Supplement to Kurt Gödel

Gödel’s Documents

Gödel had begun to concentrate almost exclusively on philosophy of mathematics from about 1943. His standards for publication in philosophy were, possibly, unreasonably high—for example he would not publish papers which contained only negative arguments—and as a result he published only four more or less strictly philosophical papers in his lifetime (but see below): “On Russell's Mathematical Logic,” published in 1944, “What is Cantor's Continuum Problem?”, published in 1947, “A Remark on the Relationship between Relativity Theory and Idealistic Philosophy” published in 1949; his last published paper, apart from revised versions of earlier ones, was the 1958 “Über eine bisher noch nicht benützte Erweiterung des finiten Standpunktes,” which presents the so-called “Dialectica interpretation.” (For a discussion of the latter see above.) On the other hand many of Gödel's technical papers are deeply philosophical in nature, beginning with his 1929 thesis; and so the boundary between his mathematical and philosophical work must remain, in nearly all cases, an artificial one.

In addition to his published work, Gödel's philosophical oeuvre consists of lecture and manuscript drafts among a considerable quantity of philosophical material in his Nachlass in the form of notebooks and completed and partially completed manuscripts, as well as extensive commentaries on other philosophers. There are two complete manuscripts: that on which the Gibbs lecture, given at Brown University in 1951, was based, and secondly the six versions of the paper entitled “Is Mathematics a Syntax of Language?,” meant to be submitted to the Library of Living Philosophers volume on Carnap, edited by Schilpp, and written in the period of 1953–9. Both manuscripts now appear in the Collected Works.

The Nachlass material exists in German, in English and in Gabelsberger shorthand (Gabelsberger shorthand is a notation system for German in common use among German and Austrian academics in the early part of the twentieth century) and some of it was brought to such a stage of completion by Gödel that he drew up two lists of them under the heading: “was ich publizieren könnte” (“what I could publish”). Some of this material has been published posthumously (Gödel 1995). (The Nachlass material has also lead to a supplementation of the final list of Gödel's theorems. See the introduction to the Dreben correspondence in Gödel 2003a.)

Gödel's philosophical oeuvre should include his conversations and the related correspondence with Hao Wang, which took place over approximately the last decade of Gödel's life. The conversations concerned Gödel's philosophical and foundational views as contrasted with Wang's, and were eventually published by Wang in the books From Mathematics to Philosophy: Reflections on Kurt Gödel (Wang 1987) and Logical Journey (Wang 1996), as well as in numerous papers. As to the value of Wang's transcriptions of those conversations, it has to be said that views differ. However there is no doubt about the accuracy of extended passages in From Mathematics to Philosophy, passages which Gödel either revised or completely rewrote. (See Gödel 2003b, p. 387, for the correspondence between Gödel and Wang concerning these passages. See Wang 1973, pp.200–205, and see Wang 1996, p. 237, for Wang's discussion of his collaboration with Gödel.) Disclaimers aside, particularly the last book of the three contains hundreds of philosophical remarks and aphorisms of Gödel's, spanning an extraordinary range of mathematical, foundational, philosophical, and other topics. For example, we learn in remark 13.9.72 that Gödel was committed to “the method of bold generalization,” as he called it, recommending that philosophers have the audacity to “generalize things without any inhibition.” Chapter 8, entitled “Set Theory and Logic as Concept Theory,” sheds a great deal of light on Gödel's last thoughts on the foundations of set theory. For example, in remark 8.7.9 he asserts that the “central principle” is the reflection principle. (See above for the definition of the Levy reflection principle; see section 8.7 of Wang 1996 for the more general reflection principle to which Gödel refers in remark 8.7.9.)

Finally, Gödel's philosophical oeuvre should include an important recent addition to the record, namely the transcription of his 1972-5 conversations with the proof theorist Sue Toledo, Toledo (2011). The conversations focus on three areas: Husserlian phenomenology, proof theory and the Platonic dialogue “Euthyphro.” See also Curtis Franks's (2011) for a penetrating analysis of these conversations.

“My Notes, 1940–1970”

In this section we direct the reader's attention to document number 040363 in the Gödel Nachlass, a list entitled “My Notes, 1940–1970.” (For the list and a discussion of it see pp.94–99 of Wang 1996.) It was written during a period of illness, perhaps in order to direct future readers of the Nachlass to the material in it Gödel thought important. The list is as follows:

  1. About 1,000 stenographic pages (6 x 8 inches) of clearly written philosophical notes (=phil. [philosophical] assertions).
  2. Two phil. [philosophy] papers almost ready for print.
  3. Several 1,000's of pages of phil. [philosophical] excerpts and literature.
  4. The clearly written proofs of my cosmological results.
  5. About 600 clearly written pages of set-theoretical and logical results, quest. and conjectures (to some extent outstripped by recent developments).
  6. Many notes on intuit. [intuitionism] (the whole Ev. [Evidenz] on Main qu. [question] and other (pertaining to the Dial. [Dialetica] work and another work)) and other foundational questions, auch Literat. [Literatur]

Regarding item 2, a complicated footnote indicates that the two papers are one on Kant (Gödel *1946/9-B2, Gödel *1946/9-C1) and secondly, “Is Mathematics a Syntax of Language?” (Gödel *1953/9-III and Gödel 1953/9-V.) Other manuscripts are mentioned in the footnote are his ontological proof, and his notes on his new consistency proof of the axiom of choice.

Regarding item 6, “Ev.” apparently stands for “evidence.” As to the main question, it would not be implausible that by it Gödel means the question Gödel raises in the Dialectica paper, namely that of giving a precise characterization of the notions of abstract and concrete evidence—especially since his work pertaining to that paper is mentioned in item 6. (This is Wang's interpretation.)

There are a number of surprises here. The Gibbs lecture, which appears on the list, “Was ich publizieren könnte,” (along with his “Is Mathematics a Syntax of Language?”) does not appear in item 2 as one might expect. Also, the volume of the material referred to in item 5 is perhaps greater than one would have expected.

Copyright © 2015 by
Juliette Kennedy <>

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