# Games, Full Abstraction and Full Completeness

*First published Thu Jan 12, 2017; substantive revision Tue Feb 2, 2021*

Computer programs are particular kinds of texts. It is therefore natural to ask what is the meaning of a program or, more generally, how can we set up a formal semantical account of a programming language.

There are many possible answers to such questions, each motivated by some particular aspect of programs. So, for instance, the fact that programs are to be executed on some kind of computing machine gives rise to operational semantics, whereas the similarities of programming languages with the formal languages of mathematical logic have motivated the denotational approach that interprets programs and their constituents by means of set-theoretical models.

Each of these accounts induces its own synonymy relation on the phrases of the programming language: in a nutshell, the full abstraction property states that the denotational and operational approaches define the same relation. This is a benchmark property for a semantical account of a programming language, and its failure for an intuitive denotational account of a simple language based on lambda-calculus has led eventually to refinements of the technical tools of denotational semantics culminating in game semantics, partly inspired by the dialogue games originally used in the semantics of intuitionistic logic by Lorenzen and his school, and later extended by Blass and others to the interpretation of Girard’s linear logic. This bridge between constructive logic and programming has also suggested stronger forms of relation between semantics and proof-theory, of which the notion of full completeness is perhaps the most remarkable instance.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Sequential higher-order computation: the full abstraction problem for PCF
- 3. Game semantics
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

### 1.1 Interpretations of programming languages

The notion of full abstraction arises from the Scott-Strachey approach
to the semantical analysis of programming languages (Scott &
Strachey 1971; Strachey 1966, 1967), also known as
*denotational* semantics. One fundamental aim of a denotational
semantics of a programming language \({L}\) is to give a
*compositional* interpretation \({\mathcal{M}}: {L}\to D\) of
the *program phrases* of \({L}\) as elements of abstract
mathematical structures (*domains*) \(D\).

We may choose another way of giving meaning to programs, based on
their execution. This *operational* interpretation is only
defined on the set Prog of programs of
\({L}\), and involves the definition of a suitable set of program
*values*, which are the *observables* of \({L}\). If the
execution of program \(e\) terminates with value \(v\), a situation
expressed by the notation \(e \opDownarrow v\), then \(v\) is the
operational meaning of \(e\). This defines the operational
interpretation of programs as a partial function \({\mathcal{O}}\)
from programs to values, where \({\mathcal{O}}(e) = v\) when \(e
\opDownarrow v\).

Both interpretations induce natural equivalence relations on program phrases. In one of its formulations, full abstraction states the coincidence of the denotational equivalence on a language with one induced by the operational semantics. Full abstraction has been first defined in a paper by Robin Milner (1975), which also exposes the essential conceptual ingredients of denotational semantics: compositionality, and the relations between observational and denotational equivalence of programs. For this reason, full abstraction can be taken as a vantage point into the vast landscape of programming language semantics, and is therefore quite relevant to the core problems of the philosophy of programming languages (White 2004) and of computer science (Turner 2016).

### 1.2 Compositionality

Compositionality (Szabó 2013) is a desirable feature of a
semantical analysis of a programming language, because it allows one
to calculate the meaning of a program as a function of the meanings of
its constituents. Actually, in Milner’s account (see especially
1975: sec. 1, 4), compositionality applies even more generally to
*computing agents* assembled from smaller ones by means of
appropriate composition operations. These agents may include, beside
programs, hardware systems like a computer composed of a memory,
composed in turn of two memory registers, and a processing unit, where
all components are computing agents. This allows one to include in one
framework systems composed of hardware, of software and even of both.
Now, the syntactic rules that define inductively the various
categories of phrases of a programming language allow us to regard
\({L}\) as an *algebra of program phrases*, whose signature is
determined by these rules. One account of compositionality that is
especially suitable to the present setting (Szabó 2013: sec. 2)
identifies a compositional interpretation of programs with a
homomorphism from this algebra to the domain of denotations
associating with every operation of the algebra of programs a
corresponding semantical operation on denotations.

As an example, consider a simple imperative language whose programs
\(\mathtt{c}\) denote state transformations
\({\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}) : \Sigma \to \Sigma\). Among the
operations on programs of this language there is *sequential
composition*, building a program \(\mathtt{c}_1 ; \mathtt{c}_2\)
from programs \(\mathtt{c}_1\) and \(\mathtt{c}_2\). The intended
operational meaning of this program is that, if \(\mathtt{c}_1 ;
\mathtt{c}_2\) is executed starting from a state \(\sigma \in
\Sigma\), we first execute \(\mathtt{c}_1\) starting form state
\(\sigma\). If the execution terminates we obtain a state \(\sigma'\),
from which we start the execution of \(\mathtt{c}_2\) reaching, if the
execution terminates, a state \(\sigma''\). The latter state is the
state reached by the execution of \(\mathtt{c}_1 ; \mathtt{c}_2\) from
state \(\sigma\). From a denotational point of view, we have the
operation of composition on functions \(\Sigma \to \Sigma\), and the
compositional interpretation of our program is given by the following
identity, to be read as a clause of a definition of \({\mathcal{M}}\)
by induction on the structure of programs:
\[{\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}_1 ; \mathtt{c}_2) = {\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}_2) \circ {\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}_1)\]
or, more
explicitly, for any state \(\sigma\):
\[{\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}_1 ; \mathtt{c}_2) (\sigma) = {\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}_2) ({\mathcal{M}}(\mathtt{c}_1) (\sigma)).\]
As most programming
languages have several categories of phrases (for instance
expressions, declarations, instructions) the algebras of programs will
generally be multi-sorted, with one sort for each category of phrase.
Denotational semantics pursues systematically the idea of associating
compositionally to each program phrase a denotation of the matching
sort (see Stoy 1977 for an early account).

### 1.3 Program equivalence and full abstraction

The existence of an interpretation of a programming language \({L}\)
induces in a standard way an *equivalence* of program
phrases:

**Definition 1.1** (Denotational equivalence). Given any
two program phrases \(e,e'\), they are *denotationally
equivalent*, written \(e \simeq_{\mathcal{M}}e'\), when
\({\mathcal{M}}(e) = {\mathcal{M}}(e')\).

If \({\mathcal{M}}\) is compositional, then \({\simeq_{\mathcal{M}}}\)
is a congruence over the algebra of programs, whose derived
operations, those obtained by composition of operations of the
signature, are called *contexts*. A context \(C\blbr\)
represents a program phrase with a “hole” that can be
filled by program phrases \(e\) of appropriate type to yield the
program phrase \(C[e]\). By means of contexts we can characterize
easily the compositionality of a semantic mapping:

**Proposition 1.1.** If \({\mathcal{M}}\) is
compositional, then for all phrases \(e,e'\) and all contexts
\(C\blbr\):
\[\tag{1}\label{compositionality}{e \simeq_{\mathcal{M}} e'} \Rightarrow {C[e] \simeq_{\mathcal{M}} C[e']}.\]

This formulation highlights another valuable aspect of
compositionality, namely the *referentially transparency* of
all contexts, equivalently their *extensionality*:
denotationally equivalent phrases can be substituted in any context
leaving unchanged the denotation of the resulting phrase. The
implication (\(\ref{compositionality}\)) states, in particular, that
\({\simeq_{\mathcal{M}}}\) is a congruence. In order to compare
denotational and operational congruence, therefore, we must carve a
congruence out of the naive operational equivalence defined by setting
\(e \sim e'\) if and only if \({\mathcal{O}}(e) = {\mathcal{O}}(e')\).
This can be done by exploiting *program* contexts \(C\blbr\),
representing a program with a “hole” that can be filled by
program phrases \(e\) of suitable type to yield a complete program
\(C[e]\).

**Definition 1.2** (Observational equivalence) Given any
two program phrases \(e,e'\), they are *observational
equivalent*, written \(e \simeq_{\mathcal{O}}e'\), when, for all
program contexts \(C\blbr\) and all program values \(v\):
\[C[e] \opDownarrow v\ \text{ if and only if }\ C[e'] \opDownarrow v.\]

Observational equivalence is then a congruence over the algebra of
program phrases, and in fact it is the largest congruence contained in
\(\sim\). From the general point of view of the account of Milner
(1975), that we are following closely, the context of a computing
agent represents one of its possible environments. If we adopt the
principle that “the overt behavior constitutes the
*whole* meaning of a computing agent” (Milner 1975: 160),
then the contexts represents intuitively the observations that we can
make on the behavior of the computing agent. In the case of programs,
the observables are the values, so observational equivalence
identifies phrases that cannot be distinguished by means of
observations whose outcomes are distinct values. One consequence of
Milner’s methodological principle is that a computing agent
becomes a

transducer, whose input sequence consists of enquiries by, or responses from, its environment, and whose output sequence consists of enquiries of, or responses to, its environment. (Milner 1975: 160)

A behavior of a computing agent takes then the form of a
*dialogue* between the agent and its environment, a metaphor
that will be at the heart of the game theoretic approaches to
semantics to be discussed in
Section 3.
This behavioral stance, which has its roots in the work of engineers
on finite state devices has also been extended by Milner to a
methodology of modeling concurrent systems, with the aim

to describe a concurrent system fully enough to determine exactly what behaviour will be seen or experienced by an external observer. Thus the approach is thoroughly extensional; two systems are indistinguishable if we cannot tell them apart without pulling them apart. (Milner 1980: 2)

In addition, the roles of system and observer are symmetric, to such an extent that

we would like to represent the observer as a machine, then to represent the composite observer/machine as a machine, then to understand how this machine behaves for a new observer. (Milner 1980: 19)

While observational equivalence is blind to the inner details of a
computing agent but only observes the possible *interactions*
with its environment in which it takes part, denotational equivalence
takes as given the internal structure of a computing agent and, in a
compositional way, synthesizes its description from those of its
internal parts. The notion of full abstraction is precisely intended
to capture the coincidence of these dual perspectives:

**Definition 1.3** (Full abstraction). A denotational
semantics \({\mathcal{M}}\) is *fully abstract* with respect to
an operational semantics \({\mathcal{O}}\) if the induced equivalences
\({\simeq_{\mathcal{M}}}\) and \({\simeq_{\mathcal{O}}}\)
coincide.

As a tool for investigating program properties, full abstraction can
be seen as a *completeness* property of denotational semantics:
every equivalence of programs that can be proved operationally, can
also be proved by denotational means. Equivalently, a denotational
proof that two terms are not equivalent will be enough to show that
they are not interchangeable in every program context.

Full abstraction also functions as a criterion for assessing a
translation \(\vartheta\) from a language \({L}_1\) into a (not
necessarily different) language \({L}_2\), provided the two languages
have the same sets of observables, say *Obs* (Riecke 1993).
Then \(\vartheta\) is *fully abstract* if observational
equivalence (defined with respect to *Obs*) of \(e,e' \in
{L}_1\) is equivalent to observational equivalence of
\(\vartheta(e),\vartheta(e')\) in \({L}_2\). The existence of fully
abstract translation between languages can be used to compare their
expressive power, following a suggestion of (Mitchell 1993; Riecke
1993): \({L}_1\) is no more expressive than \({L}_2\) if there is a
fully abstract translation of \({L}_1\) into \({L}_2\).

Before going on in this general introduction to full abstraction and
related notions in the area of programming languages semantics, in
order to show the broad relevance of these notions, it is interesting
to observe that there is a very general setting in which it is
possible to study the full abstraction property, suggested by recent
investigations on compositionality in natural and artificial languages
by Hodges (2001) and others. In this setting, full abstraction is
connected to the problem of finding a compositional extension of a
semantic interpretation of a subset \(X\) of a language \(Y\) to an
interpretation of the whole language, via Frege’s *Context
Principle* (see Janssen 2001 on this), stating that the meaning of
an expression in \(Y\) is the contribution it makes to the meaning of
the expressions of \(X\) that contain it. In the original formulation
by Frege \(X\) was the set of sentences and \(Y\) the set of all
expressions, while in programming theory \(X\) is the set of programs,
\(Y\) the set of all program phrases.

A weakening of the definition of full abstraction represents an essential adequacy requirement for a denotational interpretation of a language:

**Definition 1.4** (Computational adequacy). A
denotational semantics \({\mathcal{M}}\) is *computationally
adequate* with respect to an operational semantics
\({\mathcal{O}}\) if, for all programs \(e\) and all values \(v\)
\[{\mathcal{O}}(e) = v \ \text{ if and only if } \ {\mathcal{M}}(e) = {\mathcal{M}}(v).\]

An equivalent formulation of computational adequacy allows to highlight its relation to full abstraction:

**Proposition 1.2.** Assume that \({\mathcal{M}}\) is a
compositional denotational interpretation such that \({\mathcal{O}}(e)
= v\) implies \({\mathcal{M}}(e) = {\mathcal{M}}(v)\). The following
two statements are equivalent:

- \({\mathcal{M}}\) is computationally adequate with respect to \({\mathcal{O}}\);
- for any two
*programs*\(e,e' \in {\texttt{Prog}}\), \[e \simeq_{\mathcal{M}} e' \ \text{ if and only if } \ e \simeq_{\mathcal{O}} e'\]

While the definition of the full abstraction *property* is
straightforward, fully abstract models for very natural examples of
programming languages have proved elusive, giving rise to a full
abstraction *problem*. In our discussion of full abstraction we
shall mainly concentrate on the full abstraction problem for the
language PCF (Programming language for Computable Functions, Plotkin
1977), a simply typed \(\lambda\)-calculus with arithmetic primitives
and a fixed-point combinator at all types proposed in Scott 1969b.
This language is important because it includes most of the programming
features semantic analysis has to cope with: higher-order functions,
types and recursion, with reduction rules that provide an abstract
setting for experimenting with several evaluation strategies.
Furthermore, PCF is also a model for other extensions of simply typed
\(\lambda\)-calculus used for experimenting with programming features,
like the Idealized Algol of Reynolds (1981). The efforts towards a
solution of the full abstraction problem for PCF contributed, as a
side effect, to the systematic development of a set of mathematical
techniques for semantical analysis whose usefulness goes beyond their
original applications. We shall describe some of them in
Section 2,
devoted to the semantic analysis of PCF based on partially ordered
structures, the *domains* introduced by Dana Scott (1970), that
we examine in
Section 2.3.
Technical developments in the theory of domains and also in the new
research area focussed on Girard’s *linear logic* (Girard
1987) have led to *game semantics* (Abramsky, Jagadeesan, &
Malacaria 2000; Hyland & Ong 2000), which is now regarded as a
viable alternative to standard denotational semantics based on
domains. It is to this approach that we shall dedicate
Section 3
trying to provide enough details to orient the reader in an extensive
and still growing literature documenting the applications of games to
the interpretation of a wide spectrum of programming language
features.

## 2. Sequential higher-order computation: the full abstraction problem for PCF

The full abstraction problem has proved especially hard for a version of simply typed \(\lambda\)-calculus with arithmetic primitives called PCF (Programming with Computable Functions) (Plotkin 1977), a toy programming language based on the Logic for Computable Functions of Scott (1969) and Milner (1973). In this section we introduce (a version of) the language with its operational and denotational semantics, and outline how the full abstraction problem arises for this language. The problem has been one of the major concerns of the theoretical investigation of programming languages for about two decades, from its original formulation in the landmark papers (Milner 1977; Plotkin 1977) to the first solutions proposed in 1993 (Abramsky et al. 2000; Hyland & Ong 2000) using game semantics, for which see Section 3.

### 2.1 Syntax of PCF

PCF is a language based on simply typed \(\lambda\)-calculus extended with arithmetic and boolean primitives, and its type system is defined accordingly:

**Definition 2.1** (PCF types). The set Types
of types of PCF is defined inductively
as follows

- the
*ground types*num (for terms representing natural numbers), bool (for terms representing boolean values) are types, - if \(\sigma, \tau\) are types, also \((\sigma \to \tau)\) is a type.

Parentheses will be omitted whenever possible, with the convention that they associate to the right, so that a type \(\sigma_1 \to \cdots \sigma_n \to \tau\) is equivalent to \((\sigma_1 \to (\sigma_2 \to (\cdots (\sigma_n \to \tau)\cdots)))\)

PCF terms are the terms of simply typed \(\lambda\)-calculus extended with the following arithmetic constants, of the indicated type:

- a constant \({0}\) of type \(\texttt{num}\), representing the natural number 0;
- a constant \(\texttt{succ}\) of type \(\texttt{num}\to \texttt{num}\) representing the successor function over natural numbers;
- a constant \(\texttt{pred}\) of type \(\texttt{num}\to \texttt{num}\) representing the predecessor function over natural numbers;
- constants \(\texttt{tt}\) and \(\texttt{ff}\) of type \(\texttt{bool}\);
- constants of type \(\texttt{bool}\to \texttt{num}\to \texttt{num}\to \texttt{num}\) and \(\texttt{bool}\to \texttt{bool}\to \texttt{bool}\to \texttt{bool}\) for conditionals of type num and of type bool, respectively: these are both written as \({\texttt{if }\cdot\texttt{ then }\cdot\texttt{ else }\cdot}\), and we let context make clear what is the intended type of the result;
- a constant \(\texttt{zero?}\) for the test for zero of type \(\texttt{num}\to \texttt{bool}\);
- a unary function symbol \({\mathtt{Y}(\cdot)}\) for the fixed point combinator, where \({\mathtt{Y}(e)}:\sigma\) for any \(e:\sigma \to \sigma\).

Terms are built inductively according to rules that allow to infer
*judgements* of the form \(B \vdash e : \sigma\), stating that
term \(e\) is of type \(\sigma\) under the assumption that the
variables occurring free in \(e\) are given unique types in a
*basis* \(B\) of the form
\[{\{ x_1:\sigma_1,\ldots,x_k:\sigma_k \}}.\]
The rule for building
PCF-terms are therefore inference rules for such judgements. In
particular there are rules for typed constants, for example in any
basis \(B\) there is a judgement \(B \vdash \texttt{zero?} :
\texttt{num}\to \texttt{bool}\), and we have rules for typed
\(\lambda\)-abstractions
\[\frac{B,x:\sigma \vdash e:\tau}{B \vdash {\lambda x:\sigma{\, . \,}e}:\sigma \to \tau}\]
and applications
\[\frac{B \vdash e_1 : \sigma \to \tau \qquad B \vdash e_2 : \sigma}{B \vdash e_1 e_2 : \tau}\]
and
a rule for the fixed-point operator:
\[\frac{B \vdash e:\sigma \to \sigma} {B \vdash {\mathtt{Y}(e)}:\sigma}.\]

### 2.2 Operational semantics

A PCF *program* is a closed term of ground type. We specify how
programs are to be executed by defining an evaluation relation \(e
\opDownarrow v\) between closed terms \(e\) and *values* \(v\),
where the values are the constants and abstractions of the form
\({\lambda x:\sigma{\, . \,}e}\). In particular, values of ground type
bool are \(\texttt{tt},\texttt{ff}\),
and values of the ground type num are
\({0}\) and all terms of the form
\[\mathtt{n} = \underbrace{\texttt{succ}(\ldots \texttt{succ}}_{n}({0}) \ldots ) .\]
Evaluation is defined
by cases according to the structure of terms, by means of inference
rules for judgements of the form \(e \opDownarrow v\). These rules
state how the result of the evaluation of a term depends on the result
of the evaluation of other terms, the only axioms having the form \(v
\opDownarrow v\) for every value \(v\). For example there is a rule
\[\frac{e \opDownarrow v}{{\texttt{succ }e} \opDownarrow {\texttt{succ }v}}\]
that states that, if the result of the evaluation of
\(e\) is \(v\), then the result of the evaluation of \({\texttt{succ
}e}\) is \({\texttt{succ } v}\). Similarly we can describe the
evaluation of the other constants. The evaluation of a term of the
form \(e_1\ e_2\) proceeds as follows: first \(e_1\) is evaluated; if
the evaluation terminates with value \(v'\), then the evaluation of
\(e_1\ e_2\) proceeds with the evaluation of \(v'\ e_2\); if this
terminates with value \(v\), this is the value of \(e_1\ e_2\),
formally
\[\frac{e_1 \opDownarrow v' \qquad v'\ e_2 \opDownarrow v}{e_1\ e_2 \opDownarrow v}\]
For a value of the form \({\lambda x:\sigma{\, .
\,}e_1}\), its application to a term \(e_2\) has the value (if any)
obtained by evaluating the term \(e_1[e_2/x]\) resulting by
substituting \(e_2\) to all free occurrences of \(x\) in \(e_1\):
\[\frac{e_1[e_2/x] \opDownarrow v}{({\lambda x:\sigma{\, . \,}e_1}) e_2 \opDownarrow v}.\]
These implement a *call-by-name* evaluation
strategy: in an application, the term in function position must be
evaluated completely before the term in argument position, which is
then passed as actual parameter. The fixed point combinator is
essential to the encoding of recursive definitions. Its evaluation is
described by the rule
\[\frac{e({\mathtt{Y}(e)}) \opDownarrow v}{{\mathtt{Y}(e)} \opDownarrow v}\]
which is the only rule whose
premiss involves the evaluation of a larger term than the one to be
evaluated: this is why the definition of the evaluation relation
cannot be reduced to structural induction.

We shall be especially interested in situations when the evaluation of
a term \(e\) does not have a value; in these case we say that \(e\)
*diverges*, and write \(e \opUparrow\). It is in the presence
of divergent terms that the causal structure of the evaluation process
is exposed. The initial example is in fact a term that diverges in a
very strong sense:

**Definition 2.2** (Undefined). For any ground type
\(\gamma\), define \(\Omega:\gamma\) as
\[{\mathtt{Y}({\lambda x:\gamma{\, . \,}x})}\]

By inspecting the evaluation rules we see that the only possible evaluation process gives rise to an infinite regress, therefore \(\Omega \opUparrow\).

We can define the usual boolean operations by means of the conditional
operator, as in the following examples:
\[\begin{align}
\tag{2} \texttt{and} &= {\lambda x:\texttt{bool}, y:\texttt{bool}{\, . \,}{\texttt{if }x\texttt{ then }y\texttt{ else }\texttt{ff}}}.
\label{etbivalente} \\
\tag{3} \texttt{or} &= {\lambda x:\texttt{bool}, y:\texttt{bool}{\, . \,}{\texttt{if }x\texttt{ then }\texttt{tt}\texttt{ else }y}}
\label{velbivalente}\end{align}\]
with the usual
truth tables. However, we have now to take into account the
possibility of divergence of the evaluation process, for example in a
term like \(\texttt{or}(\Omega,\texttt{tt})\), therefore we extend the
usual truth tables by adding a new boolean value, representing absence
of information, \(\bot\) (read as “undefined”) to
\(\texttt{tt}\) and \(\texttt{ff}\), as the value of the term
\(\Omega\). Here, the first argument to be evaluated is the one on the
left, and if the evaluation of this diverges then the whole evaluation
process diverges. Consider now an operator por
whose interpretation is given by the
table
\[\tag{4}\label{por}
\begin{array}{r|lll}
\texttt{por}& \textit{tt}& \textit{ff}&\bot \\\hline
\textit{tt}& \textit{tt}& \textit{tt}&\textit{tt}\\
\textit{ff}& \textit{tt}& \textit{ff}&\bot\\
\bot & \textit{tt}& \bot &\bot
\end{array}\]
In this case \(\texttt{por}(\texttt{tt},\Omega) =
\texttt{por}(\Omega,\texttt{tt}) = \texttt{tt}\): this is the
*parallel-or* which plays a central role in the full
abstraction problem for PCF. It will turn out that is is not definable
by any PCF term, precisely because of its parallel nature. In order to
carry out a semantical analysis of PCF, we need a theory of data types
with *partial elements* and of functions over them that support
an abstract form of recursive definition through fixed point
equations: this is what is achieved in Scott’s theory of
domains, the original mathematical foundation for denotational
semantics of programming languages as conceived by Strachey (1966,
1967).

### 2.3 Denotational semantics

#### 2.3.1 Types as domains

What are the general structural properties of a space of partial data?
The mathematical theory of computation elaborated by Dana Scott (1970)
is an answer to this question, that takes partially ordered sets
generically called *domains* as basic structures. The partial
order of a domain describes a qualitative notion of
“information” carried by the elements. In such a framework
it is natural to reify divergence by introducing a new element
\(\bot\) representing absence of information. When \(x \sqsubseteq y\)
in this partial order,

\(y\) is

consistent with\(x\) and is (possibly)more accurate than\(x [\ldots]\) thus \(x \sqsubseteq y\) means that \(x\) and \(y\) want to approximate the same entity, but \(y\) givesmoreinformation about it. This means we have to allow “incomplete” entities, like \(x\), containing only “partial” information. (Scott 1970: 171)

The resulting partially ordered sets should also have the property
that sequences of approximations, in particular infinite chains \(x_0
\sqsubseteq x_1 \sqsubseteq \ldots\) should converge to a
*limit* containing the information cumulatively provided by the
\(x_i\). The same structure is also exploited in Kleene’s proof
of the First Recursion Theorem in Kleene 1952 (secs. 66,
348–50), and will allow to define a notion of continuous
function in terms of preservation of limits.

**Definition 2.3** (Complete partial orders). A complete
partial order (cpo) is a partially ordered set \({\langle
D,\sqsubseteq \rangle}\) with a least element \(\bot\), and such that
every increasing chain \(x_0 \sqsubseteq x_1 \sqsubseteq \ldots\) of
elements of \(D\) has a least upper bound \(\bigsqcup_n x_n\).

Given any set \(X\), we write \(X_{\bot}\) for the set \(X \cup \{
\bot \}\) obtained by adding a new element \(\bot\). It is natural to
order the elements of \(X_{\bot}\) according to their amount of
information, by setting for \(x,y \in X_{\bot}\),
\[\begin{aligned}
x \sqsubseteq y &\Longleftrightarrow (x = \bot \ \text{ or } \ x = y).\end{aligned}\]
Partially ordered structures of the form \(X_\bot\) are called
*flat domains*, among which we have \(\texttt{bool}= {\{
{\textit{tt}},{\textit{ff}}\}}_\bot\) and \(\texttt{num}=
{\mathbb{N}}_\bot\), that will be used to interpret the ground types
of PCF.

A general requirement on domains is that every element be a limit of
its finite approximations, for a notion of finiteness (or
*compactness*) that can be formulated entirely in terms of the
partial order structure:

**Definition 2.4** (Finite elements of a cpo). If \(D\)
is a cpo, an element \(d \in D\) is *finite* if, for every
increasing chain \(x_0 \sqsubseteq x_1 \sqsubseteq \ldots\)
\[d \sqsubseteq \bigsqcup_n x_n \Longrightarrow \exists x_i\ \left(d \sqsubseteq x_i \right).\]
For \(d \in D\), the notation \(\mathcal{A}(d)\) denotes
the set of finite elements below \(d\); \(\mathcal{A}(D)\) is the set
of finite elements of \(D\). Finite elements are also called
*compact*.

Observe that finite subsets of a set \(X\) are exactly the finite elements of the complete lattice of subsets of \(X\). It is useful also to observe that this definition only partially matches our intuition: consider for example the finite element \(\infty + 1\) in the cpo \[0 \sqsubseteq 1 \sqsubseteq 2 \sqsubseteq \cdots \sqsubseteq \infty \sqsubseteq \infty + 1.\]

**Definition 2.5** (Algebraic cpo). A \(D\) is
*algebraic* if, for every \(d \in D\), there is an increasing
chain \(x_0 \sqsubseteq x_1 \sqsubseteq \ldots\) of finite
approximations of \(d\) such that
\[d = \bigsqcup_n x_n.\]
If \(D\) is algebraic,
we say that the finite elements form a *basis* of \(D\).

One last completeness assumption on algebraic cpo’s is needed in order to get a category of domains suitable for the interpretation of PCF:

**Definition 2.6**. Given a cpo \(D\), if \(X \subseteq
D\) has an upper bound we say that \(X\) is *consistent*, and
write \(\opuparrow X\), or \(x \opuparrow y\) when \(X = {\{ x,y
\}}\). \(D\) is *consistently complete* if every \(X \subseteq
D\) such that \(\opuparrow X\) has a least upper bound.

The following notion of domain that has proved extremely convenient as a framework for the denotational semantics of programming languages (Scott 1982):

**Definition 2.7** (Domain). A *domain* is a
consistently complete algebraic cpo with a countable basis.

#### 2.3.2 An abstract theory of computable functions of higher-types

How can we use the notion of information implicit in the ordering on
the elements of domains to develop an abstract notion of
computability? Clearly, a computable function should preserve
*monotonically* any increase of information on its inputs:
\(f(x) \sqsubseteq f(y)\) whenever \(x \sqsubseteq y\). In particular,
*strict* functions \(f : D \to E\) over flat domains, those for
which \(f(\bot_D) = \bot_E\), are monotonic.

Consider the domain \({\{ 0,1 \}}^\infty\) whose elements are finite and infinite sequences of bits \(0,1\), where \(u \sqsubseteq v\) if either \(u\) is infinite and \(u = v\), or \(u\) is finite and \(u\) is a prefix of \(v\). What properties should be true of a computable function taking as arguments an infinite sequence of bits \({\langle b_1,b_2,b_3,\ldots \rangle}\)? Take as an example the function \(\textit{search}:{\{ 0,1 \}}^\infty \to {\mathbb{B}}_\bot\) whose value is \({\textit{tt}}\) if, for \(u \in {\{ 0,1 \}}^\infty\), \(1\) occurs in \(u\) at least once, otherwise \(\bot\). Think of the sequence \({\langle b_1,b_2,b_3,\ldots \rangle}\) as given one element at a time: the initial segments obtained in this process are an increasing chain of finite elements of \({\{ 0,1 \}}^\infty\), \[{\langle \rangle} \sqsubseteq {\langle b_1 \rangle} \sqsubseteq {\langle b_1,b_2 \rangle} \sqsubseteq {\langle b_1,b_2,b_3 \rangle} \sqsubseteq \ldots\] having \({\langle b_1,b_2,b_3,\ldots \rangle}\) as a limit (i.e., least upper bound). By monotonicity we have a corresponding increasing chain of values \[\textit{search}({\langle \rangle}) \sqsubseteq \textit{search}({\langle b_1 \rangle}) \sqsubseteq \textit{search}({\langle b_1,b_2 \rangle}) \sqsubseteq \textit{search}({\langle b_1,b_2,b_3 \rangle}) \sqsubseteq \ldots\] If \(\textit{search}({\langle b_1,b_2,b_3,\ldots \rangle}) = {\textit{tt}}\), then there must be a finite initial segment \({\langle b_1,b_2,\ldots,b_n \rangle}\) for which \(\textit{search}({\langle b_1,b_2,\ldots,b_n \rangle}) = {\textit{tt}}\), and this will be the cumulative value of the function for the infinite sequence \({\langle b_1,b_2,b_3,\ldots \rangle}\). In general, a computable function \(f : D \to E\) should (be monotonic and) have the property that a finite amount of information on the output \(f(x)\) must be already obtainable by giving a finite amount of information on the input \(x\). This is equivalent to the notion of continuity originally introduced by Scott in his theory of computable functions over domains:

**Definition 2.8** (Continuous functions). If \({\langle
D,\sqsubseteq _D \rangle},{\langle E,\sqsubseteq _E \rangle}\) are
cpo’s and \(f : D \to E\) is monotonic, \(f\) is
*continuous* if
\[f(\bigsqcup_i x_i) = \bigsqcup_i f(x_i)\]
for every increasing chain \(x_0
\sqsubseteq x_1 \sqsubseteq \ldots \subseteq D\).

From the point of view of denotational semantics, a fundamental property of continuous functions \(D \to D\) is that they admit a least fixed point, whose construction can be carried out uniformly and continuously:

**Theorem 2.1** (The Fixed Point Theorem for continuous
functions) Let \(f : D \to D\) be a continuous function and \(x \in
D\) be such that \(x \sqsubseteq f(x)\). Then the element
\[\bigsqcup_{n \in {\mathbb{N}}} f^{(n)}(x)\]
is the least \(y \sqsupseteq x\) such that \(f(y) = y\).

**Definition 2.9**. The least fixed point of a continuous
\(f : D \to D\) is the element of \(D\) defined by
\[{\texttt{fix}(f)} =_{\textrm{def}} \bigsqcup_{n \in {\mathbb{N}}} f^{(n)}(\bot).\]

The continuous functions from \(D\) to \(E\), for cpo’s
\({\langle D,\sqsubseteq _D \rangle}\) e \({\langle E,\sqsubseteq _E
\rangle}\), form a cpo \([D \to E]\), ordered pointwise by setting,
for \(f,g:D \to E\):
\[f \sqsubseteq g \Longleftrightarrow \forall d \in D. f(d) \sqsubseteq _E g(d).\]
\([D \to E]\) is a domain if \(D\)
and \(E\) are, and \({\texttt{fix}(\cdot)}:[D \to D] \to D\) is
continuous. A further construction on cpo’s which also extends
to domains and is very frequently used is *cartesian product*:
given cpo’s \(D,E\), their cartesian product is defined as the
set \(D \times E\) of pairs \({\langle d,e \rangle}\) where \(d \in
D\) and \(e \in E\), ordered pointwise: \({\langle d,e \rangle}
\sqsubseteq {\langle d',e' \rangle}\) if and only if \(d \sqsubseteq
_D d'\) and \(e \sqsubseteq _E e'\). We can summarize these
constructions in categorical language (Plotkin 1978, Other Internet
Resources), saying that the category whose objects are domains and
whose morphisms are the continuous functions is *cartesian
closed*.

#### 2.3.3 Continuous semantics for PCF

The *standard interpretation* of PCF consists of a family of
cpos \(D^\sigma\), for each type \(\sigma\), where \(D^\texttt{num}=
{\mathbb{N}}_{\bot}\) and \(D^\texttt{bool}= {\mathbb{B}}_{\bot}\),
\(D^{\sigma \to \tau} = [D^\sigma \to D^\tau]\) and the PCF constants
have the natural interpretation as strict continuous functions of the
appropriate type, for example \(\texttt{cond}: {\mathbb{B}}_{\bot} \to
{\mathbb{N}}_{\bot} \to {\mathbb{N}}_{\bot} \to {\mathbb{N}}_{\bot}\)
is interpreted as:
\[\textit{cond}(b)(x)(y) = \left\{ \begin{array}{ll}
x&\text{if \(b = \texttt{tt}\)}\\
y &\text{if \(b = \texttt{ff}\)}\\
\bot &\text{if \(b = \bot\),}
\end{array}
\right.\]
Furthermore, the operator
\({\mathtt{Y}(\cdot)}\) is interpreted as the continuous functional
\({\texttt{fix}(\cdot)}\) at the appropriate type. This is the
interpretation considered in Scott 1969b) and Milner 1973.

The possibility that \(e\) may contain free occurrences of variables
(whose types are given by a basis \(B\)) slightly complicates the
interpretation of terms, making it depend on a further parameter, an
*environment* \(\rho\) mapping each free variable \(x:\tau\) of
\(e\) to an element of \(D^\tau\) (if the latter condition is
satisfied, we say that \(\rho\) *respects* \(B\)). Of course,
the environment is irrelevant when \(e\) is closed.

The standard interpretation of PCF terms \(e:\sigma\) (from a basis
\(B\)) is then an element \({\lll e\rll \rho} \in D^\sigma\), for any
environment \(\rho\) such that \(\rho\) respects \(B\), built by
structural induction on terms, interpreting application as function
application and \(\lambda\)-abstractions by (continuous) functions.
More generally, an interpretation is *continuous* if every
\(D^\sigma\) is a cpo and \(D^{\sigma \to \tau}\) consists of
continuous functions \(D^\sigma \to D^\tau\).

A *model* of PCF is an interpretation that satisfies the
expected identities between terms of the same type. We shall omit the
details of the general characterization of models of PCF, for which
the reader is referred to Ong (1995: sec. 3.2) and Berry, Curien,
& Lévy (1985: sec. 4), but just to point out an example of
what must be taken into account when such a generality is needed, in
order to admit interpretations where the elements at function types
are not, strictly speaking, functions, we have to assume a family of
*application* operations
\[\cdot_{\sigma\tau}: D^{\sigma \to \tau} \times D^\sigma \to D^\tau\]
so that, if \(B \vdash
e_1 : \sigma \to \tau\) and \(B \vdash e_2 ; \sigma\), \({\lll
e_1e_2\rll \rho} = {\lll e_1\rll \rho} \cdot_{\sigma\tau} {\lll
e_2\rll \rho} \in {{{D}^{\tau}}}\). A model is
*order-extensional* if, for all elements \(f,g \in
{{{D}^{\sigma \to \tau}}}\), \(f \sqsubseteq g\) if and only if \(f
\cdot x \sqsubseteq g \cdot x\) for all \(x \in {{{D}^{\sigma}}}\). A
model is *extensional* if, for all elements \(f,g \in
{{{D}^{\sigma \to \tau}}}\), \(f = g\) if and only if \(f \cdot x = g
\cdot x\) for all \(x \in {{{D}^{\sigma}}}\). An element \(d \in
D^\sigma\) of a model is *definable* is there is a closed terms
\(e:\sigma\) such that \(d = {\lll e\rll }\).

### 2.4 Relating operational and denotational semantics

The general setting for discussing full abstraction requires that we introduce the following notions:

**Definition 2.11** (Observational preorder and
equivalence) Given PCF terms \(e\) and \(e'\) of the same type
\(\sigma\), we write \(e \precsim_{\textrm{obs}} e'\) (read *\(e\)
is observationally less defined than \(e'\)*) if, for every
program context \(C\blbr\) with a hole of type \(\sigma\) and any
value \(v\),
\[C[e] \opDownarrow v \ \text{ implies that } \ C[e'] \opDownarrow v.\]
We say that \(e\) and \(e'\) are
*observationally equivalent*, and write \(e
\simeq_{\textrm{obs}} e'\), if \(e \precsim_{\textrm{obs}} e'\) and
\(e' \precsim_{\textrm{obs}} e\).

Observational equivalence is a congruence. Another congruence on PCF terms is given by equality of denotations in a model:

**Definition 2.11** (Denotational preorder and
equivalence). Given PCF terms \(e\) and \(e'\) of the same type
\(\sigma\) relative to a basis \(B\), we write \(e
\precsim_{\textrm{den}} e'\) if \({\lll e\rll \rho} \sqsubseteq {{\lll
e'\rll} \rho}\) for all environments \(\rho\) respecting \(B\). We
write \(e \simeq_{\textrm{den}} e'\) if \(e \precsim_{\textrm{den}}
e'\) and \(e' \precsim_{\textrm{den}} e\) .

**Proposition 2.1** (Computational adequacy for PCF). The
following two statements hold for the standard model of PCF, and are
equivalent:

- For any two PCF terms of the same ground type \(e,e'\), \(e \simeq_{\textrm{den}} e'\) implies \(e \simeq_{\textrm{obs}} e'\);
- For any closed PCF term \(e\) of ground type and any value \(v\) of that type, \({\lll e\rll } = {\lll v\rll }\) if and only if \(e \opDownarrow v\);

We can now justify our intuitive interpretation of \(\bot\) in the standard model, where ground types are interpreted as flat domains:

**Corollary 2.1.** For any closed PCF term \(e\) of
ground type, \(e \opUparrow\) if and only if \({\lll e\rll } =
\bot\).

In Section 1.3 we have already defined a very general notion of (equational) full abstraction, based on synonymy, i.e., equality of interpretation of terms. In the case PCF, whose intended models are partially ordered at all types, we can define a stronger property:

**Definition 2.12** (Inequational full abstraction). A
continuous model \({\langle {\{ {{{D}^{\sigma}}} \mid \sigma \in
\texttt{Types}}\},{\lll \cdot\rll \cdot} \rangle}\) of PCF is
*inequationally fully abstract* if, for closed terms \(e,e'\),
\(e \precsim_{\textrm{obs}} e'\) implies \({\lll e\rll } \sqsubseteq
{\lll e'\rll }\).

Definability is the key to full abstraction, as shown by the following important result of Milner and Plotkin:

**Theorem 2.2.** A continuous, order-extensional model of
PCF is fully abstract if and only if for every type \(\sigma\),
\({{{D}^{\sigma}}}\) is a domain whose finite elements are
definable.

We turn now to the failure of the full abstraction property for the standard model of PCF, as shown by Plotkin in his classic study (Plotkin 1977):

**Proposition 2.2.** The standard model of PCF is not
fully abstract with respect to call-by-name evaluation.

The proof is based on the observation that we can build PCF terms of type \((\texttt{bool}\to \texttt{bool}\to \texttt{bool}) \to \texttt{num}\) that recognize the parallel-or function. Specifically, consider the “test” terms \(T_i\) defined as follows, where \(i = {0},1\):

Then, \({\mathcal{D}\lll T_{0}\rll}\ \texttt{por} = {0}\neq 1 = {\mathcal{D}\lll T_1 \rll }\ \texttt{por} \), where por is defined by table \((\ref{por})\), so \(T_{0} {\simeq_{\textrm{den}}}T_1\) does not hold. However, no program context in PCF can separate \(T_{0}\) and \(T_1\) because por is not definable. This can be shown by characterizing in a combinatorial way the relations of dependence induced by the evaluation process of a program among the evaluation processes of its (sub)terms, as Plotkin does in the Activity Lemma (Plotkin 1977: Lemma 4.2). As an alternative, it is possible to build a computationally adequate models of PCF whose functions enjoy a weak sequentiality property (that we discuss below, in Section 2.5.1) and where, therefore, the function por is ruled out: a complete formal proof along these lines is given in Gunter 1992 (sec. 6.1).

One option to solve the full abstraction problem is to extend the language: a remarkable result of Plotkin (1977) shows that adding parallel-or is enough:

**Proposition 2.3.** The standard model is fully abstract
for the language PCF extended with parallel-or.

Milner (1977) has shown that there is a fully abstract model of PCF, by taking the set of closed terms at each type \(\sigma\) identifying observationally equivalent terms and by completing the resulting partially ordered set turning it into a cpo.

**Corollary 2.2.** There is a unique continuous, order
extensional, inequationally fully abstract model of PCF, up to
isomorphism.

The full abstraction problem for PCF consists in finding a direct description of the class of domains and continuous functions that make up the fully abstract model. A solution to this problem would require a precise criterion for assessing the extent to which a proposed description of the model is satisfactory. If one accepts the “precise minimal condition that a semantic solution of the full abstraction problem should satisfy” given by Jung & Stoughton (1993), namely the possibility of describing in an effective way the domains \(D^\sigma\) of a finitary version of PCF (whose only ground type is bool), then the story of failed attempts to give such a direct description of the fully abstract model is justified, with hindsight, by a result of Loader (2001):

**Theorem 2.3.** Observational equivalence for finitary
PCF is not decidable.

It is still possible, however, that one could find a direct
description of an *intensionally* fully abstract model
(Abramsky et al. 2000: 411):

**Definition 2.13** (Intensional full abstraction). A
model of PCF is *intensionally fully abstract* if every
\(D^\sigma\) is algebraic and all its compact elements are
definable.

Pursuing this line of development of the full abstraction problem leads us to game semantics, which will be the topic of the next Section. Before that, we outline the main attempts to reduce the model by means of a semantical characterization of higher-order sequential computation.

### 2.5 Towards a sequential semantics

The reason for the failure of full abstraction of the continuous
semantics of PCF is the existence of functions whose evaluation
requires parallel computation. We describe now some proposals for
characterizing *sequentiality* of functions by means of
properties related to the structure of the domains on which they are
defined. This has been an area of intensive research toward the
solution of the full abstraction problem for PCF, and some of the
insights that emerged from it lead very naturally to the game models
discussed in
Section 3.
In addition, the following summary of attempts at a characterization
of sequentiality is also a very interesting demonstration of the
expressive power of the language of partial order in the semantic
analysis of programming concepts.

Intuitively, a sequential function is one whose evaluation proceeds
serially: this means that it is possible to schedule the evaluation of
its arguments so that the evaluation of the function terminates with
the correct value; if the evaluation of one of them diverges, the
whole evaluation diverges. At each stage of this process there is an
argument whose value is needed to obtain more information on the
output of the function. In order to account for this causal structure
of computations at the semantical level, we need to enrich the domain
structure so that the order on the elements reflect the happening of
computational *events* and their causal order. This suggests
another way of interpreting the abstract notion of information that
motivated the axioms of a cpo in
Section 2.3.1.
Now,

information has to do with (occurrences of) events: namely the information that those events occurred. For example in the case of \({\mathbb{N}}_{\bot}\), \(\bot\) might mean that no event occurred and an integer \(n\), might mean that the event occurred of the integer \(n\) being output (or, in another circumstance being input). (Plotkin 1978, Other Internet Resources)

#### 2.5.1 Stability

One interpretation of events regards them as the production of values
in the evaluation of an expression. This interpretation originates in
the context of bottom-up computation of recursive programs developed
by Berry (1976), where a recursive definition is translated into a
graph displaying the dependence of results of an expression on results
of its subexpressions. This context naturally suggests the notion of
*producer* of an event \(x\), as a set of events that must have
happened in order that \(x\) may happen. Reformulating this
observation in the language of partial orders, Berry (1976)
defined:

**Definition 2.14** (Stability). Let \(D_1,\ldots,D_n,
D\) be flat cpo’s and \(f: D_1\times \ldots \times D_n \to D\)
monotonic (hence continuous). Then \(f\) is *stable* if for
every \(\vec{x} = {\langle x_1,\ldots,x_n \rangle} \in D_1\times
\ldots \times D_n\) there is a unique minimal element \(m(f,x)
\sqsubseteq \vec{x}\) such that \(f(m(f,\vec{x})) = f(\vec{x})\).

Clearly, the parallel-or function is not stable: the value
\(\texttt{por}(\bot,{\textit{tt}}) = {\textit{tt}}=
\texttt{por}({\textit{tt}},\bot)\) has no minimal producer. A
remarkable property of stable functions is that they allow to build a
new model of PCF, where \({{{D}^{\sigma \to \tau}}}\) is the set of
stable functions on the domains that interpret the types \(\sigma\)
and \(\tau\), which are refinements of Scott domains called
*dI-domains* (Berry 1978). From our point of view, the
important outcome of these definitions is the following adequacy
result (Gunter 1992: chap. 6):

**Proposition 2.4.** The interpretation of PCF terms as
elements of dI-domains, where \(D^{\sigma \to \tau}\) is the dI-domain
of stable functions from \(D^\sigma\) to \(D^\tau\) with the stable
order, is a computationally adequate model of PCF.

This result completes the argument showing the failure of full abstraction for the continuous model of PCF at the end of Section 2.4, if the informal notion of sequentiality used there is formalized as stability. The stable model of PCF has recently been shown to be fully abstract for an extension of PCF (Paolini 2006).

#### 2.5.2 Sequential functions

The first definitions of sequentiality, due to Vuillemin (1974) and
Milner (1977) stated that an \(n\)-ary functions \(f\) over flat
domains is *sequential at argument \({\langle x_1,\ldots,x_n
\rangle}\)* if there is a *sequentiality index* \(i\) of
\(f\), depending on \({\langle x_1,\ldots,x_n \rangle}\), such that
every increase in the output information must increase the information
at argument \(i\). For example, the function \(\texttt{cond} :
{\mathbb{B}}_{\bot} \times {\mathbb{N}}_{\bot} \times
{\mathbb{N}}_{\bot} \to {\mathbb{N}}_{\bot}\) is sequential in this
sense at any input tuple. In fact, its sequentiality index at
\({\langle \bot,m,n \rangle}\) is 1; its sequentiality index at
\({\langle {\textit{tt}},m,n \rangle}\) is 2, and its sequentiality
index at \({\langle {\textit{ff}},m,n \rangle}\) is 3. There is
however no sequentiality index for the function \(\texttt{por} :
{\mathbb{B}}_{\bot} \times {\mathbb{B}}_{\bot} \to
{\mathbb{B}}_{\bot}\) at the input \({\langle \bot,\bot
\rangle}\).

While all sequential functions (over flat domains) are stable, sequentiality is strictly stronger than stability. For example, the continuous function from \({\mathbb{B}}_\bot \times {\mathbb{B}}_\bot \times {\mathbb{B}}_\bot\) to \({\mathbb{B}}_\bot\) defined as the smallest continuous extension of the three assignments \[{\langle {\textit{tt}},{\textit{ff}},\bot \rangle} \mapsto {\textit{tt}}, {\langle {\textit{ff}},\bot,{\textit{tt}}\rangle} \mapsto {\textit{tt}}, {\langle \bot,{\textit{tt}},{\textit{ff}}\rangle} \mapsto {\textit{tt}}.\] has no sequentiality index at the argument \({\langle \bot,\bot,\bot \rangle}\), but is stable because the arguments \({\langle {\textit{tt}},{\textit{ff}},\bot \rangle},{\langle {\textit{ff}},\bot,{\textit{tt}}\rangle},{\langle \bot,{\textit{tt}},{\textit{ff}}\rangle}\) are pairwise inconsistent.

The following result adds support to the search for a semantical characterizations of sequentiality:

**Proposition 2.5.** Let \(f : D_1 \times \cdots \times
D_n \to D\) be a continuous function, where \(D_i,D\) are either
\({\mathbb{N}}_\bot\) or \({\mathbb{B}}_\bot\). Then \(f\) is
sequential if and only if it is definable in PCF.

#### 2.5.3 Concrete data structures and sequential algorithms

If the domains needed for an adequate definition of sequentiality are
to describe the causality relations among occurrences of computational
events, then it is necessary to enrich our picture by considering
events as located at *places*, generalizing the notion of
argument place in the definitions of Vuillemin and Milner which
depends on how a function is presented. This led to a notion of
*concrete data structure* (cds) (Kahn & Plotkin 1993) and
to an axiomatization of the order-theoretic properties of domains of
first-order data. Kahn and Plotkin obtained a representation theorem
for the domains described by their axioms, the *concrete
domains*, in terms of the *states* of a process of
exploration of a concrete data structure that consists in filling,
given a state \(x\), any cell enabled by sets of events that have
already happened in \(x\), starting from *initial* cells
enabled in the initial, empty state: this is similar to proving
theorems in an abstract deductive system whose rules are the
enablings. As a motivating example, think of a linked list of, say,
natural numbers. The initial cell may be filled at any time with any
value \(n_1\). This event enables the second cell of the list, which
may then (and only then) be filled with any value \(n_2\), and so on
for all later cells.

Observe that the framework of concrete data structures gives the
necessary notions to reconstruct a semantical version of
sequentiality. Roughly, a monotonic function \(f\) from states of
\(M\) to states of \(M'\) is *sequential* (at state \(x\)) if,
for any output cell \(c'\), there is an input cell \(c\) that must be
filled in any transition from \(x\) to \(y\) such that the transition
from \(f(x)\) to \(f(y)\) fills \(c'\) (if such a \(c'\) does exist)
(Curien 1986: Def. 2.4.5). The cell \(c\) is the
*sequentiality index* for \(f\) at \(x\) for \(c'\).

The category whose objects are the concrete data structures and whose
morphisms are the sequential functions just defined is, however, not
cartesian closed, not unexpectedly. This observation (for a simple
proof, see Amadio & Curien 1998 (theorem 14.1.12)) prevents the
use of this category as a model of PCF. However, it is possible to
define for every two concrete data structures \(M,M'\) a new one \(M
\to M'\) whose states represent *sequential algorithms* and
which is the exponential object of \(M\) and \(M'\) in a cartesian
closed category whose morphisms are sequential algorithms (Curien
1986: sec. 2.5). The generalizations of the model theory of PCF to
categorical models allows us to obtain a model of PCF from this new
category, even though its morphisms are not functions in the usual
set-theoretic sense. It turns out that the sequential algorithm model
is not extensional, because there are distinct PCF terms that denote
the same continuous function yet represent distinct algorithms. As an
example, consider the following two terms, that denote the same
function but different algorithms:
\[\begin{aligned}
\texttt{lror}(x,y) &= \texttt{if }x\texttt{ then }({\texttt{if }y\texttt{ then }\texttt{tt} \texttt{ else }x}) \\
&\quad \texttt{ else }({\texttt{if }y\texttt{ then }\texttt{tt}\texttt{ else }\texttt{ff}}) \\
\texttt{rlor}(x,y) &= \texttt{if }y\texttt{ then }({\texttt{if }x\texttt{ then }\texttt{tt}\texttt{ else }y})\\
&\quad \texttt{ else }({\texttt{if } x\texttt{ then }\texttt{tt}\texttt{ else }\texttt{ff}}).
\end{aligned}\]
By suitably
introducing error values \(\textit{error}_1,\textit{error}_2\) in the
semantics, and enforcing an error-propagation property of the
interpretations of terms (thus enlarging the observables of the
language), the *functions* corresponding to the above terms can
then be distinguished: clearly, for the interpreting functions
\(\textit{lror}\) and \(\textit{rlor}\) we have
\[\begin{aligned}
\textit{lror}(\textit{error}_1,\textit{error}_2) &= \textit{error}_1 &\textit{rlor}(\textit{error}_1,\textit{error}_2) &= \textit{error}_2\end{aligned}\]
which
also points to the possibility of proving full abstraction of this
(non-standard) extensional model with respect to an extension of PCF
with control operators (Cartwright, Curien, & Felleisen 1994).

Before leaving this overview of the quest for an extensional
characterization of higher-order sequentiality, we should mention
Bucciarelli & Ehrhard (1994) who introduced a refinement of the
dI-domains of Berry supporting a notion of *strongly stable
function* which allows them to build an extensional model of PCF,
which is not fully abstract. The reason for the failure of full
abstraction in this case depends on the fact that PCF-definable
functionals satisfy extensionality properties that fail when functions
are ordered by the stable order. This was also the reason that
motivated the introduction of *bidomains* (Berry 1978), where
the stable and extensional (= pointwise) orderings of functions
coexist.

### 2.6 Historical notes and further readings

The problem of full abstraction has been anticipated in a large amount of work on the relations between the denotational and operational interpretations of programming languages. In particular, the pioneering work on the semantics of recursive programs carried out in Stanford in the early 1970s by a group of people gathering around Zohar Manna, and including Jean Marie Cadiou, Robin Milner and Jean Vuillemin, also interacting with Gilles Kahn.

A related tradition was also quite influential on the background of the full abstraction problem, namely the characterizations of semantical notions like continuity and sequentiality inside syntactic models of the (untyped) \(\lambda\)-calculus based on Böhm trees (Barendregt 1984), mainly due to Lévy and Berry (see Berry et al. 1985 and Curien 1992) for accounts of the search for fully abstract models of PCF along this line).

The basic papers on full abstraction for PCF are Milner 1977; Plotkin 1977. They can be read together as giving a coherent picture of the semantic analysis of this language. An independent approach to full abstraction came from the Russian logician Vladimir Sazonov who characterized definability in PCF in terms of a certain class of sequential computational strategies (Sazonov 1975, 1976). His work, however, had no direct influence on the bulk of research on the full abstraction problem, and only recently there have been attempts to relate Sazonov’s characterization to the game theoretic approaches (Sazonov 2007).

Another, completely different approach to full abstraction, exploits
special kinds of *logical relations* in order to isolate
quotients of the continuous model. The first use of logical relations
in the context of the problem of full abstraction is Mulmuley 1987,
but the resulting construction of a fully abstract model is obtained
by brute force and therefore is not what the full abstraction problem
searches for. Later, Sieber (1992) and O’Hearn & Riecke
(1995) have employed refinements of this technique to gain a better
insight into the structure of the fully abstract models,
characterizing the definable elements of the standard continuous model
by means of invariance under special logical relations cutting out the
non-sequential functions.

Detailed accounts of the full abstraction problem for PCF can be found in Gunter 1992 (chaps 5,6), Streicher 2006, Ong 1995, Stoughton 1988 and Amadio & Curien 1998 (chaps 6, 12, 14), in approximately increasing order of technical complexity. The emphasis on the recursion-theoretic aspects of PCF and its full abstraction problem are dealt with in detail in the textbook (Longley & Normann 2015: chaps 6, 7); a shorter account can be found in Longley 2001 (sec. 4).

## 3. Game semantics

### 3.1 Full completeness

Theorem 2.2
highlights the fundamental role of definability of finite elements in
the fully abstract model of PCF, an aspect that has been stressed in
Curien 2007. As a smooth transition to the formalisms based on games,
and partly following the historical development of the subject, we
pause shortly to examine another aspect of definability that arises at
the border between computation and the proof theory of constructive
logical systems. It has been a remarkable discovery that the structure
of natural deduction proofs for, say, the implicative fragment of
intuitionistic propositional calculus is completely described by terms
of the simply typed \(\lambda\)-calculus, where a provable
propositional formula of the form \(\sigma \to \tau\) is read as the
type of the terms representing its proofs. This is the
*propositions-as-types correspondence*, to be attributed to
Curry, de Bruijn, Scott, Läuchli, Lawvere and Howard, which
extends to much richer formal systems (for a history of this
correspondence see Cardone & Hindley 2009: sec. 8.1.4).

The existence of this correspondence makes it possible to speak of a
*semantics of proofs*, that extends to constructive formal
proofs the denotational interpretations of typed \(\lambda\)-calculi,
and in this context it also makes sense to ask whether an element
\(x\) of some \(D^\sigma\) in a model of a typed \(\lambda\)-calculus
is the interpretation of some proof of formula \(\sigma\). A further
question asks whether *every* element of \(D^\sigma\)
satisfying a suitably chosen property is the interpretation of a proof
of formula \(\sigma\). Suitable properties may be for example
invariance under logical relations, suitably defined over each
\(D^\sigma\), like in several results of Plotkin, Statman and others
summarized in Barendregt, Dekkers, & Statman 2013 (I.3, I.4). We
can read the latter question as asking for a strong form of
completeness for that system called *full completeness*
(Abramsky & Jagadeesan 1994), whose definition can be better
understood in a categorical semantics of systems of constructive
logic. It is common to interpret formulas \(A\) of such systems as
objects \({\lll A \rll }\) of suitable categories \(\mathbb{M}\), and
proofs \(p\) of sequents \(A \vdash B\) as morphisms \(\lll p \rll :
\lll A \rll \longrightarrow \lll B \rll\). While ordinary completeness
states that for every valid sequent \(A \vdash B\) the set
\(\mathbb{M}({\lll A \rll },{\lll B \rll })\) of morphisms is not
empty, in the present setting full completeness expresses the stronger
requirement that every morphism \(f: \lll A \rll \longrightarrow \lll
B \rll\) in a semantical category \(\mathbb{M}\) arises as the
interpretation of some proof, i.e., \(f = {\lll p \rll }\) for some
proof \(p\) of the sequent \(A \vdash B\). Full completeness results
have been proved for several subsystems of linear logic Girard (1987),
see Abramsky (2000) for a general framework. Furthermore, it has also
suggested techniques for achieving the definition of models of PCF
enjoying the strong definability property required by intensional full
abstraction.

### 3.2 Interaction

In our description of the refinements to the continuous model of PCF
in order to guarantee the definability of finite elements at each
type, we have progressively come closer to an interactive explanation
of computation. For example, the action of a sequential algorithm \(M
\to M'\) (Curien 1986: sec. 3.4) exploits an external calling agent
which triggers a cycle of requests and responses on input cells
leading (possibly) to the emission of an output value. That
interaction should be a central notion in the analysis of computation,
especially in relation to full abstraction, is perhaps a natural
outcome of the observational stance taken in the definition of
operational equivalence. Our short account of game semantics starts
precisely from an analysis of a general notion of *interaction*
as a motivation to a first formalization of games which is however
rich enough to provide a universe for the interpretation of a
restricted set of types and terms. Later we shall add to this
definition of game and strategies the features needed to express the
constraints that allow strategies to characterize precisely
higher-order, sequential computations, which is the aim set for
denotational semantics by the full abstraction problem. The present
account of the conceptual background of game semantics owes much to
the work of Abramsky and Curien (Abramsky 1994, 1996, 1997; Curien
2003a).

The relevant notion of interaction has been isolated as the result of
contributions that come from widely different research areas
intensively investigated only in relatively recent years, notably
linear logic (Girard 1987) and the theory of concurrent processes. It
is in these areas that a notion of *composition as interaction*
of *modules* takes shape. We give here just a simple example
where the composition of modules in the form of “parallel
composition + hiding” is found in nature, in order to connect it
with the origin of this idea in the semantics of concurrent processes
developed by Hoare (1985), and also to afford a first glimpse into a
simplified game formalism.

Consider a module \(S\) with four channels labeled \(a_\textrm{in},a_\textrm{out},r_\textrm{in},r_\textrm{out}\). The module is intended to return on channel \(a_\textrm{out}\) the successor of the number \(n\) incoming through channel \(a_\textrm{in}\), therefore its behavior can be specified as follows:

- \(S\) receives an input signal \(\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in}\) on channel \(r_\textrm{in}\), then
- emits a signal \(\mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}\) on channel \(r_\textrm{out}\), and
- waits for a value \(n\) on channel \(a_\textrm{in}\) and then, after receiving it,
- emits a value \(n+1\) on channel \(a_\textrm{out}\).

(This pattern of interaction is formally identical to the
*handshake protocol* which is used in hardware design to
synchronize components in order to avoid hazards caused by
interference of signals.) This behavior can be mapped on the channels
as follows:

Figure 1: A module for the successor function.

where \(\circ\) means input or, more generally, a *passive*
involvement of the module in the corresponding action, whereas
\(\bullet\) means output, or *active* involvement in the
action. We can describe the behavior of \(S\) using *traces*
(Hoare 1985), i.e., finite sequences of symbols from the infinite
alphabet \( \alpha S = {\{
\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in},\mathbf{?}_\textrm{out},n_\textrm{in},m_\textrm{out}
\}}: \)
\[\tau S = {\{ \varepsilon,\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in},\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out} n_\textrm{in},\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out} n_\textrm{in} n+1_\textrm{out},\ldots \}}\]
If we consider another instance \(S'\) of \(S\)
with alphabet \( \alpha S' = {\{
\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in}',\mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}',n_\textrm{in}',m_\textrm{out}'
\}} \) we can compose \(S\) and \(S'\) by identifying (= connecting)
channels \(r_\textrm{out},r_\textrm{in}'\), and \(a_\textrm{in} ,
a_\textrm{out}'\), and the signals passing through them, as shown:
\[\begin{aligned}
\mathbf{?}_\textrm{out} , \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in}' &\leadsto x\\
n+1_\textrm{in} , n+1_\textrm{out}' &\leadsto y\end{aligned}\]
This represents the parallel composition of the modules,
\(S \| S'\):

Figure 2

The behavior of the compound module is described by the set of traces \[{\{ \varepsilon, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in}, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} x, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} x \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}', \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} x \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}' n_\textrm{in}', \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} x \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}' n_\textrm{in}' y, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} x \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}' n_\textrm{in}' y n+2_\textrm{out}, \ldots \}}\] The symbols \(x,y\) can now be hidden, representing the behavior of the final system

Figure 3

whose traces have the required form \[{\{ \varepsilon, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in}, \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}', \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}' n_\textrm{in}', \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}' n_\textrm{in}' n+2_\textrm{out}, \ldots \}}.\] This example contains many of the ingredients on which game semantics is based. There is the idea of a System, whose behavior is triggered by an incoming request from its Environment: in a game formalism these are the roles of Proponent and Opponent in a two-person game. The behavior of each module is described as the trace of its possible interactions with other agents, and the behaviors can be composed by a peculiar change of role whereby the module who plays as System (in the above example, \(S\) emitting a request signal on channel \(r_\textrm{out}\)) is made to behave as Environment with respect to \(S'\) when this signal is received in input on channel \(r_\textrm{in}'\). Let us see how this example can be generalized.

### 3.3 Games and strategies

We only give the definitions needed to understand the basic constructions on games and to see how these form a category, following Abramsky 1997 and Hyland 1997 that contain more formal details and proofs.

#### 3.3.1 Games

**Definition 3.1** A *game* \(G\) is specified by
giving a set of *moves* \(M_G\), a *labeling* \(\ell_G\)
of the moves as either moves of the *Proponent* (\(P\)) or as
moves of the *Opponent* (\(O\)). Furthermore, there is a set of
*positions* \(P_G\) which is a set of sequences of moves where:
(1) the two players alternate, starting with \(O\); (2) if \(s \in
P_G\) then every prefix \(s'\) of \(s\) is also in \(P_G\).

As an example, consider a game associated with the data-type of Boolean values, \(G_\texttt{bool}\). There are three possible moves,

- an \(O\)-move \(?_\texttt{bool}\) and
- two \(P\)-moves \(\textit{tt}, \textit{ff}\)

(i.e., \(\ell_\texttt{bool}(?_\texttt{bool}) = O, \ell_\texttt{bool}({\textit{tt}}) = \ell_\texttt{bool}({\textit{ff}}) = P\)). The positions in this game are \[?_{\texttt{bool}}, ?_{\texttt{bool}} \texttt{tt}, ?_{\texttt{bool}} \texttt{ff}:\] think of \(?_\texttt{bool}\) as a cell (as in a concrete data structure) which can be filled by one of the two values \({\textit{tt}}\) and \({\textit{ff}}\), or as a question by the Opponent that admits as answers by the Proponent either \({\textit{tt}}\) or \({\textit{ff}}\). Similarly we can describe a game \(G_\texttt{num}\) with an \(O\)-move \(?_\texttt{num}\) and \(P\)-moves \(n \in {\mathbb{N}}\).

#### 3.3.2 Strategies and their composition

The players move in a game \(G\) alternately, at each move reaching a legal position in \(P_G\). Their behavior is best thought of as describing a strategy that prescribes deterministically what is \(P\)’s response to \(O\) in a position where it is its turn to move.

**Definition 3.2.** A *strategy* \(\sigma\) on a
game \(G\) is a prefix-closed set of even-length positions of \(G\)
such that, each time \(sab,sac \in \sigma\), we have \(b=c\).

For example, the strategies on \(G_\texttt{num}\) are \(\varepsilon\) and all sequences \(?_\texttt{num}n\), corresponding respectively to the elements \(\bot\) and \(n\) of the domain \({\mathbb{N}}_\bot\).

We would like to consider the behavior of the successor module described above as an element of a set \(G_\texttt{num}\multimap G_\texttt{num}\) of strategies that compute functions over the natural numbers. If we consider only the sequences of interactions of \(S\) taking place either on the left or on the right side of the module of Figure 1, we see that they describe positions of \(G_\texttt{num}\), with an inversion of polarity (active/passive) depending on which side the interactions take place: the module is initially passive, and becomes active upon receiving a request from the environment. Such inversion, represented by the complementary labeling of the moves \(\overline{\lambda_G}\), assigning to Proponent the moves of the Opponent in \(G\) and conversely, is essential to the definition of a game \(G \multimap H\):

**Definition 3.3.** Given any pair of games \(G,H\), the
game \(G \multimap H\) has moves \(M_{G \multimap H}\) the disjoint
union \(M_G + M_H\) of the games \(G\) and \(H\), where
\[\lambda_{G \multimap H} (m) =
\begin{cases}
\overline{\lambda_{G}} (m) = &\text{if \(m \in M_G\),}\\
\lambda_{H} (m) = &\text{if \(m \in M_H\).}
\end{cases}\]
and a position in \(P_{G \multimap H}\) is any alternating sequence
\(s\) of moves (of \(M_{G \multimap H}\)) whose restrictions \(s
\upharpoonright M_G,s \upharpoonright M_H\) to the moves in \(G\) and
\(H\), respectively, are positions of \(G\) and \(H\).

The strategy that interprets \(\texttt{succ}:\texttt{num}\to \texttt{num}\) corresponds to the behavior of the module \(S\) used above as a guiding example. The parallel composition + hiding approach used to compose two instances of the successor module can now be reinterpreted as composition of strategies, suggesting a general pattern:

\[\begin{array}{ccc|c|cccc|c} G_\texttt{num}& \multimap & G_\texttt{num}&& & G_\texttt{num}& \multimap & G_\texttt{num}& \\ \hline & & && & & & \mathbf{?}_\textrm{in} & O\\ & &\mathbf{?}_\textrm{in}' &O& &\mathbf{?}_\textrm{out} && &P\\ \mathbf{?}_\textrm{out}'& & &P& & & & &O\\ \vdots& & & \vdots && & & &\vdots \\ n_\textrm{in}'& & &O& & & & & P\\ & & n+1_\textrm{out}' &P& &n+1_\textrm{in}& & &O \\ & & &O& & & &n+2_\textrm{out} &P \end{array}\]
**Definition 3.4.** The composition \(\tau \circ \sigma\)
on \(G \multimap K\) of strategies \(\sigma\) on \(G \multimap H\) and
\(\tau\) on \(H \multimap K\) consists of the sequences of moves of
\(M_G + M_K\) obtained by hiding the moves of \(M_H\) from the
sequences \(s\) of moves in \(M_G + M_H + M_K\) such that \(s
\upharpoonright G,H\) is in \(P_{G \multimap H}\) and \(s
\upharpoonright H,K\) is in \(P_{H \multimap K}\).

There is one strategy that deserves a special name, because it is the
identity morphism in the category whose objects are games and whose
morphisms from \(G\) to \(H\) are the strategies on \(G \multimap H\).
The *copy-cat strategy* \(\textsf{id}\) on \(G \multimap G\) is
defined as the set of sequences of moves \(s\) such that the
restriction of \(s\) to the left instance of \(G\) coincides with its
restriction to the right instance.

### 3.4 Special kinds of strategies

The game formalism just introduced is not detailed enough to
characterize the kind of sequential computation at higher types needed
to achieve definability. For this purpose, a richer structure on games
is needed, making them closer to *dialogue games* between
Proponent and Opponent exchanging *questions* and
*answers*. This allows to formulate restrictions on plays by
matching answers with the corresponding questions in an appropriate
manner. The strategies for this refined game notion, that we study
next essentially through examples, will yield a richer notion of
morphism between games, allowing to make finer distinctions of a
computational nature needed for intensionally fully abstract model of
PCF, following essentially the approach of Hyland & Ong (2000)
drawing also material from Abramsky & McCusker (1999) and Curien
(2006).

The moves of the refined game notion will be either *questions*
or *answers* played by Proponent or by the Opponent. We have
then four classes of moves each represented by a kind of (round or
square) bracket: Proponent’s questions ‘(’;
Opponent’s answers ‘)’; Opponent’s questions
‘[’; and Proponent’s answer ‘]’. This
labeling of the moves subsumes under the usual well-formedness
criterion for bracket sequences, at one time: the alternation between
Proponent and Opponent, the fact that Opponent is the first to move
and that each answer of a player answers a unique question of the
partner. This is not enough, however: a further *justification*
structure on questions and answers is needed to discipline the nesting
of (sub)dialogues in the evaluation of higher-order functions,
allowing to characterize the *well-bracketed* strategies.
Consider now the strategy in \((G^{11}_\texttt{bool}\to
G^{12}_\texttt{bool}\to G^1_\texttt{bool}) \to G_\texttt{bool}\),
described informally using a labeling of the copies of
\(G_\texttt{bool}\) as shown:

- (1)Opponent asks question \(?\) in \(G_\texttt{bool}\);
- (2)Proponent asks question \(?_1\) in \(G^1_\texttt{bool}\), justified by \(?\), in order to know about the output of the input value \(f\);
- (3.1) if Opponent asks question \(?_{11}\), Proponent answers \({\textit{tt}}\) in \(G_\texttt{bool}\): the computation examines first the first argument of \(f\);
- (3.2) if Opponent asks question \(?_{12}\), Proponent answers \({\textit{ff}}\) in \(G_\texttt{bool}\): the computation examines first the second argument of \(f\);

Here, the Proponent’s moves at steps (3.\(i\)) answer the question asked by Opponent at step (1), not the questions asked by the Opponent at steps (3.1), (3.2) that are still pending. This violates a “no dangling question mark” condition on dialogues introduced under this name by Robin Gandy in his unpublished work on higher-type computability (and well-known in the tradition of game semantics for intuitionistic logic initiated by Lorenzen (1961)). Strategies such as these interpret control operators that do not exist in the fully abstract game model of PCF, but do exist, for example, in the model based on sequential algorithms (Curien 1986: sec. 3.2.7, 3.2.8). A different phenomenon occurs in a variation of the previous example:

- (1)Opponent asks question \(?\) in \(G_\texttt{bool}\);
- (2)Proponent asks question \(?_1\) in \(G^1_\texttt{bool}\);
- (3.1) if Opponent asks question \(?_{11}\), Proponent answers \({\textit{tt}}\) in \(G^{11}_\texttt{bool}\);
- (3.1.1) if Opponent answers \({\textit{tt}}\) in \(G^1_\texttt{bool}\), Proponent answers \({\textit{tt}}\) in \(G_\texttt{bool}\);
- (3.2) if Opponent answers \({\textit{tt}}\) in \(G^1_\texttt{bool}\), Proponent answers \({\textit{ff}}\) in \(G_\texttt{bool}\)

Here the strategy prescribes a response to the moves by Opponent
depending on the internal detail of the latter’s behavior. The
response prescribed to Proponent by the strategy to the initial
question should not depend on what happens between the
Proponent’s question \(?_1\) and the Opponent’s answer
\({\textit{tt}}\). This is the property of *innocence*, that
limits the amount of detail that a strategy for \(P\) can access. For
this reason, failure of innocence allows strategies to model storage
phenomena.

This gives us the necessary terminology to understand the statement of the intensional full abstraction theorem proved in Hyland & Ong 2000 (th. 7.1), where the types of PCF are interpreted as games and terms as innocent and well-bracketed strategies, see also Abramsky et al. 2000 (th. 3.2), Curien 2006 (th. 5.1):

**Theorem 3.1.** For every PCF type \(\sigma = \sigma_1
\to \cdots \to \sigma_n \to \kappa\) with \(\kappa = \texttt{num}\) or
\(\kappa = \texttt{bool}\), every (compact) innocent and
well-bracketed strategy corresponds to the denotation of a closed
term.

This closes our quick overview of game semantics applied to the full abstraction problem for PCF, but opens a broad research area in the classification of programming disciplines according to the possible combinations of restrictions (innocence, well-bracketing) on general strategies for games as defined above. An introductory picture (the “semantic square” by Abramsky and his students) of this landscape, that we leave to the contemplation of the reader, can be found in Abramsky & McCusker 1999.

### 3.5 Historical notes and further readings

Games as a semantic framework have a longstanding tradition, from ancient logic onwards. Here we list of the main sources and further readings pertaining to game semantics applied to programming languages.

The use of game semantic for dealing with the full abstraction problem
for PCF originates from Abramsky et al. 2000 and Hyland & Ong
2000. Hanno Nickau (1994) proposed independently a game model similar
to that of Hyland and Ong: their games are sometimes called
collectively “H_{2}O games”.

As a background for game semantics, from intuitionistic logic we have the very early Lorenzen (1961) on dialogue games, then from linear logic Lafont and Streicher (1991) and Blass (1992) and from Coquand’s game theoretical analysis of classical provability (Coquand 1995). From combinatorial game theory the categorical account by Joyal (1977), “the first person to make a category of games and winning strategies” according to Abramsky & Jagadeesan (1994). A readable historical account of the first uses of games in the interpretation of constructive logical formalisms, especially linear logic, is included in Abramsky & Jagadeesan 1994. It should be observed that games for logic require winning strategies in order to capture validity, an issue that we have not dealt with at all in this entry.

Connections with concrete data structures were first noticed by Lamarche (1992) and Curien (1994), see Curien 2003b. Antonio Bucciarelli (1994) explains the connections between Kleene’s unimonotone functions and concrete data structures: the use of dialogues in the former is mentioned in Hyland & Ong 2000 (sec. 1.4).

Finally, among the introductions to game semantics for PCF and other languages, we suggest Abramsky 1997; Abramsky & McCusker 1999. The latter also contains a description of the applications of game semantics to imperative languages, notably Idealized Algol. Other excellent introductions to game semantics are Hyland 1997 and Curien 2006. A broad account of the use of games in the semantics of programming languages with many pointers to Lorenzen games, and intended for a philosophical audience, is Jürjens 2002.

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## Other Internet Resources

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### Acknowledgments

I am grateful to Ray Turner for advice and encouragement, and to Luca Paolini for comments on an early draft of this entry.