Freedom of Speech

First published Fri Nov 29, 2002; substantive revision Mon May 1, 2017

This entry explores the topic of free speech. It starts with a general discussion of freedom in relation to speech and then moves on to examine one of the first and best defenses of free speech, based on the harm principle. This provides a useful starting point for further digressions on the subject. The discussion moves on from the harm principle to assess the argument that speech can be limited because it causes offense rather than direct harm. I then examine arguments that suggest speech can be limited for reasons of democratic equality. I finish with an examination of paternalistic and moralistic reasons against protecting speech, and a reassessment of the harm principle.

1. Introduction: Boundaries of the Debate

The topic of free speech is one of the most contentious issues in liberal societies. If liberty of expression is not highly valued, as has often been the case, there is no problem; freedom of expression is simply curtailed in favor of other values. It becomes a volatile issue when it is highly valued because only then do the limitations placed upon it become controversial. The first thing to note in any sensible discussion of freedom of speech is that it will have to be limited. Every society places some limits on the exercise of speech because it always takes place within a context of competing values. In this sense, Stanley Fish is correct when he says that there is no such thing as free speech (in the sense of unlimited speech). Free speech is simply a useful term to focus our attention on a particular form of human interaction and the phrase is not meant to suggest that speech should never be limited. One does not have to fully agree with Fish when he says , “free speech in short, is not an independent value but a political prize” (1994,102) but it is the case that no society has existed where speech has not been limited to some extent. Haworth (1998) makes a similar point when he suggests that a right to freedom of speech is not something we have, not something we own, in the same way as we possess arms and legs.

Alexander and Horton (1984) agree. They note that “speech” encapsulates many different activities: speaking, writing, singing, acting, burning flags, yelling on the street corner, advertising, threats, slander and so on. One reason for thinking that speech is not special simpiciter is that some of these forms of communication are more important than others and hence require different levels of protection. For example, the freedom to criticize a government is generally thought to be more important than the freedom of an artist to offend her audience. If two speech acts clash (when yelling prevents a political speech) a decision has to be made to prioritize one over the other, which means that there can be no unlimited right to free speech. For example, Alexander and Horton (1984) claim that arguments defending speech on democratic grounds have many parts. One is a claim that the public needs a great deal of information in order to make informed decisions. Another is that because government is the servant of the people, it should not be allowed to censor them. Such arguments show that one of the main reasons for justifying free speech (political speech) is important, not for its own sake but because it allows us to exercise another important value (democracy). Whatever reasons we offer to protect speech can also be used to show why some speech is not special. If speech is defended because it promotes autonomy, we no longer have grounds for protecting speech acts that undermine this value. If our defence of speech is that it is crucial to a well-functioning democracy, we have no reason to defend speech that is irrelevant to, or undermines, this goal. And if we agree with John Stuart Mill (1978) that speech should be protected because it leads to the truth, there seems no reason to protect the speech of anti-vaccers or creationists.

Speech is important because we are socially situated and it makes little sense to say that Robinson Crusoe has a right to free speech. It only becomes necessary to talk of such a right within a social setting, and appeals to an abstract and absolute right to free speech hinder rather than help the debate. At a minimum, speech will have to be limited for the sake of order. If we all speak at once, we end up with an incoherent noise. Without some rules and procedures we cannot have a conversation at all and consequently speech has to be limited by protocols of basic civility.

It is true that many human rights documents give a prominent place to the right to speech and conscience, but such documents also place limits on what can be said because of the harm and offense that unlimited speech can cause, (I will discuss this in more detail later). Outside of the United States of America speech does not tend to have a specially protected status and it has to compete with other rights claims for our allegiance. John Stuart Mill, one of the great defenders of free speech, summarized these points in On Liberty, where he suggests that a struggle always takes place between the competing demands of authority and liberty. He claimed that we cannot have the latter without the former:

All that makes existence valuable to anyone depends on the enforcement of restraints upon the actions of other people. Some rules of conduct, therefore, must be imposed—by law in the first place, and by opinion on many things which are not fit subjects for the operation of law. (1978, 5)

The task, therefore, is not to argue for an unlimited domain of free speech; such a concept cannot be defended. Instead, we need to decide how much value we place on speech in relation to other important ideals such as privacy, security, democratic equality and the prevention of harm and there is nothing inherent to speech that suggests it must always win out in competition with these values. Speech is part of a package deal of social goods: “speech, in short, is never a value in and of itself but is always produced within the precincts of some assumed conception of the good” (Fish, 1994, 104). In this essay, I will examine some conceptions of the good that are deemed to be acceptable limitations on speech. I will start with the harm principle and then move on to other more encompassing arguments for limiting speech.

Before we do this, however, the reader might wish to disagree with the above claims and warn of the dangers of the “slippery slope.” As Frederick Schauer (1985) has demonstrated, slippery slope arguments make the claim that a current acceptable change (he calls this the instant case) to the status quo regarding speech will lead to some intolerable future state of affairs (what he calls the danger case) once the instant case prohibiting speech is introduced. The assumption is that the instant case is acceptable; otherwise it would be critiqued in its own right. The complaint is that a change from the status quo to the instant case will lead to unwanted future limitations on speech and should be avoided (even if a change to the instant case would be immediately desirable). The slippery slope argument has to make a clear distinction between the instant and the danger case. If the former was part of the latter then it is not a slippery slope argument but simply an assertion about the unwarranted breadth of the instant case. The claim being made is that a change to an acceptable instant case that is distinct from the danger case should nevertheless be prohibited because a change from the status quo to the instant case will necessarily transport us to the danger case.

As Schuer says this is not very compelling because it needs to be demonstrated, rather than merely stated, that the move from the status quo is so much more likely to lead to the danger case. Part of the problem is that slippery slope arguments are often presented in a way that suggests we can be on or off the slope. In fact, no such choice exists: we are necessarily on the slope whether we like it or not, and the task is always to decide how far up or down we choose to go, not whether we should step off the slope altogether. We need to keep in mind that the slippery-slope claim is not that the proposed instant case will lead to minor changes in the future, but that a small change now will have drastic and tyrannical consequences. The slippery-slope argument seems to suggest that the instant case is so flawed that any change to it from the status quo (which again, is a position already on the slope) puts us in imminent threat of sliding into the danger case. Unfortunately, the causal mechanisms for how this must necessarily happen are usually unspecified. Anyone making such claims should be willing to demonstrate how this unlikely event will happen before being taken seriously. Such a person is not simply advocating caution; she is claiming that there is an imminent risk of moving from an acceptable instant case to an unacceptable danger case. This is not to say that slippage cannot occur. One safeguard against this is to be as precise as possible in our use of language. If harm to others is our preferred stopping point on the slope, we need to specify in clear terms what counts as harm and what does not. Sometimes we will fail in this task, but precision puts brakes on the instant case and limits its capacity for sliding down the slope.

Those who support the slippery slope argument tend to make the claim that the inevitable consequence of limiting speech is a slide into censorship and tyranny. It is worth noting, however, that the slippery slope argument can be used to make the opposite point; one could argue that we should not allow any removal of government interventions (on speech or any other type of freedom) because once we do we are on the slippery slope to anarchy, the state of nature, and a life that Hobbes described in Leviathan as “solitary, poore, nasty, brutish, and short” (1968, 186).

It is possible that some limits on speech might, over time, lead to further restrictions—but they might not. And if they do, those limitations might also be justified. The main point is that once we abandon the incoherent position that there should be no limits on speech, we have to make controversial decisions about what can and cannot be expressed; this comes along with the territory of living together in communities.

Another thing to note before we engage with specific arguments for limiting speech is that we are in fact free to speak as we like. Hence, freedom of speech differs from some other types of free action. If the government wants to prevent citizens engaging in certain actions, riding motor bikes for example, it can limit their freedom to do so by making sure that such vehicles are no longer available; current bikes could be destroyed and a ban can be placed on future imports. Freedom of speech is a different case. A government can limit some forms of free expression by banning books, plays, films etc. but it cannot make it impossible to say certain things. The only thing it can do is punish people after they have spoken. This means that we are free to speak in a way that we are not free to ride outlawed motorbikes. This is an important point; if we insist that legal prohibitions remove freedom then we have to hold the incoherent position that a person was unfree at the very moment she performed a speech act. The government would have to remove our vocal cords for us to be unfree in the same way as the motorcyclist is unfree.

A more persuasive analysis suggests that the threat of a sanction makes it more difficult and potentially more costly to exercise our freedom of speech. Such sanctions take two major forms. The first, and most serious, is legal punishment by the state, which usually consists of a financial penalty, but can stretch to imprisonment (which then, of course, further restricts the persons free speech). The second threat of sanction comes from social disapprobation. People will often refrain from making public statements because they fear the ridicule and moral outrage of others. For example, one could expect to be publicly condemned if one made racist comments during a public lecture at a university. Usually it is the first type of sanction that catches our attention but, as we will see, John Stuart Mill provides a strong warning about the chilling effect of the latter form of social control.

We seem to have reached a paradoxical position. I started by claiming that there can be no such thing as a pure form of free speech: now I seem to be arguing that we are, in fact, free to say anything we like. The paradox is resolved by thinking of free speech in the following terms. I am, indeed, free to say (but not necessarily to publish) what I like, but the state and other individuals can sometimes make that freedom more or less costly to exercise. This leads to the conclusion that we can attempt to regulate speech, but we cannot prevent it if a person is undeterred by the threat of sanction. The issue, therefore, boils down to assessing how cumbersome we wish to make it for people to say certain things. I have already suggested that all societies do (correctly) make some speech more costly than others. If the reader doubts this, it might be worth considering what life would be like with no sanctions on libelous statements, child pornography, advertising content, and releasing state secrets. The list could go on.

The conclusion to be drawn is that the problem we face is deciding where, not whether, to place limits on speech, and the next sections look at some possible solutions to this puzzle.

2. The Harm Principle and Free Speech

2.1 John Stuart Mill's Harm Principle

Given that Mill presented one of the first, and still perhaps the most famous liberal defense of free speech, I will focus on his arguments in this essay and use them as a springboard for a more general discussion of free expression. In the footnote at the beginning of Chapter II of On Liberty, Mill makes a very bold statement:

If the arguments of the present chapter are of any validity, there ought to exist the fullest liberty of professing and discussing, as a matter of ethical conviction, any doctrine, however immoral it may be considered. (1978, 15)

This is a very strong defense of free speech; Mill tells us that any doctrine should be allowed the light of day no matter how immoral it may seem to everyone else. And Mill does mean everyone:

If all mankind minus one were of one opinion, and only one person were of the contrary opinion, mankind would be no more justified in silencing that one person than he, if he had the power, would be justified in silencing mankind. (1978, 16)

Such liberty should exist with every subject matter so that we have “absolute freedom of opinion and sentiment on all subjects, practical or speculative, scientific, moral or theological” (1978, 11). Mill claims that the fullest liberty of expression is required to push our arguments to their logical limits, rather than the limits of social embarrassment. Such liberty of expression is necessary, he suggests, for the dignity of persons. If liberty of expression is stifled, the price paid is “a sort of intellectual pacification” that sacrifices “ the entire moral courage of the human mind” (1978, 31).

These are powerful claims for freedom of speech, but as I noted above, Mill also suggests that we need some rules of conduct to regulate the actions of members of a political community. The limitation he places on free expression is “one very simple principle” (1978, 9), now usually referred to as the harm principle, which states that

…the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. (1978, 9)

There is a great deal of debate about what Mill had in mind when he referred to harm; for the purposes of this essay he will be taken to mean that an action has to directly and in the first instance invade the rights of a person (Mill himself uses the term rights, despite basing the arguments in the book on the principle of utility). The limits on free speech will be very narrow because it is difficult to support the claim that most speech causes harm to the rights of others. This is the position staked out by Mill in the first two chapters of On Liberty and it is a good starting point for a discussion of free speech because it is hard to imagine a more liberal position. Liberals are usually willing to contemplate limiting speech once it can be demonstrated that it does invade the rights of others.

If we accept Mill's argument we need to ask “what types of speech, if any, cause harm?” Once we can answer this question, we have found the appropriate limits to free expression. The example Mill uses is in reference to corn dealers: he suggests that it is acceptable to claim that corn dealers starve the poor if such a view is expressed in print. It is not acceptable to make such statements to an angry mob, ready to explode, that has gathered outside the house of the corn dealer. The difference between the two is that the latter is an expression “such as to constitute…a positive instigation to some mischievous act,” (1978, 53), namely, to place the rights, and possibly the life, of the corn dealer in danger. As Daniel Jacobson (2000) notes, it is important to remember that Mill will not sanction limits to free speech simply because someone is harmed. For example, the corn dealer may suffer severe financial hardship if he is accused of starving the poor. Mill distinguishes between legitimate and illegitimate harm, and it is only when speech causes a direct and clear violation of rights that it can be limited. The fact that Mill does not count accusations of starving the poor as causing illegitimate harm to the rights of corn dealers suggests he wished to apply the harm principle sparingly. Other examples where the harm principle may apply include libel laws, blackmail, advertising blatant untruths about commercial products, advertising dangerous products to children (e.g. cigarettes), and securing truth in contracts. In most of these cases, it is possible to show that harm can be caused and that rights can be violated.

2.2 Mill's Harm Principle and Pornography

There are other instances when the harm principle has been invoked but where it is more difficult to demonstrate that rights have been violated. Perhaps the most obvious example is the debate over pornography. As Feinberg notes in Offense to Others: the Moral Limits of the Criminal Law, most attacks on pornography up to the 1970s were from social conservatives who found such material to be immoral and obscene. This type of argument has died away in recent times and the case against pornography has been taken up by some feminists who often distinguish between erotica, which is acceptable, and pornography, which is not, because it is claimed it degrades, harms, and endangers the lives of women. The harm principle can be invoked against pornography if it can be demonstrated that it violates the rights of women.

This is an approach taken by Catherine MacKinnon (1987). She takes seriously the distinction between pornography and erotica. Erotica might be explicit and create sexual arousal, but neither is grounds for complaint. Pornography would not come under attack if it did the same thing as erotica; the complaint is that it portrays women in a manner that harms them.

When pornography involves young children, most people accept that it should be prohibited because it harms persons under the age of consent (although the principle would not necessarily rule out people over the age of consent from portraying minors). It has proved more difficult to make the same claim for consenting adults. It is difficult to know if the people who appear in books, magazines, films, videos and on the internet are being physically harmed. If they are we then need to show why this is sufficiently different from other forms of harmful employment that is not prohibited, such as hard manual labour, or very dangerous jobs. Much of the work in pornography seems to be demeaning and unpleasant but the same can be said for many forms of work and again it is unclear why the harm principle can be used to single out pornography. MacKinnon's (1987) claim that women who make a living through pornography are sexual slaves seems to exaggerate the case. If conditions in the pornography industry are particularly bad, stronger regulation rather than prohibition might be a better option, particularly as the latter will not make the industry go away.

It is also difficult to demonstrate that pornography results in harm to women as a whole. Very few people would deny that violence against women is abhorrent and an all too common feature of our society, but how much of this is caused by pornography? MacKinnon, Andrea Dworkin, (1981) and many others, have attempted to show a causal link but this has proven challenging because one needs to show that a person who would not rape, batter or otherwise violate the rights of women was caused to do so through exposure to pornography. Caroline West provides a useful overview of the literature and suggests that even though pornography might not dispose most men to rape, it might make it more likely for those men who are already so inclined. She uses the analogy of smoking. We have good grounds for saying that smoking makes cancer more likely even though smoking is neither a necessary nor sufficient condition for causing cancer. One possible problem with this analogy is that we have very powerful evidence that smoking does significantly increase the possibility of cancer; the evidence suggesting that viewing pornography leads men (already inclined) to rape women is not as robust.

If pornographers were exhorting their readers to commit violence and rape, the case for prohibition would be much stronger, but they tend not to do this, just as films that depict murder do not actively incite the audience to mimic what they see on the screen. For the sake of argument let us grant that the consumption of pornography does lead some men to commit acts of violence. Such a concession might not prove to be decisive. The harm principle might be a necessary, but it is not a sufficient reason for censorship. If pornography causes a small percentage of men to act violently we still need an argument for why the liberty of all consumers of pornography (men and women) has to be curtailed because of the violent actions of a few. We have overwhelming evidence that consuming alcohol causes a lot of violence (against women and men) but this does not mean that alcohol should be prohibited. Very few people reach this conclusion despite the clarity of the evidence. Further questions need to be answered before a ban is justified. How many people are harmed? What is the frequency of the harm? How strong is the evidence that A is causing B? Would prohibition limit the harm and if so, by how much? Would censorship cause problems greater than the harm it is meant to negate? Can the harmful effects be prevented by measures other than prohibition?

There are other non-physical harms that also have to be taken into consideration. MacKinnon argues that pornography causes harm because it exploits, oppresses, subordinates and undermines the civil rights of women, including their right to free speech. A permissive policy on pornography has the effect of prioritizing the right to speech of pornographers over the right to speech of women. MacKinnon's claim is that pornography silences women because it presents them as inferior beings and sex objects who are not to be taken seriously. Even if pornography does not cause violence, it still leads to discrimination, domination and rights violations. She also suggests that because pornography offers a misleading and derogatory view of women, it is libelous. Along with Andrea Dworkin, MacKinnon drafted a Minneapolis Council Ordinance in 1983 that allowed women to take civil action against pornographers. They defined pornography as:

…the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women through pictures or words that also includes women dehumanized as sexual objects, things, or commodities; enjoying pain or humiliation or rape; being tied up, cut up, mutilated, bruised, or physically hurt; in postures of sexual submission or servility or display; reduced to body parts, penetrated by objects or animals, or presented in scenarios of degradation, injury, torture; shown as filthy or inferior; bleeding, bruised or hurt in a context which makes these conditions sexual (1987, 176).

Such arguments have so far not led to the prohibition of pornography (which was not the intent of the Ordinance) and many liberals remain unconvinced. One reason that some doubt MacKinnon's claims is that the last twenty years have seen an explosion of pornography on the internet without a concurrent erosion of women's rights. If those arguing that pornography causes harm are right, we should expect to see a large increase in physical abuse against women and a hefty decrease in their civil rights, employment in the professions, and positions in higher education. The evidence does not seem to show this and social conditions for women today are better than 30 years ago when pornography was less prevalent. What does seem to be reasonably clear, at least in the USA, is that the increased consumption of pornography over the last 20 years has coincided with a reduction in violent crime against women, including rape. If we return to West's smoking analogy, we would have to rethink our view that smoking causes cancer if a large increase in smokers did not translate into a comparable increase in lung cancer.

The matter remains unsettled, and the lives of women might be significantly better if pornography was not around, but so far it has proven difficult to justify limiting pornography by way of the harm principle. It is important to remember that we are currently examining this issue from the perspective of Mill's formulation of the harm principle and only speech that directly violates rights should be banned. Finding pornography offensive, obscene or outrageous is not sufficient grounds for censorship. Nor does Mill's principle allow prohibition because pornography harms the viewer. The harm principle is there to prevent other-regarding not self-regarding harm.

Overall, no one has mounted a compelling case (at least as far as legislators and judges are concerned) for banning pornography (except in the case of minors) based on the concept of harm formulated by Mill.

2.3 Mill's Harm Principle and Hate Speech

Another difficult case is hate speech. Most liberal democracies have limitations on hate speech, but it is debatable whether these can be justified by the harm principle as formulated by Mill. One would have to show that such speech violated rights, directly and in the first instance. I am interested here in hate speech that does not advocate violence against a group or individual because such speech would be captured by Mill's harm principle. The Public Order Act 1986 in the U.K. does not require such a stringent barrier as the harm principle to prohibit speech. The Act states that “A person is guilty of an offence if he ...displays any writing, sign or other visible representation which is threatening, abusive or insulting, within the hearing or sight of a person likely to be caused harassment, alarm or distress.”

There have been several prosecutions in the U.K. that would not have happened if the harm principle governed “absolutely the dealings of society with the individual”(Mill,1978, 68). In 2001 evangelist Harry Hammond was prosecuted for the following statements: “Jesus Gives Peace, Jesus is Alive, Stop Immorality, Stop Homosexuality, Stop Lesbianism, Jesus is Lord”. For his sins he was fined 300 pounds and made to pay 395 pounds in costs. In 2010, Harry Taylor left anti-religious cartoons in the prayer-room of Liverpool's John Lennon Airport. The airport chaplain was “insulted, offended, and alarmed” by the cartoons and called the police. Taylor was prosecuted and received a six-month suspended sentence. Barry Thew wore a t-shirt hours after two women police officers were murdered near Manchester in 2012. The front of the shirt had the slogan “One less pig, perfect justice,” and on the back was written “Kill a cop for fun”. He admitted a Section 4A Public Order Offence and was sentenced to 4 months jail. Also in 2012, Liam Stacey took to twitter to mock a black professional football player who collapsed during a match. He then proceeded to racially abuse people who responded negatively to his tweet. He was sentenced to 56 days in jail. This case provoked significant commentary, most of it taking the form of slippery-slope claims that the decision would inevitably lead to Britain becoming a totalitarian state. The most recent (June 2016) case to receive public attention involves Paul Gascoigne, the former English football star, who has been charged with racially aggravated abuse after commenting, whilst on stage, that he could only make out a black man standing in a dark corner of the room when he smiled. It is doubtful that any of these examples would be captured by Mill's harm principle.

In Australia, Section 18C of the Racial Discrimination Act 1975 states that “It is unlawful for a person to do an act, otherwise than in private, If: (a) the act is reasonably likely in all the circumstances to offend, insult, humiliate or intimidate another person or group of people, and (b) the act is done because of race, colour or national or ethnic origin”. The most prominent person prosecuted under the Act is Andrew Bolt, a conservative political commentator, who was found guilty of racially vilifying nine aboriginal persons in newspaper articles in 2011. He suggested that the nine people had identified as aboriginal, despite having fair skin, for their own professional advantage. The case prompted the Tony Abbott led Liberal government into a failed attempt to change the legislation.

It should be noted that Section 18C is qualified by Section 18D (often ignored in the backlash against the Bolt decision). 18D says that

…section 18C does not render unlawful anything said or done reasonably and in good faith: (a) in the performance, exhibition or distribution of an artistic work; or (b) in the course of any statement, publication, discussion or debate made or held for any genuine academic, artistic or scientific purpose or any other genuine purpose in the public interest; or (c) in the making or publishing: (i) a fair and accurate report of any event or matter of public interest; or (ii) a fair comment on any matter of public interest if the comment is an expression of a genuine belief held by the person making the comment…

It is clear that these qualifications remove some of the teeth from Section 18C. As long as the statements are made artistically and/or in good faith, for example, they are immune from prosecution. The conclusion of the judge in the Bolt case was that none of the Section 18D exemptions applied in his case. Even with these qualifications in place, however, it seems that the Racial Discrimination Act would still be ruled out by Mill's harm principle which seems to allow people to offend, insult, and humiliate (although perhaps not intimidate) regardless of the motivation of the speaker.

The United States, precisely because it fits most closely with Mill's principle, is an outlier amongst liberal democracies when it comes to hate speech. The most famous example of this is the Nazi march through Skokie, Illinois, something that would not be allowed in many other liberal democracies. The intention was not to engage in political speech at all, but simply to march through a predominantly Jewish community dressed in storm trooper uniforms and wearing swastikas (although the Illinois Supreme Court interpreted the wearing of swastikas as “symbolic political speech”). It is clear that many people, especially those who lived in Skokie, were outraged and offended by the march, but were they harmed? There was no plan to cause physical injury and the marchers did not intend to damage property.

The main argument for prohibiting the Skokie march, based on considerations of harm, was that the march would incite a riot, thus putting the marchers in danger. The problem with this argument is that the focal point is the potential harm to the speakers and not the harm done to those who are the subject of the hate. To ban speech for this reason, i.e., for the good of the speaker, tends to undermine the basic right to free speech in the first place. If we turn our attention to members of the local community, we might want to claim that they were psychologically harmed by the march. This is much more difficult to demonstrate than harm to a person's legal rights. It seems, therefore, that Mill's argument does not allow for state intervention in this case. If we base our defense of speech on Mill's principle we will have very few prohibitions. It is only when we can show direct harm to rights, which will almost always mean when an attack is made against a specific individual or a small group of persons, that it is legitimate to impose a sanction.

One response is to suggest that the harm principle can be defined less stringently. Jeremy Waldron (2012) has made a recent attempt to do this. He draws our attention to the visual impact of hate speech through posters and signs displayed in public. Waldron argues that the harm in hate speech (the title of his book) is that it compromises the dignity of those under attack. A society where such images proliferate makes life exceedingly difficult for those targeted by hate speech. Waldron suggests that the people engaged in hate speech are saying “[t]he time for your degradation and your exclusion by the society that presently shelters you is fast approaching” (2012, 96). He claims that prohibiting such messages assures all people that they are welcome members of the community.

Waldron does not want to use hate speech legislation to punish those who hold hateful thoughts and attitudes. The goal is not to engage in thought control but to prevent harm to the social standing of certain groups in society. Liberal democratic societies are founded on ideas of equality and dignity and these are damaged by hate speech. Given this, Waldron wonders why we even need to debate the usefulness of hate speech. Mill, for example, argued that we should allow speech of this type so that our ideas do not fall into the “slumber of a decided opinion” (1978, 41). Waldron doubts that we require hate speech to prevent such an outcome.

As we have seen, Waldron is making a harm based argument but his threshold for what counts as harm is lower than Mill’s. He needs to convince us that an attack on a person's dignity constitutes a significant harm. My dignity might often be bruised by colleagues, for example, but this does not necessarily show that I have been harmed. Perhaps it is only when an attack on dignity is equivalent to threats of physical abuse that it counts as a reason for limiting speech. Waldron does not offer a lot of evidence that a permissive attitude to hate speech, at least in liberal democracies, does cause significant harm. There is no specific hate speech regulation in the United States, for example, but it is not clear that more harm occurs there than in other liberal democracies.

David Boonin (2011) is not convinced that there is a need for special hate speech legislation. He claims that hate speech does not fit within the regular categories of speech that can be prohibited. Even if he can be persuaded that it does fit, he still thinks special hate speech laws are not required because existing legislation will capture the offending speech. I will examine one example he uses to make his point. Boonin argues that threatening speech already sits within the category of speech that is rightfully prohibited. He suggests, however, that hate speech does not fall within this category because a significant amount of hate speech is not directly threatening. A group of black men, for example, will not be threatened by a racially abusive elderly white woman. He argues that this example, and others like it, show why a blanket ban on all hate speech on the grounds that it is threatening cannot be justified.

Nor is it likely, he suggests, that racist attacks by frail old ladies will contribute to an atmosphere of danger. This argument might be less persuasive. Mill’s use of the corn dealer example demonstrates how the use of language can incite violence regardless of who is speaking. But Mill’s example also shows that a blanket ban would still be unwarranted because it allows incendiary statements to be made about corn dealers under controlled conditions.

Boonin’s argument does not rest here. If it really does turn out to be the case that all hate speech is threatening in the appropriate sense, this still does not justify special hate speech laws because there is already legislation in place prohibiting threatening language. Boonin is opposed to banning hate speech because it is hateful not because it is threatening. He claims that the argument for special hate speech laws is “impaled on the horns of a dilemma: either the appeal is unconvincing because not all forms of hate speech are threatening, or it is unnecessary precisely because all forms of hate speech are threatening and are therefore already prohibited” (2011, 213). Boonin uses the same strategy with regard to other reasons, such as “fighting words”, for banning hate speech; they all find themselves impaled on the horns of the same dilemma.

The arguments of Waldron and Boonin seem to be a long way apart and the latter suggests that anyone who argues for hate speech laws is taking an extreme position. There is, however, a lot of overlap between the two, particularly as both focus on harm, and neither wants to censor hate speech simply because it is offensive. This becomes clearer if we take a suggestion offered by Waldron. At one point in his book he ponders whether it might be advantageous to abandon the term “hate speech” altogether. Such a move goes a long way to reconciling the arguments of Waldron and Boonin. Both authors agree that prohibition is acceptable when speech is threatening; they disagree on what counts as a harmful threat. Waldron thinks most forms of racial abuse qualify whereas Boonin is more circumspect. But the disagreement between the two is about what causes harm rather than any major philosophical difference about the appropriate limits on speech. If both agree that a threat constitutes a significant harm, then both will support censorship. This still leaves lots of room for disagreement, particularly as we are now more aware than was Mill of psychological as well as physical harm. I cannot delve into the topic here except to say that if we expand the harm principle from the physical to the mental realm, more options might become available for prohibiting hate speech and pornography.

2.4 Responses to the Harm Principle

There are two basic responses to the harm principle. One is that it is too narrow; the other is that it is too broad. This latter view is not often expressed because, as already noted, most people think that free speech should be limited if it causes illegitimate harm. George Kateb (1996), however, has made an interesting argument that runs as follows. If we want to limit speech because it causes harm, we will have to ban a lot of political speech. Most of it is useless, a lot of it is offensive, and some of it causes harm because it is deceitful and aimed at discrediting specific groups. It also undermines democratic citizenship and stirs up nationalism and jingoism, which results in harm to citizens of other countries. Even worse than political speech, according to Kateb, is religious speech. He claims that a lot of religious speech is hateful, useless, dishonest, and foments war, bigotry and fundamentalism. It also creates bad self-image and feelings of guilt that can haunt persons throughout their lives. Pornography and hate speech, he claims, cause nowhere near as much harm as political and religious speech. As we rightly do not want to ban political and religious speech, Kateb claims to have demonstrated that the harm principle casts the net too far. His solution is to abandon the principle in favor of almost unlimited speech.

This is a powerful argument, but there seem to be at least two problems. The first is that the harm principle would actually allow religious and political speech for the same reasons that it allows most pornography and hate speech, namely that it is not possible to demonstrate that such speech does cause direct harm to rights. I doubt that Mill would support using his arguments about harm to ban political and religious speech. The second problem for Kateb is that if he is right that such speech does cause harm by violating rights, we now have powerful reasons for limiting political and religious speech. If Kateb's argument is sound he has shown that harm is more extensive than we might have thought; he has not demonstrated that the harm principle is invalid.

3. The Offense Principle and Free Speech

3.1 Joel Feinberg's Offense Principle

The other response to the harm principle is that it does not reach far enough. One of the most impressive arguments for this position comes from Joel Feinberg who suggests that the harm principle cannot shoulder all of the work necessary for a principle of free speech. In some instances, Feinberg suggests, we also need an offense principle that can guide public censure. The basic idea is that the harm principle sets the bar too high and that we can legitimately prohibit some forms of expression because they are very offensive. Offending is less serious than harming so any penalties imposed should not be severe. As Feinberg notes, this has not always been the case and he cites a number of instances in the U.S. where penalties for “offensive” acts like sodomy and consensual incest have ranged from twenty years imprisonment to the death penalty. Feinberg's principle reads as follows: “it is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it would probably be an effective way of preventing serious persons other than the actor, and that it is probably a necessary means to that end...The principle asserts, in effect, that the prevention of offensive conduct is properly the state's business” (1985, 1).

Such a principle is hard to apply because many people take offense as the result of an overly sensitive disposition, or worse, because of bigotry and unjustified prejudice. A further difficulty is that some people can be deeply offended by statements that others find mildly amusing. The furore over the Danish cartoons brings this starkly to the fore. Despite the difficulty of applying a standard of this kind, something like the offense principle operates widely in liberal democracies where citizens are penalized for a variety of activities, including speech, that would escape prosecution under the harm principle. Wandering around the local shopping mall naked, or engaging in sexual acts in public places are two obvious examples. Given the specific nature of this essay, I will not delve into the issue of offensive behavior in all its manifestations, and I will limit the discussion to offensive forms of speech. Feinberg suggests that many factors need to be taken into account when deciding whether speech can be limited by the offense principle. These include the extent, duration and social value of the speech, the ease with which it can be avoided, the motives of the speaker, the number of people offended, the intensity of the offense, and the general interest of the community.

3.2 Pornography and the Offense Principle

How does the offense principle help us deal with the issue of erotica? Given the above criteria, Feinberg argues that books should never be banned because the offensive material is easy to avoid. If one is unaware of the content and should become offended in the course of reading the text, the solution is simple-close the book. A similar argument would be applied to erotic films. The French film Baise-Moi was in essence banned in Australia in 2002 because of its supposed offensive material (it was denied a rating which meant that it could not be shown in cinemas). It would seem, however, that the offense principle outlined by Feinberg would not permit such prohibition because it is very easy to avoid being offended by the film. It should also be legal to advertise the film, but some limits could be placed on the content of the advertisement so that sexually explicit material is not placed on billboards in public places (because these are not easily avoidable). At first glance it might seem strange to have a more stringent speech code for advertisements than for the thing being advertised; the harm principle would not provide the grounds for such a distinction, but it is a logical conclusion of the offense principle.

What of pornography i.e. material that is offensive because of its extremely violent or degrading content? In this case the offense is more profound: simply knowing that such material exists is enough to deeply offend many people. The difficulty here is that bare knowledge, i.e., being offended by knowing that something exists or is taking place, is not as serious as being offended by something that one does not like and that one cannot escape. If we allow that films should be banned because some people are offended, even when they do not have to view them, consistency demands that we allow the possibility of prohibiting many forms of expression. A lot of people find strong attacks on religion, or t.v. shows by religious fundamentalists deeply offensive. Feinberg argues that even though some forms of pornography are profoundly offensive to many people, they should not be prohibited on these grounds.

3.3 Hate Speech and the Offense Principle

Hate speech causes profound offense. The discomfort caused to the targets of such attacks cannot be shrugged off easily. As with violent pornography, the offense that is caused by the march through Skokie cannot be avoided simply by staying off the streets because offense is taken over the bare knowledge that the march is taking place. As we have seen, however, bare knowledge does not seem sufficient grounds for prohibition. But in respect to some of the other factors regarding offensive speech mentioned above, Feinberg suggests that the march through Skokie does not do very well: the social value of the speech seems to be marginal, the number of people offended will be large, and it is difficult to see how it is in the interests of the community. These reasons also hold for violent pornography which Feinberg suggests should not be prohibited for reasons of offense.

A key difference, however, is the intensity of the offense; it is particularly acute with hate speech because it is aimed at a relatively small and specific audience. The motivations of the speakers in the Skokie example seemed to be to incite fear and hatred and to directly insult members of the community through the use of Nazi symbols. Nor, according to Feinberg, was there any political content to the speech. The distinction between violent pornography and the Skokie example of hate speech is that a particular group of people were targeted and the message of hate was paraded in such a way that it could not be easily avoided. It is for these reasons that Feinberg suggests hate speech can be limited by the offense principle.

He also claims that when fighting words are used to provoke people who are prevented by law from using a fighting response, the offense is profound enough to allow for prohibition. If pornographers engaged in the same behaviour and paraded through neighborhoods where they were likely to meet great resistance and cause profound offense, they too should be prevented from doing so. It is clear, therefore, that the crucial component of the offense principle is whether the offense can be avoided. Feinberg's principle means that many forms of hate speech will still be allowed if the offense is easily avoidable. It still allows Nazis to meet in private places, or even in public ones that are easily bypassed. Advertisements for such meetings can be edited (because they are less easy to avoid) but should not be banned. It seems Feinberg thinks that hate speech does not, in and of itself, cause direct harm to the rights of the targeted group (he is not claiming that offence equals harm) and he would be troubled by some of the prohibitions on speech in the U.K. and Australia.

4. Democracy and Free Speech

4.1 Democratic Citizenship and Pornography

Very few, if any, liberal democracies are willing to support the Millian view that only speech causing direct harm to rights should be prohibited. Most support some form of the offense principle. Some liberal philosophers are willing to extend the realm of state interference further and argue that hate speech should be banned even if it does not cause harm or unavoidable offense. The reason it should be banned is that it is inconsistent with the underlying values of liberal democracy to brand some citizens as inferior on the grounds of race, religion, gender or sexual orientation. The same applies to pornography; it should be prevented because it is incompatible with democratic citizenship to portray women as submissive sexual objects, who seem to enjoy being violently mistreated. Rae Langton, for example, starts from the liberal premise of equal concern and respect and concludes that it is justifiable to remove certain speech protections for pornographers. She avoids basing her argument on harm: “If, for example, there were conclusive evidence linking pornography to violence, one could simply justify a prohibitive strategy on the basis of the harm principle. However, the prohibitive arguments advanced in this article do not require empirical premises as strong as this…they rely instead on the notion of equality” (1990, 313).

Working within the framework of arguments supplied by Ronald Dworkin, who is opposed to prohibitive measures, she tries to demonstrate that egalitarian liberals such as Dworkin should support the prohibition of pornography. She suggests that we have “reason to be concerned about pornography, not because it is morally suspect, but because we care about equality and the rights of women” (1990, 311). Langton concludes that “women as a group have rights against the producers and consumers of pornography, and thereby have rights that are trumps against the policy of permitting pornography…the permissive policy is in conflict with the principle of equal concern and respect, and that women accordingly have rights against it” (1990, 346). Because she is not basing her argument on the harm principle, she does not have to show that women are harmed by pornography. For the argument to be persuasive, however, one has to accept that permitting pornography does mean that women are not treated with equal concern and respect. It also seems that the argument can be applied to non-pornagraphic material that portrays women in a demeaning way that undermines their status as equals.

4.2 Democratic Citizenship and Hate Speech

To argue the case above, one has to dilute one's support for freedom of expression in favor of other principles, such as equal respect for all citizens. This is a sensible approach according to Stanley Fish. He suggests that the task we face is not to arrive at hard and fast principles that prioritise all speech. Instead, we have to find a workable compromise that gives due weight to a variety of values. Supporters of this view will remind us that when we are discussing free speech, we are not dealing with it in isolation; what we are doing is comparing free speech with some other good. We have to decide whether it is better to place a higher value on speech than on the value of privacy, security, equality, or the prevention of harm.

Fish suggests we need to find a balance in which “we must consider in every case what is at stake and what are the risks and gains of alternative courses of action” (1994, 111). Is speech promoting or undermining our basic values? “If you don't ask this question, or some version of it, but just say that speech is speech and that's it, you are mystifying—presenting as an arbitrary and untheorized fiat—a policy that will seem whimsical or worse to those whose interests it harms or dismisses” (1994, 123).

The task is not to come up with principles that always favors expression, but rather, to decide what is good speech and what is bad speech. A good policy “will not assume that the only relevant sphere of action is the head and larynx of the individual speaker” (Fish, 1994, 126). Is it more in keeping with the values of a democratic society, in which every person is deemed equal, to allow or prohibit speech that singles out specific individuals and groups as less than equal? Fish's answer is that, “it depends. I am not saying that First Amendment principles are inherently bad (they are inherently nothing), only that they are not always the appropriate reference point for situations involving the production of speech” (1994, 113). But, all things considered, “I am persuaded that at the present moment, right now, the risk of not attending to hate speech is greater than the risk that by regulating it we will deprive ourselves of valuable voices and insights or slide down the slippery slope towards tyranny. This is a judgement for which I can offer reasons but no guarantees” (1994, 115).

These kinds of justification for prohibitions on hate speech suggest that the permissive approach undermines free speech properly understood. Even if hate speech or pornography does not cause harm (in Mill's sense) or offense, it has to be limited because it is incompatible with democracy iteslf. The argument from democracy contends that political speech is essential not only for the legitimacy of the regime, but for providing an environment where people can develop and exercise their goals, talents, and abilities. If hate speech and pornography curtail the development of such capacities in certain sections of the community, we have an argument, based on reasons used to justify free speech, for prohibition.

According to Fish, the boundaries of free speech cannot be set in stone by philosophical principles. It is the world of politics that decides what we can and cannot say guided, but not hidebound, by the world of abstract philosophy. Fish suggests that free speech is about political victories and defeats. The very guidelines for marking off protected from unprotected speech are the result of this battle rather than truths in their own right: “No such thing as free (nonideologically constrained) speech; no such thing as a public forum purged of ideological pressures of exclusion” (Fish, 1994, 116). Speech always takes place in an environment of convictions, assumptions, and perceptions i.e., within the confines of a structured world. The thing to do, according to Fish, is get out there and argue for one's position.

We should ask three questions according to Fish: “[g]iven that it is speech, what does it do, do we want it to be done, and is more to be gained or lost by moving to curtail it?” (1994, 127). He suggests that the answers we arrive at will vary according to the context. Free speech will be more limited in the military, where the underlying value is hierarchy and authority, than it will be at a university where one of the main values is the expression of ideas. Even on campus, there will be different levels of appropriate speech. Spouting off at the fountain in the centre of campus should be less regulated than what a professor can say during a lecture. It might well be acceptable for me to spend an hour of my time explaining to passers-by why Manchester United is a great football team but it would be completely inappropriate (and open to censure) to do the same thing when I am supposed to be giving a lecture on Thomas Hobbes. A campus is not simply a “free speech forum but a workplace where people have contractual obligations, assigned duties, pedagogical and administrative responsibilities” (1994,129). Almost all places in which we interact are governed by underlying values and speech will have to fit in with these ideals: “[r]egulation of free speech is a defining feature of everyday life” (Fish, 1994,129). Thinking of speech in this way removes a lot of its mystique. Whether we should ban hate speech is another problem, albeit more serious, similar to whether we should allow university professors to talk about football in lectures.

4.3 Paternalistic Justification for Limiting Speech

Although Stanley Fish takes some of the mystique away from the value of speech, he still thinks of limitations largely in terms of other- regarding consequences. There are arguments, however, that suggest speech can be limited to prevent harm being done to the speaker. The argument here is that the agent might not have a full grasp of the consequences of her actions(whether it be speech or some other form of behavior) and hence can be prevented from engaging in the act. Arguments used in the Skokie case would fit into this category and there is evidence to suggest that watching pornography can cause psychological damage the viewer . Most liberals are wary of such arguments because they take us into the realm of paternalistic intervention where it is assumed that the state knows better than the individual what is in his or her best interests.

Mill, for example, is an opponent of paternalism generally, but he does believe there are certain instances when intervention is warranted. He suggests that if a public official is certain that a bridge will collapse, he can prevent a person crossing. If, however, there is only a danger that it will collapse the public can be warned but not coerced from crossing. The decision here seems to depend on the likelihood of personal injury; the more certain injury becomes, the more legitimate the intervention. Prohibiting freedom of speech on these grounds is very questionable for liberals in all but extreme cases (it was not persuasive in the Skokie case) because it is very rare that speech would produce such a clear danger to the individual.

We have examined some of the options regarding limitations on free speech and one cannot be classed as a liberal if one is willing to stray much further into the arena of state intervention than already discussed. Liberals tend to be united in opposing paternalistic and moralistic justifications for limiting free expression. They hold a strong presumption in favor of individual liberty because, it is argued, this is the only way that the autonomy of the individual can be respected. Feinberg suggests that to prohibit speech for reasons other than those already mentioned means: “[i]t can be morally legitimate for the state, by means of the criminal law, to prohibit certain types of action that cause neither harm nor offense to any one, on the grounds that such actions constitute or cause evils of other kinds” (1985, 3). Acts can be “evil” if they are dangerous to a traditional way of life, because they are immoral, or because they hinder the perfectibility of the human race. Many arguments against pornography take the form that such material is wrong because of the moral harm it does to the consumer. Liberals oppose such views because they are not impressed by states trying to mold the moral character of citizens.

5. Back to the Harm Principle

We began this examination of free speech with the harm principle; let us end with it. The principle suggests that we need to distinguish between legal sanction and social disapprobation as means of limiting speech. As already noted, the latter does not ban speech but it makes it more uncomfortable to utter unpopular statements. Mill does not seem to support the imposition of legal penalties unless they are sanctioned by the harm principle. As one would expect, he also seems to be worried by the use of social pressure as a means of limiting speech. Chapter III of On Liberty is an incredible assault on social censorship, expressed through the tyranny of the majority, because he claims it produces stunted, pinched, hidebound and withered individuals: “everyone lives as under the eye of a hostile and dreaded censorship…[i]t does not occur to them to have any inclination except what is customary” (1978, 58). He continues:

the general tendency of things throughout the world is to render mediocrity the ascendant power among mankind…at present individuals are lost in the crowd…the only power deserving the name is that of masses…[i]t does seem, however, that when the opinions of masses of merely average men are everywhere become or becoming the dominant power, the counterpoise and corrective to that tendency would be the more and more pronounced individuality of those who stand on the higher eminences of thought. (1978, 63–4)

With these comments, and many others, Mill demonstrates his distaste of the apathetic, fickle, tedious, frightened and dangerous majority. It is quite a surprise, therefore, to find that he also seems to embrace a fairly encompassing offense principle when the sanction does involve social disapprobation:

Again, there are many acts which, being directly injurious only to the agents themselves, ought not to be legally interdicted, but which, if done publicly, are a violation of good manners and, coming thus within the category of offenses against others, may rightly be prohibited. (1978, 97 author's emphasis)

Similarly, he states that “The liberty of the individual must be thus far limited; he must not make himself a nuisance” (1978, 53). In the latter parts of On Liberty Mill also suggests that distasteful people can be held in contempt, that we can avoid them(as long as we do not parade it), that we can warn others about them, and that we can persuade, cajole and remonstrate with those we deem offensive. These actions are legitimate as the free expression of anyone who happens to be offended as long as they are done as a spontaneous response to the person's faults and not as a form of punishment.

But those who exhibit cruelty, malice, envy, insincerity, resentment and crass egoism are open to the greater sanction of disapprobation as a form of punishment, because these faults are wicked and other-regarding. It may be true that these faults have an impact on others, but it is difficult to see how acting according to malice,envy or resentment necessarily violates the rights of others. The only way that Mill can make such claims is to incorporate an offense principle and hence give up on the harm principle as the only legitimate grounds for interference with behavior. Overall, Mill's arguments about ostracism and disapprobation seem to provide little protection for the individual who may have spoken in a non-harmful manner but who has nevertheless offended the sensibilities of the masses.

Hence we see that one of the great defenders of the harm principle seems to shy away from it at certain crucial points; even Mill was unable to mount a defense of free speech on this “one simple principle” alone. It does, however, remain a crucial part of the liberal defense of individual freedom.

6. Conclusion

Liberals tend to justify freedom generally, and free speech in particular, for a variety of reasons. According to Mill, free speech fosters authenticity, genius, creativity, individuality and human flourishing. He tells us that if we ban speech the silenced opinion may be true, or contain a portion of the truth, and that unchallenged opinions become mere prejudices and dead dogmas that are inherited rather than adopted. These are empirical claims that require evidence. Is it likely that we enhance the cause of truth by allowing hate speech or violent and degrading forms of pornography? It is worth pondering the relationship between speech and truth. If we had a graph where one axis is truth and the other is free speech, would we get one extra unit of truth for every extra unit of free speech? How can such a thing even be measured? It is certainly questionable whether arguments degenerate into prejudice if they are not constantly challenged. Devil's advocates are often tedious rather than useful interlocutors. Sometimes supporters of free speech, like its detractors, have a tendency to make assertions without providing compelling evidence to back them up. None of this is meant to suggest that free speech is not vitally important: this is, in fact, precisely the reason we need to find arguments in its favour. But regardless of how good these arguments are, some limits will have to be placed on speech.

We have found that the harm principle provides reasons for limiting free speech when doing so prevents direct harm to rights. This means that very few speech acts should be prohibited. It might be possible to broaden the scope of this principle, as Waldron attempts to do, to include things other than harmful rights violations. Feinberg's version of the offense principle has a wider reach than the harm principle, but it still recommends very limited intervention in the realm of free speech. All forms of speech that are found to be offensive but easily avoidable should go unpunished. This means that much pornography and hate speech will escape censure.

If these arguments are acceptable, it seems reasonable to extend them to other forms of behavior. Public nudity, for example, does not cause serious harm and if it does offend some people it is at most a bit embarrassing, and is avoided by averting one's eyes. The same goes with nudity, sex, and coarse language on television. Turning off the television provides instant relief from the offense. Neither the harm or the offense principles as outlined by Mill and Feinberg support criminalizing most drug use, nor the enforcement of seat belts, crash helmets and the like.

Some argue that speech can be limited for the sake of other liberal values, particularly the concern for democratic equality. This argument, unlike those based on harm and offense, has the potential to allow significant limits on pornography and hate speech. The claim is not that speech should always lose out when it clashes with equality, but it certainly should not be automatically privileged. To extend prohibitions on speech and other actions beyond this point requires an argument for a form of legal paternalism that suggests the state can decide what is acceptable for the safety and moral instruction of citizens, even if it means limiting actions that do not cause harm or unavoidable offense and which do not undermine democratic equality.

It has certainly been the practice of most societies, even liberal-democratic ones, to impose some paternalistic restrictions on behavior and to limit speech that causes avoidable offense. Hence the freedom of expression supported by the harm principle as outlined in Chapter One of On Liberty and by Feinberg's offense principle has yet to be realised. It is up to the reader to decide if such a society is an appealing possibility.


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Other Internet Resources

[As of January 2008, typing “free speech” on Google will net millions of entries. Hence it is best to simply jump in and see what one can find. It is worth noting that almost all of them are devoted to the promotion of speech in the face of censorship. This reflects a strong bias on the internet in favor of the “slippery slope” view of free speech. There are not many entries where an argument is made for placing limitations on free expression. Wikipedia has a quite a few entries dealing with censorship, free speech, pornography, and crime statistics. Here are a few other sites to get you going.]

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David van Mill <>

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