Fictional Entities

First published Tue Nov 6, 2018; substantive revision Wed Jul 26, 2023

Philosophical issues surrounding fiction have attracted increasing attention from philosophers over the past few decades. What follows is a discussion of one familiar and quite fundamental topic in this area: fictional entities (both the issue of what such entities might be like and whether there really are such entities).

A familiar characteristic of works of fiction is that they feature fictional characters: individuals whose exploits are written about in works of fiction and who make their first appearance in a work of fiction. Shakespeare’s Hamlet, for example, features the fictional character Hamlet, Doyle’s A Study in Scarlet features Sherlock Holmes, Tolstoy’s Anna Karenina features Anna Karenina, and so on. All of these works feature numerous other fictional characters, of course (Ophelia and Dr Watson, for example); indeed, some works of fiction are characterized by the sheer abundance of their characters (Russian novels are often said to have this characteristic). Fictional characters belong to the class of entities variously known as fictional entities or fictional objects or ficta, a class that includes not just animate objects of fiction (fictional persons, animals, monsters, and so on) but also inanimate objects of fiction such as fictional places (Anthony Trollope’s cathedral town of Barchester and Tolkien’s home of the elves, Rivendell, for example). As stated, however, it doesn’t include entities located in the real world, although real entities do have an important role to play in works of fiction. Thus, neither London nor Napoleon are fictional entities, but the first is the quite essential backdrop to what goes on in the Holmes stories while the second plays an important role in the events described in War and Peace. (While London and Napoleon are not fictional entities, some have thought that the London of the Holmes stories and the Napoleon of War and Peace should be classed as special fictional entities. This view has recently gained some popularity: cf. Landini 1990, Bonomi 2008, Voltolini 2006, 2013, 2020b, Motoarca 2014.)

The above characterization suggests that fictional entities constitute a special type of entity. Not surprisingly, then, one fundamental philosophical question we can ask about fictional entities is a question about their nature: what kind of thing is a fictional entity? This question is separate from what seems an even more fundamental question: why suppose that there are any fictional entities in the first place? After all, our world never contained a Sherlock Holmes or a Rivendell—these alleged entities make their appearance in works of fiction, not works of fact. Following the division in Thomasson 1999, we shall call the first question the metaphysical question, and the second the ontological question.

1. The Metaphysics of Fictional Entities

As Thomasson (1999: 5) puts it, the first question amounts to asking: what would fictional entities be if there were any? Different answers have been proposed to this question. But however much the answers differ, they all try to accommodate in some way or other what seems to be an intuitive datum facing philosophers who theorize about fictional entities: these entities lack existence, or at least existence as ordinary physical objects. According to this datum—call it the nonexistence datum—paradigmatic objects of fiction like Hamlet and Holmes do not exist. In support of this datum, note that the layperson would almost certainly answer No to the question of whether such objects exist, although she might qualify this answer by allowing that there may be another sense in which they do (Barbero et al. 2023). We also appeal to nonexistence in this sense when we want to dispute the view that some alleged individual is a genuine historical figure; we might say, for example, that King Arthur does not exist, thereby underlining our view that a search for a historical King Arthur would be in vain.

Those who do not believe that there are any fictional entities (fictional antirealists, as we shall call them) will claim that the nonexistence datum has an ontological reading only: to say that fictional entities do not exist amounts to saying that in the overall domain of what there is there are no such things as fictional entities. As they see it, fictional realists (those who do believe that there are fictional entities) are the only ones to give the datum a certain metaphysical reading, namely that fictional entities have the property of not existing (in some sense or other). They might also insist that fictional realists are the only ones to think that the nonexistence of fictional entities is determined by their nature as fictional entities. But this overstates the case. Because they hold that there are no such things as fictional entities, even antirealists are likely to admit that the fact that there is no such thing as some alleged entity X follows from the fact that X has been shown to be fictional. That is what happened in the case of King Arthur and many other legendary or mythological entities (fictional entities in the broad sense). People originally supposed that King Arthur was a real person, a British leader who ruled England after the departure of the Romans (cf. Geoffrey of Monmouth’s Historia Regum Britanniae), until it was discovered that King Arthur is merely a figure of legend, a fictional entity. It was this discovery that licensed the conclusion that King Arthur doesn’t exist. So it seems that even antirealists have a stake in the answer to the metaphysical question “What would it take for something to be a fictional entity?”

One further comment about the nonexistence datum before we turn to various accounts of fictional objects and the ways in which such accounts cope with the datum. As we have already seen, it is natural when discussing the datum to use quantifiers such as “Some things are …” (“There are things that are …”), and “Everything is…”, whose domain appears to include both existent and nonexistent objects. We do so when we say, for example, that there are objects, such as fictional objects, that don’t exist. Fictional antirealists will take such talk with a grain of salt, since they do not acknowledge a sense in which there really are any fictional objects. Fictional realists, on the other hand, will think that a sentence like “There are objects, among them Hamlet and Holmes, that don’t exist” is either literally true or at least it conveys a truth. They typically acknowledge a distinction between unrestricted quantifiers, whose domain includes even nonexistent objects, and restricted quantifiers, whose domain includes only existent objects (cf., e.g., Berto 2013).

1.1 Possibilism

One way to account for the nonexistence datum is the possibilist theory of fictional entities, which holds that fictional entities do not exist in the actual world but only in some other possible worlds. In this respect, fictional entities are thought to be like other merely possible entities such as talking donkeys. According to standard versions of the possible worlds framework, some things not present at the actual world exist as talking donkeys at some merely possible worlds. Similarly, the possibilist theory holds that Sherlock Holmes does not exist in the actual world, although he does exist at some merely possible worlds in which the Holmes stories are fact.

Such a possibilist theory is faced with a problem of ontological indeterminacy. For there is more than one possible world in which Conan Doyle’s Holmes stories are fact, and in which there is a witty, cocaine-addicted detective called “Holmes” who lives at 221B Baker St., has a friend called “Watson”, and does the things recorded of him in the Holmes stories. Not all of these Holmes-candidates are the same; while they all match each other in terms of what the stories say about Holmes, they may be very different in other crucial ways—they may have had very different childhoods, including different parents, and so on. (Indeed, when characters are underdescribed in a story, a single possible world may contain many individuals who fit exactly what the story says about the character.) We can now ask: which of these different witty, cocaine-addicted detectives is Holmes? (cf. Kaplan 1973: 505–6; Kripke 1972 [1980: 156–8]). There seems to be no principled way of deciding.

Kripke suggests that this indeterminacy shows that none of these possible entities is Holmes, “[f]or if so, which one?” (Kripke 1972 [1980: 157–8]). But suppose, for argument’s sake, that this indeterminacy could somehow be resolved, perhaps by the story including details of certain properties that, arguably, only Holmes could have, such as his being the only person to have originated from certain gametes. Even in that case, there would be strong reason not to identify Holmes with a merely possible entity. To see this, take a different case, that of the mythical sword Excalibur extracted from a rock by King Arthur. Because we know that the story of King Arthur is merely fictional, we know that this sword does not exist. Its nonexistence would not be threatened by someone’s discovering an object with the physical properties that the Breton cycle ascribes to Excalibur (unless, of course, that gave us reason to think the Breton cycle was based on fact). No matter how similar, an actual object that resembles a fictional object would not be that fictional object (Kripke 1972 [1980: 157–8]). Now, moving from the actual world to merely possible worlds does not change things: why should Excalibur be identified even with a merely possible entity? Had a merely possible entity exactly matching Excalibur in its properties been actual, it would not have been the fictional Excalibur, by the Kripkean argument rehearsed above. So how are things different if this merely possible Excalibur-like sword remains merely possible? In a nutshell, if there is a gap between fiction and reality, there is also a gap between fiction and possibility.

These difficulties for possibilism do not equally affect all versions of the doctrine. Consider David Lewis’s version of the doctrine, which is embedded in his realist account of possible objects (Lewis 1986). Roughly speaking, Lewis takes a possible individual to be a Holmes candidate if it has Holmes’s properties in a possible world in which the Holmes stories are told as known fact (Lewis 1978). For Lewis, each such individual is a part of one world and not part of any other world (possible individuals are in a sense ‘world-bound’ on Lewis’s view); no Holmes candidate is therefore identical to any other Holmes candidate. But unlike more doctrinaire possibilists, Lewis can use his counterpart theory (Lewis 1986) to offer a principled way of counting each such Holmes candidate as being Holmes. Suppose you are a reader of the Holmes stories. Each Holmes candidate is a counterpart for you of every other Holmes candidate. For even if they should differ substantially in terms of overall qualitative similarity, the various Holmes candidates are all counterparts by acquaintance for you (or, as Lewis seems to have thought, for your community of fellow readers)—they are all, in their respective worlds, the person called “Holmes” whom you or your community (or rather, your counterparts) learn about by reading the Holmes stories, told as known fact (cf. Lewis 1983b; Currie 1990: 137–9; Kroon 1994). In short, the fact that there are so many distinct Holmes candidates is less embarrassing for Lewis than it is for other possibilists. (See also the suggestion in Sainsbury 2010 (pp. 82–3) that Lewis could have accommodated a plurality of possible Holmes candidates by refusing to identify Holmes with any of them, instead modeling the relation between talk of Holmes and talk of these possible Holmes candidates on the model of the notion of precisification used in Lewis’s semantics of vagueness.)

Lewis’s counterpart theory is not widely accepted, however. In general, Kripkean objections against possibilism about fictional entities have been more influential. Some have argued, however, that such objections only succeed if we use a ‘variable domain’ conception of what there is to quantify over at any particular world, a conception that allows the set of objects available at one world to differ from the set of objects available at another world (Kripke’s preferred semantics for modal logic is of this kind.) Suppose instead that one adopts a version of a ‘fixed domain’ conception of quantification on which one has a fictional individual at one’s disposal as a nonexistent entity in the actual world and as an existent entity in other possible worlds (Priest 2005, Berto 2011). If so, the indeterminacy problem may not arise. As Priest (2005: 119–20) puts it, we first of all have Doyle’s conception of Sherlock Holmes; this Sherlock Holmes—the Holmes that Doyle conceives of—is an individual in the actual world but it does not exist there; it exists only in other worlds. For Priest, then, Doyle doesn’t arbitrarily pick one Holmes candidate from among all possible Holmes candidates, each located in its own possible world. Rather, Doyle intends a particular individual that does not exist in the actual world but instead fits, or realizes, the Holmes stories in some other possible worlds. Trivially, this individual is Holmes. (Doyle manages this even though the actual world contains many other possible individuals that don’t exist there but realize the Holmes stories in other possible worlds (Priest 2005: 93–4).)

Priest and Berto call their version of possibilism Modal Meinongianism because it uses a modal framework to capture central features of Meinong’s famous account of nonexistent objects (to be discussed below), but also because they see it as a descendent of Richard Routley’s early attempts at defending Meinong’s views (cf. Routley 1980). But Modal Meinongianism has faced considerable criticism, some of it directed at its account of the way authors manage to pick out nonexistent objects. One might wonder how it is that Doyle is acquainted with a particular Holmes candidate via the intentionality of his thought rather than with any of the other Holmes candidates. Is authorial intending a creative act, perhaps, one that first brings it about that there is an object of the right kind, as Thomasson (1999: 90) suggests? All the indications are that Priest and Berto reject this view. For them, “an act of pure intention can intend an object even when there are other indiscriminable objects” (2005: 142). Such a response has struck a number of critics as deeply problematic: without the ability to identify Holmes as the unique such-and-such, Modal Meinongianism seems unable to guarantee that there is a determinate Holmes (this problem may, in fact, be the reason why Routley himself did not go on to develop a modal version of Meinongianism; cf. Kroon 2019). Bueno & Zalta (2017) contrast Modal Meinongianism’s apparent troubles on this score with the resources available for identification in Zalta’s version of Meinongianism (for a response, see Priest et al. 2020).

Such a possibilism also faces another problem. For Priest, as for other possibilists, fictional entities do not actually possess the properties in terms of which they are characterized in the relevant stories; they only have these properties in (some of) the worlds in which they exist. Sherlock Holmes, for instance, is not actually a detective since he does not exist. Rather, Holmes is only possibly a detective; he is only a detective in possible worlds in which he exists. (Note that he is not a detective in all the worlds in which he exists, since it is presumably a truth about Holmes that he might not have had the career that he ended up with; in some possible worlds, therefore, Holmes exists without being a detective.) Now, it is admittedly strange to say that a fictional object like Holmes is a detective in the very same sense in which, say, a certain actual member of the New York police force is a detective. But retreating to the possibilist view that Holmes has such properties only in merely possible worlds carries its own costs; for one thing, it seems to underestimate the role of the actual world in various familiar relational claims we can make about fictional objects. Consider cases in which we compare such objects with actual concrete individuals. Suppose we say:

  • (1) Holmes is cleverer than any actual detective.

We seem to be saying that Holmes actually has such comparative features, that is, has them in the actual world, not merely in some possible world or other. Suppose that we read (1) instead as saying, à la Priest:

  • (1P) Holmes is possibly cleverer than any actual detective.

(More precisely, relative to worlds in which Holmes is as he is described to be in the Holmes stories, Holmes has a greater degree of cleverness than that possessed by any detective in the actual world; cf. Priest 2005: 123.) But no such cross-world way of reading (1) matches the way we would read any other sentence involving a comparison between individuals. Take:

  • (2) Stalin was crueler than any other actual dictator.

It would clearly be incorrect to read (2) as:

  • (2P) Stalin was possibly crueler than any other actual dictator

(say, in the sense that, relative to worlds in which Stalin fits the orthodox account of his activities, Stalin is crueler than any other dictator in the actual world). (2) is intended to be a substantive claim about how Stalin actually was, not a claim about how he might have been. In addition, a possibilist reading like (1P) makes it hard to make sense of the attitudes we hold towards fictional characters (Kroon 2008: 201, 2012). Our belief in Holmes’s great cleverness explains our admiration for Holmes, just as our belief in Anna Karenina’s suffering explains our pity for Anna Karenina. It is hard to see how our belief in Holmes’s possible cleverness could do this. In reply, Priest has insisted that this is precisely how we should understand such claims: Holmes is admired for the things he does in the Holmes worlds, while a real individual such as Mandela is admired for what he actually did (2016: 217). But this seems to beg the question. Surely the mere fact that there are possible worlds in which Stalin dedicates his life to rescuing migrants from death in the Mediterranean sea, say, does not make him worthy of admiration in the actual world, although it may make him an object of admiration to people in these other worlds. Why should it be any different with Holmes?

The next approach to fictional entities to be discussed (the (neo-) Meinongian approach) is able to avoid such problems. But before we describe this approach, we should note that Modal Meinongians tend to subscribe to a broader theory than possibilism. As many philosophers have noted, fictional narratives are often inconsistent. The Holmes stories, for example, characterize Dr Watson as having a war wound on a single shoulder, variously given as his left and his right shoulder. Lewis (1983a: 277–8) suggests that, typically, impossible fictions can be dealt with by invoking only possible worlds (on Lewis’s preferred view, both φ and not-φ can be true in such an impossible fiction, but not their conjunction). But there are difficulties with this suggestion when extended to certain deeply entrenched contradictions. Thus consider certain time-travel stories. Priest himself concocts a story that wouldn’t make sense unless a particular fictional box—Sylvan’s box—was an impossible object (Priest 2005: 125ff.). Philosophers like Priest invoke impossible worlds to deal with such stories, and argue that some fictional objects are impossible objects to the extent that the only worlds in which the stories that characterize them are true are impossible worlds.

1.2 Meinong and Neo-Meinongianism

According to possibilism (perhaps extended to allow some fictional objects to be impossible objects), fictional objects are just like actual objects, except that they exist only in various non-actual worlds. Like actual objects, they are determinate down to the last detail in worlds in which they exist (so long as the stories that characterize them represent the world as being determinate down to the last detail). This is so even if the stories do not themselves fill in these details. For example, in worlds in which the Holmes stories are true, Holmes is left-handed, right-handed, or ambidextrous, even though the stories themselves do not tell us which (all that is true in the Holmes stories is that, having hands, he is one of these).

1.2.1 Meinong’s theory of objects

The view that fictional objects are Meinongian objects constitutes a very different metaphysical option. Meinong (1904) thought that among the entities that have some kind of being, there are real entities (entities with (spatio)temporal being — these can be physical or mental) and ideal entities (entities whose mode of being is non-temporal or abstract, such as numbers and relations). In addition, there are the paradigmatic Meinongian objects that lack any kind of being, such as the golden mountain and the round square. Meinong himself used “[mere] subsistence” (Bestand) for the non-temporal kind of being, reserving “existence” (Existenz) for the temporal kind. “Sein” was his word for the most general kind of being, which includes both Bestand and Existenz, thus putting entities that do not have being in either sense outside the scope of Sein. To simplify terminological matters, unless we specify otherwise we will use “exists” for the most general mode of being, i.e., Meinong’s Sein. Meinong’s view, then, is that there are objects that have no form of existence, or being, whatsoever.

Even though Meinongian objects do not exist, they do have properties. In particular, Meinong thought that their being such-and-so (their Sosein) is independent of their being or Sein. These Sosein-specifying properties, moreover, are precisely the properties in terms of which the objects are descriptively given. This claim is captured by the so-called Characterization Principle, whose explicit formulation is due to Routley (1980: 46) but which is already implicit in Meinong 1904 (1960: 82). According to this Principle, objects, whether they exist or not, have the properties in terms of which they are given or characterized; schematically, the thing that is characterized as being F is in fact F. Take, for instance, the golden mountain or the round square. The golden mountain does not exist, yet we can say that it is both golden and a mountain since these are the properties in terms of which the object is characterized; similarly, the round square is both round and square, even though it cannot exist.

It is commonly assumed that for Meinong fictional objects are just a subset of his Meinongian objects—they are Meinongian objects that are given in terms of the properties they have in the stories that feature them. Note that the problem for possibilism mentioned towards the end of the last section disappears on this account. For, so conceived, fictional entities do in fact possess the properties in terms of which they are characterized in the relevant narratives: Holmes really does have a high degree of cleverness, higher, perhaps, than that possessed by any actual detective, and so (1) might well be true. Note also that fictional entities so conceived are not completely determined with respect to their properties, unlike fictional entities conceived on the model of possibilism. Because Conan Doyle’s stories are quiet on these matters, Holmes on the Meinongian model is not right-handed; nor is he left-handed; nor is he ambidextrous. He does, however, have the property of being one of these. (One caution. Although this is the usual understanding of Meinong’s conception of fictional objects, Meinong may not have endorsed it in precisely this form: his most complete account of fictional objects suggests that they are higher-order entities, that is, entities that are constructed out of simpler entities, in the same sense in which, for instance, a melody is an entity constructed out of its constituent sounds (cf. Raspa 2001 and Marek 2008 [2013]).

1.2.2 Concrete and abstract neo-Meinongianism

Modern versions of Meinongianism accept much of what Meinong has to say on the topic of nonexistent objects, but depart from his account at various points. Suppose we restrict our attention to properties appropriate to physical, spatiotemporal objects (for example, being a mountain or being a detective). What, following Reicher (2023), we might call concrete neo-Meinongianism (Parsons 1980, Routley 1980, Jacquette 1996) maintains that Meinongian objects characterized in terms of such properties are concrete correlates of sets of such properties, possessing the properties in exactly the same sense as ordinary concrete objects have properties. Corresponding to a set S of such properties, there is a concrete object that has (at least) the properties contained in S. Corresponding to {being golden, being a mountain}, for example, there is the golden mountain, which has the properties of being a mountain and being golden (as well, perhaps, as all properties P such that necessarily, whatever is a golden mountain is P). These properties constitute the nature or essence of the golden mountain. But the golden mountain also has other properties, in particular properties that reflect its relationship to actual objects in the world (being often thought about by Meinong, for example). Like Meinong himself, concrete Meinongians think that such objects lack existence in the broad sense, i.e. the kind of existence appropriate to concrete or abstract objects. And while some are neutral on the question of whether there might be an even more inclusive mode of being possessed by nonexistent object (Parsons 1980: 10), others are adamant that there is no such mode. Routley has the most extreme version of this view; his “noneism” holds that the only mode of being is existence narrowly construed as the possession of causal powers and/or spatiotemporal location, a view shared by Priest’s version of Modal Meinongianism (Priest 2005, 2016). (Against such a Routley-style concrete neo-Meinongianism, David Lewis has famously argued that we should repudiate any understanding of existence on which “ it can be a substantive thesis that only some of the things there are exist—or, for that matter, … a substantive thesis that everything exists” (Lewis 1990: 32).

Concrete neo-Meinongians claim that fictional objects can similarly be regarded as concrete correlates of sets of properties. Consider Holmes, a cocaine-addicted detective who lives (lived) in London at 221B Baker Street, solves many baffling crimes, has a friend called “Watson”, and so on (where the “and so on” includes all the properties P such that it is true in the Holmes stories that Holmes has P). For concrete neo-Meinongians, Holmes is a concrete, albeit nonexistent, correlate of the set having those properties as members. (An interesting variant of these neo-Meinongian views is Castañeda’s guise-theory, according to which an existent individual is a bundle of guises—particulars formed from sets of properties by a special concretizing operation—related by a relation of consubstantiation. An object like the golden mountain is a guise that is not consubstantiated with any guise, not even itself, and so doesn’t exist. Castañeda takes fictional objects to be bundles of guises related by a special relation of consociation; see Castañeda 1989: ch.11.)

While agreeing that fictional objects form a subset of Meinongian objects, abstract neo-Meinongians (the label is again from Reicher 2023) maintain that Meinongian objects in general should be conceived of as objects that have a non-spatiotemporal mode of existence, and hence as abstract rather than concrete (see especially Zalta 1983)). And while they agree with the idea that for any collection of properties there is an individual that has all these properties, they do not take Meinongian objects to be correlates of sets of properties in anything like the way described by concrete neo-Meinongians. Instead, they take them to be something like generic objects or roles, along the model of Platonic attributes. (Indeed, Zalta and others have used his theory to model a range of philosophical notions, including Platonic forms; see Zalta 1983: 41–7, and Pelletier & Zalta 2000.) Consider the golden mountain again. For abstract neo-Meinongians, this object is not a mountain in the same sense that Mt Taranaki, for example, is a mountain. The golden mountain is an abstract object, and mountains are not abstract objects. It is more akin to the object referred to as the U.S. President in the following statement:

  • (3) The US President faces an election every four years,

where the subject is not a particular US President like George W. Bush or Barack Obama, but rather the role or office of US President. (While Zalta is the clearest example of an abstract neo-Meinongian in our sense, others come close. For example, Rapaport (1978) considers M-objects (his version of Meinongian objects) to be akin to plans rather than concrete individuals, and plans are presumably abstract objects.) Note finally that while abstract neo-Meinongians take Meinongian objects like the golden mountain and Sherlock Holmes to exist in the broad sense, they agree on the importance of the nonexistence datum: Zalta, for example, emphasizes that while Holmes has being, i.e., existence in the broad sense, ‘he’ lacks existence in the narrow, more salient, sense of having spatiotemporal location (Zalta 1988: 21).

There are other realist positions which, although admittedly not Meinongian, come close to this abstract form of neo-Meinongianism. The realist view of Wolterstorff (1980), for example, takes fictional objects to be Platonic kinds whose instances or examples are ordinary objects that have properties like being a famous detective, living in London, being called ‘Holmes’, etc. (in the case of the fictional object Holmes); it thereby shares with abstract neo-Meinongianism a form of Platonism about fictional objects. Others take them to be work-bound roles (Currie 1990), thereby holding a form of abstractionism that leads to a conception of fictional objects as dependent entities, like the conception explicitly defended by creationists (see below). (Indeed, even the idea of fictional objects as kinds can be given a creationist rather than Platonist interpretation; see Terrone 2017, which interprets fictional objects as abstract types dependent on mental files.)

Before turning to another important point of disagreement among neo-Meinongians, it is worth emphasizing that abstract neo-Meinongianism should be considered an unorthodox variant of Meinongianism on the usual understanding of Meinong’s view. After all, if Meinongian objects are abstract then they must all have Sein or existence in the broad sense, contrary to what Meinong is generally taken to have thought. (There is some evidence, however, that Meinong later also contemplated a more Platonist way of understanding such objects, taking them to function as abstract universals that serve as “auxiliary” objects for the comprehension of real objects, see Meinong (1915 [1972]: 739f.)

1.2.3 Two kinds of properties vs. two modes of predication

The distinction between concrete and abstract neo-Meinongians is drawn at the metaphysical level. It is closely linked to another distinction relevant to Meinongian objects, and so to fictional objects conceived of as Meinongian objects: that between kinds of properties and modes of predication. Recall that on the one hand it seems natural to say that fictional objects have the properties in terms of which stories characterize them (for instance, Anna Karenina was a woman driven to suicide by her failed affair, and Sherlock Holmes a cocaine-addicted detective living in London), and on the other hand not in the least natural (Anna Karenina may have committed suicide, but it is no use looking for news of her suicide in the newspapers of the day). Now, all neo-Meinongians accept Meinong’s view that a Meinongian object possesses the properties in terms of which it is characterized. Following what Meinong (1972 [1915]) himself came to say on the basis of a suggestion by his student Ernst Mally, some neo-Meinongians (for example, Parsons 1980, Jacquette 1996) take these properties to be the object’s nuclear properties, where, in general, if M is the Meinongian object correlated with a set of properties S, the members of S are the object’s nuclear properties. On this view, being a detective, for example, is a nuclear property of Holmes, while being a king is a nuclear property of King Arthur. (Routley similarly talks of an object’s characterizing properties; cf. Routley 1980: 507–10.) But a Meinongian object also has other properties on this view: its extranuclear properties are those of its properties that are not among its nuclear or characterizing properties. In the case of fictional objects, these are the properties that a fictional object has outside the scope of the story in which it appears—properties, we might say, that it has in virtue of the way the world really is, not properties that it has from the point of view of that story. Consider, for example, the following two sentences:

  • (4) Mickey Mouse is a pop culture icon
  • (5) Anna Karenina is a fictional character.

These sentences involve properties—being a pop culture icon, being a fictional character—that are being ascribed to Mickey Mouse and Anna Karenina even though the properties do not characterize these characters in the stories in which they appear. Mickey Mouse has the first property because of the effects of his enormous popularity on pop culture, not because he is depicted as a pop culture icon in the Mickey Mouse stories. Anna Karenina has the second property because of her status as the product of creative fiction, not because of what Tolstoy’s story says about her (according to Tolstoy’s story she is a woman, not a fictional character). These two properties are typical instances of extranuclear properties.

(A cautionary comment. In light of what we have just said, the claim that the properties true of a fictional object in a work count as the object’s nuclear properties needs qualification. It is true in the Holmes stories, for example, that Holmes exists, even though Holmes doesn’t actually exist. So non-existence is one of Holmes’s (extranuclear) properties despite the fact that in the stories Holmes is as much an existent object as he is a detective living in London. One way of dealing with this apparent tension is to insist that Holmes does have a property like existence, but that this property should be understood as a weaker, ‘watered-down’, version of its extranuclear counterpart, a notion first advanced by Meinong (cf. Parsons 1980: 44, 184–6). We return to the notion of watered-down versions of extranuclear properties below.)

Some other neo-Meinongians claim instead that fictional and other Meinongian objects possess the very same kind of properties that ordinary individuals possess, but possess them in a very different way. (This suggestion was first made by Mally (1912), but not adopted by Meinong.) When, for example, we say that Anna Karenina was a woman and Holmes an inhabitant of London, we use a different mode of predication from the one we use when we say that Marilyn Monroe was a woman or Tony Blair an inhabitant of London. On Zalta’s familiar formulation of this idea (Zalta 1983), fictional entities encode such properties while ordinary individuals simply exemplify them. Similarly, Castañeda (1989) appeals to an internal as well as external mode of predication of properties, while Rapaport (1978) talks of properties that are constituents of objects and properties that are exemplified by objects. Both Anna Karenina and Marilyn Monroe, we might say, have the property of being a woman, but the former encodes the property (the property is predicated of Anna internally, or Anna has it as a constituent), while the latter exemplifies the property (she has it externally).

But fictional objects also exemplify properties, perhaps some of the very same properties they encode or have internally (this happens whenever these properties are predicated of the objects in the stories in which they appear). Thus, what makes both (4) and (5) true is that the properties of being a pop culture icon and being a fictional character are exemplified, or possessed externally, by Mickey Mouse and Anna Karenina respectively. Anna Karenina therefore turns out to be internally non-fictional (since it is true in the novel that she is a woman, not a fictional character), and externally fictional.

That said, note that there are important differences between the ways in which Zalta, on the one hand, and Castañeda and Rapaport, on the other, formulate these distinctions. For Zalta (1983: 12), encoding is a primitive notion that he embeds in a rigorous higher-order modal theory which is then used to prove the existence, and derive the properties, of abstract objects, including fictional objects. The fact that encoding is a primitive notion is not seen as a drawback, given the fruitfulness of the notion once embedded in a general theory of abstract objects (Bueno & Zalta 2017). For both Castañeda (1989: 200) and Rapaport (1978: 162), on the other hand, internal predication applies to set-correlates, and so this mode of predication can be defined in terms of set-membership: a (fictional) entity F has P internally (or: has P as a constituent) if and only if P belongs to the property set that is correlated with F.

On the surface, the ‘modes of predication’ distinction appears to be in a better position to handle the data than the ‘kinds of properties’ distinction (for more on these distinctions, see the exchange between Jacquette (1989) and Zalta (1992)). For one thing, there seems to be no workable criterion for distinguishing nuclear and extranuclear properties: some properties seem to be both. Consider the property of being a fictional character. Being a fictional character may seem to be the prototypical candidate of an extranuclear property, as the case of (5) above testifies, but there may well be ‘metafictional’ narratives whose protagonists are not characterized in the usual way as flesh and blood individuals, but instead as fictional characters. (The fictional character The Father in Pirandello’s Six Characters in Search of an Author is a famous case in point.) So being a fictional character seems to qualify as both a nuclear and an extranuclear property. Defenders of the ‘modes of predication’ distinction have no problem here: they hold that we can externally predicate being a fictional character of both Anna Karenina and Pirandello’s The Father, while we can also internally predicate this property of The Father. (It should be pointed out that defenders of the ‘kinds of properties’-distinction have their own way of responding to this problem: they say that in such cases the nuclear property in question is the ‘watered-down’ counterpart of the corresponding extranuclear property. On this view, Pirandello’s The Father has the extranuclear property of being a fictional character as well as its nuclear ‘watered-down’ correlate. But apart from the seemingly ad hoc character of this response, it is faced by a more serious problem: it threatens to expose the distinction to an endless regress of ever more ‘watered- down’ nuclear properties (cf. Voltolini 2006).)

It is probably fair to say that at the current stage of the debate the ‘modes of predication’ distinction is more widely accepted, although as far as fictional entities at least are concerned, both distinctions are taken to be problematic (Everett 2013). We should remember, however, that this debate is internal to neo-Meinongianism, and that neo-Meinongianism as a theory of fictional objects has important virtues that owe nothing to the outcome of this debate. One such virtue is that the theory can account for the idea that fictional entities necessarily have the properties that they are characterized as having in the relevant stories. It is hard to see how Holmes could not have been a detective, for example. Of course, Doyle might have written a story in which someone called ‘Holmes’ was a film director, but it is hard not to interpret this thought as simply meaning that Doyle might have created another character with the same name. At the same time, it is a plain truth of the Holmes stories that Holmes might never have become a detective, that this was a purely contingent choice on Holmes’s part. No matter how it is formulated, neo-Meinongianism has a way of capturing both these intuitions. On Zalta’s formulation of the ‘modes of predication’ distinction, for example, Holmes exemplifies the property of being necessarily such that he encodes both being a detective and being someone who might not have been a detective. A neo-Meinongian advocating the ‘types of property’ distinction would say that Holmes has the extranuclear property of being necessarily such that he has the (nuclear) property of being a detective, but that he also has the (watered-down) nuclear property of being someone who might not have been a detective.

On the basis of the essentialist idea that fictional objects necessarily have the properties that they are characterized as having in the relevant stories, neo-Meinongians have suggested a simple criterion for the identity of fictional entities, one which can be traced back to the criterion for the identity of Meinongian objects in general: If x has all the same nuclear properties as y (alternatively, if x and y internally possess the same properties), then \(x = y\) (cf., for example, Parsons 1980: 28, 188).

Despite the apparent attractions of such a view, there is an evident problem facing the underlying thought that once you have a certain collection of properties you ipso facto have a fictional entity. (Note that (most) neo-Meinongians accept this thought, since they take fictional objects to be a subset of the class of objects generated on the basis of something like Meinong’s Principle of the Freedom of Assumption (cf. Meinong 1915 [1972: 282]), the principle that for any collection of (nuclear) properties there is a Meinongian object that has those properties.) But generating fictional entities is surely not quite that easy. Take an arbitrary collection of properties, say {weighing more than 10kgs, bearing the name “Oscar”, having a passion for garden gloves, being a devotee of the number 17}. The mere existence of this set of properties is not enough to generate a fictional object, Oscar, with these properties. More has to happen. (Kripke (2013: 70–1) mentions the historical case of the Biblical term ‘Moloch’, which interpreters of the Bible took to be a name for a mythical pagan god, whereas modern philology suggests it was in fact used as a common noun either for kings or for human sacrifices. If modern philology is right and Bible-interpreters were confused, there is no mythical god Moloch. This is so even though we can agree that there is a collection of properties that past interpreters mistakenly understood the Bible to assign to such a god.)

Neo-Meinongians have tried to circumvent this problem by stressing that Meinongian objects, including fictional objects, are not sets of properties, but correlates of such sets. Whether this move enables neo-Meinongians to avoid admitting objects like Oscar and Moloch into the overall domain of fictional objects will depend on how this move is understood. (In Castañeda’s variant of neo-Meinongianism, fictional objects are systems of set-correlates, built up, or put together, by a fiction maker (cf. Castañeda 1989: ch.11). But if this implies that the activity of fiction-making is essential to the identity of fictional objects, we no longer have a pure neo-Meinongianism but a view that is closer to the ‘creationist’ view described in the next section.)

Even if the idea of a set-correlate helps to solve this particular problem, it seems that no neo-Meinongian theory is able to block another problem that stems from letting the identity of such an object depend on the properties in terms of which it is characterized. Take Jorge Luis Borges’s famous story of a man called Pierre Menard who happens to write a text that is word for word identical with Miguel Cervantes’s Don Quixote. Assume, in this variant of Borges’s story, that Menard and Cervantes are unknown to each other, even though they live in the very same town; one can even suppose that they are neighbors. In that case, the Borges story describes a situation in which one and the same set of properties corresponds to different fictional objects: Cervantes’s Don Quixote and Pierre Menard’s Don Quixote are two distinct fictional characters who, nonetheless, share all the properties they have in the respective works. (The ‘Menard’ case was first mentioned in this context by Lewis (1978: 39). As a problem for the identity of fictional objects, it was then exploited by Fine (1982: 107); see also Thomasson (1999: 7, 56).) In this case, claiming that fictional objects are set-correlates rather than mere property sets does not solve the problem, for we have only one set-correlate, yet two distinct objects.

Intuitively speaking, the problem is clear. Neo-Meinongianism in all its varieties tends to sketch a Platonistic picture of a fictional entity, either as something akin to a Platonic attribute, or as a correlate of something else that we tend to describe in Platonic terms—a set of properties. Neo-Meinongianism thus sees a fictional object as something that pre-dates the story-telling activities that intuitively bring fictional objects into being. To see the tension between these conceptions, note that we often speak of fictional objects as the creations of storytellers or of the human mind more generally. Neo-Meinongianism, so it seems, leaves no such room for storytellers.

1.3 Creationism

The intuition that story-tellers have some kind of creative role to play is accounted for by so called artifactualist, or creationist, accounts of fictional entities (see Searle 1979, Salmon 1998, Thomasson 1999, Voltolini 2006; the position was also defended in Kripke 2013, and elements of the position are found in van Inwagen’s (1977) theory of fictional objects as posits of literary criticism; Ingarden 1931 is a significant historical forerunner). According to such accounts, fictional objects are artifacts since they come into being once they are conceived by their authors; to that extent, they are authorial creations. Moreover, they are abstract entities, just as abstract neo-Meinongians believe. Unlike Platonic abstracta, however, they not only have a beginning in time, but they are also dependent entities since they depend on other entities for their existence. (Roughly speaking, an entity O existentially depends on another entity O′ just if O couldn’t exist without O′ existing (cf. Thomasson 1999). For a more discriminating account, one that avoids the consequence that everything existentially depends on necessary existents like natural numbers, see Fine 1994.) More specifically, fictional objects depend historically rigidly on the authors who create them (necessarily, if O comes into being at t, then the author(s) who creates O exists at some time t′ before t) and constantly generically on the literary works that feature them (necessarily, if O goes on existing, then some literary work W or other featuring O exists during O’s time of existence) (see Thomasson 1999 for an extended discussion of such dependencies). While historical rigid dependence accounts for a fictional object’s coming into being, constant generic dependence accounts for its continued existence or persistence. Such an account of the persistence of fictional objects seems as intuitive as the account of their generation. Not only do we say that some given fictional object was created at a certain point of time, but we might also describe it as having a certain age (Hamlet, we might point out, is now over 400 years old).

Note that creationism thus characterized earns its keep from the ‘obviousness’ of the thought that authors somehow create fictional characters through the creation of fictional works in which they appear. Language seems to support this thought: we routinely hear statements like “Hamlet is one of Shakespeare’s most complex creations”. It is on the basis of this thought that creationists then hypothesize that fictional objects literally are the creations of their authors: not concrete creations, clearly, so therefore non-concrete, abstract creations. But this move is far from innocent. Yagisawa (2001), for example, argues that creationism conflicts sharply with other seemingly obvious thoughts, for example the nonexistence datum that fictional characters like Hamlet don’t exist (for a response, see Goodman 2004). At an even more fundamental level, Brock (2010) argues that the creationist’s appeal to creation is explanatorily void, leaving more questions than answers. Not only is it left unclear when a fictional object is created, but also how it is created. Appealing to authorial intentions, for example, is inadequate, for such intentions may be lacking or overridden. (Brock considers an imaginary scenario in which Doyle intended Holmes and Watson to be the same character, but died before writing the story that revealed this (361–362). Arguably, this wouldn’t change the fact that Holmes is distinct from Watson.) Some creationists have responded to such cases by arguing for models of creation on which the creation of fictional objects may be inadvertent, perhaps because of the role played by readers or because of authorial confusion. (Lee 2022, Zvolenszky 2016).

Creationists themselves claim that the appeal to creation does solve a number of significant problems that afflict other metaphysical theories. There is, for example, no mythical god Moloch, for nobody has created such an object by gathering various properties and embedding them in a certain narrative. And although they share all the properties attributed to them in the respective renditions of Don Quixote, there are two Don Quixotes, Cervantes’s and Menard’s, not just one, because there were two utterly independent acts of authorial generation (cf. Voltolini 2006: 32ff.). It is not clear, however, how creationists can deal with a related problem that affects their theory, the problem of indiscriminable fictional objects (Everett 2013: 191ff., Kroon 2015). Intuitively, there were thousands of fictional dwarves who took part in Tolkien’s War between the Dwarves and Orcs, without Tolkien’s engaging in thousands of acts of dwarf-creation. (In response to this worry, some creationists have denied that there are such characters; see, for example, Voltolini 2006: 209–11, Schnieder & von Solodkoff 2009: 147.)

It is evident, then, that creationism is not without its problems. Perhaps the most significant ones have to do with the nature of the creative process and the relation between the creative process and the identity of fictional objects. It seems, for example, that what comes into existence on the above account of the generating process (which talks of authors’ conceiving of their literary creations) is not a fictional object as such, but rather a (mere) intentional object, the target of a certain authorial thought. A mere intentional object is not yet a fictional object, as Thomasson (1999:89) agrees, so what makes it one? Does it become one by being able to be ‘shared’ by more than one person through appearing in a text (maybe not a physical copy but one stored in memory)? Or is there a more discriminating criterion to single out which intentional objects are fictional objects?

This question is perhaps best answered by giving a somewhat different account of the generating process. Thus, some creationists (Schiffer 1996, 2003; Thomasson 2003a,b) say that a fictional object comes into being as an abstract artifact not when an author first conceives of it, but only once a certain make-believe process has come to an end, namely, the process in which someone—typically, a story-teller—pretends that there is an individual who is such-and-such and does so-and-so. It is disputable whether this provides a sufficient condition for ficta generation; perhaps something else is needed, such as a reflexive stance on the very make-believe process itself (Voltolini 2006, 2015a, 2020a).

Creationists may even choose to downplay the issue of ficta generation. Fictional objects can perhaps be construed as institutional entities along the model of baptisms and marriages, entities that figure in the general inventory of what there is, but do so for free. Just as one can allow for the existence of baptisms and marriages simply by appealing to constitutive rules along the model of Searle’s (1969) account of illocutionary acts, so one can say that fictional objects come to exist once certain practices having do with make-believe (and possibly also its recognition) are in force (Thomasson 2003a,b, 2014; Voltolini 2020b). Alternatively, one may appeal to regulative rules and say that, just like driving or queueing, fiction requires an equilibrium solution to a coordination problem in the communication, among consumers of fiction, of the content of their imaginings. Fictional objects arguably provide stability in such imaginings. On this picture, fictional objects, qua institutional entities, are simply generated by the fact that giving expression to such imaginings also counts as declaring that things stand in a certain way, thereby constituting the very fact they declare, much like standard declarations such as a declaration of marriage (Abell 2020). (It is of course important for this view to justify how the use of language resulting in ficta generation can count as authoritative in the very same sense as the words of an officer declaring, and thereby generating, a marriage.)

But whatever the right account, another question remains: even if we agree on the nature of the process-type that gives rise to a fictional object, what is the thing that is purportedly generated in this way? What are the identity conditions for fictional objects? Creationists typically do not think that a fictional object possesses the properties that characterize it in the story in which it appears. A fictional object simply has those properties according to the story. It is not true of Holmes, for instance, that ‘he’ (or it) is a detective—only physical objects, not an abstract artifact, can be a detective. In Williamson’s terms (2000: 203), it is not true that Holmes, as a cultural artifact, is a detective that is fictional. Instead, what is true of Holmes is that ‘he’ is a detective according to the Holmes stories (equally, Holmes is male according to those stories, and so deserving of the masculine pronoun “he”). In general, for creationists the only properties that fictional objects genuinely possess are the properties that neo-Meinongians would call extranuclear or take to be externally predicated: properties like being a fictional detective or being Doyle’s creation or even being a detective according to the Holmes stories (cf. Thomasson 1999). The approach thus fails to account for the idea, mentioned earlier, that there must be a sense in which fictional objects actually have the properties that characterize them in the relevant stories.

In addition, the restricted nature of such properties makes it hard to see how to individuate a fictional entity. Thomasson gives sufficient identity conditions for fictional entities within a literary work: x and y are the same fictional object F if x and y are ascribed exactly the same properties in the work (1999: 63). But what do we say in the case of fictional objects that appear in different works? Thomasson admits that in this case one can only provide a necessary condition: x and y are the same fictional object only if the author of the second work \(W'\) is competently acquainted with x of the previous work \(W\), and intends to import x into \(W'\) as y (1999: 67). The reason why she thinks this cannot be a sufficient condition is that, no matter what the author’s intentions are, he does not succeed in importing x (an entity that appears in W) into \(W'\) as y if he attributes properties to y that are too radically different from the properties that were attributed to x in W (1999: 68). (There are other cases that show even more clearly how authorial intention can be thwarted. Thus, consider a case of a fusion of characters, in which an author intends to import into \(W'\) two characters x and y from a previous work W as a single character z. Clearly, given the transitivity of identity, z is not identical with either x or y, so the author fails in her attempt. Analogous problems arise in the converse situation of character fission: cf. Voltolini 2012.)

The problem of the reliability of authorial intentions also arises in another account, close to creationism, that has recently been developed: the hylomorphist account (Evnine 2016). Just as ordinary artifacts (chairs, tables, statues ...) amount to the particular arrangements of certain materials in accordance with certain creative intentions, so fictional objects come into play by arranging material of a specific kind, viz., the properties predicated in a certain fiction, in accordance with certain authorial intentions. On this model, fictional objects have their characterizing properties, albeit merely contingently (the authorial plan may change). Once again, however, what specific authorial intention is in play and how it may be put into force is a matter of debate. As before, there may be no creative intention, or it may be overridden (to come back to a previous example, few would take Holmes to be assembled out of properties that include being identical to Watson, even if Conan Doyle had, perversely, intended this).

To conclude this discussion of the metaphysics of fictional objects, it is worth noting that neo-Meinongian and creationist theories seem to suffer from complementary defects. On the one hand, neo-Meinongians provide exact identity criteria for fictional objects, but these criteria are clearly insufficient in that they do not take into account the fact that such objects are products of the human mind. On the other hand, creationists do account for this fact, but they only provide relatively non-specific identity criteria for such entities. Those theories are normally taken to be incompatible, for they appeal to different metaphysical models—broadly speaking, a Platonic model as opposed to a constructivist one. This claim of incompatibility should not be taken as definitive, however; there may well be ways in which the two theories, or perhaps the most promising elements of each theory, can somehow be combined (for recent attempts to go in such a direction, cf. Zalta 2000, Voltolini 2006).

2. The Ontology of Fictional Entities

The metaphysical question about fictional entities asked what such entities are like, should there be any. We now turn to the ontological question, which simply asks whether there are any such entities.

2.1 Semantical Arguments for and Against Realism

Obviously the important division at the ontological level lies between those who believe that there are fictional entities—fictional realists—and those who believe that there are no such entities—fictional antirealists. For a long time, the battlefield between those two parties has been ordinary language. Realists have always been fascinated by the fact that there are sentences in language that seem to commit one to fictional entities. Antirealists have instead insisted that such appearances are deceptive: whenever a sentence seems to commit one to fictional entities, one can always provide a paraphrase which has the same truth-conditions as the original sentence but is not so committed. Realists in turn try to show either that those paraphrases are inadequate or that there are still further sentences for which no adequate paraphrases can be found. Antirealists will reply that, despite appearances, these sentences can also be paraphrased in noncommittal terms; and so the game goes on.

2.1.1 Russell’s anti-realism

Frege (1892) is often taken to be the first champion of fictional antirealism within analytic philosophy, in so far as he held that in direct (gerade) contexts such as “Odysseus came ashore” the fictional name “Odysseus” has a sense but no reference. But Frege also held that in oblique (ungerade) contexts such as “John believed that Odysseus came ashore” and “The author of the Odyssey says that Odysseus came ashore” this sense becomes the new referent of the fictional name. If senses of this type can model the notion of a fictional entity, then Frege can be construed as a kind of fictional realist (Künne 1990); otherwise, he can’t. (Parsons (1982) is doubtful; Zalta may be more sympathetic, since he thinks his abstract objects can model both the notion of sense (Zalta 2001) and the idea of a fictional object.)

The modern form of the realism-antirealism debate, however, did not originate with anything Frege said on the matter, but with a dispute between Meinong (1904) and Russell (1905a). Consider a sentence like:

  • (6) Apollo is young.

According to Meinong, considered here as the paradigmatic realist, the very meaningfulness of this statement commits one to a (broadly) fictional entity—the deity of the Greek myths—on the grounds, roughly, that the thought expressed by the statement is directed at this entity, and so requires there to be such an entity. The statement itself expresses a truth rather than a falsehood about this entity. For Russell, however, appearances in this case were deceptive. First of all, he thought that “Apollo”, like any other ordinary proper name, is short-hand for a definite description—say, “the sun-god”. Secondly, following his discovery of the theory of definite descriptions Russell held that a sentence containing a definite description has to be analyzed in terms of another sentence in which the description is eliminated in favor of quantifiers, predicates, logical connectives, and genuine proper names. What (6) says on this account is given by a paraphrase in which the definite description for which “Apollo” is short-hand, namely “the sun-god”, has disappeared on analysis:

  • (6R) There is at least one sun-god and at most one sun-god and every sun-god is young.

(Put more simply: There is a unique sun-god, and he is young.)

Thirdly, there is no longer even the appearance of a singular term (“Apollo”) that must designate something for the paraphrase to be meaningful. In fact, Russell saw that this result showed the original statement to be both meaningful (because able to be analyzed in this way) and false (given obvious facts). Say that a definite description has a Russellian denotation when the Russellian conditions for the description to have a denotation are fulfilled; that is, when there is at least one individual satisfying the relevant predicate, but no more than one. Then we can say that the definite description for which “Apollo” is short-hand does not have a Russellian denotation since (6R)’s first conjunct, namely:

  • (7) There is at least one sun-god

is false. Far from making (6) meaningless, the absence of a denotation in this Russellian sense when taken in conjunction with Russell’s eliminative strategy shows (6) to be false. Russell thought that his theory of definite descriptions allowed him to show that all fictional names lacked denotation in this way, and that sentences containing fictional names were therefore true or false rather than meaningless.

2.1.2 Metafictional sentences and “in the fiction” operators

Let us accept, for argument’s sake, that the adoption of Russell’s theory of descriptions allows us to avoid ontological commitment to such ‘bizarre’ entities as nonexistent fictional and mythological entities. (Although this is a widely accepted view, there is in fact reason to doubt it: David Kaplan argues that it is “one of [the] virtues” of Russell’s theory that the theory is “essentially neutral with respect to ontological commitment”, that it permits descriptions to denote nonexistent entities if there are such entities (Kaplan 2005: 975–6; cf. also Voltolini 2006: 139ff.). Even if Russell’s theory is ontologically potent in this way, however, the theory as formulated faces a simple and seemingly devastating objection: many intuitively true sentences come out as false on their Russellian paraphrases. Consider sentence (6) again. If we use Russell’s theory to dispense with an entity like Apollo, it follows that (6) is false, insofar as its Russellian paraphrase is false. This is widely acknowledged to be counterintuitive. Presented with (6), most would say that it is intuitively true, unlike, say:

  • (8) Apollo is a rock-star.

As it turns out, the antirealist who follows Russell has an easy way of circumventing this problem. She will point out that the reason why (6), but not (8), seems to be true is that in the Greek myth things are exactly as (6) says. The impression that (6) is true can then easily be accommodated by taking (6) to be elliptical for a longer sentence, namely:

  • (6I) According to the Greek myth, Apollo is young.

Here the locution “according to the Greek myth” works as an intensional operator, whereas the sentence following that operator, which is nothing but (6) itself, has to be analyzed in Russellian fashion:

  • (6IR) According to the Greek myth, there is a unique sun-god and he is young.

(A caveat. It would be more proper to say that it is a use of (6) that is taken to be elliptical for (6IR), rather than (6) itself. For (6) is a case of a fictional sentence, namely a sentence that could easily occur in the body of a narrative (a myth, in this case). Such sentences have a use on which they have merely fictional truth-conditions, that is, truth-conditions from the stand-point of the narrative or work of fiction, and on this kind of use even their truth-values are merely fictional. Following Evans (1982), who here borrows a Quinean terminology, we may call this the conniving use of such sentences: the use on which the utterer is engaged in pretense or make-believe. But there is another use of the same sentences—what Evans calls the non-conniving use—on which we take them to have real truth-conditions, hence real truth-values: the kind of use on which we take (8), unlike (6), to express a real falsehood. A case in point would be an utterance of (8) in response to a request for information about Apollo in an exam on Greek mythology. We shall call sentences of the form (6I), even reshaped as (6IR), internal metafictional sentences, for they purport to say how things stand in, or according to, a certain fiction. They are meant as sentences that capture the non-conniving use of fictional sentences like (6).)

Let us now go back to the amendment to Russellianism we were considering. On the view being discussed, an expression like “according to the Greek myth” is, qua intensional operator, a circumstance-shifting operator, one that shifts the circumstance of evaluation of the sentence following it. Suppose, for the sake of argument, that a sentence of the form “According to story S, p” is true in the actual world if and only if “p” is true at the closest possible worlds to the actual world in which S is true (cf. Lewis 1978). Now, any sentence that this operator embeds has to be analyzed in Russellian terms if it contains a singular term. In that case, a sentence like (6I) is true in the actual world if and only if (6), i.e., (6R), is true at the closest possible worlds in which the Apollo-myth is true. Insofar as (6R) is indeed true at such worlds, the singular term in question—“Apollo”, that is, “the sun-god”—has a (Russellian) denotation in those worlds, even though it lacks a denotation in the actual world. Hence, we again get the result Russell desired: the whole sentence is true although the relevant singular term has no actual denotation but only a possible one. Thus, no commitment to fictional entities arises out of the truth of that sentence.

Or rather, no such commitment arises from Russell’s theory on its own. If we assume Lewis’s modal realism, then saying as we did that a description has a possible denotation entails an ontological commitment to fictional objects as possibilia. Normally, however, this intensionalist approach is taken in an antirealist sense (cf., e.g., Lamarque & Olsen 1994; Orenstein 2003; Rorty 1982). For the Russellian, central to this antirealist understanding is the fact that a sentence like (6I) should be given a de dicto, not a de re, reading: what is said to be true in the fiction is a certain dictum or proposition, not the claim, about some given thing or res x, that x has a certain property. On Russell’s way of understanding this distinction, the description “the sun-god” for which “Apollo” is short-hand should be interpreted as having a secondary, not a primary, occurrence in the sentence, or, which is the same, the existential quantifier occurring in the Russellian paraphrase of the sentence should be assigned narrow, not wide, scope. (6I), that is, should be read as: “According to the Apollo-myth, there is exactly one sun-god, and he is young” rather than as “There is a unique sun-god, and according to the myth he is young”. The reason for this is evident. If we adopt the wide-scope reading of the quantifier, the sentence turns out to be false, not true (given that there is no sun-god); and it is the truth of a sentence like (6I) that the Russellian aims to capture.

Suppose that the Russellian amendment works for fictional sentences on their non-conniving use. Intuitively, however, there are many sentences that talk of fictional characters even though they do not even implicitly mention stories. Let us call these external metafictional sentences (some other commentators talk of “transfictive” or “critical” sentences). (4) and (5) above are typical examples. Clearly, (4) and (5) cannot be taken as elliptical for internal metafictional sentences such as:

  • (4I) According to the Disney stories, Mickey Mouse is a pop culture icon
  • (5I) According to Anna Karenina, Anna Karenina is a fictional character.

For unlike (4) and (5), the latter sentences are simply false even on their de dicto reading (a point already stressed by Lewis (1978: 38)): Mickey Mouse has the status of a pop culture icon in the actual world, not in the Disney stories; and according to Anna Karenina, Anna is a woman, not a fictional character. Many realists, especially creationists, have concluded that sentences of this kind really do establish that we are committed to fictional characters. They argue that even though fictional sentences on their non-conniving use can be paraphrased as internal metafictional sentences on their de dicto reading and thus do not commit us to fictional characters, external metafictional sentences cannot be paraphrased in this way, and their truth really does commit us to fictional characters (see, for example, Schiffer 1996 and Thomasson 2003b).

One possible antirealist solution to this problem—although not one that Russellians themselves have promoted—is to invoke a kind of fictionalism about fictional characters. On this strategy, sentences like (4) and (5) should be thought of as implicitly prefixed by another intensional “in the fiction” operator, so that even in this case the impression of reference to a fictional entity would turn out to be baseless. In cases of this type, the operator would appeal not to a story but rather to the realist presumption that such an impression seems to support. The suggestion, then, is that external metafictional sentences are to be read as implicitly prefixed by an operator like “according to the fiction of realism” or “according to the realist’s hypothesis”:

  • (4F) According to the realist’s hypothesis, Mickey Mouse is a pop culture icon.
  • (5F) According to the realist’s hypothesis, Anna Karenina is a fictional character.

Once external metafictional sentences are read this way, any apparent commitment to fictional entities seems to disappear, provided once again that the resulting complex sentences are read de dicto (for such a move, see Brock 2002, Phillips 2000).

2.1.3 The descriptivist problem for theories of fictional names

The appeal to intensional “in the fiction” operators is a well-known strategy for dealing with the apparent truth of statements like (6), and because it is available to Russell this may seem like good news for Russell’s antirealism, especially given the way the strategy might be extended to external meta-fictional statements like (4) and (5). But such an amended version of Russellianism faces a problem already faced by the unamended version of Russell’s view. If such a Russellianism is to provide the correct analysis of sentences like (6), one has to assume that proper names are synonymous with definite descriptions. This is because the strategy used in arriving at a sentence like (6IR) involves replacing a proper name (“Apollo”) with an equivalent definite description (“the sun-god”). But there are well-known, and widely accepted, arguments against such a descriptivist view of proper names (Donnellan 1972, Kripke 1972 [1980], 2013). In particular, descriptions of the sort that speakers or communities standardly associate with a name might simply fail to fit what the name really refers to (in the actual world and relative to other possible worlds). One response to this objection as far as fictional names like “Apollo”, “Holmes”, etc., are concerned is to reject descriptivism about ordinary names but endorse it for fictional names (see, for example, Currie 1990: 158–162). On the surface, however, this looks like an unpromising move: for one thing, it is possible to attempt to engage in conversation about Apollo, believing he is real, before coming to the realization that he is merely a mythological figure, a possibility that is hard to explain if ordinary names and fictional names have entirely different sorts of meanings.

This descriptivist problem presents itself as a potential challenge to any antirealist view that endorses a de dicto reading of sentences like (6I) and (4F) / (5F). For how else, if not in terms of some kind of descriptivist view of names like Russell’s, are we to understand such de dicto readings? If names are instead taken to be directly referential—that is, if they are taken to be terms that do not secure their reference by means of descriptive meanings—there seems to be no room left for a de dicto as opposed to a de re reading of such sentences, and, consequently, no room for the thought that sentences containing (allegedly) empty names like “Apollo” even have truth-conditions.

A particularly stark form of this dilemma is faced by what is perhaps the most widely accepted post-Kripkean alternative to descriptivism, namely Millianism, which holds that what a name contributes semantically to the propositions expressed through the use of sentences containing the name is just the name’s referent. The combination of Millianism and the antirealist view that fictional names like “Apollo” lack reference (and so make no contribution to the expression of propositions) appears to imply that sentences like (6I) don’t express any proposition, let alone true propositions. There is now a lively industry devoted to finding Millianism-friendly solutions to this quandary. Some Millians argue that what we see as meaningful and even true concerns what is implicated rather than semantically expressed by such sentences (e.g., Taylor 2000). Others appeal to gappy or unfilled propositions. These are proposition-like entities expressed by sentences containing empty names that can fail to be true because of the gaps (see Braun 1993, 2005; Adams et al. 1997). Both Braun and Adams et al. argue that such gappiness doesn’t prevent internal metafictional sentences such as “In the Holmes stories, Holmes is a detective” from expressing truths. But they disagree about external metafictional sentences like “Holmes is a fictional character”, with Adams et al. insisting that these too can be true despite the names being non-referring, and Braun (2005) arguing that such statements call for a creationist position on which the names in such sentences refer to genuine, created fictional entities.

Millians are not the only ones to have grappled with the implications that the Kripke-Donnellan attack on descriptivism has for the semantics of fictional names. Michael Devitt, for example, another early critic of descriptivism, has used the problem of fictional and other empty names to argue against Millianism and in favor of his version of a causal-historical theory of reference (cf. Devitt 1989). And Mark Sainsbury argues in Sainsbury 2005 that names, including fictional names, have singular but non-descriptive meanings that can be specified in a Davidson-style truth theory whose background logic is a Negative Free Logic (that is, a logic that counts simple or atomic sentences containing empty names as false). Given the role assigned to Negative Free Logic, it is scarcely surprising that the greatest challenge for such a framework is again the problem of external metafictional sentences such as (4):

  • (4) Mickey Mouse is a pop culture icon.

The latter has the appearance of an atomic sentence and so should, implausibly, count as false on such a logic. In (2009) and (2011), Sainsbury uses the idea of presupposition- / acceptance-relative truth to deal with such problems, an idea that is related to ideas found in the popular pretense-theoretic approach to fictional names. That is the approach we turn to next.

2.1.4 Pretense Theory

For the antirealist, the semantics of names presents an important hurdle to attempts to accommodate the truth of internal and external metafictional sentences featuring fictional names. Such difficulties have suggested the need to look in a completely different direction. As we saw before, it is important to acknowledge the role of pretense in fictional talk and writing. A fictional sentence has a conniving use when it is uttered within the context of a certain pretense involving the telling of a story. Call such a context a fictional context. Note that a sentence considered as uttered in such a context does in a sense carry ontological commitments: it carries pretend ontological commitments. For within the context of the relevant pretense, the singular terms involved do refer to things. For instance, to utter (6) in the context of telling the Greek myth is to utter a sentence in which, from the perspective of the relevant pretense, the name “Apollo” refers to a god. Consequently, the sentence has fictional truth-conditions in that context (the sentence is true in the world of that context just if the entity referred to as “Apollo” in that context is young in that world) and has also a fictional truth-value (considered as uttered in that context, the sentence is true, for in the world of that context—the world of the Greek myth—there is a god, Apollo, who is indeed young). Outside that context, however—that is, in a real context where there is no pretense that the Greek myth is fact—a name like “Apollo” refers to nothing. No endorsement of descriptivism is here required. Quite simply, if the singular terms in question are directly referential (currently the most popular view of names), then a sentence containing a fictional proper name will have no real truth-conditions, hence no real truth-value, since any such term is really empty. Take the case of “Apollo”, which on this view has no referent when uttered in a real, non-fictional context of utterance. Assuming it is a directly referential term, it makes no truth-conditional contribution to sentences that contain it. Hence, when uttered in a real context (6) will have no truth-conditions, hence no truth-value. (The kernel of this proposal is in Walton 1990; see Recanati 2000 and Everett 2013 for refinements.)

So far, so good. Remember, however, that the intuition that a sentence like (6) is really, not just fictionally, true—hence, that it has real, not just fictional, truth-conditions—is a powerful one. How can a pretense antirealist account for this intuition?

As a first attempt, a pretense antirealist may try to combine the virtues of the pretense account with the virtues of the intensionalist approach. That is, she may first stick to the idea that on its non-conniving use a sentence like (6) has to be taken as elliptical for an internal metafictional sentence like (6I). But she may also insist that the “according to the story” operator should be taken as a context-shifting operator, not simply (like the familiar intensional operator “It is necessary that”) as a circumstance-shifting operator. That is, she may insist that it is an operator that shifts not only the circumstances of evaluation of the sentence it embeds, but also the context relevant for the interpretation of such sentence—typically, the context of its utterance. More precisely, if we take a fictional sentence “p” on its non-conniving use as elliptical for “According to the story S, p”, then “p” so understood is true in the actual world if and only if “p”, taken as uttered in the context of the story S (that is, a fictional context), is true in the world of that context.

The antirealist merits of this account are clear. It allows a proper name like “Apollo” to be both genuinely empty, carrying no commitment to any fictional entity, but also genuinely non-descriptive. The embedded sentence containing the name ((6), say) is understood as being uttered in a fictional context, and in that context the name directly refers to an individual, the individual existing in the world of the relevant pretense. Since this reference occurs only in that fictional context, not in a real context, the name really does remain empty. (This proposal can be traced back to Walton 1990; see also Adams et al. 1997.)

Despite these virtues, the suggestion faces a well-known criticism. Kaplan calls such context-shifting operators ‘monsters’, and claims that “none can be expressed in English (without sneaking in a quotation device)” (1989a: 511). In the case of indexicals, for example, “no operator can control … the indexicals within its scope, because they will simply leap out of its scope to the front of the operator” (1989a: 510). To see how this worry applies to a fictional sentence containing an indexical, consider the famous first line of Proust’s In Search of Lost Time:

  • (9) For a long time I used to go to bed early.

Within the fictional context mobilized by Proust’s telling his story, the first person pronoun “I” refers to the person narrating the events that constitute the imaginary world of Proust’s Recherche—an individual who exists only in that world, not the actual world. Now, suppose we want to capture the sense in which (9) is really true by reporting that the claim expressed by (9) is true according to In Search of Lost Time. On the above pretense-intensionalist approach, we might formulate this suggestion as:

  • (9PI) According to In Search of Lost Time, for a long time I used to go to bed early.

However, this equivalence clearly does not work. Assuming that you are the person who utters (9PI), the sentence says that you used to go to bed early for a long time in the imaginary world of Proust’s Recherche. But this is false, since you are not an inhabitant of this world.

It may be possible to obviate Kaplan’s problem in some way, for instance by claiming that the context-shift affects the whole sentence, not just the embedded one (Recanati 2000); but then one has to show how such sentences may nonetheless have real truth-conditions, and not merely fictional ones. Or the problem may turn out to be restricted to the case of embedded indexicals, or even certain types of indexicals. Predelli, for example, has argued that there are examples of discourse about fiction using modal and temporal indexicals that are best analyzed in terms of such context-shifting Kaplanesque ‘monsters’ (Predelli 2008).

Be that as it may, one might try to simplify the pretense-theoretical proposal by reversing the order of explanation. Rather than taking the fictional sentence on its non-conniving use as elliptical for an internal metafictional sentence, we might take the internal metafictional sentence to be really true just when the fictional sentence (on its non-conniving use) is really true. We might, that is, follow Walton in treating the fictional sentence as “primary”; cf. 1990: 401–2). It is in fact relatively easy to discern the sense in which the fictional sentence on its non-conniving use is really true. It is really true just in case there is a pretense of a certain kind relative to which the sentence on its conniving use is fictionally true. In short, the fictional sentence is really true on its non-conniving use if and only if it is fictionally true (for this formulation, see Crimmins 1998: 2–8). (Walton’s 1990 own formulation of the point is weaker, for it gives the proposal a pragmatic twist: by being fictionally true, a sentence may be taken to assert, or to convey, a real truth. See also Everett 2013.)

One advantage of such an antirealist move is that it can be used for both fictional sentences and external metafictional sentences. For Walton, what distinguishes the two cases is simply the kind of pretense that makes the relevant sentence fictionally true. In the former case, the game of make-believe that the relevant fictional context singles out is an authorized one; that is, it is a game authorized by what serves as a prop in that game (in the case of a literary game of make-believe, the text written or narrated by the storyteller); the prop dictates how things go in the world of that game. In the latter case, the relevant game of make-believe is an unofficial, albeit standard, one (1990: 417); in this case, there may be no constraints—none, at least, provided by the prop—that dictate how things stand in the world of that game (cf. Walton 1990: 51, 406, 409).

Take (6) again. In order for (6) to be fictionally true, and hence for it to be really true on its non-conniving use, the world of the Greek myth must contain a god (Apollo) who is young. This is a consequence of the fact that this is the way the myth is told. The myth-telling functions as a prop constraining how the “Apollo” game of make-believe has to be played; a person who makes believe that Apollo is a rock-star is not playing the game correctly, or is perhaps playing another game. But now consider (4). In order for an utterance of (4) to be fictionally true, hence for it to be really true on its non-conniving use, it must allude to a game in which there is a fictional character named “Mickey Mouse” who has the special property of being a pop culture icon—a ‘Meinongian’ pretense, as Recanati (2000) calls it. Now, such a game is not constrained by any text; there is no Mickey Mouse story that describes Mickey Mouse in these terms. The game in question is instead one where facts about the important place occupied in popular culture by the Mickey Mouse stories are what make it fictionally true in the game that Mickey Mouse has the special property of being a pop culture icon. To that extent the game is an unofficial one.

On this account, then, external metafictional sentences enjoy no special status; in particular, they don’t provide us with a reason for assuming the existence of fictional entities. Our final example returns us to Pirandello’s Six Characters in Search of an Author. Consider an utterance of:

  • (10) The Father is a fictional character.

On the one hand, this is an external metafictional sentence of the very same kind as (5), a sentence that the speaker uses to describe the metaphysical status of one of the protagonists of Pirandello’s work. On the other hand, (10) may also be taken as a fictional sentence, since Pirandello’s play is characterized by the fact that its protagonists are not ordinary concrete individuals but fictional characters. In such a case, the sentence has two distinct non-conniving uses. On its use as a fictional sentence it is allegedly equivalent to:

  • (10′) According to Six Characters in Search of an Author, the Father is a fictional character.

In this case, (10) is really true in so far as it is fictionally true relative to a game authorized by the work Six Characters in Search of an Author. In the other case, it is really true in so far as it is fictionally true relative to an unofficial game in which some entities count as ‘real people’ and some as ‘fictional characters’, with the Father correctly singled out as one of the latter because ‘he’ originated in a work of fiction.

Walton’s pretense-based version of antirealism has been very influential (for a development of the view, see Everett 2013), but it has also attracted a great deal of criticism. Some have doubted that a sentence’s fictional truth on its conniving use can ground a sense in which it is really true on its non-conniving use (cf. Voltolini 2006), a move that is crucial to his antirealism. Others have doubted that Walton’s appeal to unofficial games of make-believe can yield appropriate antirealist paraphrases for metafictional sentences in general, perhaps because these critics deny that such sentences involve either explicit or implicit appeals to pretense (Thomasson 1999, van Inwagen 2003).

2.1.5 Quantificational arguments for realism

Of course, to show that some antirealist paraphrases of fictional sentences do not work does not mean that no such paraphrases will work. Perhaps it is always possible to find new paraphrases that do not raise any of the problems hitherto pointed out, whether such paraphrases are based on a new version of the pretense-theoretic approach or on some other approach. To take this point into account, some realists have pursued a different linguistically-based strategy. To be, as Quine said, is to be the value of a variable (Quine 1948). Hence if we can locate existentially quantified discourse involving quantification over fictional entities—either directly, as external metafictional sentences that can themselves be used as premises to derive other metafictional sentences, or indirectly, as a result of a valid inference from external metafictional sentences—then it seems that such ontological commitment is unavoidable. In this connection, consider the sentence:

  • (11) There is a fictional character who, for every novel, either appears in that novel or is a model for a character who does.

Not only can such a sentence be inferred from, say:

  • (12) Sancho Panza is a model for at least one character in every novel, apart from the novel Don Quixote, in which he himself appears,

but it also legitimizes an inference to:

  • (13) If no character appears in every novel, then some character is modelled on another character

(cf. van Inwagen 2000: 243–4).

Now, it is certainly true that insisting on the need to preserve the validity of the above inferences in any account of external metafictional sentences is a good antidote to the antirealist ‘paraphrase’ strategy. For there is no guarantee that validity is preserved once the above sentences are paraphrased (say, in a pretense-theoretic manner à la Walton). This suggests that such antirealist paraphrases may not capture the meaning of the original sentences, leaving the field to realist construals of such sentences (cf. again van Inwagen (ibid.); for Walton’s response, see Walton 1990: 416ff.).

Still, this may not be enough to show that antirealism should be rejected. For while existential sentences like (11) that quantify over fictional characters are common enough, there are other existential claims with the same logical features as (11) that philosophers are far less likely to take as evidence of realism. Thus consider:

  • (14) While there is an imaginary emperor who Nathan Salmon imagined took over France, there certainly is no imaginary emperor who Nathan Salmon imagined took over Canada.

This sentence is suggested by Nathan Salmon’s account of allegedly empty names in Salmon 1998. Salmon suggests that while fictional names in general stand for abstract created fictional entities, certain other terms are thoroughly non-referring or empty. In this connection, he contemplates the possibility of there being an armed fanatic who has just taken over the government of France by declaring himself emperor, and then stipulates that the name “Nappy” is to refer to whoever is the present emperor of France if there is such a person (as there would be if this imaginative scenario were actual), and to nothing if there isn’t. Such a name, he thinks, is clearly empty. Note, however, that in Salmon’s imaginative scenario,

  • (15) Nappy is a French emperor

is true, but that there is no similar scenario involving a present emperor of Canada. A sentence like (14) is a natural way of recording this fact. But now we face a problem. As Caplan (2004) points out, taking (11) as an evidence for the genuine existence of what van Inwagen calls creatures of fiction suggests that we should, by parity of reasoning, take (14) as evidence for the genuine existence of sui generis creatures of the imagination. Or, to put the point the other way round, if we don’t think that linguistically-based reasons such as the availability of an (apparently) true quantified sentence like (14) commit us to bizarre entities like Nappy, we should not think that such reasons commit us to fictional entities either. For variants of the problem and complications, see Kroon (2011, 2013, 2015).

Note that we do not even need quantificational locutions to see the problem. If one thinks that the truth of the external metafictional sentence (5) commits us to the existence of a fictional character, Anna Karenina, then it is hard to resist the thought that the truth of the non-quantified sentence:

  • (16) That little green man is just a trick of the light

uttered by someone who wants to describe the mistake made by those around him who think that they see a little green man, similarly commits us to the existence of a certain creature of the imagination, one who has the property of being a trick of the light (cf. Kroon 1996: 186). Many would resist such an easy road to realism about creatures of the imagination.

2.2 Ontological Arguments for and Against Realism

The problems that one thus encounters in trying to let semantic-linguistic arguments ground a commitment to fictional objects give one reason to think that there is no semantical shortcut available to the realist. That is to say, if a realist wants to claim that our prima facie commitment to fictional entities is justified, she has to provide a genuine ontological argument to that effect.

In her 1999 book, Thomasson tried to provide just such an argument. Her argument claims that we cannot reject fictional objects if we admit fictional works: given that fictional objects and fictional works belong to the same genus of entities (the genus of created, artifactual objects) it would be false parsimony to accept the one and reject the other.

This argument has several problems. For one thing, it postulates an identity of kind between fictional works and fictional entities that is far from intuitively clear. As Thomasson herself seems to admit (1999: 65), fictional works are syntactical-semantic entities, unlike fictional entities. But there is a similar argument that does not rely on a parallelism between fictional works and fictional characters, but on the fact that the identity conditions of the fictional works refer to fictional characters. In brief: if we admit a certain kind of entity, we cannot but admit all the other kinds of entities that figure in the identity conditions of such an entity; we admit fictional works; so we cannot but also admit fictional objects because they figure in the identity conditions of fictional works (cf. Voltolini 2003, 2006).

If the antirealist wants to challenge the realist on directly ontological grounds, she has to discredit such arguments, and, better still, provide an argument for the conclusion that there cannot be any fictional entities. Curiously enough, Russell, who is usually remembered for having originated the ‘paraphrase’ strategy for eliminating apparent reference to nonexistent entities (see 2.11 above), also used non-linguistically-based ontological arguments against admitting such entities. In fact, there is good reason to believe that he took his main argument against Meinong to be that Meinongian entities are apt to violate the law of noncontradiction (cf. Russell (1905a,b)). In his (2005) and (2013), Everett reprises and extends Russell’s ontological criticisms so that they become a critique of fictional entities in particular. He provides a number of arguments that are intended to show that, first, such entities may violate some basic logical laws—not only the law of noncontradiction, but also the symmetry of identity—and, second, they may be problematically indeterminate with respect to both their existence and identity. These arguments are based on odd but intelligible stories in which, for example, one individual is both identical to and distinct from another, or in which it is indeterminate whether a certain individual exists. The link to fictional characters is provided through certain bridging principles (more refined versions of such principles are provided in his 2013):

(P1) If the world of a story concerns a creature a, and if a is not a real thing, then a is a fictional character.

(P2) If a story concerns a and b, and if a and b are not real things, then a and b are identical in the world of the story if and only if the fictional character of a is identical to the fictional character of b.

Everett’s critique is interesting and innovative, and (given the worries expressed about language-focused arguments) in some ways a model of how an antirealist should really pursue the battle against what she believes are ontological illusions. But, not surprisingly, the debate has not ended there. Although at least one influential (erstwhile) realist has conceded the power of Everett’s argument, proposing an antirealist notion of assumption-relative truth (Howell 2011, 2015) in place of the realist absolute notion he championed earlier (Howell 1979), some other realists think that Everett underestimates the conceptual resources available to them.

Take, for example, the case that seems to have exercised creationists the most — the argument for indeterminate identity — and consider an example like the following made-up nursery rhyme (from Schnieder & von Solodkoff 2009: 139):


There once was a man called Bahrooh

There once was a man called Bahraah

But nothing determined if Bahraah was Bahrooh

Or if they were actually two.

Given that “Bahraah” and “Bahrooh” are fictional names, it follows from (P1) and (P2) that it is indeterminate whether the fictional character Bahrooh is identical to the fictional character Bahraah, contrary to philosophical consensus that indeterminate identity is incoherent (see especially Evans 1980 and the ensuing literature).

Philosophers of fiction have not been slow to respond to this argument. Few have been willing to accept fiction-generated ontic indeterminacy (Thomasson 2011 and Paganini 2023 are among the exceptions). Schnieder & von Solodkoff (2009) suggest that (P2) itself is to blame, and that there is a better default principle of identity that lets story-relative ontic indeterminacy suffice for determinate ontic distinctness. Such a variation on (P2) would block Bah-Tale from implying ontic indeterminacy, although some, siding with Everett, think the variation is ad hoc (Caplan & Muller 2014). Others challenge the role played by principles of identity. Lee (2022), for example, argues that the identity of fictional characters is (usually) to be settled by appeal to authorial intentions rather than principles of identity, and that this is enough to disarm alleged examples of ontic determinacy. But even if we stress the importance of principles of identity, what such principles show may not be all that clear. One popular line of argument holds that Everett-style cases only generate semantic, not ontic, indeterminacy (Thomasson 2011, Cameron 2013, Woodward 2017). Some even think that an appeal to more or less familiar neo-Meinongian distinctions between i) predicative and propositional negation and ii) modes of predication (alternatively, kinds of property) is enough to block the inference to ontic indeterminacy (Voltolini 2010). Of course, antirealists take such distinctions to be poorly understood and part of what makes realism an unattractive option in the first place (they may also be unusable in complex fiction-involving sentences; see again Everett 2013; for a reply, cf. Voltolini 2015b)). Hence even if such rebuttals are successful on their own terms, this is not likely to settle the realism-antirealism debate.


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Many thanks to Gideon Rosen for useful comments on an earlier draft of this entry and to Luke Manning for his remarks on the previous version of this entry. We are especially grateful to Paul Oppenheimer for his unstinting help and support.

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