Notes to Friendship

1. For more details, see the entry on love.

2. Cooper (1977a) tries to refute this understanding of Aristotle. We should not, he thinks, interpret the sense in which we wish our friends well because they are useful to us as providing a justification; the “because” here rather signals a causal connection between our friends’ usefulness and our wishing them well: “Understanding the ‘because’ in this causal way makes it at least as much retrospective as prospective; the well-wishing and well-doing are responses to what the person is and has done rather than merely the expression of a hope as to what he will be and may do in the future” (633). Consequently, he claims, even pleasure and utility friends are wished well for their sakes rather than for our own. (For further arguments along these lines, see Grunebaum 2005.)

3. For further discussion of the significance of the mirror view and its limits, see Brink 1999.

4. It is unclear as to whether in having my friend’s ends become valuable to me, I do so by adopting these ends as my own, or whether they are valuable to me only as her ends: different examples Friedman offers tend to different interpretations.

5. Whiting does claim that the history of the relationship can be important for justifying continuing the friendship, though she says little to explain either how this is so or how it is consistent with her otherwise impersonal account of friendship.

6. Sherman makes this point using an example of the love (philia) of parents for their children, though it is clear that she intends it to apply to friendship generally, both from context and from the fact (as noted in §1 above) that the Aristotelian notion of philia includes not only relationships of attachment between family members but also, and paradigmatically, friendship.

7. Stroud (2006) and Keller (2007) offer similar arguments in the context of epistemology: part of being a good friend is being epistemically partial towards your friends, in conflict with the impartial conception of justification implicit in mainstream epistemological theories. Kawall (2013) responds Stroud and Keller, arguing that whatever "reasonable optimism" we normally have towards our friends is wholly compatible with the sort of latitude epistemic norms normally allow -- that to be biased towards our friends in epistemically unreasonable ways would be to risk having a skewed, artificial image of them that would undermine the friendship itself.

8. Of course, sometimes our having this disposition will backfire, and we will be led by it to act in sub-optimal ways. Nonetheless, Railton thinks, our having and acting out of this disposition (rather than acting in ways directly motivated by consequentialist principles) will enable us to do more good in the long run, and so our acquisition of this disposition is justifiable on consequentialist grounds.

9. Collins (2013) offers a similar defence of deontological accounts of the justification of friendship: impartial, deontological moral principles can justify our having and acting on distinctively partial attitudes towards our friends. Indeed, she argues, this is required in order for our practices of acting out of partial motives themselves to be justified.

Copyright © 2021 by
Bennett Helm <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free