesthetic creativity) to live a good human life is ‘better’ than a living thing of another species who has the capacities and skills to live a good life relative to its species.

Showing that there are problems with – and even failures in arguments for – human superiority does not amount to positively establishing the general biocentric thesis that all living things are intrinsically valuable, let alone the more controversial egalitarian biocentric proposition that all living things are equal in intrinsic value. Nevertheless, on the supposition that the appeal to human superiority is the only line of defence that humans have in attempting morally to justify their destructive exploitation of the earth’s environment and its other inhabitants, then, given that humans have already benefited disproportionately at the great expense of members of many other species, the onus appears to be on the humans to demonstrate that they are indeed ‘greater’ than the rest. There is a paradox in such a conclusion. If the greatness of humanity is not mere human self-aggrandisement, then such greatness may consist at its core in a moral capacity to look beyond the interests of oneself and one’s close associates, and to show a willingness to care for and share with those who are less able to fend for themselves.

Copyright © 2021 by
Andrew Brennan <>
Norva Y. S. Lo <>

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