Gómez Pereira

First published Tue Apr 19, 2022

Gómez Pereira (1500–?) was a Spanish physician and philosopher who is mainly known for having formulated a complete theory of animal mechanism a hundred years before Descartes. In the context of the debate over the immortality of the soul, he defended a radical division between the soul and the body, and a conception of the soul as simple form whose essential activity lies in self-consciousness. Pereira was an alumnus of the University of Salamanca, where he met the new pedagogical methods developed by nominalists as well as an increasing interest on natural philosophy. From a heterodox point of view, he addressed some physical and metaphysical topics in his books. Pereira rejected some concepts widely accepted in his time such as prime matter, common sense or intelligible species. Grounded upon a psychology that gave priority to simplicity, he replaced the scholastic theory of cognitive faculties with a new one in which the intentional act became relevant. For Pereira the subject and the object constitute a unity that can only be conceptually separated; this unity is determined by the conception of the mind as pure attention that is capable of perceiving itself.

1. Life and Works

Gómez Pereira’s biography is largely unknown. Only a few data have been extracted from the Prologues of his books and from some legal documents discovered in his hometown Medina del Campo (Alonso Cortés 1914: 10; González Vila 1976: 95–96). He was a prestigious doctor who practiced his profession in his own town, which at that time enjoyed great prosperity as a center of commerce. His medical reputation may have gone beyond the limits of Medina del Campo since he was summoned by the court of Madrid to look after the health of the Infante, the future Charles II, son of Philip II. The origin of his family is uncertain (the surname “Pereira” indicates that its origin was probably in Galicia or Portugal). It seems that his family was in trade and had a favorable position. Because of this professional activity it has been suggested that Gómez Pereira came from a family of Jewish “conversos” (González Vila 1976: 96–97; Rodríguez Pardo 2008: 195–199).

The young Pereira was sent to study Arts at the University of Salamanca, where a profound pedagogical renewal was just then under way (Muñoz Delgado 1964: 75–89; Valverde 2019: ix). Among the professors whose lectures he attended we must pay particular attention to Juan Martínez Guijarro and Juan de Oria. The first came from the University of Paris and developed at the University of Salamanca new teaching methods in the field of logic and natural philosophy. Many years later, Gómez Pereira dedicated one of his books to him as a sign of affection and admiration for the man who was in charge of the education of young Philip II and became Archbishop of Toledo. Also, Juan de Oria – who was later condemned by the Inquisition and spent his last years of life in seclusion – lectured on logic and natural philosophy. Oria probably sparked Pereira’s interest in the question of immortality, since he had great acquaintance with the controversies which was occurring – especially at the universities of northern Italy during those years (Muñoz Delgado 1987: vol. I, 9–17; Valverde 2020: 242–247).

Gómez Pereira only wrote three books: the Antoniana Margarita, published in 1554, an Apologia that he redacted in 1555 to answer the objections raised against his first book, and the Novae veraeque medicinae of 1558 (González Vila 1976: 111–114). As can be seen by the dates, the publication of his writings was concentrated in a few years, probably at the end of his life. It is, then, likely that these writings had many years of reflection, readings and experimentation probably determined by his profession. The Antoniana Margarita, entitled so in honor of Pereira’s parents, is his best-known work. It is composed in three parts without any internal division of chapters: the first part, which gives the title to the entire book, is the largest; the second is a commentary on Aristotle’s De anima III, and the third is a treatise De immortalitate animorum. The discourse is arranged in a sequence of paragraphs whose content is sometimes announced by marginal notes which are more numerous in the first part than in the other two. The prose is usually very dense and full of digressions, many of which are so extensive that they seriously break the thread of the main argument. The impression of disorder and lack of a previous expository plan is certainly overwhelming, so that only the interesting opening of the book, where Pereira introduces in media re the theme of animals’ lack of sensory perception, can attract the interest of the reader. In his Apologia, Pereira summarized and confirmed all the theses previously established in the Antoniana, and took the opportunity to clarify some points of his own thought, as for example the nature of human soul as a simple substance that only conceptually can be divided into parts. Finally, the Novae veraeque medicinae, probably published posthumously, were written following an empirical methodology that aimed to discover the true causes and the effects of diseases and affections. For example, against the common opinion of his time and the criteria of Greek and Arab medical treatises, Pereira explained fever as a mechanism devoted to restoring a lost equilibrium in the body.

2. Epistemology and Nominalism

Like some other figures of his time, Gómez Pereira took great interest in exposing the shortcomings and difficulties he encountered in scholastic natural philosophy. The Aristotelian scheme seemed to him insufficient, so he directed severe criticism at it for being unclear or even contradictory in some essential respects, especially those which had to do with the explanation of life and the controversial issue of the nature and origin of the soul.

About his own vision of empirical method and scientific research, the Prologues of his books provide us with enlightening information. In his Novae veraeque medicinae Pereira proclaims that the duty of a scientist is to use the instruments of logic and experience to reach the truth, without becoming entangled in the subtleties of language and sterile sophistry. In this sense, Pereira denounces Erasmus and his followers for having wasted the intelligence of many young people who could have devoted themselves to science (NVM: 1a). Also, at the beginning of the Antoniana Pereira rejects the principle of authority if it is used to replace rational demonstration. Against those who base their doctrines in Aristotle, Pereira says:

writers of this kind would have had more respect for their readers if they had demonstrated what they believed to be true by means of solid reasoning. (AM: I.193)

As we shall see, the epistemology formulated by Pereira in his Antoniana was built on a deep criticism of the philosophy of Aristotle and scholastic realism.

The Antoniana begins by denouncing the incoherencies that Pereira finds if we admit that animals and humans share sensory perception. These inconsistencies are based on an erroneous analysis of the process that leads from the images to the mental concept. In this process two elements need to be present. First, we receive some species from the external objects through our own sense-organs. However, these species are not yet properly sensations; to get these last some animadversio is also necessary:

Once our sensory organs have been fashioned, in accordance with what is due to happen, by a visual image or something corresponding to a visual image, human beings should still not be called ‘sentient’ unless they turn the acuteness of their mind upon the object they want to recognise. (AM: I.273)

From sensation thus configured, the mind which pays attention to those species builds, at a higher cognitive level, the notio of the object (AM: I.275).

Now, Pereira emphasized that all this is a process in which multiple instances can be differentiated only conceptually; there is a unique subject of this process: the entire soul, which first pays attention to an object and later constructs the notion of it. What is more, the attention of the soul is nothing other than the soul itself, which focuses on one object rather than on any other and does it spontaneously. In other words, its own attention is not accidental, but what Pereira himself called a mode of being: so, the act of knowing is not realiter anything other than the soul itself (AM: I.295). In this conception, the body does not participate in knowledge, nor is knowledge different from the soul (González Vila 1975: 28–29). It is likely that nominalism, during its ephemeral implantation in Spain in the first half of the sixteenth century, had a decisive influence on Pereira’s thought; he certainly aimed at contradicting the Realistic notion of St. Thomas about the soul, which assumed that the soul’s faculties are diversified by their acts and, in turn, their acts are diversified by their objects (Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, I, q. 77, a. 3). Against this conception, the Spanish author affirmed that the soul is always equivalent to its acts, so he ultimately criticized Aristotle for having turned to a group of differentiated faculties in his description of the cognitive process: such a plurality was unnecessary.

An example of this criticism can be found at the moment when the existence of the common sense is rejected in the Antoniana (AM: I.371–373). This is the faculty responsible for processing the so-called common sensibles, that is, those common objects of perception which are co-incidental to the exclusive objects of each sense (i.e., motion, rest, number, figure etc.; see Aristotle, De Anima, III, 1–2). In opposition to Aristotle, Pereira argued that, if the common sense is an organic faculty, so that it perceives what has been previously perceived by the senses, it would make the latter unnecessary and we should be obliged to conclude that nature has created many organs to do what it could with fewer, which goes against its own principles. It is, therefore, better to maintain that it is the soul itself, as an indivisible unity, which perceives, judges and differentiates all the sensibles: the soul is present, in effect, in all parts of the living body and is affected in a similar way by all the sense organs.

For Pereira there is no real difference between the sensory and intellectual faculties. Neither must they be understood as two different accidents of one unique substance, i.e., the soul, because such a diversity would make impossible to explain how, if the objects of both sense and intellect are different realiter, they can converge on a single object: it would then be necessary to appeal for a third power or faculty which would analyze both objects and, finally, link them. In addition, the unity of the soul would be broken, because it would be divisible according to the various objects it can perceive and understand; in this case one could not explain how it is possible that, since those different objects are processed by different cognitive faculties, knowledge is always a simultaneous and indivisible achievement. Pereira emphasized that this is only because the subject that reaches this knowledge is necessarily one and indivisible (AM: I.379–381).

Similarly, because of the unity and indivisibility of the soul, the author rejected the existence of intelligible species. For him, these species may not be extracted from phantasmata since these have a corporeal constitution, while intelligible species are immaterial by definition; but our intellect is unable to generate a spiritual substance from a material one: God alone is endowed with such a power (AM: I.409). Almost a century after Pereira had formulated this argument, Descartes resorted to a very similar one to support his own rejection of intelligible species as well as of the possibility that ideas can be caused by bodies (see, for example, Descartes, Meditationes AT, p. 41; about the historical precedents of Descartes’ theory see Spruit 1995, vol. II, pp. 379–386: unfortunately, Spruit did not have access to the Antoniana, so he could not introduce Pereira among the possible influences that Descartes received from earlier philosophy). For the Spanish doctor it was then much more efficient to explain the intellectual process on the basis of considering that all cognitive activity, whether sensory or intelligible, not only depends on the soul but, in fact, identifies with it.

A new question then emerges: what is the difference between sensory perception and understanding? Pereira’s answer was that there are not diverse instances of knowledge but rather a unique process that progressively reaches various stages of refinement. Basing himself on the Preface of Aristotle’s Physics, he examined these various stages through which the universal concept would pass (AM: I.439–441). This concept can be confused or distinct: the confused concept is that which covers a complete genus without any distinction of the species contained therein, while the distinct one is precisely that which defines the designated object with all the categories that belong to it. There are then two forms of knowledge: one of them is less subtle because it rests upon the mere assertion of the existence of an object, and the other is subtler because it distinguishes with clarity all the elements that are present in it. Given the nature of our own cognitive potentiality, it is always easier to have access to the first type of universal cognition; only through effort and exercising shall we be able to achieve a greater determination in our own understanding.

To illustrate this cognitive progression, Pereira explained how we can achieve the abstract notion of substance:

If I want to understand the substance of a square white wall, I turn my mind away from thinking about whiteness, and quantity, and shape, and location, and when it was built, and all the other individual circumstances connected with the wall, every one of which I had recognised beforehand, either by means of my external senses, or conceived earlier abstractly in my imagination, and I draw forth cognition of something I have never perceived sensorily, namely, the subject of these things. (AM: I.445)

This process is accomplished by us spontaneously. Pereira said that it is simply a quality that belongs to our soul by nature and allows us to extract species from genera. We do all this by ourselves and in ourselves, since, as he repeatedly emphasized, the intellect, the act of thinking, and the object thought are the same, i.e., the unique and indivisible human soul (AM: I.455; see González Vila 1975: 28–30).

Pereira’s nominalist position rests on this basis. The question of whether universals are or not substances is elucidated by explaining the universal concept as a connotative term which exists only in the sentences formulated by our own mind. The soul understands that the singular elements that can constitute a genus or a species have similar characteristics, and thus it regards them all as a unity and this unity as a universal concept. Applying this doctrine, Pereira directed his criticism to certain metaphysical concepts that were meaningless and unnecessary for him. Such is the case, for example, of the scholastic difference between essence and existence. Against St. Thomas, he affirmed that these two concepts are not different realiter but only conceptually, and this because

… aut essentia erit ens, et sic ens et essentia non distinguentur, quod probare nisi sumus. Aut non erit ens, et sic non ens intrasset entis compositionem, quod implicat. (AM: I.490)

That is:

… either essence will be a being, and thus a being and essence will not be different from one another, (which [we cannot] prove unless we exist) or it will not be a being, and thus a being would not have entered the make-up of the thing it is embracing. (AM: I.491)

Nor did Gómez Pereira accept the concept of prime matter. The procedure which Aristotle followed to conceive this concept was none other than analogy, because prime matter is not accessible to the senses. It is something that remains as an immutable subject in the transition from one form to another one; for instance, if a new form must be induced during the process of generation, then the natural dispositions required for the formation of the new living being must be precedent and remain during all this process; those dispositions, inaccessible to sensory perception, are prime matter, which lacks any positive nature. Hence Aristotle pointed out in Metaphysics VII that it is not a quid or a quantum, or any other genre of predicates (see Metaphysica, VII, 3, 1029a6–29). Against this theory, the author of the Antoniana Margarita argued that in the process of natural generation it is observed not only that the material part of the compound disappears, but also the formal one, so if the sentence ex nihilo nihil fieri is adopted by the Aristotelians for affirming the necessary permanence of matter, the same should be said with respect to the form, since neither the form nor matter can turn into nothing or be generated from nothing: this means then that also the form would exist in a temporal continuum (AM: I.549). In Pereira’s opinion, this problem can be easily solved if we consider that the elements are the basic materials of nature. They can perfectly play the role of matter, and there is no problem in the fact that the elements are also subject to mutation and even annihilation, because, ultimately, they are under the influence of qualities which are contrary to their own consistency: so when these qualities have a strong presence in them, this always leads to their destruction; but, on the contrary, whenever the primary qualities appear in the right proportion, the same elements are generated again.

3. Psychology

3.1 Nature of the soul

Pereira’s epistemology follows from a theory of the soul whose basic premises are simplicity and indivisibility (González Vila 1975: 22). His own vision of the rational soul led him to object to the philosophy of Aristotle, as well as to give a response to the question of whether the human intellect can perform its own activity without the support of the body. Pereira’s reply was a categorical yes: in fact, given his own epistemological premises, knowledge is possible only if it is identical with the substance of the soul itself. To demonstrate this assertion, the author addressed some issues that had been present in the debate about the nature and destiny of the soul from the Middle Ages (see Nardi 1958: 365–442; Kristeller 1979: 181–196; Valverde 2019: 35–55).

In the first place, the problem of the soul’s indivisibility had aroused an important debate within Aristotelianism. Aristotle himself had already denounced at the end of Book I of his De Anima the absurd consequences of considering that the soul has parts understood as substantially different: if the soul is the principle that unifies the body, it can in no way be divisible itself; if not, we should have to find another superior principle and so on to infinity. Notwithstanding this assess, there is no doubt that Aristotle also spoke of the different functions exercised by the soul through its different faculties: thus, it was inevitable that the unity of the soul reappeared once again. This issue had been widely discussed since the Middle Ages but remained still debated among many Renaissance Aristotelians. The subtleties (distinctiones) in the interpretation of the thought of Aristotle became increasingly complex, giving rise to an intricate tangle of arguments and counter-arguments difficult to follow even for the experts (see Di Napoli 1963: 339 ff.; Schmitt 1983: 13–42; Bianchi 2003a: 133–172).

Linked to this question was another topic also discussed among the Aristotelians: are there several substantial forms in a single compound? The different responses to this question had a particular impact on the debate over the connection of the intellectual soul with the body. Two main positions can be easily distinguished here: there was a unitary position based on the thought of St. Thomas, for whom the intellective soul is the only substantial form present in human beings, having in itself the derived potentialities of the vegetative and sensitive souls; the position contrary to this had as a pattern the philosophy of Averroes: in this case many – professed Averroists or not – admitted the existence of more than one substantial form in the same compound in order to explain the link between the human soul and the body, as can be seen in great figures of medieval and Renaissance Aristotelianism such as John of Jandun, Nicole Oresme, Paul of Venice, Agostino Nifo and later Giacomo Zabarella. Zabarella summarized this position by pointing out that the intellectual soul may in no way be attached directly to prime matter: its own complexity requires a high level of organization in the subject matter so that it can serve as an appropriate instrument for the powers that the human soul is capable of exercising. For this reason, our soul needs a preliminary compound with its own substantial form (Zabarella 1590 [2016: vol. II, pp. 897]; Park 1988: 464–484).

In this debate Pereira wanted to intervene formulating a discourse whose principal aim was to resolve those difficulties which were inherent in the relation between the soul and the body. This discourse was clearly linked to the theoretical assumptions of his time, but it had in addition traits of certain originality which has gone alas largely unnoticed. The author of the Antoniana Margarita put his finger on the deficiencies of the Scholastic-Thomist philosophy when it was applied to demonstrate the immortal nature of the human soul. In this sense, he clearly assumed that the criticism of the Alexandrist Aristotelians, and in particular of Pietro Pomponazzi, was essentially correct (Pine 1986: 124 ff.; Perrone 1999: xlvi–lxvii). Pereira concluded that assuming that the rational soul is potentially capable of exercising the activities related to vital functions implies recognizing that it is linked to the body. Thus, given the premises established by Aristotle himself in his De generatione animalium (II, 3), the origin of that soul must be found in the same process of natural generation that gives rise to the living body, but this process is essentially material. For Pereira, then, if we really want to save the immortality of the soul, we must radically separate it from all activity that is related in one way or another to the body. He accepted the consequences of the dilemma that Pomponazzi had established in his De immortalitate animae (1516): if the soul has the body as its own substratum (ut subiecto) or cannot operate without the support of the body (ut obiecto), it is inseparable from it, being then perishable (see Pine 1986: 55–123; Kessler 1988: 500–504). It can be said that, to a great extent, the Antoniana Margarita was conceived to give a satisfactory answer to this unavoidable syllogism (see Valverde 2017: 541–553). Pereira tried to show that the rational soul has nothing to do with the body because it is a simple and independent substance dissociated from all those vital functions that have the body as their object or as their substrate: these functions belong then to a psychic principles different from the intellect:

In their workings, external as well as internal, all forms except the rational soul make use of the ways their whole is arranged, as instruments, and without these they could do nothing. (AM: I.739)

The forms of brute beasts use heat, cold, wetness, and dryness, to feed and preserve the whole, of which they are intrinsic parts, but it lacks unity precisely because of its intimate connection with the parts of the body that perform the vital functions. Therefore, this soul is drawn from the very power of properly organized matter.

For Pereira, the rational soul is completely different. Its indivisible nature is alien to the generative process that gives rise to a living body. Thus, in Pereira life and spirit are sharply disconnected. This is the only way to demonstrate the immortality of the soul. To achieve such a demonstration, he believed that, as principle of apprehension and knowledge, the soul has to comprehend in itself all the episodes included in this activity. What is more, the substance of the soul is always its own activity. Now, if this is so, the question is why the soul is not continually thinking. Gómez Pereira’s answer was that attention is what determines both the perception of objects which can be perceived sensorily and the self-perception of the soul itself; the latter as well as the former depend on the will of the soul: consequently, they are not continuous (AM: II.1071). If it were so, we could not perceive anything else. Moreover, the necessary condition for self-perception is some kind of “awakening” that the soul experiences from external objects: only after this excitement does the soul become aware of itself, that is, of its own existence. The final conclusion of Pereira is then:

If this notion is going to precede, it will be able to serve no useful purpose other than recognition that there is a particular antecedent from which the soul may later elicit a consequence: namely, that it is self-aware. The reasoning will go as follows. I know that I know something: whatever knows, exists: therefore I exist (nosco me aliquid noscere, et quicquid noscit est, ergo ego sum). (AM: II.1075)

Once the soul has known its own affection, it is able to reflect on itself and discover itself as existing. This is a single process in which two moments must be distinguished: in the first act the soul knows the fact of being affected by something, whereas only in the second does it know itself as an independent entity, with autonomous existence. Now, the immediacy with which the soul reaches the consciousness of this existence shows that for Gómez Pereira this is not a deductive development, but a pure intuitive act that has a previous formal factor: the awareness of the affection is, in effect, “quodam antecedens cognitum” necessary to verify that the soul “seipsam noscit”.

The above expression “nosco me aliquid noscere, et quicquid noscit est, ergo ego sum” is not the final sentence of the Antoniana Margarita, since Gómez Pereira will formulate new arguments pro immortalitate, but it can be considered as the true culmination of all the discourse that the author has directed to prove the immortality of the soul. This discourse represents the central nerve of the work to which the other contents, and especially the doctrine of animal insensitivity, are secondary derivations. Many scholars have argued that animal automatism represents the genuine motif of the Antoniana, probably because of its originality, but we should not confuse originality with logical priority. Underneath the amalgam of contents and the diffuse and often disordered prose of the author of the Antoniana, a well-structured reasoning was present, in which three stages can be distinguished (González Vila 1975: 22.):

  1. The nature of the act of knowledge requires an indivisible principle, so that only the soul, the unique indivisible principle in man, knows; the body does not participate in sensory knowledge, not even as a tool; therefore, the soul, in its main functions (which are cognitive) enjoys complete independence and full operational self-sufficiency regardless of the body.
  2. This operational independence logically founds the ontological independence that allows the survival of the separated soul. Although Pereira does not deny the “corporeal” conditioning factors to which knowledge is subject, as evidenced by experience, he recognizes that the soul is weighed down by the body in its cognitive operations, so the body restricts the original and absolute cognitive spontaneity of the soul.
  3. Once the operating-ontological independence of the soul is asserted, and consequently its separate subsistence, the perpetuity of this subsistence does not involve any difficulty, since in the soul, which is indivisible, there is no intrinsic principle of corruption.

3.2 The Body-soul compound

This conception adopted by Pereira to explain the integral unity of the rational soul needed to be developed to explain the integral unity of the human being. Many of his statements, both in the Antoniana and in the Apologia, pointed out that the human being is not only the soul, but the conjunction of a body and a soul (see, for example, AM: I.687, I.697, II.1077, II.1149). In fact, he never abandoned the formal relationship that the rational soul has with regard to the body (see González Vila 1975: 41). However, the concept of form used by Pereira permitted him to speak of a plurality of forms in a single subject (as many Averroists defended: see above). For him, the unity of a compound is not given by the uniqueness of a substantial form, but by the hierarchy of several forms under a superior one that gives the compound its ultimate denomination. In a human, who is the most complex being of creation, there would be a compound of compounds. Therefore, the rational soul is not the only substantial form in him, although it is the only human form since it crowns that hierarchy of forms and confers to the whole human being his nature and denomination. Pereira defended what can be considered a dynamic hylomorphism which was surely built on his own biological experience as a doctor. However, the body-soul union of which the Spanish physician spoke in his Antoniana can hardly be considered substantial sensu stricto, mainly because in his book there is no detailed explanation of the relation of the soul to the body, or of what kind of union there is between two natures so different in themselves. For him it is a factum that in human beings these two natures converge, but he failed to explain this question – probably for the sake of a coherence that was perhaps impossible.

It is curious that many of his contemporaries tried to respond to the challenge of proving the immortality of the soul by appealing to coherence, precisely when the Alexandrists emphasized that the coherence of Aristotle was placed in mortality: every substantial form is born and perishes with the compound to which it gives the essence. Pereira was then not original when he tried to respond to Pomponazzi’s mortalist thesis by resorting to an alternative coherence based on the radical separation of body and mind. But, in this attempt, he showed, probably as no one before, that the hylomorphic explanatory scheme applied to the nature of the human being led to an unavoidable crossroads: one path ended in an integral materialism, the other in a strict dualism. Those who chose this last road, as Pereira undoubtedly did, had a peremptory question before them: what is the body for? For Pereira the body was a datum of experience whose negation would have been contrary to the principles upon which he wished to sustain his work, i.e., experience and logical coherence. His response came through the allegory of an imprisoned man (AM: II.1067). The soul is like a man inside a reticular sheath. This man cannot know anything at all if he is not “awakened” by the blows that fall on the surrounding sheath from outside. Such blows or affections produced by external realities are necessary for the man wrapped in such a sheath to awaken and know, but they are not enough to explain knowledge itself. Thus, for Pereira the body is a kind of “alarm clock” of the soul. This corporeal affection is required pro statu isto (i.e., the state of union body-soul) as conditio sine qua non of human understanding. But it is no less true that for Pereira the soul outside this sheath-jail would be permanently awake and would possess a more perfect knowledge of itself as well as of the other objects. Unfortunately, Pereira did not explain at any time why the soul has to be in such a deplorable state: forgetful of itself, and aware only when it is unpleasantly excited by external stimuli. The tone in which Pereira referred to the situation of the incarnated soul shows us the most pessimistic version of an anthropological dualism: the knowledge that the soul is capable of achieving in this life is only a pale reflection of the one it can reach in the other. If, as Pereira seems to think, the soul is essentially self-consciousness, this nature can be reached here only indirectly, and for a limited time. But Pereira told us nothing of the metaphysical framework that would be needed to explain what universal order allows a reality of a higher nature to be restricted in this way. If the death of the compound involves the reunion of the soul with its true condition (“corrupto carcere statim in totum expergiscetur”/“once his prison was destroyed he would be completely awake” AM: II.1068/1069), why should it suffer the unfortunate restrictions to which it is subjected in the body? Although he wanted to deal with the issue of the soul’s immortality from the point of view of natural reason, in the end it was necessary to transcend the physical realm to give a full explanation of the fact that two natures as different as the spirit and the body cohabit in human beings.

4. Animal Mechanism

The beginning of the Antoniana is an extensive discussion aimed at demonstrating that animals do not have the faculty of sensory perception. His argument is easy to sum up: if animals had the ability to perceive objects and were able to behave in one way or another depending on this perception, then we should have to grant them not only sensory perception, but also the faculty of reasoning. What is more, it would be necessary to conclude that they have an indivisible and immortal soul, as humans do. Pereira himself recognized that such a thesis could seem surprising, since it was generally accepted that beasts had been endowed with the faculty of sensory perception (AM: I.191). The author was right to believe that to his contemporary reader a thesis that denies the existence of sensory perception in beasts might seem not only a striking novelty, but also something which contradicted common experience and the principles of Aristotelian philosophy. Without going into the controversial question of whether Aristotle accepted or not the existence of certain traces of intelligence in animal behavior (see Newmyer 2011: 6–10), there is no doubt that he attributed the sensitive faculty, in different degrees of complexity, to animals. In the De Anima, without going any further, Aristotle clearly said:

now all animals have one sense at least, viz. touch, and whatever has a sense has the capacity for pleasure and pain and therefore has pleasant and painful objects present to it, and wherever these are present, there is desire, for desire is just appetition of what is pleasant. (De Anima, II, 3, 414b3–5)

But, if the boundary between humans and animals is located at the limit between sensory perception and the intellect, precisely because this limit is far from being well-defined, it is difficult to determine with precision the ontological difference between men and animals, to the extent that one can find some cases of true bestiality among humans: these cases are certainly rare, but not as rare as those men who are capable of living according to virtue and science (see Bianchi 2003b: 63–100). This is the context that explains much of the content of the Antoniana. In the opinion of its author, those who recognize that any animal perceives what seems to it desirable or harmful, and then acts accordingly initiating a movement in pursuit of it or escaping from it, are not only obliged to grant them a sensory faculty with a discriminating power, but even rationality and thought (AM: I.199). Moreover, given that Aristotle also distinguished an intellectual faculty devoted to apprehending simple objects and another one which can deduce the complex from the simple (so that one can built a true or false proposition from the connection of terms), then if we concede the first power to animals, we must also concede the second, since

those who maintain that brute beasts recognize the presence or absence of an enemy or a friend are forced to acknowledge that they are forming mental propositions. If this is not so, let them explain how one recognises the existence of an enemy, and they will find no answer other than the formation of the foresaid mental propositions. (AM: I.203)

Furthermore, if the animals are capable of knowing the world through sensory perception, nature would have been very cruel for making them suffer all they suffer, for example, at the hands of men. And, given that certain species of animals can pre-empt the arrival of cold winter and shelter or run away from it, we must grant them also some faculty of prediction; but, if they can predict the winter, they will also be able to have knowledge of death and, just like human beings, they will worry about the future of their souls (AM: 1.215).

We might also grant them the knowledge of universal concepts. As Aristotle says, once the premises are established and known, it is necessary to deduce from them a conclusion: for example, if beasts know that this fire burns, and that this other also burns, and they run away from whatever fire they can perceive, they must have formulated the proposition “all fire burns.” In this case, they have an indivisible soul, since only with an indivisible soul can one achieve the knowledge of any object as a whole. For, if we accept that the animals have a divisible soul (quanta), they will never reach such global knowledge: an animal would know through a part of it a part of its object, and through another, another part, and so it would be unable to reach a perfect identification of whatever could be in front of it (AM: I.227).

To avoid such undesirable consequences, which de facto put animals in the same category as human beings, Pereira tried out an alternative explanation of animal behavior. This behavior and the diversity of movements observed in animals is due to what he called some occultae qualitates by which visual images (species) coming from outside, or certain affections that occur in the phantasmata that stay in the front of the brain (occiput) set the animal in motion by activating its nervous system (AM: I.253). In the case of human beings, who, like animals, are also exposed to these species and have inside their brains the same phantasmata, there is a real mental activity which is able to generate their own movements through the knowledge of the object.

For Pereira, there are three main types of movement in nature. The simplest is movement of inorganic objects. It is ruled by the principles of perpetual and invariable motion. This movement is merely a local one: for example, the attraction of metal to a magnet. The most complex category is voluntary movement (i.e., the complete freedom of movement of humans). At the medium level of complexity, Pereira located what he called “vital movement”, which describes animal movements. Vital movement includes movement caused by muscular and nervous organs in direct response to interior and exterior stimuli; this movement does not involve will nor any kind of spontaneous decision. Notwithstanding this, Pereira said that vital movement does not consist of invariable movement. Instead, the complexity of movements that can be observed in animals is the result of the complexity of the stimuli or forces that can act on them. To clarify this, Pereira classified four different types of animal movement: i) movements produced as a reaction to objects that are present; ii) movements produced by objects that were present in the past time; iii) movements produced as consequence of some previous instruction; iv) movements resulting from the so-called natural instinct (AM: I.241). The central core of Pereira’s theory on animal behavior is found precisely in the explanation of these four types of movement (see Sánchez Vega 1954: 383–387; Bandrés & Llavona 1992: 161; Rodríguez Pardo 2008: 191).

(i) The first type of movement is based on the reaction to objects that are present. In this case, Pereira formulated an explanation that embraced a pioneering theory of reflex reaction which involved both peripherical stimuli and a central organ. The process as it was described by him consisted of four phases. It starts with the object that stimulates the sensory organs. This stimulation leads to reactions in the sensory organs which cause certain mechanical alteration called by Pereira species. The sense of touch occupies a special category into this explanation model, since in this sense the process is not activated by means of mechanical alterations caused by distant object, but by direct physical contact between the object and the organism, without the intervention of those species. The second phase consists of the transmission of the alteration in the sensory organ to the brain. This transmission of the species to the brain takes place without any resistance, so that it spreads along the nerves at an enormous speed. The third phase is located in the brain and consists of the activation of the areas where the motor nerves originate (Pereira considered the connections corresponding to each sensorial modality to have a specific location in the brain). And finally, the fourth and last phase consists of the activation of the nerves which gives way to contraction and distention of the muscles that generates the movement of the different parts of the animal (AM: I.243–245).

But for Pereira it was evident that, before the same object, the behavior of an animal could vary and even be contradictory. He explained such a variety by resorting to a complex interaction of factors that occur simultaneously. To illustrate this question the author described the case of an animal that on some occasions drinks as a reaction to the presence of water and on other occasions does not, depending on the interaction between the species produced by the water and the current internal state of thirst of the animal (AM: II.877).

(ii) Another type of movement is that produced by previously present objects. To explain this type Pereira turned to internal senses, which he defined as inner cognitive organic faculties. He said that, while there are two internal senses in man, imagination and memory, in animals only memory is present. Pereira then developed a mechanical way of processing information in animal memory which excluded mental activity. According to him, when an object disappears it leaves a phantasma. These phantasmata or traces are stored in a cell located in the posterior zone of the brain, remaining there in a passive state. In the absence of the object, those phantasmata can be activated and move from the cell to the synciput which is located in the anterior zone of the brain. There they produce the same reactions provoked by the species coming from present objects. The author said that the only difference between humans and animals with respect to the function of memory is that man can voluntarily cause the movement of the memory traces to evoke a recall, whereas in animals this movement is due to purely mechanical stimuli which can come from internal or external origin (AM: I.251, I.253–255, I.263–265).

(iii) Pereira’s third type of movement is produced by training, which certain animals are capable of assimilating. His doctrine is developed through the exposition of specific cases of animal training. For example, Pereira considered the imitation of human language by birds as a special type of reflex mechanism in which hearing organs of birds receive voice waves which are transmitted to a soft area of the brain where they are recorded. When the brain is activated after receiving some stimuli, it causes a series of muscular movements in the speech organs that finally reproduce the previously recorded sounds. In this case, hearing and speech are two sides of a single process. Another case that Pereira studied was that of birds which can emit words that have been spoken in the past. According to him, this is due to the animal memory wherein a voice is retrieved from the corresponding trace or phantasma that is stored in the posterior area of the brain. When these traces are somehow activated, they pass to the anterior zone and provoke the production of the same sounds that created them. But why should an animal emit some words and not others? The explanation is found in the frequency with which a determined voice is presented to the animal: the trace of a frequently repeated voice is more mobile than that of an infrequent one, and then much more susceptible to flowing in the direction of the anterior zone (AM: I.263). Another example of training in animals is found in movements in answer to a master’s voice. These movements consist of approach or escape reactions and the diversity of responses can be explained by certain voices in the past which have been followed by the offer of food whereas others have been produced by punishment. In this case, Pereira explained how the activation of a master’s voice phantasma on the posterior area of an animal’s brain generates the mobilization of the phastasmata of past events that were accompanied by such a voice. Here it is important to note that reward and punishment have a primary role in Pereira’s concept of behavior modification, because they are effective not only in establishing new behaviors but also in favoring learning by imitation (AM: I.263–265).

(iv) The fourth and last type of movement in Pereira’s theory is instinctive movements. Pereira attributed these movements to what he called natural instinct. Among the examples he used is the persecution of the mouse by the cat. Pereira recognized that the perfection and complexity of these movements are such that, if they are not carefully examined, they could lead us to the conclusion that not only do animals have sensations, but that they also possess thought and reason. However, mere appearances are not evidence or proof. For example, he described the astonishing action of semen deposited by the male inside the vulva, and yet, semen does not have sensory perception. The same can be said of nutritional processes, wherein the relationships between different organs cause a selection of some materials and the rejection of others, and neither these operations are the result of a sensory process (AM: I.343–345).

In sum, Pereira thought that all these movements might be explained by turning to two types of causes: specific causes and generic causes. The first ones consist of various actions of the species on the receptive organs; that is to say, environmental stimulation. Generic causes are the functional interest. Pereira placed these causes under the general term “nature”, which plays a role as a universal regulator (AM: I.349). This broad generic cause is responsible for animals having organs adequate to enable them to interact with their habitat. This also explains the different bodies and types of animals and their varying capacity to be trained. Nature is also responsible for the fact that some of an animal’s external movements serve as signs. For instance, a dog’s bark or a lion’s roar frightens us and warns us of possible attack. Pereira considered instinctive movements to include those basic processes related to environmental adaption, especially the search for food, avoiding danger, etc. These movements are the result of the interaction between natural tendencies in the animal and concrete environmental circumstances. In this way, Pereira explained the perfect harmony between the beast and its physical, animal, and human surroundings (see Bandré & Llavona 1992: 163–164).

5. Aftermath

The little attention that has been paid to the Antoniana Margarita by Spanish researchers (outside Spain this attention has been non-existent) has been mainly focused on the impact of the work especially in post-sixteenth century philosophy, just when its fortune was linked to the Cartesian philosophy as a possible precedent of the animal mechanism formulated by the French philosopher (see González Vila 1977: 99–125; Bandrés & Llavona 1993: 131–137; Valverde 2019: 55–61). However, a closer look allows us to verify that in the immediate context of sixteenth century Spanish philosophy the Antoniana had a certain impact, negative rather than positive. Gómez Pereira himself introduced in an early reprint of his work the first or at least one of the first reactions to his book. In this case, the reaction was solicited directly by Pereira, because he asked his old teacher Miguel de Palacios, Professor of Theology at the University of Salamanca, for a critical survey of his book. The Objectiones which Palacios wrote to please his pupil were included in the Antoniana Margarita and accompanied by an Apologia where Pereira summarized and defended all the theses previously established. Palacios’ attitude was that of a professor who condescendingly reads the work of a good student, not that of a genuine critic. In any case, these Objectiones failed to identify the central message of the Antoniana, either because the author did not read the work carefully or because he did read it but did not understand his student’s thought. Palacios’ work analyzed some questions which, even if they do not lack some interest, do not address the core of the work, that is, Pereira’s intention of dissociating the soul and the body so as to formulate on this basis a demonstrative proof of the immortality of the human soul. For, even if in the order of the text the thesis of animals’ lack of sensory perception is the first issue addressed, this was only one of the consequences drawn from the claimed independence and unity of the human soul. In Palacios’ opinion, however, that was the only significant content of the book, so he was unable to build a systematic criticism of Pereira’s arguments.

Another notably adverse reaction to the Antoniana was the Endecálogo contra Antoniana Margarita, written in Castilian by Francisco Sosa, a colleague of Pereira who lived in the same city and probably met him. This work is a satiric fable in which the animals bring a suit before Jupiter, as a judge, against Pereira because he has deprived them of genuine sensory perception and self-movement. González Vila emphasizes that the work, beyond its questionable literary quality and lack of philosophical depth, serves only to demonstrate that the Antoniana had some popular repercussion (see González Vila 1977: 102).

These two books show that the immediate reception of Pereira’s work was adverse and probably disappointing for the author, who could feel misunderstood and unjustly attacked. In any case, the echo of his work vanished soon, as evidenced by the fact that during the next century the references to the Antoniana and to Gómez Pereira himself were very few.

The second period dates from the moment when Gómez Pereira became the object of the attention of those who saw in him a precedent of the philosophy of Descartes. The great occasion for this ephemeral change arose from the French philosopher Pierre Bayle. Before him, Vossius had already spoken of Pereira as a precursor of animal mechanism (Vossius, De theologia gentili, 1641 [1700: vol. V, p. 345]). But when Bayle included Pereira in his Dictionnaire (Bayle 1730: vol. III, pp. 649–656), he gave rise to a debate about the true originality of Descartes before the unquestionable precedent contained in the Antoniana Margarita. Bayle did not discuss Pereira’s merit as the true author of a primitive version of animal mechanism, but he thought that the real originality should nevertheless be attributed to Descartes, because his mechanism derived from the firm principles of its philosophy, while Pereira had only an ingenious occurrence without the support of a true system of principles such as that of Descartes.

From this moment on, the figure of Pereira acquired a relevance like never before. Even if Bayle tried to show the unmethodical way in which the doctor of Medina del Campo expressed his doctrine of animals’ lack of sensory perception, the fact is that it did not take the opponents of Descartes long to spread the suspicion that he had plagiarized some of the contents of the Antoniana Margarita. This accusation was known to the extent that Adrien Baillet, the great biographer of the French philosopher, was obliged to claim that the doctrine of animal mechanism had already been conceived by the young Descartes before he had the opportunity to know of the existence of Pereira’s book (Baillet 1691: vol. I, p. 51 ff.). However, it has been maintained that neither the chronological observations of Baillet nor the denial expressed by Descartes himself of having read Pereira’s work completely rules out the possibility that he could have read Pereira’s book in the Netherlands, where it was probably more accessible than in France. Those chronological reasons of Baillet were not accepted by many others, such as Huet, who openly stated that Pereira had clearly anticipated Descartes in the theory of animal automatism (Huet 1689 [1734: 193 ff.]).

Other references to the work of Gómez Pereira can be found during the transition from the seventeenth to the eighteenth century, for example, in the Portuguese Jewish physician Isaac Cardoso, who edited his Philosophia libera in 1673. Here Pereira is placed on the same level as Vallés and Gassendi as a modern atomist who rejected the Aristotelian concept of prime matter. Even in Leibniz himself we can find traces of Pereira: in two letters dated on 1711 and 1713 he said he was looking for a copy of the Antoniana, and after having found it, he recognized that the thought of Descartes was not too different from that of Pereira. Leibniz believed, however, that the French philosopher had not read his work.

The question of Descartes’ debt to Gómez Pereira will be found again among the Enlightenment writers, as we can see in the Dictionaries of Calmeto, Moreri, Brucker, etc. (see Bandrés & Llavona 1993: 133–134). In the Encyclopedia of Diderot and D’Alembert, particularly in the article devoted to the soul of beasts, we may read that Descartes was the first who dared to treat animals as mere machines, even if Gómez Pereira had said something similar before him, but he arrived at this concept by pure chance. The Enlightenment authors echoed the opinion of Bayle in pointing out that Pereira did not draw his doctrine from any principle, and therefore his name had scant relevance: he suffered the saddest thing that can happen to an innovator, “il ne fit point de Secte” (Bayle 1730: vol. III, pp. 651).

One unexpected effect of the presence of Gómez Pereira in the French erudite elite, even if in a pale way, was the recovery of his work during the eighteenth century. But, unfortunately for our author again, this recovery did not involve any serious and detailed study of his thought (González Vila 1977: 109). The unique perspective adopted to comment on and analyze the contents of the Antoniana Margarita was determined by the notion of their possible influence on Descartes; moreover, the Spanish writers generally followed the sentence of Bayle denying such an influence. One of the most notable exceptions was the Jesuit Juan de Ulloa, who after refuting mechanism and atomism, said that, in spite of everything, he was proud of the fact that some of his countrymen, such as Pereira and Vallés, had guided such powerful minds as that of Descartes (Bandrés & Llavona 1993: 134).

This growing interest in animal mechanism and specifically in the Antoniana Margarita was the cause of the second and final edition of the book in 1749, whose preface and permission generously praised Gómez Pereira, and lamented the fact that such an innovator had fallen into total oblivion among the philosophers of his own land. Unfortunately, this new edition did not remedy the prevailing ignorance about him, as one can realize by reading the different works of natural philosophy and the dictionaries produced in Spain at that time, where there are few references to our doctor and they seem to come from indirect sources, not from a direct reading of the text.

This same poverty of references to Gómez Pereira’s philosophy was also present during the nineteenth century, at least until the moment when, in the context of a debate on Spanish science which was stimulated by Menéndez Pelayo and J. M. Guardia, among others, the figure of Gómez Pereira was recovered as an illustrious example of a true scientific tradition, or on the contrary as an exception in the most desolate desert.

In the case of Menéndez Pelayo, whose interest in the Antoniana came from his youth, Gómez Pereira was considered as an outstanding physician, a great scholar and a true pioneer of Cartesianism not only from the point of view of animal mechanism, but also as the first author of the famous cogito ergo sum (González Vila 1977: 113). Later the Cantabrian scholar dedicated a detailed monographic study to the Antoniana, which he first published independently in 1878 and later as an appendix to his famous work La ciencia española (Menéndez Pelayo 1887–1888: vol. II, Appendix). Against the interpretative tradition that was rooted in Pierre Bayle’s opinion with respect to the thought of Pereira, Menéndez Pelayo argued that in the Antoniana there is a complete philosophical system based on well-established principles. The image of Pereira drawn by Menéndez Pelayo was that of a great thinker (comparable to Vives), a sincere Catholic who was able to reconcile independence with orthodoxy, and someone who represented the living proof of the freedom of Spanish scientists under the Inquisition.

Another relevant vision of the Castilian doctor, contemporary with that of Menéndez Pelayo, can be found in the doctor, science writer and Humanist José M. Guardia, who was educated in France (in fact, the majority of his works were published in the famous Revue Philosophique de la France et de l’Etranger). Guardia destined an extensive study to the figure of Gómez Pereira, for whom he felt a special affinity as a free thinker in a remarkably hostile environment (Guardia 1889: 270–291, 382–407, 607–634). He tried to present him as a victim of the Inquisition in Spain: Pereira’s unquestionable materialism was soon persecuted, and his works almost disappeared. But, in spite of everything, an heroic Pereira was able to exercise a scientific methodology which helped him to overcome all the prejudices accumulated over the long history of the scholastic school. From this perspective, Guardia held that the third part of the Antoniana devoted, as we have seen, to the immortality of the soul, was only a subterfuge to “keep up appearances”. For him the central thesis of the book is the animal mechanism, where it is necessary to place Pereira’s great originality. With regard to the “Cartesian question” Guardia emphasized that neither Descartes nor the Cartesians wanted to recognize how much their philosophy owed to this Spanish doctor. This debate on the interpretation and the meaning of Pereira’s thinking somehow determined his recovery among the small number of Spanish scholars who have focused their attention on the figure of Gómez Pereira during the twentieth century (González Vila 1977: 120 ff.).


Primary sources: Gómez Pereira

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