Margaret Fuller (1810–1850), one of the most important American feminists of her day, was a philosopher, journalist, and literary critic. She belonged to the New England intellectual community called the transcendentalists, who also included Ralph Waldo Emerson and Henry David Thoreau. Her most important written work is Woman in the Nineteenth Century (1845), an expansion of her article entitled “The Great Lawsuit: Man versus Men, Woman versus Women” (1843). Fuller is remembered not only for her writings, but also for her life: a series of undertakings to live up to her own ideal of transcending the then customary gender differentiations. This article will present a summary of her philosophy and also take note of the various ways in which she sought (or did not seek) to implement her philosophical ideals.
- 1. Biography
- 2. Major Themes in Fuller’s Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Margaret Fuller was born in Cambridgeport, Massachusetts, on 23 May 1810, the eldest child of Timothy Fuller and Margarett Crane Fuller. (Cambridgeport is now part of Cambridge, Massachusetts, and the Margaret Fuller House where she was born is still standing.) Timothy Fuller was elected a Congressman from Massachusetts in 1817 and served until 1825. He lavished upon his eldest daughter a rigorous classical education usually reserved for boys. He taught her how to read at age three and a half, and she proved a child prodigy who rewarded Timothy’s attention. Her childhood curriculum included Latin prose, poetry, and composition, supplemented by Greek writings that included the New Testament as well as the classical philosophers, along with natural philosophy (natural science) and the wide-ranging discipline then called moral philosophy, which subsumed what we call the social sciences. When she was nine, her father added The Spectator, Paradise Lost, and Dr. Samuel Johnson to her reading list. Timothy’s stern manner and demanding requirements left young Margaret with emotional as well as scholarly legacies: she became obsessive and self-critical.
Formal schooling only began for Margaret in 1819; starting in 1824 she boarded at the School for Young Ladies in Groton for two years, then returned home. There she resumed her study of the classics. She found the Greeks more congenial than the Romans, identifying the Greeks with idealism, imagination, and freedom, the Romans with practicality, logic, and stern composure. Her readings were supplemented now by the Romantic literature taking shape in Europe, which she found fascinating. By the time she was in her thirties, she could be regarded as the best-read person, male or female, in New England (Douglas 1977: 263). She ended up espousing an avowedly dual philosophy that sought to embrace both classical and Romantic outlooks. She taught that the Platonic tradition celebrated masculine qualities while Romanticism celebrated feminine ones. Humanity as whole needed both—and each individual person should cultivate both their masculinity and their femininity.
Meanwhile, however, Timothy Fuller’s political ambitions had not been realized and his law practice shrank to the point where he decided in 1833 to move to Groton, Massachusetts, and operate (like many other Americans of the time) a family farm. The farm had not yet begun to turn a profit, however, when Margaret’s father died of cholera in October, 1835. Timothy had not drawn up a will, and by the male-oriented law of the time, title to the farm passed to his brothers, leaving his widow and children living on the farm dependent on the charity of Margaret’s uncles. Margaret felt understandably bitter, and though only in her twenties was forced to assume responsibility for supporting her mother and young siblings. She had begun work on a biography of Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, having achieved fluency in German remarkably quickly, but gave up on it, and the European trip it would have entailed, so she could teach school full time and earn a salary.
Margaret Fuller moved in highly literate circles, both before and after her father’s death. In 1839 she made use of her social contacts when she commenced a series of discussion groups for women that lasted five years; she referred to them as “conversations”. Most of these were held in the home of her friend and fellow intellectual Elizabeth Palmer Peabody, who also facilitated Fuller’s publishing some pieces. Another friend, Ralph Waldo Emerson, invited Fuller to edit a journal called The Dial, an enterprise she undertook in 1840. Fuller was supposed to receive a salary of $200 annually, but the money was never paid—one of the reasons why she resigned after two years. She continued to write for The Dial after no longer editing it.
In 1844 Fuller moved to New York City and went to work for Horace Greeley’s famous newspaper, the New York Tribune, as a full-time book reviewer. Where the Dial had a small and declining circulation, the Tribune had 50,000 subscribers. Over the next four years, Fuller wrote over 250 Tribune articles on literature, music, and art as well as social and political issues. She also published poetry during this period, though her poetry has never received much attention.
Starting in 1846, at her own initiative Fuller moved to Europe, first to England and then to the Italian peninsula (Italy was not yet a united country), where she served as a foreign correspondent for Greeley. While still in England she met two Italians who would remain prominent in her life: Giuseppi Mazzini, Italian patriot and republican leader then in exile, and Giovanni Angelo Ossoli, whom she eventually married, though it is unclear when or whether they participated in a wedding ceremony. If such a ceremony did occur, it was after the birth of their baby boy, Angelo Eugene Philip Ossoli, nicknamed Angelino or Nino, on 5 September 1848 (Marshall 2013: 350).
When a Roman Republic was proclaimed in February 1849, the Ossolis were living in the democratic Republic and supporting its cause, led by Mazzini. The Republic sought to replace the Pope as temporal ruler of Rome, while continuing his spiritual function. The Pope did not acquiesce, and requested foreign aid to restore his power. France provided it. In the war that followed, the Ossolis fought on behalf of the Republic, he as a soldier and she as a nurse, but the French prevailed, and the Ossolis fled into exile in Florence.
In 1850 the couple decided to move to the United States, where Margaret hoped to publish a book she had written on the short-lived Roman Republic, even though Giovanni spoke no English. The family set sail in May on a U.S. freighter named the Elizabeth, bound for New York. During the voyage the captain died of smallpox, leaving the first mate as acting captain. Under this inexperienced leadership, the ship ran aground on a sandbar near Fire Island, NY, during a storm at 3:30 a.m. on 19 July 1850. Since they were less than 300 yards from shore, those who could swim jumped into the water—including the acting captain. The Ossoli family could not swim, and were left behind. A crowd formed on shore, but no one tried to rescue the Ossolis. After 10 hours, a giant wave washed Margaret and her family out to sea. Nino’s tiny body was eventually found ashore; neither of the adult Ossoli bodies ever was. The manuscript of Margaret’s book on the Roman Republic was among the items lost.
2. Major Themes in Fuller’s Philosophy
2.1 Unitarianism and the Cultivation of the Self
Central to both Margaret Fuller’s theory and practice of life was the cultivation of the self. The practice of “self-improvement” or “self-culture” was very widespread among middle-class white Americans of the time. Even working-class men like Abraham Lincoln labored for self-improvement in their individual character and talents as a pathway to security and prosperity. Conscious development of one’s own integrity and abilities was regarded as a personal application of America’s proud white male democracy. The most admired and sophisticated exponent of self-culture was the famous clergyman of the recently emerged Unitarian religious denomination, William Ellery Channing (1780–1842). Channing pioneered a form of Christian humanism. Fuller regarded him as a heroic exemplar of her own ideal of self-culture. Channing’s project included both genders and all races of human beings (Fuller 1845: 60).
Margaret Fuller was raised a Unitarian. The denomination originated in early nineteenth-century New England in an intellectual rebellion by descendants of the Puritans against Calvinist theology. The name “Unitarian” reflected their repudiation of the conventional Trinitarian Christian doctrine of a triune God of Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. The New England Unitarians ceased to regard Jesus Christ as a unique divine personification of the Godhead. Instead, they emphasized the potential divinity in everyone: every good person should seek to create their own Christlike, even Godlike, character. As Channing explained in his sermon entitled “Likeness to God”: “God becomes a real being to us in proportion as his own nature is unfolded within us” (D. Howe 1970: 120; citing Channing 1828, in Works, III, 229).
Margaret Fuller’s personal quest for own self-realization as well as her ardent feminist program for the self-realization of all women both took inspiration from Channing. Even though she abandoned the Unitarian church and stopped attending any religious services, Fuller never lost her admiration for Channing. Fuller set forth her mature religious principles in “A Credo” around June 1840 (preserved in the Margaret Fuller Ossoli Collection, especially pp. 97–98, in the Boston Public Library).
Fuller, Channing and many other American intellectuals of their time based their conception of self-improvement on the faculty psychology of the Scottish moral philosophers Thomas Reid, Lord Kames, and Dugald Stewart. The word “faculty”, like the word “facility”, is derived from the Latin word for “power”, and faculty psychology throughout ancient, medieval, and modern times has been the study of human powers. The conventional vision of human nature in Fuller’s day was hierarchical, with reason being rightly superior to the emotions. Conscience was considered a rational power. Channing Unitarians endorsed metaphysical dualism and sought to subordinate matter to mind in the process of self-culture. A key issue for self-improvement was subordinating “the passions” (including selfish, mercenary motives) to reason, the divine quality in human nature. This version of Christian humanism took academic shape in the moral philosophy taught at Harvard during Fuller’s lifetime (D. Howe 1988, especially chap. 2, “The Moral Nature of Man”). Margaret Fuller became the first woman granted library privileges at what was then an all-male university.
2.2 Transcendentalism and Platonism
1835 was a year when the most influential persons in Margaret Fuller’s life changed: her father Timothy died, and she made the acquaintance of Ralph Waldo Emerson, who became her friend and mentor. Fuller’s relationship with Emerson, like that with her father, was full of tensions. The two had very discordant personalities, as Judith Thurman has observed: “Waldo’s cool, cerebral, and ironic; Margaret’s noisy, histrionic, and sincere” (Thurman 2013: 79). Though their interactions were often tempestuous, Emerson converted Fuller to his own version of self-improvement: the quest for spiritual self-transcendence. Followers became known as transcendentalists because they sought to transcend the material world in communion with the divine. Fuller became a member of the Transcendental Club founded by Emerson and Frederick Henry Hedge, virtually all of whose members were Unitarians or former Unitarians. The transcendentalists (including Thoreau, Theodore Parker, and Elizabeth Peabody) are remembered today for their contributions to American literature, philosophy, and social reform, the first intellectual counter-culture in American history (see the entry on transcendentalism). At Emerson’s invitation, Fuller edited the transcendental periodical The Dial for two years (1840–42) and continued to write for it afterwards.
The transcendentalists aspired to rescue the United States from cultural provincialism. American culture was then chiefly based on Calvinism and on the Enlightenment; the transcendentalists wanted to introduce their country to Romanticism and the philosophy of Kant. Fuller was strongly attracted to German Romanticism. Hence her ambition, never realized, to write a biography of Goethe. Of the ancient philosophers to whom her father had introduced her, Fuller’s favorite was Plato.
The American transcendentalists embraced Plato and Platonism in general. They looked back fondly on the Platonists (more properly called Neoplatonists) of seventeenth-century Cambridge University in England. The Unitarian and transcendentalist intellectuals of nineteenth-century New England were aware of these Renaissance intellectuals and admired their reliance on individual freedom as the foundation for religious faith rather than intolerant coercion. The Cambridge Platonists rejected Calvinism and embraced a humanist form of Christianity focused on the proper development of human powers. They not only found Plato’s own philosophy congenial, but also that of the third-century Alexandrian Neoplatonist named Plotinus. Plotinus had developed a system for self-cultivation, seeking God within one’s own psyche. All of this heritage was invoked in the nineteenth century by William Ellery Channing, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and Margaret Fuller.
Fuller was thoroughly conversant with Plato, but by no means his uncritical follower. In some of his writings, Plato was the first feminist. Among the guardians of his ideal Republic a perfect meritocracy prevails and women are included within the public spirit of the polis; they receive the same education as men and have equal opportunity to exercise political power. Elsewhere, however, Plato compromised with and even legitimated the prevailing subjugation of women. Fuller accordingly rendered a mixed verdict on Plato’s philosophy of gender (Fuller 1845: 90; also see Okin 1979: 15–70). Here, as always, she used tradition as a resource without letting herself be imprisoned by it.
Where Channing and other Unitarian thinkers had been metaphysical dualists eager to impose the supremacy of mind over matter, Emerson and most transcendentalists espoused pure idealism. At least initially, transcendentalism was itself a religion, and a religion that rejected the relevance of empirical evidence like Scripture, miracles, and the fulfillment of prophecies (see the entry on transcendentalism).
Margaret Fuller retained the dualistic metaphysics of Channing rather than the pure idealism of Emerson and her other transcendentalist friends. But she followed the transcendentalist approach to the distinction between “Reason” and “Understanding”. What we normally regard as perception and logical thinking they classified as “Understanding”. “Reason” Fuller and others saw as divinely inspired insight, peculiar to each individual and much more important for true religion. “Understanding” carried us through the mundane, practical material world. “Reason” was the faculty through which a wise person conducted the Platonic Quest to go beyond the material in search of the ideal. Both Channing and Emerson wanted to recreate in the modern world the role that had been played by the New England Puritan minister as inspirational intellectual, spiritual, and moral leader. Fuller was determined to open this role to women. Even while embracing nineteenth-century Romanticism, she sought to implement the Enlightenment ideal of natural rights. In this and other ways, she stands out to us as the most modern of the New England transcendentalists.
2.3 Feminism and Conversations
Margaret Fuller’s “Conversations” in Boston became famous among early American feminists. They commenced in 1839 and continued until April 1844. Each would last would last thirteen weeks in a pre-announced time and place (usually the parlor of her friend Elizabeth Peabody). The “conversants” paid to participate—usually ten dollars for the series, about what Emerson and other transcendentalists charged for a set of their lectures. Most of the Conversations were for women only and had about twenty-five participants. Fuller herself led off each two-hour weekly session with a talk, which the audience were then encouraged to discuss and question. The women who attended were generally well-read, usually Unitarian in practice or background, often wives or relatives of male transcendentalists. Fuller conceived of her Conversations as essential supplements to the educational opportunities then available to middle- and upper-class New England women. These might include literature, classics, and fine arts, simply decorative or recreational in purpose. Fuller would lead off with such subjects, but then use them to press her participants to address serious questions about women’s lives, roles, and purposes. She was applying a conversational method she had learned from Plato’s dialogues and seen exemplified by her fellow transcendentalist and Plato disciple Bronson Alcott. Her concern was not so much to teach as to provoke others to think more deeply than usual (see Capper 1987).
Among the many women who attended Fuller’s Conversations a number would go on to prominence in feminist and other reform causes, such as Lydia Maria Child, Elizabeth Peabody, Caroline Sturgis, Sophia Ripley, Julia Ward Howe, Elizabeth Cady Stanton, Lydian Emerson (wife of Ralph Waldo Emerson), Ann Terry Phillips (wife of Wendell Phillips), Mary Peabody Mann (wife of Horace Mann), and Mary Channing (daughter of William Ellery Channing) (see Capper 2007: 110).
In these Conversations Fuller sought for a while to avoid discussing social reform causes other than feminism, such as antislavery, even though some of her participants were already getting involved in them. The British feminist Harriet Martineau, who visited America, criticized her repeatedly for this policy. Eventually Fuller changed her mind about this. The Conversations, though she intended them to stimulate the thinking of others, also stimulated her own.
In July 1843, The Dial published as its lead article the fruits of Fuller’s new position, “The Great Lawsuit: Man versus Men, Woman versus Women”. Despite its title, the article was not framed as a lawsuit. It postulates that Manhood (“Man”) and Womanhood (“Woman”) are transcendent ideals that individuals should strive to realize, and that each ideal contains both masculine and feminine qualities. There is no “wholly masculine man; no purely feminine woman” (1843: 14; also in Fuller 1845: 103). But because men have greater access to the means of self-development, the ideals of manhood have been more fully realized in practice than those of womanhood. This needs to be corrected for the benefit of all humanity.
Fuller embraces in this article both Romantic and Enlightenment ideals of democracy and scorns America’s cant about democracy while betraying it in practice. “I need not speak of what has been done towards the red man, the black man” (1843: 8; 1845: 14), she comments in disgust. Now she views feminism as expressing a parallel objective with the abolition of slavery: both causes labor on behalf of the individual seeking to realize personal potential (as do other reform causes like temperance and public education for children and the mentally retarded). Only after her move to Europe, however, would her commitment to radical social change become complete.
In the meantime, Fuller’s embrace of the feminist cause was explained more fully in the enlargement of her “Great Lawsuit” article into her book, Woman in the Nineteenth Century, the work for which she is chiefly remembered. She completed the book in November of 1844. Since the end of her “Conversations”, she had concluded that feminism was one of a number of worthy causes for human emancipation women should support. The book endorses freedom for Ireland and the return of Jews to Palestine, adding an emphatic warning against the annexation of Texas because that would strengthen the institution of slavery (Fuller 1845: 90–91).
Modern readers will be surprised that Fuller’s book doesn’t mention woman suffrage, which was not then a public issue—though of course it was clearly implied by her insistence on equal rights for women, and Susan B. Anthony did acknowledge Fuller as a precursor of the women suffrage movement. Fuller usually addresses problems with popular culture rather than legal issues. She does stress the need for women to have a wider range of occupations available.
You ask me what offices they may fill; I reply—any. I do not care what case you put; let them be sea-captains, if you will. (Often misquoted as “let them be sea-captains, if they will”)
A greater variety of occupations would help women to realize their potential, to “rouse their latent powers”, as she put it (Fuller 1845: 95). Most often, Fuller addresses the need to transform the marriage relationship. Instead of the woman belonging to the man, marriage should enable the two partners to ally and form a whole together. Ideally, marriage would be a “pilgrimage toward a common shrine” (Fuller 1845: 42).
At the end, her book cries out for an individual woman to be an example to the world:
And will she not soon appear? The woman who shall vindicate their birthright for all women; who shall teach them what to claim, and how to use what they obtain? (Fuller 1845: 97)
Once she had gone to Europe, Margaret Fuller herself would undertake this role.
One can find fault with Fuller’s book. It does not consistently address its issue with logical development; it rambles, flowing from one thought to another. She assumes her reader possesses her own wide range of literary and classical learning, frequently making allusions that few readers will actually recognize (especially nowadays). Fuller’s book anticipated the first women’s rights convention, which would occur in July 1848 at Seneca Falls in upstate New York and demanded women’s suffrage, though even some feminists of the time felt reluctant to endorse such a drastic measure. The book proved quite popular, not only in the U.S. but also in Britain, where it was pirated at a time before publishers were required to observe international copyright. Hers was the feminist book of its time, analogous to Simone de Beauvoir’s The Second Sex in the mid-twentieth century.
2.4 The Philosopher’s Politics
In 1844 Horace Greeley invited Margaret Fuller to move to New York and go to work for his newspaper the New York Tribune as America’s first fulltime literary critic. Greeley had published “The Great Lawsuit” in the Tribune and had persuaded Fuller to expand it into a book. His wife Mary had attended Fuller’s “Conversations” and had prompted him to hire her (Capper 2007: 165). The Tribune provided Fuller with a huge audience. Greeley and his paper belonged to the Whig political party, which had formed in opposition to Andrew Jackson and criticized his policies, including “Indian Removal” of tribes to west of the Mississippi. Fuller had travelled through Chicago and the Midwest earlier in the year and had become publicly critical of white treatment of the Indians. She shared Greeley’s opposition to slavery and praised Frederick Douglass. Greeley’s Tribune embraced many reform causes of the time. Fuller had come to view women’s rights as part of a broad need for social reform, evident in her compassion for the women in prison whom she visited. Most of them had been convicted of prostitution, though the men involved were never prosecuted.
In Congress, Timothy Fuller had strongly supported John Quincy Adams’s presidential campaign, opposed the Missouri Compromise, and defended the rights of Native Americans. His daughter and pupil invoked the sixth President’s attitude toward the female sex in Woman in the Nineteenth Century (Fuller 1845: 77–78). When the Whig Party took shape in the 1830s, both Adams and Margaret Fuller identified with it. Though women could not vote, Fuller saw the Whigs as her party of choice. “I attended last week”, she wrote to Emerson on 14 August 1837, “the Whig Caucus here” (meaning Providence, Rhode Island). “It is rather the best thing I have done” (Fuller, Letters, ed. Hudspeth 1983: I, 295; for more on her Whig politics, see Letters, IV, 121). Actually, the Whig Party was a bit more sympathetic to women’s rights than the Democratic Party, probably because the cause of women was a predominantly middle-class movement prior to the Nineteenth Amendment, and the Whigs were a middle-class party. The Whigs were also the party of both evangelical and Unitarian Protestantism, which in those days provided the principal base of support for many reform movements, including antislavery, temperance, public schools, higher education, international peace, prison reform (which promoted “penitentiaries” rather than simply punishment like flogging), the American Bible Society (which fostered literacy), and asylums for the insane, as well as women’s liberation. Though Unitarians did not share the theology of the evangelical denominations, they often shared common social and political aims.
In 1846 Fuller went to Europe and become a foreign correspondent for the New York Tribune, writing about European literature and public opinion. European travel was expensive, and it was not clear that Greeley was willing to reimburse Fuller’s costs sufficiently. Fortunately, a wealthy and politically enlightened Quaker couple, Marcus and Rebecca Spring, were friends of Fuller, decided to spend some time in Europe, and offered to pay for some of her expenses if she would travel with them and tutor their young son Eddie.
Fuller began touring in England and Scotland with the Springs, sending articles back to Greeley’s Tribune. She met interesting people there, including the elderly poet Wordsworth and Harriet Martineau, the English feminist who had earlier criticized her for shunning reforms other than feminism. Now that Fuller had embraced a much wider reform agenda, the two got along. London harbored an intellectual curiosity of the time, Thomas Carlyle, who rejected the Calvinist Christianity of his youth, celebrated German Romanticism, and knew many smart women, one of whom was his wife Jane. When Fuller and Carlyle met, mutual admiration ensued. But always with serious reservations. Carlyle’s politics were very different from Fuller’s. He rejected democracy, endorsed antisemitism and white racism, and celebrated populist, nationalist historic leaders like Oliver Cromwell and Frederick the Great. (Generations later some Nazis would look back on Carlyle as a precursor.) Another Romantic whom Fuller met in London would arouse her more uncritical admiration: Giuseppi Mazzini, the heroic Italian revolutionary. Mazzini embraced liberal democracy and personal fulfillment as aspects of his Italian republican nationalism. Fuller welcomed the chance to speak in an event at a free elementary school for poor Italian expatriate boys, where she endorsed Mazzini’s revolutionary cause and invoked the principle of self-improvement through public education so popular with American Unitarians and Whig reformers. Mazzini loved it.
Fuller went on to France, where she confirmed that Paris was indeed the cultural capital of the world; she enjoyed the music and fine arts there as well as the literature and philosophy she was accustomed to engaging. She contrived to meet the woman who had adopted the pen name George Sand and become one the most popular and successful writers in all Europe, along with her current lover, Frederic Chopin. More significant politically was her relationship with Adam Mickiewicz, the exiled Polish Romantic poet-turned- revolutionary, striving to achieve Polish independence from Russia and Austria. Fuller had admired him even before they met in France. His social democracy appealed to her and so did his Romantic religious passion. It seemed like the two of them might form a bond both sexually romantic and philosophically Romantic—but Mickiewicz was already married. Fuller moved on to the Italian peninsula.
Margaret Fuller’s time in Italy proved politically climactic. She embraced simultaneously the Italian language, in which she became fluent, and the revolutionary struggle for Italian unity and democracy. Now back in touch with Giuseppe Mazzini on his home turf, she eagerly supported his cause: transforming Rome into a democratic republic. When the new Pope Pius IX temporarily seemed supportive, she approved but (perceptively) remained cautious. When forced to choose, the Pope disavowed Mazzini, and Fuller denounced the Pope. As revolutionary movements spread around Europe in 1848, Fuller was consistently enthusiastic. She kept her American audience informed about the European revolutions, explaining that America should no longer imagine itself to be the model Europe should imitate. She had become impatient with middle-class moderates and endorsed socialism. By now she was even further to the Left than Mazzini. Meanwhile, Fuller’s time in Italy was proving climactic personally as well as politically. She met the younger Giovanni Angelo Ossoli. Together they had a child and their probable marriage is a point of discussion in the literature.
Margaret Fuller’s grand international political project was not realized. The Roman revolution for which she and her husband fought proved a lost cause, and they had to flee to Florence. Her attempted return to the United States with her new family ended in disaster (as related above in Section 1 above). But Margaret Fuller’s ultimate vision of a world where people are free and empowered, regardless of gender, race, or class, has remained a noble and inspiring vision.
- American Transcendentalists: Essential Writings, Lawrence Buell (ed.), New York: Modern Library of Random House, 2006.
- Beecher, Catharine, Margaret Fuller, and M. Carey Thomas, The Educated Woman in America: Selected Writings of Catharine Beecher, Margaret Fuller, and M. Carey Thomas, Barbara M. Cross, (ed.), New York: Teachers College Press, .
- Channing, William Ellery, 1828, “Likeness to God”, published in The Works of William E. Channing, Boston: James Munro and Company, fourth edition, 1845, volume III, 227–255. [Channing 1828 available online]
- Clarke, James Freeman, The Letters of James Freeman Clarke to Margaret Fuller, John Wesley Thomas (ed.), Hamburg: Cram, de Gruyter, 1957.
- The Dial, Volumes 1–4, quarterly journal published July 1840–April 1844, in Boston, edited by M. Fuller, R. E. Emerson, G. Ripley. Reprinted 1961. Also available online:
- Emerson, Ralph Waldo and Margaret Fuller, Selected Works: Essays, Poems, and Dispatches, edited with Introduction by John Carlos Rowe, Boston: Houghton Mifflin, c. 2003.
- Fuller, Margaret, 1840, “A Credo” June 1840 [approx.], manuscript in Margaret Fuller Ossoli Collection, Boston Public Library.
- –––, 1843, “The Great Lawsuit: Man versus Men, Woman versus Women”, The Dial, IV(1): 1–47.
- –––, 1845, Woman in the Nineteenth Century, New York: Greeley and McElroth.
- –––, Art, Literature, and the Drama, by Margaret Fuller Ossoli, edited by her brother, Arthur B. Fuller, Boston: Roberts Bros., 1860.
- –––, At Home and Abroad; or Things and Thoughts in America and Europe, by Margaret Fuller Ossoli, edited by her brother Arthur B. Fuller, Boston: Crosby, Nichols and Co., 1856.
- –––, The Essential Margaret Fuller, edited and with an introduction by Jeffrey Steele, New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press, c. 1992.
- –––, The Letters of Margaret Fuller, Robert N. Hudspeth (ed.), 6 volumes, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1983–94.
- –––, Life Without and Life Within: Reviews, Narratives, Essays, and Poems by Margaret Fuller Ossoli, edited by her brother Arthur B. Fuller, New York: The Tribune Association, 1869, c. 1859.
- –––, Literature and Art, by S. Margaret Fuller, with an introduction by Horace Greeley, New York: Fowler and Wells, 1852; available electronically.
- –––, Love-Letters of Margaret Fuller, 1845–46, with an introduction by Julia Ward Howe [to which are added the reminiscences of Ralph Waldo Emerson, Horace Greeley, and Charles T. Congdon], New York: Greenwood Press, 1969; originally published 1903. [Letters written to James Nathan, later James Gotendorf.]
- –––, Margaret Fuller: American Romantic: A Selection from Her Writings and Correspondence, Perry Miller (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1963
- –––, Margaret Fuller, Critic: Writings from the New York Tribune, 1844–1846, Judith Matson Bean and Joel Myerson (eds.), New York: Columbia University Press, 2000.
- –––, Margaret Fuller: Essays on American Life and Letters, Joel Myerson (ed.), New Haven, CT: College and University Press, 1978.
- –––, Margaret Fuller’s New York Journalism: A Biographical Essay and Key Writings, edited by Catherine C. Mitchell, Knoxville: University of Tennessee Press, c. 1995.
- –––, Memoirs of Margaret Fuller Ossoli, R. W. Emerson, J. F. Clarke, and W. H. Channing (eds), 2 volumes, Boston: Phillips, Sampson, 1852. [The editors, close friends of Fuller, unfortunately sometimes censored and rewrote her writings, to make them conform closer to Victorian taste.]
- –––, Papers on Literature and Art, New York: Wiley & Putnam, 1846. 2 volumes in 1; microfilm; Wiley & Putnam’s Library of American Books, no. 19, 20.
- –––, Summer on the Lakes in 1843, with an introduction by Susan Belasco Smith; original illustrations by Sarah Clarke, Urbana, University of Illinois Press, c. 1991.
- –––, Summer on the Lakes. With autobiography, Memoir by Ralph Waldo Emerson, W.H. Channing, and others. London, Ward and Lock, 1861.
- –––, “These Sad But Glorious Days”: Dispatches from Europe, 1846–1850, Larry J. Reynolds and Susan Belasco Smith (eds), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, c. 1991.
- –––, The Woman and the Myth: Margaret Fuller’s Life and Writings, compiled by Bell Gale Chevigny. Revised and expanded edition, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1994.
- Allen, Margaret Vanderhaar, 1979, The Achievement of Margaret Fuller, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
- Argersinger, Jana and Phyllis Cole (eds.), 2014, Toward a Female Genealogy of Transcendentalism, Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press.
- Brown, Arthur W., 1964, Margaret Fuller, Woodbridge, CT: Twayne Publishers.
- Capper, Charles, 1987, “Margaret Fuller as Cultural Reformer: The Conversations in Boston”, American Quarterly, 39(4): 509–528. doi:10.2307/2713122
- –––, 1992/2007, Margaret Fuller: An American
Romantic Life, New York: Oxford University Press
- Volume 1: The Private Years, 1992;
- Volume 2, The Public Years, 2007.
- Capper, Charles and Cristina Giorcelli (eds.), 2007, Margaret Fuller: Transatlantic Crossings in a Revolutionary Age, Madison, WI: University of Wisconsin Press.
- Chevigny, Bell Gale, 1994, The Woman and the Myth: Margaret Fuller’s Life and Writings, revised edition, Boston, MA: Northeastern University Press; first published in 1976.
- Dickenson, Donna, 1993, Margaret Fuller: Writing a Woman’s Life, New York: St. Martin’s Press.
- Douglas, Ann, 1977, The Feminization of American Culture, New York: Knopf.
- Ellison, Julie K., 1990, Romanticism, Gender, and the Ethics of Understanding, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- Gustafson, Sandra M., 1995, “Choosing a Medium: Margaret Fuller and the Forms of Sentiment”, American Quarterly, 47(1): 34–65. doi:10.2307/2713324
- Higginson, Thomas Wentworth, 1884, Margaret Fuller Ossoli, Cambridge, MA: The Riverside Press.
- Howe, Daniel Walker, 1970 , The Unitarian Conscience: Harvard Moral Philosophy, 1805–1861, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. Revised edition, Middletown, CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1988.
- –––, 1997, “ Margaret Fuller’s Heroic Ideal of Womanhood”, in his Making the American Self: Jonathan Edwards to Abraham Lincoln, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 212–234 (Chapter 8).
- Howe, Julia Ward, 1883, Margaret Fuller (Marchesa Ossoli), Boston, MA: Roberts Brothers; reprinted New York: Haskell House, 1968.
- Marshall, Megan, 2013, Margaret Fuller: A New American Life, Boston and New York: Houghton Mifflin Harcourt.
- Matteson, John, 2012, The Lives of Margaret Fuller, New York: W.W. Norton.
- Okin, Susan, 1979, Women in Western Political Thought, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Packer, Barbara L., 1995, “The Transcendentalists”, in The Cambridge History of American Literature (Volume 2), Sacvan Bercovitch (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 329–604; reprinted as The Transcendentalists, Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2007.
- Rose, Anne C., 1981, Transcendentalism as a Social Movement, 1830–1850, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
- Slater, Abby, 1978, In Search of Margaret Fuller, New York: Delacorte Press.
- Steele, Jeffrey, 2001, Transfiguring America: Myth, Ideology, and Mourning in Margaret Fuller’s Writing, Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press.
- Rose, Anne C., 1981, Transcendentalism as a Social Movement, 1830–1850, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
- Thurman, Judith, 2013, “An Unfinished Woman: The Desires of Margaret Fuller”, The New Yorker, 1 April 2013, 89(7): 75–81.
- Urbanski, Marie Mitchell Oleson, 1980, Margaret Fuller’s Woman in the Nineteenth Century: A Literary Study of Form and Content, of Sources and Influence, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
- Von Mehren, Joan, 1994, Minerva and the Muse: A Life of Margaret Fuller, Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press.
- Myerson, Joel, 1998, Margaret Fuller: Annotated Bibliography of Criticism, 1983–95, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
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