Gustav Theodor Fechner

First published Sun Jan 12, 2020

Fechner’s philosophy is characterized by a clash between his metaphysical interests and his positivist proclivities. His metaphysical interests led him toward panpsychism: the doctrine that the universe is created and governed by mind or the soul; his positivist leanings led him to uphold an early version of verificationism and phenomenalism. Fechner insisted that there was no disparity between these tendencies, that the best scientific evidence supported the view that the universe is psychic. His philosophy of mind is an early form of neutral monism.

1. A Divided Soul

Gustav Theodor Fechner (1801–1887) is one of the most enigmatic thinkers of nineteenth century German philosophy. His intellectual soul was fractured, torn into two deeply divided halves, each of which claimed dominance over the other. His entire career was an attempt to unite these warring sides. But, despite his best efforts, he never succeeded.

What were these halves? On the one hand, Fechner had deep positivist proclivities, which made him advocate the strictest standards of observation and measurement in science, and which led him to adopt early versions of phenomenalism and verificationism in philosophy. On the other hand, Fechner also had a desperate longing for metaphysics, for a complete vision of the entire cosmos, which his piecemeal scientific work could never satisfy. The problem facing him was daunting: How to be both a cautious and sober scientist and a daring and imaginative metaphysician?

These two sides of Fechner represent conflicting currents of his age. Growing up in the early nineteenth century, Fechner was exposed to the rise of romanticism and the growth of the empirical sciences. He was an early student of romantic Naturphilosophie, the writings of Schelling, Oken and Steffans, which were Faustian attempts to grasp nature as a whole. But he was also a student of physics and physiology at the University of Leipzig, where his mentors, Alfred Volkmann and Ernst Weber, were at the forefront of experimental work on the psychology of perception. Fechner learned early that the speculative methods of Naturphilosophie were insufficient to yield careful and substantive results in science; despite that, he never lost the longing for unity, the desire for a complete vision of things, which is characteristic of Naturphilosophie.

Each side of Fechner’s personality bore its characteristic fruit. The product of his positivist side was his early scientific work on the psychology of perception, and his massive two volume work Elemente der Psychophysik (1860), which attempts to describe in precise laws the relationship between the psychic and physical. Because it stressed the dependence of the mental on its physical expression and embodiment, Fechner’s philosophy of mind has been described as a form of materialism. The product of his metaphysical side is his so-called “panpsychism”, the the doctrine that the cosmos is psychic, that it is an embodiment of the psychic (for a more precise definition of this term, see below, section 4). Fechner put forward this doctrine in his two most famous works: Nanna oder über das Seelenleben der Pflanzen (1848a) and Zend-Avesta oder über die Dinge des Himmels und des Jenseits (1851).

Fechner’s effort to harmonize the two sides of his nature came with his inductive metaphysics, i.e., the attempt to reach general metaphysical conclusions on the basis of the methods and results of the empirical sciences. Like other philosophers of his generation, viz., Lotze, Trendelenburg and Hartmann, Fechner rejected the synthetic methods of the German idealists (Fichte, Schelling, Hegel), who attempted to derive their conclusions by a priori methods. In his view, metaphysics should follow, not lead the empirical sciences, which are autonomous and stand on their own foundation independent of philosophy. The crucial question was whether general metaphysical principles really could be based on the empirical sciences, whose results are always piecemeal and tentative.

Any attempt to understand Fechner must come to terms with both sides of his personality. We must do justice to his panpsychism as well as his positivism. We can dismiss the panpsychism on positivist grounds, as many have done; but if we do that, we beg questions against Fechner. He insisted that his conclusions are based on well-grounded inferences from facts of experience, and he pointed out (rightly) that resistance to his views was often based on little more than prejudice. Far from a reckless metaphysician, Fechner himself applied positivist standards to his own metaphysics. We can dispute whether he met those standards; but we can can do so only after a careful examination of his argument. Even where his conclusions extend beyond the empirical evidence for them, they at least raise interesting questions and possibilities. Fechner’s panpsychism raises the important question of the limits of consciousness: Is consciousness limited to human beings and animals? Or should we extend it to plants and indeed all organic beings?

Many studies of Fechner are one-sided, emphasizing one side of him at the expense of the other. Older scholarship tended to focus on his metaphysical side, especially his panpsychism (see, for example, Adolph 1923; Bruchmann 1887; Pastor 1901a,b; Wille 1905; and Wentscher 1924: 18–72). In reaction to such work, a more recent book by Michael Heidelberger finds “the heart of Fechner’s philosophy” in his non-metaphysical side, and it stresses his “non-reductive materialism” as the main achievement of his philosophy (2004: 73–74). While Heidelberger’s work is an important corrective to older scholarship, it still makes the same mistake: it too is one-sided. It is unconvincing because it drastically underplays Fechner’s panpsychism, which it simply dismisses as “one of his most notorious ideas” (2004: 3). Though odd by contemporary standards, panpsychism was Fechner’s general worldview, and its exposition and defense would preoccupy him for much of his life. It is also deeply misleading to describe the heart of Fechner’s philosophy as any form of materialism, even if it is a “non-reductive” kind. Fechner not only had a deep aversion to materialism, but he also insisted that belief in the existence of matter is only the reification of an abstraction. There are indeed passages, which Heidelberger duly cites, where Fechner describes his philosophy as “very materialist”; but in those very same passages he also describes his philosophy as “very idealist”.[1]

The chief purpose of this introductory article is to provide a brief survey of Fechner’s most important philosophical writings. No attempt is made to consider his writings on physics and psychology, which is the task for another article. The most important philosophical writings are, in my opinion, Nanna, Zend-Avesta and Ueber die physikalische und philosophische Atomlehre.[2] These writings represent the two sides of Fechner’s philosophy, the metaphysical and positivist. There is also no attempt to provide an account of Fechner’s Elemente der Psychophysik—even though some contemporaries regarded it as his most important work—since its results are essentially empirical and have, on Fechner’s own reading (see Fechner 1860: I, 6), little philosophical relevance. Because Fechner’s philosophy is incomprehensible without knowing about his life, this article also includes two biographical sections, one on his early life and another on his mental breakdown. The latter section, though seemingly superfluous, is crucial because it is the source and motivation for Fechner’s mature philosophy. The article concludes with a short analysis of Fechner’s theory of mind, which is probably that aspect of his philosophy of most contemporary interest. Finally, a supplement: “Dr. Mises’ Merry Pranks” contains a survey of Fechner’s early pseudonymous writings, which should shed light on his philosophical development.

2. Early Years

Gustav Theodor Fechner was born on April 19, 1801, in the then Saxon village of Großsärchen. His father, Samuel Traugott Fischer (1765–1806), and indeed grandfather, were pastors in the village; and his mother, Dorothea Fechner (1744–1806), was also from a pastoral family. This religious background had a profound effect on Fechner, who would attempt to rationalize it in his philosophy.

Gustav was the second of five children. He had an older brother, Eduard Clemens (1799–1861), who was an artist, and who moved to Paris in 1825; he had three younger sisters, Emilie, Clementine, and Mathilde. Though only a village pastor, Samuel Fechner was a man of the Enlightenment: he was the first in his village to inoculate his children; he put a lightning rod on the village church; and he was the first to give sermons without wearing a wig. By all accounts he was a cherished father; but he died when Gustav was only five. His death left the family destitute.

Fechner showed great promise from an early age. He could speak Latin even as a boy. He learned quickly and studied avidly. When he was only fifteen, the Rektor of his Gymnasium said to him: “Fechner, you are still very young; you must leave because there is nothing more that we can teach you” (Kuntze 1892: 5). But, simply because he was too young for the university, he had to stay an extra year in the Gymnasium. When he was only sixteen, he went to the University of Leipzig. Since he could receive little help from his family, he had to rely on stipends and to give tutorials. Later Fechner would support himself through translations and literary work. This reliance on hack literary work, as we shall soon see, would prove fateful.

Fechner was, in the truest sense of the word, “ein Leipziger”. Though he spent his childhood in Großsärchen and Dresden, he lived almost his entire life in Leipzig, from 1817 to 1887. He travelled outside it only for vacations, and only once for a short sojourn, a three month stay in Paris in 1827. Leipzig was not intellectually restricting, however, since, in the first half of the nineteenth century, it was in many respects the cultural center of Germany. It was famous for its musical life, for its book trade, and for its literary salons. It was called “the Paris of Germany”. Fechner enjoyed this cultural life and was fully integrated into it.

Fechner first studied medicine, taking his Baccalaureate and doctoral exams in 1822. But he quickly became dissatisfied with the subject. Although he had the right to practice medicine, he confessed that he did not have the least idea how to bleed an artery, to deliver children, or to apply a bandage (Kuntze 1892: 38). Medicine also did not satisfy him as an intellectual discipline because its theories were based more on authority and tradition rather than observation and experiment. Because of his intellectual interests, Fechner soon gravitated toward physics, which applied higher standards and more rigorous methods than medicine. He gave up most of his lectures on medicine and attended only the lectures of the physiologist Ernst Heinrich Weber (1795–1878) and the mathematician Karl Mollweide (1774–1825). For a while Fechner became Mollweide’s assistant, but he confessed that he had little talent for mathematics (Kuntze 1892: 37). Weber’s and Mollweide’s work on perception would prove to be a profound influence on Fechner’s later psychophysics.

A crucial event in Fechner’s intellectual development came in 1820 with his reading of Lorenz Oken’s Lehrbuch zur Naturphilosophie (1809). Oken was an admirer of Schelling’s Naturphilosophie, and in his Lehrbuch he set out to provide a systematic exposition of its basic ideas and to reconcile its many opponents (in his “Vorrede” [1809: v–vi]).[3] Fechner was excited by Oken’s breathtaking speculations about the whole of nature. From his study of medicine he had become accustomed to see nature as a mechanism; but Oken gave him an exciting new way of conceiving nature as an organic whole. Fechner later said of his first reading of Oken’s book: “A new light seemed to me to illuminate the whole world and the sciences of the world; I was dazzled by it” (Kuntze 1892: 39).

For the next four years, Fechner devoted himself to Naturphilosophie. Although he said that he little understood Oken’s book, of which he read only the first chapter, he went on to read other Naturphilosophen, especially Schelling and Steffens. He was indeed so involved in Naturphilosophie that in 1823 he wrote his PhD dissertation on it, Praemissae ad theoriam organismi generalem (a summary is provided by Marilyn Marshall 1974b), which was a general theory of organisms. In 1824, in a collection of essays, Stapelia mixta, he made his own proposals for the method of Naturphilosophie (1824).[4]

In the midst of his fascination with Naturphilosophie, Fechner started writing satires under the pseudonym “Dr. Mises”. His first two publications were spoofs of the pretensions and practices of the medicine of his day: Beweis, daß der Mond aus Jodine bestehe (1821) and Panegyrikus der jezigen Medicin und Naturgeschichte (1822). These satires also contain a critique of the methods of Naturphilosophie, which Dr. Mises chastened for its hasty analogies and its lack of careful experimentation. Despite his awareness of its flaws, Fechner did not lose his enthusiasm for Naturphilosophie. He believed that its problems could be overcome by finding and employing the proper methodology. Hence the proposals in Stapelia mixta, which were designed to put Naturphilosophie on a sounder methodological footing.

However, in 1824, the very year in which Stapelia mixta appeared, Fechner seemed to have lost further confidence in Naturphilosophie. In that year he had begun to translate the French physicists Louis Jacques Thénard (1777–1857) and Jena Baptiste Biot (1774–1862), whose work deeply impressed him (Thénard 1813–16 [trans. 1825–28] and Biot 1817 [trans. 1828–29]). By following careful methods of experimentation and observation, the French physicists seemed to produce definite results. Fechner asked himself if Oken and Schelling could ever have produced the precise laws of optics found in Biot’s work? (Kuntze 1892: 39–40).

Despite such disillusionment, Naturphilosophie would remain a profound influence on Fechner. There are two fundamental ideals of Naturphilosophie which would have an enduring effect on him: first, its ideal of a unified worldview; and, second, its organic concept of nature. However much Fechner rejected the methods of Naturphilosophie, he was still excited by these ideals, which he would never renounce. Already by 1824, then, there is a basic tension in Fechner’s intellectual life: the hankering for speculative Naturphilosophie and the demand for exact science.

In the Winter Semester 1823–24, at the tender age of twenty-two, Fechner began his academic career by lecturing on physiology for the faculty of medicine. After the death of Ludwig Gilbert (1769–1824), the Leipzig professor of physics, in 1824, Fechner served as his temporary substitute. Because he was still so young, the position could not be made permanent. It was only in 1834 that Fechner finally became professor of physics in Leipzig.

During the 1820s, Fechner began his first experimental work, taking as his subject the new and exciting field of electricity. He conducted experiments to test, and to perfect the measurements for, Ohm’s law,[5] which had been discovered in 1826, but which was at first very controversial. Fechner’s exact observations and experiments were highly praised and contributed to the general acceptance of Ohm’s law. The experiments were collected under the title Maßbestimmungen über die galvanische Kette (Leipzig: Brockhaus, 1831).

In 1827 Fechner took a long journey through Bavaria, Salzburg, Tirol, and Switzerland, which finally ended with his three month stay in Paris. There he finally met Biot and Thénard as well as André Marie Ampère (1775–1836); their exacting experimental work served as a model for him. Fechner’s translations of Biot and Thénard played an important role in disseminating French mathematical science in Germany.

From 1838 to 1840 Fechner undertook experiments on the psychology of sense perception. In doing so he became part of a Leipzig tradition: in the 1830s Alfred Volkmann (1801–1877), and Ernst Heinrich Weber (1795–1878) and Eduard Friedrich Weber (1806–1871) had conducted experiments on the psychology and physiology of sense perception. Fechner continued in that tradition by conducting experiments on color perception. He wanted to investigate the connection between the objective phenomenon of light and its subjective perception. He discovered that the appearance of many color phenomena is due more to retinal fatigue rather than any property of light itself. Fechner’s results proved fruitful and were later taken up by Helmholtz.[6]

Although Fechner was making a name for himself, he was still nearly destitute. His lecturing posts were either poorly paid or not paid at all, so he somehow had to make up for the lack of income. To keep the wolf from the door, he engaged in various translation and writing projects. The most questionable of these projects was his editing Breitkopf and Härtel’s Hauslexikon, a household guide (1834). This work consisted in eight volumes, each containing eight to nine hundred pages; a third of the articles had to be written by Fechner himself. So our philosopher found himself writing on the best way to set the table and how to cut meat. Fechner’s motive for undertaking this work was totally financial: previous editions of the Hauslexikon had been very profitable. But, as fortune would have it, this edition proved to be a bust. Fechner’s mighty labors were for very little gain. It was working on such projects that so exhausted him, leading to his breakdown in 1840.

3. The Breakdown

The most dramatic and fateful event in Fechner’s life was his mental breakdown, which lasted for nearly four years, beginning in December 1839 and ending in October 1843. The breakdown was extremely severe, leading to near death and loss of sanity. His mental and physical collapse was the talk of Leipzig. No one expected Fechner to come out of it. But, remarkably, he did. That he survived it at all, and then continued in a productive career, is astonishing. Fechner himself regarded it as “a miracle”.

Fechner’s breakdown was a watershed in his intellectual development. It forced him to reevaluate the orientation of his work. From now on, he would write on only what was important to him. No more hackwork. More importantly, during his recovery Fechner had a mystical experience which it became his mission to spell out in philosophical prose. Some of Fechner’s iconic works are the direct result of this experience.

The story of the breakdown was told by Fechner himself in a memoir, entitled ‘Krankheitsgeschichte’, written in 1845 (reproduced in Kuntze 1892: 106–126). What follows are the highlights of his story.

In the Autumn of 1839 the strain of overwork was beginning to take its toll on Fechner. There were acute physical symptoms of mental stress. He was suffering from headaches, insomnia and lethargy. But there were also symptoms of neurosis. His thought was obsessive and compulsive. He complained that his thinking was leading nowhere, that he would constantly come back to the same point, that in doing so he was exhausting himself. It was impossible for him to stop thinking; he could not relax or distract himself. Rather than he controlling his thinking, it was as if his thinking were controlling him.

The worst physical symptom of Fechner’s growing illness was near blindness. He had strained his eyes doing his experimental work. He had to look through colored glasses at the sun, so that images of bright objects would remain in his eyes. He also had to stare for long periods at very fine measurement scales, which taxed his vision. His sight received “its final blow” in 1840. His eyes became so sensitive to light that he could not open them. He had to live in a completely darkened room and to wear a blindfold. Because of the deterioration of his sight, he had to abandon reading and writing; and because he could not read or write, he could not work. His great enemy became boredom. All could have been bearable to him if he could only sleep; but his insomnia was relentless.

Though Fechner could not read himself, someone could still read to him. For a while, this was his only source of stimulation. His wife would often read to him; so would a friend, who would visit him daily. That friend was no less than the young Hermann Lotze, who was just then beginning his writing career. But, eventually, even his visits had to stop. Fechner could not bear the strain of listening. There could be only complete silence in that darkened room.

Anything that involved mental effort was now unbearable to Fechner. Because even conversation was impossible for him, he avoided all contact with others, even his wife. And so Fechner became completely isolated, from the world and others. He was utterly alone in that black and silent room.

Desperate, Fechner finally made the fateful decision to listen to his doctors. They would attempt an experimental remedy from traditional Chinese medicine. They would apply to his back moxa—a down of dried leaves from the plant Artemisia moxa. The immediate effect was to create swellings, which left scars on his back; but the long-term effect was much worse: digestion became impossible. Now Fechner could not eat or drink; he quickly became emaciated. He was on the brink of starvation.

Fechner was rescued from starvation by a woman who was acquainted with his family. She had read of his illness, and dreamed of a remedy for it. She sent him pieces of dried ham, cleaned of all fat. To his surprise, Fechner enjoyed eating it, and he gradually recovered his strength through it.

Some of the symptoms Fechner describes in the depths of his illness sound like schizophrenia. He complained that his thoughts were beyond his control. They would arise from very incidental reasons and he could not stop them. As he wrote of his state of mind: “My inner being divided itself into two parts: in my self and in my thoughts.” (114)

Fechner later wrote that only two things prevented him from sinking into complete oblivion: the care of his wife and his religious faith. He was especially strengthened and comforted by the thought that there was compensation in another life for the sorrows endured in this life. These eschatological themes will later play a central role in his theory of religion.

The worst month of his illness, Fechner later wrote, was August 1843. It seemed he could not sink any further into depression, and that there could be neither rescue nor redemption from all his suffering. But, slowly and gradually, a process of recovery began in October. He found that he could now speak without having unpleasant sensations, and that the more he spoke, the more he liked speaking. With self-confidence and prudence, his powers gradually strengthened. For a few seconds, he could open his eyes without feeling any pain; he later found that he could do this for longer moments. Fechner told himself that he was not merely passive, that he had the power to exercise his eyes, and that he could make them stronger. Eventually, he wrote, they felt “a real hunger for light”.

Thus Fechner cured himself. It was as if it were all a question of will power. He found a source of strength within himself, a power to go out and meet the world. He now believed that he had allowed himself to sink into nothingness; if he was the source of his self-annihilation, he reasoned, he could also be the source of his self-affirmation. And so by Christmas of 1843, full of hope and confidence, Fechner walked out of his dark night, a new man. He would be a productive writer for the next forty four years.

4. The Soul of Plants

Fechner has gone down in history as “the father of panpsychism”. But that phrase is problematic. We should drop the claim to paternity since the doctrine is very old and has had a wealth of followers, both in ancient and modern times. The more important question is whether it is accurate to describe Fechner’s philosophy as “panpsychism”. The label is correct if it means the following: the doctrine that all living beings are psychic, i.e., have the power of consciousness.[7]

We should distinguish panpsychism from organicism. The panpsychist holds that all living beings are psychic where the psyche involves the power of consciousness; the organicists holds that living beings are not necessarily psychic, that their living powers might not be conscious but only be subconscious drives. Organicism is ambiguous: it can mean

  1. the doctrine that everything in the universe is alive; or
  2. the doctrine that the universe is organic in structure, i.e., forms a whole where the whole precedes the parts and makes them possible.

It is possible to hold (a) and (b); but it is also possible to hold (b) and not (a) if one thinks that there are inorganic parts within the organic whole. Organicists are not necessarily panpsychists because they might hold that there are living creatures who are not conscious; panpsychists are organicists at least in sense (b) but not necessarily in sense (a). Fechner was an organicist in sense (b) but not (a) because he held that there is such a thing as inorganic nature (Fechner 1879: 37).

Fechner’s first exposition of panpsychism is his Nanna oder über das Seelenleben der Pflanzen, which he first published in 1848. Nanna took the first step toward panpsychism by arguing that plants are conscious beings, having a life of feeling and volition. In his Zend-Avesta, which first appeared in 1851, Fechner took his panpsychism a giant step further by contending that planets, and indeed the cosmos as a whole, are also psychic or mental. Fechner defended and elaborated his panpsychism in two works of the early 1860s: Ueber die Seelenfrage (1861) and Die Drei Motive and Gründe des Glaubens (1863). His final exposition of his doctrine appears in his Die Tagesansicht gegenüber der Nachtansicht (1879).

Fechner’s panpsychism originated from a mystical experience which came at the end of his mental breakdown.[8] The day he began to see again, 5 October 1843, he walked into the garden of his house to look at the plants and flowers. Now the whole world appeared alive to him; it seemed for the first time to reveal itself to him. The flowers were all illuminated, as if from within. The light they shed seemed to come from their very souls.

The whole garden seemed to me transformed, as if not I but all of nature were arisen anew; and I thought, it is only a matter of opening my eyes again to allow a nature grown old to become young again. (Nanna: 65)

From that day onward, Fechner made it his mission to be true to that experience, to capture its meaning in philosophical prose. The ultimate results of his efforts were Nanna and Zend-Avesta.

Though Fechner’s panpsychism arose from a mystical experience, it is not based upon it; that experience was the origin of his view, not the rationale for it. Fechner insisted in both Nanna and Zend-Avesta that his doctrine was based upon the best natural science. While he did not claim certainty or finality for his doctrine, he still maintained that it was the most “likely story” given the latest findings of empirical research.

Fechner explains the title of his work in his forward (Nanna: xi). He wanted a short and catchy name for his book. He first considered “Flora” and “Hamadryas”; but then he found the first too botanical and the second too archaic. Just the right name came from Uhland’s work on Nordic mythology (1836: 147–148). Nanna was the goddess of flowers, the wife of Baldur, the god of light.

Fechner writes that it is the purpose of his work to show how plants are part of a world ensouled by God (Nanna: xiii). It then seems as if panpsychism can be proven simply from the omnipresence of God. But Fechner explicitly rejects this strategy because it would make the question of the soul of plants depend on general metaphysical questions, such as the relationships between God and nature or mind and body (Nanna: 7). Furthermore, even if we could prove the omnipresence of the divine mind, Fechner adds, it still would not prove that each individual thing is conscious. It would still be possible for the divine mind to be omnipresent in nature even though no individual thing is conscious (Nanna: 3). For these reasons, Fechner will investigate the question of the soul of plants on its own, apart from any general metaphysics; he asks: What evidence do we have for the common view that only humans and animals but not plants have souls?

All belief in the existence of other minds, Fechner reminds us, is based on analogy. We assume that other humans have minds because their speech and actions are like our own; and we infer that animals have minds because, in crucial respects, their actions are like our own. But we must be careful with analogy, Fechner warns, because we cannot demand that other creatures be exactly like ourselves in all respects. The very nature of analogy means that they are like us in some respects but unlike us in others. We are permitted to infer, because analogies do not exactly hold, that other creatures have minds similar to our own; but similarity does not mean identical or alike in all respects. Their minds could still be, in other respects, very different from our own. Though we assume that worms have souls, we recognize that they are very different ones from our own (Nanna: 6). Why cannot we then say that plants too have souls, though very different ones from us?

Fechner makes it his business to argue that all the reasons for ascribing souls to animals also hold for plants (Nanna: 7). Plants and animals have very similar structures and functions. They share a similar pattern of development (birth, maturity, death); both have similar cellular structures; both require nutrition, both engage in digestion, excretion, respiration. All that we can infer from the differences in their organic structure, function and development is that plants have different souls than our own, not that they have no souls at all (Nanna: 9).

The most common reason for denying souls to plants, Fechner notes, is that they do not have a central nervous system. If one destroys the nerves of a human or animal, they show no signs of life. It therefore seems that plants cannot a have a soul because they have no nervous system. But here Fechner raises an interesting question: Are nerves the only possible organs to produce sensation? Nature has many means to the same end, and we should not assume that there is only one way to produce sensation. If we cut all the strings of a violin, it produces no sound; but not all instruments are stringed. We can produce sound from wind instruments. Similarly, nature might have many means of creating sensations apart from a nervous system (Nanna: 28). The fibers of plants could perform the same function as nerves.

Another common reason for denying souls to plants is that they are not capable of locomotion, of changing their position, as humans and animals are (Nanna: 41, 71). But why should motion to different places be necessary for life?, Fechner asks. Plants move too, its just that they move vertically rather than horizontally. One maintains that the movements of plants are not voluntary, like that of humans and animals, because they are subject to physical necessity. But Fechner replies that the actions of animals too can be shown to be physically necessary. The mere necessity of an action—its explicability according to mechanical causes—does not show that it cannot be also accompanied by internal or mental events (Nanna: 79).

A weak point of Fechner’s argument is that he never sufficiently clarifies what he means by the soul or mind. His argument is cast in the language of having “a soul”, which makes it seem as if he means a special kind of substance. He tells us that by a soul (Seele) he means the same thing as mind (Geist); but this only kicks the can down the road: What are the criteria of a mind? The crucial consideration for Fechner seems to be sentience, consciousness or awareness, or at least the possibility of it. Even the most primitive plants, he argues, have consciousness or feeling; though it might not be on the level of humans and animals, it is still at least as lively and intense (Nanna: 188). This is interesting because Fechner seems to exclude the possibility of the subconscious; he does not allow, as Leibniz famously did, the existence of subconscious living creatures. In some places, Fechner seems to hold that having feelings and desires are sufficient for the presence of a mind; but he also writes that there can be sensation and desire without consciousness (Nanna: 53). In other places, he makes purposive activity a necessary condition of having a mind. Only a being with a soul has a purpose, he says (Nanna: 152). The crucial consideration for an organism, he also contends, is that its organization allows it to effectively achieve its ends (Nanna: 191). But this too becomes troubled because Fechner concedes that there can be purposive or organic development without any awareness of it (Nanna: 87).

One of the most important differences between Fechner’s panpsychism and Schelling’s and Hegel’s idealism is that, for Schelling and Hegel, the ideal does not necessarily imply the presence of consciousness. What makes a creature living is its purposive activity, which need not imply that its activity is directed by consciousness. These differences with the idealist tradition eventually became public in Fechner’s sharp criticism of Eduard von Hartmann’s Die Philosophie des Unbewussten, which put forward a strong case for the presence of subconscious life throughout nature (see Fechner 1879: 22).[9]

5. The Soul of the Universe

Zend-Avesta is Fechner’s most personal work, the statement of his fundamental beliefs. It is nineteenth century metaphysics in the grand style, on a par with Schopenhauer’s Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung and Lotze’s Mikrokosmus. It is a much more ambitious work than Nanna. Whereas Nanna would deal strictly with the realm of botany, Zend-Avesta would consider the cosmos as a whole. While Nanna would prove only that plants have souls, Zend-Avesta would attempt to show that the entire organic universe has a soul.[10] Although this panpsychic doctrine was the inspiration for Nanna, Fechner, as we have seen, refused to make it the basis of his argument. Now, in Zend-Avesta, it will be his purpose to prove this doctrine.

Zend-Avesta is unapologetically religious. Fechner conceives it as a defense of ancient natural religion. In his preface he writes that its purpose is to restore an old belief: “that all of nature is living and divinely ensouled” (ZA: vi). Zend-Avesta, which means “living word” in ancient Persian, was the sacred text of Zoroastrianism. Fechner hopes that his work will be a new Zend-Avesta (ZA: vii).

Although it has a religious agenda, Zend-Avesta was no defense of the Christian faith. Fechner’s natural religion was decidedly not Christianity. His denial of a transcendent dimension beyond nature, his insistence that the mental be embodied in the physical, and his affirmation of a God of nature, all depart drastically from Christian dogma. Still, Fechner was sympathetic to Christianity—the faith of his family and fathers—and attempted to interpret many of its beliefs in terms of his philosophy.[11] He conceived his own religion as a synthesis of Christianity and paganism (Fechner 1879: 71).

Despite his religious agenda, Fechner insists that he intends to base his faith upon the best science. This work follows a different course from most Naturphilosophie, he writes, because it does not begin from universal principles and descend to matter of fact; rather, it begins from an examination of the particulars of experience and ascends to the universal. “The whole tendency of this writing”, he says in the preface, “is that the universal rests on the particular rather than the particular on the universal.” (ZA: xiii) It will show that the realm of the soul is much wider than usually thought, and then proceed to demonstrate that it extends to the universe as a whole.

There was some equivocation on Fechner’s part on the basis for his natural religion. Although he insisted that it had to be based on science, he had to admit that it could not be based on “exact research” (ZA: vii, xiv). The very nature of the subject matter did not permit “empirical confirmation and mathematical calculation”. Furthermore, he vacillates concerning how it is based on empirical fact. He insists that he will allow only inferences based on experience; but then he says that his theory is in order as long as it does not contradict the results of science (ZA: xiv). He then went on to admit that to believe in the soul of the stars would be always “a matter of faith” (Glaubenssache; ZA: 7).

We should contrast Fechner’s attitude toward religion and science with the materialists of his day (Feuerbach, Vogt, Büchner, Moleschott). It was a major advantage of his philosophy, Fechner claimed, that it could reconcile science with religion. The materialists saw this as no advantage at all; they insisted that modern science was moving in the direction of materialism, which made it necessary to reject all the religious dogmas of the past. Fechner was well aware of the threat of materialism and did his best to counter it. His constant appeal to science was an attempt to meet the materialists on their own ground.

To prove that the universe has a soul, Fechner again follows the guiding thread of analogy, just as he did in Nanna. He begins by considering the body closest to us: the earth. He finds many similarities between the earth and our body: both are self-enclosed purposive wholes; both consist in solid, fluid, gaseous materials in manifold connections; both go through cycles of changes; both go through processes of development whereby they become differentiated and more finely organized (ZA: 29–31). Furthermore, the earth has a circulatory system like that of our body (ZA: 73–74). Because of these many similarities, we are justified in concluding, Fechner argues, that the earth is an individual organism (ZA: 35). Of course, because it is a much greater organism, there is much in the earth that one does not find in man; but there is nothing in man that one does not already find in the earth (ZA: 37). The main difference between the human body and the earth is that the earth is a higher organism than the body; this is because it is more independent, self-sufficient, massive and powerful (ZA: 31). All the characteristics of the human organism—unity, multiplicity, organization and development from within—the earth has to a greater degree (ZA: 35–6).

Having demonstrated that the earth is an organism, Fechner proceeds to argue that it also has a soul. Because the earth has a body much like our own, we are justified, on the basis of analogy, to assume that it has a soul much like our own (ZA: 110–111). If we regard freedom as a necessary characteristic of the soul, we should also attribute it to the earth, which is an even more self-sufficient and independent being (ZA: 113). All the respects in which the earth is unlike us are only reasons to attribute to it a higher soul (ZA: 115). To the objection that the earth does not have a nervous system and other organic functions like ours, Fechner replies that, though the presence of these functions proves a soul, their absence does not disprove the soul either but only the lack of an animal or human soul (ZA: 130). It is easier to prove that the earth has a soul than plants do, Fechner claims, for the simple reason that we have souls and are part of the earth (ZA: 120). We are all parts of the earth, Fechner argues at length, and just for that reason the earth must have also a soul, because a soul cannot arise from matter but only another soul (ZA: 140–1).

Fechner conceives the soul of the earth as present within all individual souls, much like Averroës famous doctrine of the universal intellect. All the different representations in one mind presuppose a single general consciousness; but the same is the case for the different representations in different minds: they too presuppose a general consciousness (ZA: 160–1). What we perceive or think as an individual mind we perceive or think through the general mind (ZA: 164). This single common consciousness in all individual consciousness explains, Fechner believes, how mutual understanding and communication are possible. Although we are independent and self-sufficient with respect to one another, that is not with respect to the higher mind. That I know myself and only myself, and that you know yourself and only yourself, does not prevent the higher spirit from knowing both of us. What is separation (Scheidung) for us is only a distinction (Unterscheidung) for it.

The earth is only one planet in the cosmos, and as such only one organism within an infinite one, one mind within an infinite one. The universal organism is nothing less than God, who is the tree of life, from which everything grows and upon which everything depends (ZA: 23). God is not above space and time, Fechner insists, but he is within them. He not only does everything in all things, but he is everything in all things (ZA: 200). “God is the one and all” (ZA: 223), Fechner says, endorsing the hen kai pan of the Goethezeit. The external world of appearances is not opposed to God, but it is simply his external side (ZA: 201). God’s spirit does not stand outside the material world but expresses itself in and through it. Fechner distinguishes between a narrower and broader concept of God: the narrow concept is God as spirit alone; the broader concept is spirit and its embodiment in the world (ZA: 200–1). In the same way, he says, we talk about a person as a personality but also as a whole being involving its body. But it is noteworthy that Fechner says that God in the narrow sense, i.e., God as a pure spirit, is only an abstraction (ZA: 204). The concept of the world in a broad sense, in which it includes spiritual and physical existence, coincides with the concept of God (ZA: 204). Fechner admits that, in this sense, his view is pantheistic, but he insists that it is not so in the Hegelian sense in which the spirit exists only in its individual manifestations.

6. The Existence of Atoms

In 1855 Fechner published a book much less famous than Nanna and Zend-Avesta but one just as important for the exposition of his philosophy: Über die physikalische und philosophische Atomlehre. While Nanna and Zend-Avesta make up the speculative or metaphysical side of Fechner’s philosophy, the Atomlehre represents its positivist side. It is in this work that Fechner puts forward his phenomenalism and verificationism. All that exists, and all that we can meaningfully talk about, it now turns out, is an object of possible experience. It is as if the soul of the universe were swept away with a positivist broom

The Atomlehre was Fechner’s contribution to a major controversy in the mid nineteenth century: the existence of the atom. Fechner argued that, by the best standards of observation and experiment then current in physics, the most probable view is that atoms really do exist; they are not only a convenient fiction or a fallacious hypostasis. The simplest and most consistent interpretation of the data of observation and experiment is that there are atoms behind the laws of experience.

The question of the existence of the atom had divided philosophy and natural science against one another. The philosophers held that atoms are only a fiction or hypostasis, while the physicists claimed that they are a reality, the best inference from observation and experiment, even though they are unobservable themselves. This disagreement among philosophers and scientists reflected their wider disagreements about the nature of matter and scientific method. They were opposed on three fronts. First, the philosophers held that matter is infinitely divisible and continuous, while the scientists maintained that it is indivisible and discrete. Second, the philosophers made forces fundamental, analyzing matter into powers of attraction and repulsion; the scientists, however, made matter the basis of force, claiming that forces inhere in matter and that they are only a way of accounting for its law-like regularities. Third, the philosophers stated that the fundamental questions about nature cannot be settled by observation and experiment and have to be determined a priori; the physicists insisted that every question of natural science has to be determined by observation and experiment and that questions about its very possibility are not the concern of natural science. The chief philosophers, who were all Germans, were Schelling, Hegel and Herbart; their philosophy of nature was in the tradition of Kant’s Metaphysische Anfangsgründe der Naturwissenschaften. The main scientists, who were French, were one and all experimental physicists, men like André Ampère (1775–1836), Augustin Cauchy (1858–1898) and Augustin Fresnel (1788–1827).

Atomism had become such a controversial issue in the mid nineteenth century partly because of the rise of materialism, and partly because of the traditional reputation of atomism. Materialism had become a rising force in German philosophy in the early 1850s; and by 1855—the very year Fechner published his work—Karl Vogt, Heinrich Czolbe, and Ludwig Büchner published their manifestos of materialism (Vogt 1855; Büchner 1855; Czolbe 1855). The German materialists were not unqualified champions of atomism. Though Czolbe had explicitly defended it (1855: 105 and 1875: 95), Büchner was more cautious, stating only that the atom was still a working hypothesis (1855 [1904: 39–40]). Nevertheless, the reputation of atomism as a materialist doctrine had been formed since antiquity. Atomism, whose chief exposition was Lucretius’ De rerum naturae, stood for a completely naturalistic worldview.

As one could surmise from the author of Nanna and Zend-Avesta, Fechner was not sympathetic to materialism and lamented its rising power in German life and letters. It was one of the most interesting features of his book that it would attempt to break the traditional association of atomism with materialism. Fechner argued that atomism does not necessarily support materialism, and that it is indeed ultimately a better support for the beliefs in the existence of God and immortality than the opposing view of the philosophers. Part I of Atomlehre lays out the experimental evidence for physical atomism; but Part II states the case for a philosophical atomism which supports a metaphysics avowing the existence of God and immortality. The battle between philosophy and physics about the existence of the atom should not be seen, at least in Fechner’s view, as a struggle between faith and science.

The most remarkable feature of Fechner’s book is that it is a defense of atomism at all. In Nanna and Zend-Avesta Fechner had expounded the organic vision of the universe so characteristic of romanticism. The support for that organic vision, as set forth by the Naturphilosophen (Schelling, Hegel, and Herbart), had been the dynamic theory of matter, according to which matter consists essentially in living force. If matter consists in force, the Naturphilosophen argued, then there is no fundamental difference in kind between mind and matter, because they are only different degrees of development and organization of force. It was just this view of matter, however, that Fechner had rejected in his Atomlehre. He was very explicit that force presupposes the existence of matter, that trying to analyze matter into these forces was like trying to analyze sounds into the intervals between them (Atom: 112, 113). But this repudiation of dynamicism inevitably poses the question: Did Fechner’s atomism not undermine his organicism?[12]

The chief reason that Fechner advocates atomism is because he thinks that it better explains the facts than its rival, dynamicism. Atomism is not simply a good model of explanation but the correct ontology, i.e., the right account of what exists in the world. That is to say, atomism does not work simply on a hypothetical basis: if atoms exist, then we can account for the phenomena; rather, it postulates that atoms do exist, and that only as such do they explain phenomena. The atomist knows that the existence of atoms cannot be confirmed by experience; but he still insists that the only way to explain what we do know about experience is to assume the existence of atoms (Atom: 25, 30). Here again the natural scientist follows the guide of analogy. He assumes that the same laws that hold for the macroscopic world also hold for the microscopic, an assumption which brings consistency into his general worldview (Atom: 33, 35–6, 88). Fechner concedes that many phenomena explicable according to atomism are also explicable according to dynamicism; but he insists that there always comes a point where phenomena reveal themselves that dynamicism cannot explain (Atom: 13, 21, 24). When we examine mass macroscopic phenomena in greater detail—taking them apart into their microscopic constituents—we find that the facts we then discover are explicable according to atomism alone.

Fechner cites the following experiments and phenomena in favor of atomism.

  1. The refraction of a ray of light into different colors was often regarded as a difficulty of the wave theory of light. Why should a single transparent ray suddenly transform itself into a multitude of colors? The investigations of Cauchy have shown, however, that refraction into different colors follows from, and is not only consistent with, wave theory if one supposes that there are discrete particles in the aether (Atom: 18).[13]
  2. A heat ray (Wärmestralung) and heat conduction (Wärmefortpfanzung) seem to be very different phenomena. But Fourier has demonstrated that conduction follows under the same laws that hold for rays provided that one assumes rays consist in discrete particles (Atom: 22).
  3. The phenomena of isomery—objects having the same mass and chemical constitution but producing different experimental results—are explicable only according to atomism. The atomist assumes that there is something more to atoms beside their mass and chemical constitution: namely, their direction or positions. The different results are then ascribed to the different directions or positions of the atoms (Atom: 37). The dynamicist, however, can refer to only mass and chemical constitution.
  4. Two crystal formations can be exactly alike in their parts and structure even though they are incongruous with one another. The atomist explains their incongruity from the different directions of their constituent atoms (Atom: 43)
  5. A rubber band, when stretched, eventually breaks in one place. The dynamicist cannot explain this break in a single place; his adherence to the principle of continuity forces him to claim that the rubber band stretches ad infinitum or breaks in all places. The atomist explains the break from the growing distance between particles inside the band; the attraction between the particles lessens as the band stretches and the distance between the particles grows (Atom: 54–55)
  6. When a body expands because of heat, its density diminishes as its volume increases (Atom: 45). The atomist can easily explain this: the particles spread further apart from one another as the body is heated.
  7. The atomist can explain organic development—the differentiation of a primal mass into a multitude of organs and functions—better than the dynamicist, because he claims that the original apparently undifferentiated mass in fact consists in many different kinds of particles with their different structures (Atom: 60–62). The dynamicist, who chastens the atomist for speculation beyond experience, can refer to only the small visible differences between primal masses, which are not sufficient to explain differentiation or the differences between individuals.

As case 1 demonstrates, Fechner still holds an aether theory. He even includes the aether into his summary of his doctrine, according to which ponderable matter consists in spatially discrete parts, in between which there is an imponderable substance or aether (Atom: 79). Fechner admits, however, that there is much uncertainty about the relation of ponderable to imponderable matter. He knew that the aether theory was problematic, though this did not stop him from referring to Cauchy’s experiments. In the introduction to Part I of Atomlehre, he is explicit that atomism does not depend on the theory of aether (Atom: 14–15). The question whether light or heat are atomistically explicable is independent of the existence of the aether, he insists.

It was a crucial aspect of Fechner’s defense of atomism that it made no philosophical claims about the nature of matter itself. Its foundation lies simply with its explanation of empirical phenomena; it does not attempt to answer deeper philosophical questions about the possibility of matter and experience. As Fechner put it: the physicist does not worry about a philosophical analysis of matter anymore than a builder troubles himself about the chemical analysis of his brick and mortar (Atom: 72). The philosopher always claimed that the atomist did not go far enough in his analysis of matter, that he did not try to answer ultimate questions. What he fails to see, however, is that the physicist does not attempt to answer such questions; he is only trying to explain the data given in experience. From this modest empirical point of view, Fechner was willing to make significant concessions to the dynamicist: perhaps matter did ultimately consist in forces of attraction and repulsion (Atom: 72); perhaps the spaces between matter were ultimately filled, so that everything is continuous after all (Atom: 76).

But this modest empiricist defense of atomism was disingenuous. It was only half the story. For Fechner had a more aggressive philosophical defense of atomism, a positivist-style counterattack which claimed that the questions posed by the philosopher are meaningless. Unlike the physicist, the philosopher does not intend to stay within the limits of experience; he attempts to go beyond these limits to find the conditions of their possibility. What makes experience possible for him is the unconditioned, the thing-in-itself; and his speculations therefore are so many attempts to know the thing-in-itself. But the thing-in-itself, Fechner insists, is an illusion, something which does not really exist (Atom: 94, 98). The world does not consist in the appearances of a thing-in-itself but in nothing more than appearances (Atom: 94). Matter is only what appears, or what would appear under certain circumstances (Atom: 95). The idea that there is something behind the appearances, something that makes them all one thing, is simply an hypostasis, the reification of a concept that unites all these appearances into one (Atom: 96). As part of this counterattack, Fechner went on to argue that the dynamicist’s concept of force or power is only a reification of the concept of a law (Atom: 106). It did not even make sense to analyze a body into its powers because power is only a relational concept between bodies; to attempt to construct matter from powers would be like constructing sound from tone intervals (Atom: 112).

Also in the spirit of this counterattack, Fechner sets out a definition of matter which spurns any philosophical account of it. Matter is defined as what resists the sense of touch; it is nothing more nor less than “tangibility” (Handgreiflichkeit) (Atom: 90). In response to the philosopher, who asks what is it that is so tangible, Fechner replies that it is nothing more than what he feels and what he infers from that feeling (Atom: 92). Fechner does not then allow the philosopher to speculate about the sources or conditions of that feeling. Rather, he claims the very idea that there is something behind this feeling, that there is a reality that that makes it possible, is an illusion (Atom: 94).

Hence Fechner’s defense of atomism is not what it first appears to be, or at least not what he pretends it to be. It does not carve out a realm of experience in which atomism holds, then leaving aside a transcendent realm which is the proper domain of metaphysics. Instead, Fechner argues that there is no such transcendent realm and that metaphysics deludes itself when it speculates about it. In this respect, Fechner’s attack on metaphysics anticipates exactly what Otto Liebmann would write ten years later in his famous Kant und die Epigonen (1865).

Though he was very aggressive in his attack on the philosophers, Fechner insisted that he had nothing against philosophy per se; his target was only contemporary philosophy, specifically the metaphysics of Schelling, Hegel, and Herbart (Atom: xiii). The second part of his book was indeed devoted to his own philosophy, his own metaphysics of matter. It would give up the empirical limits on physical atomism, and then attempt to provide a philosophical atomism, which would give “the ultimate construction of matter itself” (Atom: viii). Fechner reassured his readers that he was not sacrificing their demands for a worldview and that he would sketch one of his own. He expressed his complete agreement with the philosophers about the need to investigate “the most universal, the highest and the ultimate”; he said that he differed from them only in how he wanted to conduct such an investigation. While Schelling, Hegel and Herbart had followed an a priori methodology, which preceded natural science, Fechner insisted on an a posteriori methodology which would be based upon the natural sciences. His metaphysics would come after, not prior to or before, physics (Atom: 126). The foundation for his metaphysics would be nothing less than the whole of natural science (Atom: 127).

The great hope of Fechner, like many other philosophers of his age (Trendelenburg, Lotze, Hartmann), was that the natural sciences could provide a worldview more reliable than the a priori methods of the old metaphysics. The old metaphysics here was not simply the rationalism of Leibniz and Wolff but the metaphysics of natural science of Kant, Schelling, Hegel and Herbart, which was still indebted to the old rationalism in its faith in pure reason. This new worldview would still be able to satisfy the interests of morality and religion; and it would disarm the threat of materialism, which regarded the old morality and religion as little more than superstition.

The distinguishing feature of Fechner’s new metaphysics is his insistence that it is based upon experience alone rather than the a priori reasoning of the old Naturphilosophie. Accordingly, the basic principle of his philosophical atomism is that atoms are “limiting concepts” in the analysis of experience. This means that they represent the ultimate units of analysis hitherto, so that they involve no claim that the analysis is complete. Atoms must be defined strictly in relation to the empirically given; they are not points behind or beyond space and time but within it; but there is always the stipulation that however small they are represented to be is never enough (Atom: 132). They appear to our representation as the smallest visible and tangible points; yet they are are smaller than the smallest we can see and touch (Atom: 156).

Fechner’s new metaphysics did not avoid the problems or the concepts of the old metaphysics; it simply cast them in a quasi-empirical dress. Though Fechner adamantly insists that his atoms be defined empirically, he goes on to attribute to them the classic properties of the monad, all of which transcend the empirically given. Thus he writes that his atoms are utterly simple beings, having no characteristics (Atom: 133); that they are extensionless points (Atom: 120); and that they are completely independent of one another, so that they cannot be connected to one another (Atom: 142). Now Fechner confronts the old conundrum which caused so much trouble for Leibniz: How do unextended points give rise to the extended entities of experience? Fechner breezily dismisses the problem. Extension does not arise from the atoms themselves but the relationships between them; it is their aggregation which gives rise to their spatial appearance (Atom: 156–157). But this quick solution still did not explain how spatial relationships could arise from spaceless beings.

7. Theory of Mind

Beginning in Zend-Avesta Fechner set forth a theory of mind-body relations, which he then expounded in greater detail in his Ueber die Seelenfrage and Elemente der Psychophysik. This theory has been explained in great detail by Michael Heidelberger (2004: 73–115), who regards it as Fechner’s most important contribution to philosophy. There is no necessary connection between this theory and Fechner’s panpsychism: the theory could be true even if human minds where the only minds in the universe; panpsychism is more about the extent rather than the nature of mind.

Fechner’s theory begins with a distinction between two standpoints, two ways of observing or knowing a human being. There is an internal and external standpoint, corresponding to which there are two kinds of appearances of a human being, internal and external appearances. An internal appearance is how I appear to myself or self-appearance; an external appearance is how I appear to others. There are two kinds of knowledge corresponding to each kind of appearance. We know ourselves as minds immediately, i.e., intuitively or directly and without the need to make an inference; but we know others mediately, i.e., intellectually or indirectly, through inferences we make from certain signs, viz., actions or words.

The main point that Fechner makes about these standpoints is that their appearances belong to one and the same thing. There are not two distinct entities, a mind corresponding to internal appearances and a body corresponding to external appearances; rather, there is one and the same thing that appears inwardly to myself and outwardly to others. “Inwardly it appears to itself thus; and outwardly it appears thus; but what appears is one and the same” (ZA: 253). Hence Fechner’s theory has been described as a “two aspect theory” of the self.

This is the simplest formulation of the theory. It becomes more complicated, however, when Fechner adds other claims to it. The most striking of these claims is that the mind and body are nothing but their appearances. The mind is nothing but its (actual and possible) appearances to itself; and the body is nothing but its (actual and possible) appearances to others. There is no mind in itself beyond how it appears to itself; and there is no body in itself, apart from and prior to how it appears to others. The theory then is a form of “neutral monism”, according to which there is one and the same kind of thing which has two aspects or attributes depending on how it is viewed.[14] This thing consists in only its appearances, whether internal or external.

Another claim that Fechner adds to his theory is that the two appearances are connected to one another in a causal or law-like way (see 1861: 211 and ZA: 253). Hence he says explicitly that they are in a relation of interchange (Wechselbedingheit), that they are intimately connected with one another (solidarisch zusammenhangen) (1861: 211). This is notable because some dual aspect theories exclude the possibility of any interaction between the mental and physical appearances precisely because they are such different kinds of attribute. Spinoza, for example, forbade any causal interaction between the mental and physical because they were such different kinds of attribute of substance (Spinoza 1677: Pars Prima, Propositio VI & X). Fechner saw the interaction as problematic, as difficult to explain, but he did not forbid its possibility. Despite all the differences between mental and physical characteristics, he assumed that they referred to distinct events which, somehow, could interact. The whole purpose of his Psychophysik was to explain the interaction between them.

Still another puzzling claim added to Fechner’s theory is what he calls “the most universal law of psychophysics”: that nothing exists, originates or acts in the mind without something existing, originating or acting in the body; in other words, everything mental has its expression in the physical (1861: 211). This principle seems to bias the connection between mind and body, so that the mind appears as the body but not conversely; but the theory originally called for a reciprocal connection or interaction between mind and body (as we have just seen above).

It is on the basis of this universal law that Fechner’s theory has been described as “materialist” (Heidelberger 2004: 98, 107). This is an odd description, though, because the law seems to postulate that the mind has an efficacy on the body rather than the conversely. Materialist theories are often epiphenomenal, allowing the causal direction to move only from the body to the mind. But Fechner’s law seems to say the opposite.

We will leave aside, for reasons of space, further complications in Fechner’s theory. To avoid serious confusion, though, it is necessary to consider, if only briefly, the origins of the theory.[15] Fechner himself stated that his theory had its roots in Schelling’s Naturphilosophie (Atom: xiv). There is a certain plausibility to Fechner’s genealogy. In the early 1800s Schelling had developed his own dual aspect theory of the mind and body, according to which the mental and physical, the ideal and the real, are two equal and independent appearances of the absolute. We need not cast doubt on Fechner’s genealogy. The initial impetus for his dual aspect theory might indeed have been Schelling; perhaps, if he had not read Schelling, he would never have suggested a dual aspect theory. Still, it is important to see that Fechner developed his theory along lines completely different from Schelling’s. It was a fundamental principle of Schelling’s theory that the mental and physical are one and the same because they are different manifestations or appearances of living force; the mental is the highest organization and development of that force, the physical is its lowest organization and development. His theory therefore rested upon the dynamic theory of matter central to his Naturphilosophie. But Fechner, as we have seen, rejected this theory, which was in conflict with his atomism. Furthermore, Schelling, like Spinoza, forbade the possibility of interaction between the mental and physical, the very possibility that Fechner wanted to investigate (Schelling 1859: I/4, 344).


All translations are by the author of this entry, unless otherwise noted.

Works by Fechner

  • 1821 [1832], as Dr. Mises, Beweis, daß der Mond aus Jodine bestehe, Germanien: Penig. Zweite Auflage: Leipzig: Voß, 1832. Reprinted also in Fechner 1875: 1–20.
  • 1822, as Dr. Mises, Panegyrikus der jezigen Medicin und Naturgeschichte, Leipzig: C.H.F. Hartmann. Reprinted in Fechner 1875: 21–68.
  • 1823, Praemissae ad theoriam organismi generalem, Leipzig: Staritz.
  • 1824, as Dr. Mises, Stapelia Mixta, Leipzig: Leopold Voß. Essays include:
    • “Ueber Definitionen des Lebens”, 65–73.
    • “Verkehrte Welt”, 83–86
    • “Ueber Schematismus und Symbolik”, 119–128
    • “Ueber das Verhältniß von Kunst, Wissenschaft und Religion”, 129–157.
    • “Extreme sese tangent”, 172–179
    • “Versuch einer Entwicklung des Organisationsgesetzes aus dem räumlichen Symbol”, 180–205
    [Stapelia available online]
  • 1825, as Dr. Mises, Vergleichende Anatomie der Engel. Eine Skizze, Leipzig: Industrie-Comptoir.
  • 1831, Maßbestimmungen über die galvanische Kette, Leipzig: Brockhaus.
  • 1832, as Dr. Mises, Schutzmittel für die Cholera, Leipzig: Voß.
  • 1834, Das Hauslexikon. Vollständiges Handbuch praktischer Lenbenskenntnizze für alle Stände, 8 volumes, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1836, as Dr. Mises, Das Büchlein vom Leben nach dem Tode, Dresden: C.F. Grimmersche Buchhandlung.
  • 1846a, Ueber das höchste Gut, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1846b, as Dr. Mises, Vier Paradoxa, Leipzig: Leopold Voß.
  • [Nanna] 1848a [1908], Nanna oder über das Seelenleben der Pflanzen, Leipzig: Leopold Voß. Fourth edition (Vierte Auflage), 1908. Page references are to the fourth edition.
  • 1848b, “Ueber das Lustprincip des Handeln”, Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik, 19: 1–30, 163–94.
  • 1849, “Über das Causalgesetze”, Berichte über die Verhandlungen der Königlich Sächsischen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Leipzig, Jahrgang 1849: 98–120.
  • 1851a, “Zur Kritik der Grundlagen von Herbarts Metaphysik”, Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 21: 193–209.
  • [ZA] 1851b [1901], Zend-Avesta oder über die Dinge des Himmels und des Jenseits. Vom Standpunkt der Naturbetrachtung, Leipzig: Leopold Voß. Second edition, Kurd Laßwitz (ed.), 1901. Page references are to the second edition.
  • [Atom] 1855, Über die physikalische und philosophische Atomlehre, Leipzig: Hermann Mendelssohn. A second expanded edition appeared in 1864. All page references are to the first edition.
  • 1856, Professor Schleiden und der Mond, Leipzig: Adolf Gumprecht.
  • 1860, Elemente der Psychophysik, 2 volumes, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1861, Ueber die Seelenfrage. Ein Gang durch die sichtbare Welt, um die unsichtbare zu Finden, Leipzig: Amelang.
  • 1863, Die drei Motive und Gründe des Glaubens, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1873, Einige Ideen zur Schöpfungsund Entwickelungsgeschichte der Organismen, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1875, Kleine Schriften, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1876, Vorschule der Aesthetik, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1877, In Sachen der Psychophysik, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1879, Die Tagesansicht gegenüber die Nachtansicht, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • 1946, Religion of a Scientist: Selections from Gustav Theodor Fechner, Walter Lowrie (ed./trans.), New York: Pantheon Books.

Other Primary Sources

  • Biot, Jean Baptiste, 1817 [1828–29], Précis élémentaire de physique expérimentale, 2 volumes, Paris: Déterville. Translated by Fechner into German as Lehrbuch der Experimental-Physik oder Erfahrungs-Naturlehre, 5 volumes, Lepzig: Voß, 1828–29.
  • Büchner, Ludwig, 1855 [1904], Kraft und Stoff, Frankfurt: Meidinger. 21st edition, Leipzig: Thomas, 1904.
  • Czolbe, Heinrich, 1855, Neue Darstellung des Sensualismus, Leipzig: Costenoble.
  • –––, 1875, Grundzüge einer Extensionale Erkenntnistheorie, Plauen, Hohmann.
  • Hartmann, Eduard, 1869, Philosophie des Unbewußten, Berlin: Duncker.
  • Helmholtz, Hermann, 1867, Handbuch der physiologischen Optik, Leipzig: Voß.
  • James, William, 1904 [1912], “Does ‘Consciousness’ Exist?”, The Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods, 1(18): 477–491. Reprinted in his Essays in Radical Empiricism, New York: Longmans, Green & Co., 1912, pp. 1–38. doi:10.2307/2011942
  • Lange, Friedrich, 1875, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart, 2 volumes, Iserlohn: J. Baedeker.
  • Liebmann, Otto, 1865, Kant und die Epigonen: Eine kritische Abhandlung, Stuttgart: Carl Schober.
  • Oken, Lorenz, 1809, Lehrbuch der Naturphilosophie, Jena: Friedrich Frommann.
  • Schelling, F.W.J., 1859, Fernere Darstellungen aus dem System der Philosophie, in Sämtliche Werke, K.F.A. Schelling (ed.), Stuttgart: Cotta, 14 vols.
  • Spinoza, Baruch de, 1677 [1967], Ethica, in Opera/Werke, Günter Gawlick, Friedrich Niewöhner and Konrad Blumenstock (eds), Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Thénard, Louis Jacques, 1813–16 [1825–28], Traité de chimie élémentaire, théorique et pratique, 4 volumes, Paris: Crochand. Translated by Fechner into German as Lehrbuch der theoretischen und praktischen Chemie, 6 volumes, Leipzig: Leopold Voß, 1825–28.
  • Uhland, Ludwig, 1836, Sagenforschungen, Stuttgart: Cotta.
  • Vogt, Karl, 1855, Köhlergluabe und Wissenschaft, Gießen: Ricker.

Secondary Sources

  • Adolph, Heinrich, 1923, Die Weltanschauung Gustav Theodor Fechners, Stuttgart: Strecker und Schröder.
  • Audi, Robert, 1995, Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bruchmann, Kurt, 1887, “Gustav Theodor Fechner, ein deutscher Metaphysiker”, Preußische Jahrbücher, 58: 293–309.
  • Heidelberger, Michael, 2004, Nature from Within: Gustav Theodor Fechner and his Psychophysical Worldview, Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press.
  • Kuntze, Johannes Emil, 1892, Gustav Theodor Fechner: Ein deutsches Gelehrtenleben, Leipzig: Breitkopf und Härtel.
  • Lasswitz, Kurd, 1902, Gustav Theodor Fechner, Zweite vermehrte Auflage. Stuttgart: Frommanns Verlag.
  • Marshall, Marilyn E., 1974a, “William James, Gustav Fechner, and the Question of Dogs and Cats in the Library”, Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences, 10(3): 304–312.
  • –––, 1974b, “G. T. Fechner: Premises toward a General Theory of Organisms (1823)”, Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences, 10(4): 438–447.
  • Pastor, Willy, 1901a, Im Geiste Fechners, Fünf naturwissenschaftliche Essays, Leipzig: G.H. Meyer.
  • –––, 1901b, Gustav Theodor Fechner und die durch ihn erschlossene Weltanschauung, Leipzig: G.H. Meyer.
  • Wentscher, Max, 1924, Fechner und Lotze, Munich: Ernst Reinhardt.
  • Wille, Bruno, 1905, Idealistische Weltanschauung auf naturwissenschaftliche Grundlage im Sinne Fechners, Hamburg: Leopold Voß.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2020 by
Frederick C. Beiser <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free