Antonio Gramsci

First published Fri Jan 13, 2023

Antonio Gramsci (1891–1937) has been enormously influential as a Marxist theorist of cultural and political domination in “developed” capitalism. However, his career was that of a radical journalist and revolutionary organizer, not a professional philosopher. Gramsci was a socialist activist, cultural commentator and, later, communist party leader in Italy. Most of his writings are concerned with assessing the immediate political situation and, particularly, the prospects for revolution in interwar Italy. Nonetheless, Gramsci was conversant with philosophical currents of the time—especially Italian neo-idealism, native intellectual and political traditions dating back to Machiavelli, and the major currents of Marxist thought. It was only with his imprisonment by the Fascist authorities that he produced his most well-known and philosophically rich texts: the Prison Notebooks. The insights therein account for much of his posthumous recognition.

In the Notebooks, Gramsci undertook a series of historical and theoretical reflections on the conditions for revolution in modern states—such as Italy’s—where degrees of popular consent had been achieved. He employed the concept “hegemony” to describe a process of “intellectual and moral leadership” that embedded a ruling class across society. He rejected the economic determinism of classical Marxism in favor of a nuanced political analysis attuned to contingent variation in historical circumstance. Gramsci brought Marxism into dialogue with neo-idealist insights into practical subjectivity and he sketched a revolutionary strategy aimed at preparing a new collective identity. Although fragmentary and open to contrasting emphases, the Notebooks set out a radical philosophy of politics that has been of enduring value to critical political and cultural theory.

1. Life and Political Activity

1.1 Sardinia (1891–1911)

Antonio Francesco Gramsci was born on 22 January 1891 in Ales, Sardinia to a middle-class family of Albanian descent. Located in Italy’s southern Mezzogiorno, the island of Sardinia shared the region’s arid landscape, widespread poverty, and fragile social hierarchies. Gramsci was the fifth of seven children born to Giuseppina (née Marcia) and Francesco Gramsci and spent his early childhood near Cagliari, where his family had moved in 1897. In infancy he developed Pott’s Disease, a spinal form of tuberculosis that was not properly treated and, as a result, he grew up with a “hunched” back. He suffered frequent health problems throughout the rest of his life (Davidson 1977: 22–23).

His father, a local civil servant, was suspended from his job in 1898 on politically motivated charges of corruption (he had supported an opposition candidate in local elections) and subsequently sentenced to five years in prison (Davidson 1977: 23–25). This brought years of terrible hardship for the family, who relocated to the town of Ghilarza. In 1903 the young Antonio—known as “Nino”—even suspended his schooling to support his family by working in a Land Registry office. On his return to education two years later, following his father’s release, he progressed well. A reserved character but an avid reader with a strong will, he entered high school in Cagliari, where he lived with his elder brother, Gennaro. Gennaro introduced him to socialist literature, and he began to read Italian critics such as Gaetano Salvemini, Giuseppe Prezzolini, and Benedetto Croce, as well as Karl Marx. Gramsci shared many Sardinians’ deep resentment at the shortcomings of the “liberal” state since its unification in the nineteenth century, especially its protectionist policies, which contributed to the South’s cultural and economic underdevelopment.

In 1911 Gramsci won a monthly stipend to support his studies at the Carlo Alberto College at the University of Turin in the northern region of Piedmont.

1.2 Turin (1911–1922)

Turin contrasted radically with Gramsci’s southern upbringing: it was an advanced industrial city, dominated by the FIAT car factories and connected to wider European cultures. For some years, Gramsci endured the precarious existence of an impoverished student; his education was frequently interrupted by poverty, nervous exhaustion, and ill-health. At university he studied philology, or linguistics, and worked under the guidance of the socio-linguist Professor Matteo Bartoli, who was drawn to Gramsci’s native familiarity with Sardinian dialect (see Ives 2004). Bartoli envisaged Gramsci becoming a linguist. Studying in the Humanities, Gramsci’s own ambitions were, originally, to train as a teacher. At university, he contributed to reviews with articles on Futurism (SCW: 46–49).

Gramsci did not formally complete his university studies. He abandoned education in 1915 and became a full-time journalist and socialist activist. Joining the Italian Socialist Party (Partito socialista italiano, or PSI) in 1913, he became involved in worker’s education. Two years later, he was offered a position as a journalist for the Turin edition of the PSI daily newspaper, Avanti! Already a contributor to the weekly Il Grido del Popolo (“The People’s Cry”), he accepted the offer and began writing political commentaries and theatre reviews under a regular column, titled “Sotto la Mole” (“In the shadow of the Mole Antoniella”, a landmark in Turin, designed originally as a synagogue, near to where Gramsci lodged). In 1917, he co-published a single issue socialist cultural review, aimed at young socialists, entitled La Città futura (“City of the Future”).

The prospect of world war deeply split the Italian public and political parties into “interventionists” and “neutralists”. The firebrand revolutionary socialist, Benito Mussolini, came out for intervention against the PSI’s official neutrality. Entering the war, he hoped, would initiate a wider collapse of the liberal order and ignite social revolution. Mussolini was eventually forced out of the party. The young Gramsci was also tempted by that stance and declared his preference not for intervention but for an “active neutrality” that took the war as a moment to prepare for radical transformation (SPWI: 6–9). For this milder resistance to the party’s formal position, he was thereafter treated with some suspicion by fellow socialists.

Inspired by the Russian Revolutions of February and October 1917, Gramsci aligned himself with the “intransigent revolutionary” faction in the PSI, urging it to pursue its “maximalist” program of radical transformation. He became secretary of the executive committee of the Turin socialists and, in the same year, took up the role of editor of Il Grido del Popolo. In December 1917 he published “The Revolution Against Capital” in Avanti!, and used Il Grido to publicize news and commentary on events in Russia, including texts by Lenin and Trotsky (SPWI: 34–7). He made various efforts to organize a local proletarian cultural association to galvanize political and economic struggles into a general revolutionary project, although they did not take off.

After the war Gramsci joined with university and socialist friends to found and edit a new review, L’Ordine Nuovo (“The New Order”). Intended, initially, as a journal of “socialist culture” it became a medium to discuss the industrial factory struggles then underway in Turin. In Ordine Nuovo, Gramsci presented a theory of a workers’ state inspired by the efforts at self-management by skilled workers (see SPWI: 65–124). Spurred on by the workers’ disputes and factory occupations across the years 1919 and 1920, he published writings by syndicalist thinkers, participated in debates, and set out his own views on the potential for the factories to become the locus of proletarian state institutions (see Clark 1977).

After the occupations ended in defeat, Gramsci aligned with the communist faction of the PSI, calling for the party to be renewed as a revolutionary organization. In January 1921 in Livorno, the communists formally split from the PSI and established the Communist Party of Italy (Partito comunista d’Italia or PCd’I). Led by the militant, Amadeo Bordiga, the new party required rigid discipline and had firm ideological roots in Marxist doctrine. Gramsci was elected to its central committee and Ordine Nuovo was transformed into the party’s daily paper.

The PCd’I remained too small to have any serious impact on events. Despite substantial success in the 1919 elections, the now divided left were increasingly outwitted by the maneuverings of Mussolini, and his “fascist” movement. Throughout 1921 and 1922, fascist “squads” terrorized trade unions across the north of Italy, burning down their offices and sending armed gangs to violently assault workers and peasants. In October 1922, Mussolini was invited by the King to lead a coalition government, supported by conservative politicians increasingly alarmed at the intensity of social disorder and the prospect of a workers’ revolution.

1.3 Moscow (1922–1923)

In June 1922 Gramsci was dispatched to Russia as the PCd’I delegate to the Executive Committee of the Communist International (or “Comintern”) to participate in its Moscow conference. Exhausted by the recent years of frenetic activity, he soon booked into a sanatorium to recover his health. During that sojourn, he met Julija Schucht who in the next year became his wife and, later, mother to his two sons.

In Moscow, Gramsci was absorbed into the bureaucratic complexities of international communist politics, negotiating with the Comintern over the PCd’I’s relations to other left parties. Events in both Russia and Italy compelled Gramsci to reconsider his position on party tactics. In November, the fourth congress of the Comintern agreed that the PCd’I should fuse with the PSI (which, by then, had expelled its own reformists and renewed its links to the International). In truth, there was little enthusiasm among Italian communists for this option and no real opportunity after Mussolini had taken power. Leading members of each party (including Bordiga) were being persecuted by the regime and detained by the police. From prison, Bordiga circulated a draft manifesto openly rejecting the policy of fusion, but Gramsci—increasingly concerned at Bordiga’s open divergence from the Comintern—refused to sign it, arguing later that he had “a different conception of the Party” (GTW: 197).

1.4 Vienna and Rome (1923–1926)

Gramsci relocated to Vienna in late 1923 to open the PCd’I’s Foreign Bureau and maintain closer links with events in Italy. There he began to articulate a conception of party tactics that contrasted with Bordiga’s sectarian inclinations—under which, Gramsci claimed, “We detach ourselves from the masses” (GTW: 159)—and began organizing a new leading group with his comrades from Turin. Gramsci sought a United Front policy with other radical organizations and parties in Italy to maintain a presence across the country—particularly in the South—rather than simply await a crisis to hand leadership to the party. This view brought him closer to the policy of the Comintern. In Vienna he initiated the publication of a new daily party paper, L’Unità (“Unity”), aimed at an inclusive audience of “workers and peasants”.

Gramsci was elected in April 1924 (in his absence) to the Italian Parliament, which granted him immunity from prosecution. He returned to Italy in May and took part in the PCd’I’s clandestine conference at Como. There he made clear his tactical differences with Bordiga, although the majority remained aligned to Bordiga’s position. In the summer Gramsci took over the role of party General Secretary (GTW: 321). The political situation in Italy continued to intensify following the abduction and murder by fascist thugs of the socialist deputy Giacomo Matteotti and the subsequent withdrawal in protest of opposition parties from Parliament. Initially, public revulsion at the murder threatened to destabilize the regime but the opposition gradually crumbled, and police harassment of anti-fascists continued.

In January 1926 the PCd’I held its third congress in Lyons, France. Gramsci’s conception of party tactics finally won substantial support from the membership. The so-called “Lyons Theses”, co-written by Gramsci and Togliatti, underscored the urgency of adapting strategy to national conditions in Italy. With its partial capitalist development, extensive agrarian sector, and the precarious “compromise” between the northern bourgeoisie and southern big landowners, the unified state lacked a substantial popular base (see SPWII: 340–75). Fascism, they argued, merely preserved the rule of these two classes by armed force and with petty bourgeois support. The PCd’I, they continued, therefore needed to build mass support among both workers and peasants so that, when a revolutionary situation eventually returned, it could exercise effective leadership. In the meantime, Gramsci underscored the necessity of a united front with other democratic parties (SPWII: 406–7).

Concerned at the growing divisions within the Soviet leadership between Stalin and Trotsky, Gramsci wrote a letter in October 1926 underlining the danger this split posed to Russia’s leading role in the communist movement (GTW: 369–76). However, Togliatti, who was entrusted to pass on the letter to the Russian Central Committee, did not deliver it for fear of causing greater friction.

Gramsci himself was now increasingly in danger in Italy where, despite formal immunity, the regime increased its harassment of opposition parties as it transitioned into a full authoritarian dictatorship. On 8 November 1926, Gramsci was arrested by the authorities and placed in prison.

1.5 Prison (1926–1937)

To await trial Gramsci was transferred from Rome, via Naples and Sicily, to the island of Ustica, where he was confined in a private house with other communists (including Bordiga). In January 1927 he was conveyed to Milan, where he was placed in isolation and underwent interrogation. Permitted to receive books and write two letters a week, Gramsci indicated some potential writing projects in correspondence to his sister-in-law, Tatiana Schucht, who remained in Italy during his imprisonment and became a vital source of support. He suggested that he would like to write something “from a ‘disinterested’ standpoint, für ewig” (“for eternity”, borrowing a phrase from Goethe) (GPL: 45). He was visited by his Turin friend, Piero Sraffa (later a well-known Cambridge University economist), who helped supply reading materials and acted as an interlocutor with Togliatti.

Eventually, in May 1928, a special tribunal was held in Rome. Gramsci was sentenced to 20 years, 4 months and 5 days in prison (but in 1932 the sentence was commuted to 12 years). The prosecutor had remarked “We must stop this brain from functioning for twenty years” (PPW: xxviii). Already in fragile health, he was transferred to the prison in Turi di Bari, in the region of Apulia. Later—and despite the prosecutor—he was granted a cell of his own and permission to read and write. The first of his Notebooks is dated 8 February 1929.

Life in prison was not easy. Gramsci’s health continued to deteriorate—he was badly neglected by the prison authorities—and he suffered psychologically from his isolation. Yet was he not entirely cut off from events outside. He received visits from Tatiana and from his brothers, who (in addition to servicing his study needs and advocating on his behalf for medical treatment) passed on news concerning the PCd’I and the Russian leadership. So, at least initially, he was not wholly unaware of changing policies and strategic decisions. The Comintern’s switch in policy from 1928—the so-called “Third Period”: abandoning the united front tactic in favor of class insurrection, on the assumption that a crisis in capitalism was imminent, denouncing potential socialist and social democratic parties as “social fascists”—contrasted with Gramsci’s position supporting alliances. Gramsci’s criticism of this new policy brought ostracism from other communist prisoners (Spriano 1977 [1979: 70–1]).

Gramsci’s correspondence (like his Notebooks) was read by the prison authorities and subject to censorship, meaning that political references to outside events had to be muted or entirely absent. Nonetheless, he kept in regular contact with his wife and children (one of whom he had never met), and his mother. His letters offer fascinating insight into his intellectual interests, personal feelings, and health during incarceration (see GPL). He wrote stories for his young sons and reminisced about his own childhood in Sardinia. Initially, with other party members in the prison, he took part in reading groups and political conversations. However, his declining health over the years encouraged supporters to request his release or transfer to an infirmary. Gramsci refused to agree to his own conditional release if that meant renouncing all political activity.

In 1933 he was finally moved to a clinic in Formia. He continued to write but less productively and, after 1935, mostly correspondence. At Formia he eventually applied for and was granted conditional freedom (which enabled him to leave the grounds in the company of Tatiana). In August 1935 he moved to the “Quisisana” sanatorium in Rome where he received visits from Sraffa and from his brothers, and where in April 1937 his sentence finally expired. By that time, he was gravely ill. On the evening of 25 April 1937, Gramsci suffered a cerebral hemorrhage. He died in the early hours of 27 April.

Gramsci’s funeral was held the next day and his ashes were kept locally until after the war, when they were moved to the English Cemetery in Rome, where his grave remains. Tatiana retrieved Gramsci’s thirty-three handwritten Notebooks; these were secured secretly in a bank until the following year when they were smuggled to Moscow and passed on to the PCd’I (Spriano 1977 [1979: 133–34]).

2. Pre-Prison Journalism and Political Writings

Gramsci’s overt “philosophical” references in his writings prior to the Notebooks are sporadic and bound closely to his responses to wider events. He wrote as a committed socialist and revolutionary critic, albeit as an intellectual skeptical of prevailing orthodoxies (influenced, arguably, by his southern upbringing which made him something of an “outsider” to mainstream progressive opinion). Like many Italian commentators, he shared the view that the liberal state’s fundamental shortcoming consisted in a failure to build popular and inclusive governing institutions. The task remained, therefore, “to make Italians” (fare gli italiani) as one critic put it, that is, to find a model of association to culturally integrate citizens (see Bellamy 1987). This general problem informs Gramsci’s pre-prison writings as well as his later account of hegemony (see Bellamy & Schecter 1993).

The period up to Gramsci’s arrest was a dramatically evolving context of social and political crisis in Italy and across Europe generally. Gramsci earned local recognition during and after the war as a biting, “serious” radical journalist. He was acerbically critical of Italy’s ruling elite and the bourgeoisie’s shallow moral sensibilities. For example, in 1918 he denounced the widespread use of cocaine as “an index of bourgeois progress” and bemoaned the absence, demonstrated by the Italian card game scopone, of a “concept of ‘fair play’” proper to developed capitalist societies (see PPW: 72, 74). From the early 1920s, by contrast, his audience was primarily party members, and his writing was steeped in the technical language of revolutionary communist analysis.

Despite this shifting register, several related philosophical themes and influences can be discerned that characterized his thinking throughout his pre-prison activities. These can be summarized as:

  1. a “humanist” opposition to scientific positivism and materialist determinism for its neglect of the subjective dimension to human action. Here he was influenced by neo-idealist philosophers and critics of the classical Marxist tradition, primarily Benedetto Croce;
  2. a radical insistence on the force of subjectively motivated collective action, expressed as the formation of a unified moral will. The most popular source of this view in Italy was the revolutionary syndicalist thinker, Georges Sorel; and
  3. a preference for collective self-liberation and a rejection of authoritarian, elitist, or artificially imposed systems of rule. Such views were common among radical critics of the liberal state and its protectionist policies, such as the socialist reformer and analyst of southern underdevelopment, Gaetano Salvemini.

These themes and influences combined in Gramsci’s criticism of the liberal political class and his promotion of socialism. Three sequential phases of his pre-prison thinking can be distinguished: his early cultural socialism (§2.1); his post-war theory of the factory-based workers’ state (§2.2); and his later, developing reflections on communist party strategy (§2.3).

2.1 Cultural Socialism

Gramsci’s early writing was informed by the influential critical framework of the neo-Hegelian philosopher Benedetto Croce. Croce had denounced scientific positivism—prevalent among social scientists and European Marxists—for its abstract, ahistorical reasoning and emphasis on material “causes” in social change. Positivism neglected the historically particular and practically creative dimension of “spirit” (or consciousness) which, beyond any political program, motivated all social and cultural transformation. Croce invited a view of Italy’s political failings as the absence of a robust, unifying culture—a secular civic faith—rather than economic underdevelopment as such (see Croce 1914). He inspired numerous “aesthetic” critics of the liberal state to understand socio-political improvement as inseparable from free artistic self-creation, the assertion of moral will, and the cultivation of a shared “inner” sensibility.

Gramsci admitted later to having been “tendentially somewhat Crocean” in his early writing (FSPN: 355). For example, he endorsed the acquisition by workers of a “faith” based on intellectual self-discipline and independence of thought, severely castigating any tendency to passive “indifference” (SPWI: 17–18). Echoing Sorel, whose writings Croce had championed, he presented socialism not as the outcome of historical “laws” but as “an integral vision of life”, the adoption of an invigorating, moral consciousness to supplant the failed bourgeois order (SCW: 22). In 1917 he welcomed the Russian Revolution as the “revolution against Capital”, viewing it not as proof of Marx’s economic theories but as evidence of the practical force of a collective will (SPWI: 34–7). Later, in 1918, Gramsci offered his own idealist version of Marx, imagined as “a master of moral and spiritual life” teaching the proletariat to become consciously aware of “its power and mission” in history (PPW: 57, 56).

This somewhat ascetic, pedagogic humanism distinguished the young Gramsci from other socialists who appealed to historical progress or invested in the slow, practical advance of trade unionism and application of scientific reason. Gramsci regarded such appeals as rooted in an elitist attitude aimed at bringing reform to the masses from on-high. Instead, he endorsed a grass-roots self-organization that underscored the integrity and moral autonomy of a uniquely proletarian worldview. This placed him closer to other radical critics of the PSI, such as anarchists and syndicalists who also looked to a libertarian politics “from below” (see Levy 1999).

2.2 The Factory State

The first original initiative for which Gramsci became known was his theory of factory-based democracy, which he promoted during the so-called biennio rosso—or “two red years”—of 1919–1920.

Inspired by the industrial unrest and factory occupations in Turin and beyond, as well as by the new “soviets” in Russia, Gramsci published in Ordine Nuovo various opinions and resources on the topic of a nascent workers’ state (see SPWI: 65–124). His contributions took his earlier humanism in a more concrete, practical direction. Efforts by workers to wrest the management of production from industrialists—in part via “factory councils”, formerly grievance committees—instantiated, for him, an initiative rooted in actual history, where a new moral community was “spontaneously” expressing its own independent identity beyond the limits of trade unionism. Focused on the practical planning and control of material production, he claimed, the occupying workers were not responding passively to abstract historical laws or to the directions of their leaders but, rather, acting as agents of their own self-creation.

Gramsci sketched a model of industrial democracy in which a new type of state, based inside the factories, would replace the discredited parliamentary regime. Free trade capitalism was exhausted, and trade union organization had now reached its limit, he argued. Emerging organically inside the factories were

institutions which will replace the person of the capitalist in his administrative functions and his industrial power, and so achieve the autonomy of the producer in the factory. (SPWI: 77)

Rather than administer over isolated citizens by separating public authority from everyday life—as under liberalism—the factory instantiated a new type of polity formed around the collective material needs of production (see Schecter 1991). Gramsci envisaged a participatory system of factory councils functioning in a hierarchical democratic system through which workers would relay and manage the practical needs of national life. Authority would be reconciled to liberty, not opposed to it, as under liberalism. The atomistic individual would give way to the “producer”, an individual already psychologically and organizationally oriented to the collective through its role in the labor process (SPWI: 110–11).

Gramsci envisaged a system in which a communal identity had priority over individual initiative. His was an “organic” model of state in which all parts related to the primary needs of the whole. This was a potentially illiberal system that assumed substantive moral agreement among workers (see Sbarberi 1986). Some see here the influence of the neo-idealist (and soon fascist) philosopher, Giovanni Gentile. His radical philosophy of “actualism”—in which the subject’s inner conscience creates its own unified world and community—supported the idea of the “ethical state” (stato etico) in which public authority and individual freedom, coercion and consent, were essentially indistinguishable (Gentile 1919; see also Schecter 1990). Such anti-liberal sentiments were common in the wake of the war and chimed with widespread public disenchantment with elite-led parliamentary politics.

2.3 Communist Party Strategy

By the end of the occupations in 1920, Gramsci had already begun to shift away from advocating workers’ self-liberation. For him, the complete absence of political leadership from the PSI had undermined the occupations’ revolutionary potential. With the formation of the PCd’I, he committed to a hierarchical, centralized leadership and strict ideological discipline via a Bolshevik model of the revolutionary party. This new position was, arguably, less a wholesale volte face than a realization that the PSI was culturally and organizationally incapable of responding to the situation. Indeed, his understanding of the party’s role continued to evolve thereafter. Nonetheless, his thinking from here onwards remained within a “Leninist” frame of reference concerning revolutionary leadership, tactics, and organization.

What is notable about Gramsci’s writings on party strategy in the period 1921–26 is not that they offer a coherent or novel political theory but, rather, that they show he was developing an independent position that echoed fragments of his earlier thinking. This involved: the rejection of “formalistic” reasoning that neglected specific historical conditions; attention to the Italian social structure and the distinctive, cultural-political role of “intellectuals”; and the necessity of a mass-based party that incorporated the southern peasantry. These topics were central points of reference in Gramsci’s mature thinking about hegemony in the Notebooks.

For Gramsci, the critique of formalism underscored his growing concern that the new party wasn’t reading the “objective situation” but, rather, imposing a rigid view “deduced” from abstract principle (SPWII: 360). The surprising success of fascism in mobilizing part of the populace against the proletariat revealed just how intellectually and politically unprepared communists had been. Gramsci now began to underline the view that the received model of revolution—a violent seizure of power in the midst of a catastrophic crisis—needed to be adapted to conditions that had not applied in Russia. As he noted in September 1926:

in the advanced capitalist countries, the ruling class possesses political and organizational reserves which it did not possess, for instance, in Russia. (SPWII: 408)

Economic crises did not lead automatically to political instability because forces could be found to support the regime. In peripheral states like Italy’s, he observed, “a broad stratum of intermediary classes”—middle classes of various kinds—influenced the proletariat and the peasantry, steering them away from revolution.

In his notes on the “Southern Question”, written just prior to his arrest, Gramsci also explored the neglected problem of Italy’s South, which he described as “a great social disintegration” (SPWII: 454). He noted the influence of southern intellectuals, such as Benedetto Croce and Giustino Fortunato, in ideologically legitimating the liberal regime. Croce, especially, had performed a “national function” by endorsing liberalism, helping to prevent radical southern intellectuals from joining with peasants in opposition to the conservative agrarian bloc. Although he believed it unlikely in the short term, Gramsci argued the PCd’I needed to develop its own supporting intellectuals if it was to undertake an inclusive national strategy to overcome the agrarian bloc.

Even within the constrained horizons of communist politics, then, Gramsci was beginning to pose the question of revolution on a different plane than others in the movement. The unplanned interruption brought by his arrest and imprisonment permitted him to explore many of these issues in much greater depth.

3. Prison Writings

Gramsci’s Prison Notebooks (or Quaderni del carcere) comprise around three thousand pages of thematically organized essays, observations and comments, written between 1929 and 1935 (see QC). A number of his notes were revised over time, which indicates they were not written randomly but conformed, in part, to a plan. Recent research offers some clue as to the logic and chronology of their drafting (see Francioni 1984). Nonetheless, the Notebooks were not written for publication and, as a whole, they remain fragmentary with no explicit guide as to how, or in even what order, the contents might be read.

In his earliest letters from detention, Gramsci indicated various themes that he hoped to explore, including Italian intellectuals, comparative linguistics, the plays of Pirandello, newspapers and other forms of “popular literature” (GPL: 45–6). Later he listed more topics—including historiography, the development of the Italian bourgeoisie, the southern question, common sense, and folklore.

These cultural and historical headings may appear uncontroversial. But they permitted Gramsci to develop his wider thoughts on the practical and intellectual problems that had preoccupied him prior to his arrest. That included: historical features of the Italian state; theoretical concepts for analyzing the cultural and political conditions of class domination; and the organizing principles and character of a revolutionary strategy. Freed from the immediate constraints of tactical decisions and their repercussions, Gramsci drew on his humanistic training to extend and deepen his understanding of these problems (see Schwarzmantel 2015).

3.1 Hegemony

The concept often regarded as the locus of innovation in the Notebooks—and hence their philosophical linchpin—is “hegemony” (egemonia), signifying both leadership and domination.

Hegemony had been a common term in debates among Russian Marxists and usually described the leading (or “hegemonic”) role of the working class over its allies in a political coalition. But it had also been employed by Italian political thinkers in the nineteenth century to imagine gradually building consent across the nation for the new state—“making Italians”—rather than relying exclusively on the exercise of force. Gramsci fused these meanings to present hegemony as the general hypothesis that a social class aims to achieve consensual domination for its rule by progressively expanding its leadership across society (see Femia 1981).

This idea—with its potential for variation in empirical focus and application—was developed across different notes and topics, sometimes as a methodological device to analyze historical situations, at other times alongside different concepts to make strategic observations. But it also functioned more broadly as a philosophical horizon highlighting the inseparability of thought and action, signaling that all intellectual enquiries were unavoidably implicated in the formation of an integral “way of life”. Focusing on hegemony permits us to appreciate the Notebooks as a unified intellectual project, despite their disparate themes and contrasting accents.

The major themes of Gramsci’s ideas concerning hegemony are explored below, starting with his “sociological” observations on the state, intellectuals, and ideology (§3.2–4), and then looking at his theoretical reconstruction of Marxist philosophy (§3.5), and his observations concerning the revolutionary party (§3.6).

3.2 State and Civil Society

Gramsci’s discussion of hegemony hinged, in part, on the empirical observation that capitalist rule in developed western states, increasingly, is founded on the generation of consent across civil society, not solely on the deployment of coercion via the army, police or law courts.

Expanding on his suggestion from 1926 (see §2.3 above) that the ruling class had available to it “political and organizational reserves”, Gramsci now argued that modern states since the mid-nineteenth century have tended to cultivate consensual support—or hegemony—across civil society such that coercion, or its threat, was no longer the primary form of rule, except in “moments of crisis of command and direction when spontaneous consent has failed” (SPN: 220–21).

Gramsci drew on a distinction, common in Italian political thought, between “force” and “consent”. Hegemony referred to consent, although this was understood usually to be balanced with force. Modern states aimed to absorb threats to their power by winning over potentially hostile social groups and classes, compromising the immediate interests of the dominant class to maintain general support. Such efforts may often be fragile or limited, but that basic condition fundamentally altered the terrain of political contest. States could not be reduced to mere administrative units of executive authority—that is, to a separate “political society”—but were intertwined with a “sturdy structure of civil society”—schools, churches, “private associations”, newspapers, intellectuals and so on (SPN: 238). Unlike in Russia—where state power was strong and civil society weak (“primordial and gelatinous”)—modern states utilize the “trenches” of civil society by exercising “civil hegemony” (SPN: 243). This protected them from the threats to their rule caused by economic crises or civil disruption.

The state, then, was a complex structure combining both force and consent: it was both the instrument by which a ruling class maintained its dominance over society and the medium through which it undertook a “civilising activity”, functioning as an “ethical state” or “educator” by promoting “a certain way of life” for its citizens (SPN: 247; see also SPN: 12). At one point Gramsci formulated this as “State = political society + civil society (in other words hegemony protected by the armour of coercion)”, or what he also called an “integral” conception of the state.

Gramsci’s remarks elaborated his earlier rejection of an exclusively insurrectionary model of revolution. In the Notebooks he was further suggesting that hegemony described a general condition applicable to both bourgeois and proletarian forms of rule. Revolutionary transformation—for any class—cannot be focused exclusively on the seizure of coercive and bureaucratic power but must engage the state’s wider system of defenses. He referred to this in the military terms that had become commonplace after the First World War as a switch from a “war of manoeuvre”—a direct and violent assault on the forces of the state—to a “war of position”—the gradual winning of tactical strongholds (SPN: 238–39). A revolutionary project, he suggested, must first build consent across civil society before taking formal power (SPN: 57). That did not mean that coercion would never be necessary, only that its status was diminished in modern states.

Understanding variations in the exercise of hegemony required a political analysis attuned to the “equilibrium” of force and consent at any conjuncture. In place of the common Marxist division of economic “structure” and “superstructure”, Gramsci proposed the concept of a “historical bloc” (blocco storico). This was a composite of distinct class and social forces joined politically and culturally under a specific form of hegemony (SPN: 137). Additionally, it was possible to gauge the extent to which a class had sacrificed its “economic corporate” interests in expanding its leadership across civil society (SPN: 161). Empirical analysis of hegemony would assess the “relations of forces” that combined structures and superstructures in a historical situation (SPN: 181–85; for a discussion, see Bellamy & Schecter 1993: ch. 6).

Gramsci explored various historical examples and concepts of political rule in the Notebooks. In extensive notes on the Italian Risorgimento (the period of state building in the nineteenth century) he highlighted the failure of the northern bourgeoisie to develop an extensive hegemonic leadership by incorporating “subaltern” social classes in the South (see SPN: 52–120). He borrowed the concept of “passive revolution” to describe this situation in which a change in economic structure occurs but without a radical political transformation; this was a concept he also suggested could describe Fascism (SPN: 105–20).

3.3 The Theory of Intellectuals

Intellectuals formed a major theme of the Notebooks and developed Gramsci’s brief observations on the topic prior to his arrest. Intellectuals, he noted,

are the dominant group’s “deputies” exercising the subaltern functions of social hegemony and political government. (SPN: 12)

As such, they were key agents in the state’s connection to civil society.

To understand their role in organizing consent, he argued, it was necessary to expand the concept of intellectual. Rather than refer to academics or artists, who work explicitly with ideas, the category comprised all those whose social function was to communicate with, and educate, non-specialists (SPN: 9). Those undertaking the function of intellectuals included industrial technicians, managers, entrepreneurs, bureaucrats, and scientists. Gramsci distinguished between “organic” and “traditional” types: organic intellectuals emerged from a specific social class and functioned to elaborate that class’s productive activity as a set of general principles; traditional intellectuals, such as philosophers or the clergy, were remnants of a former historical stage who retained social prestige but no longer directly served a productive class. Intellectuals were therefore rooted in material relations of production but undertook the “critical elaboration” of that activity into a “new and integral conception of the world” (SPN: 9).

The construction of hegemony, Gramsci underlined, would require both the elaboration of new organic intellectuals and the assimilation of traditional intellectuals. He noted that his work with Ordine Nuovo in Turin had already involved developing new forms of “intellectualism” among skilled workers who constituted, in his view, the organic intellectuals of a future communist society (SPN: 9–10). In his notes on “Americanism and Fordism”, he explored this theme in modern rationalized and mechanized production systems, still with little optimism that proletarian organic intellectuals were ready to promote a new worldview (SPN: 279–318). Notably, Gramsci devoted considerable attention to an assessment of Croce, a traditional intellectual with an unparalleled “role in Italian life” (FSPN: 360), comparable “with that of the Pope in the Catholic world” (FSPN: 469; see also SPN: 94–95).

3.4 Ideology and Common Sense

Gramsci’s attention to intellectuals connected to his reflections on popular consciousness and its practical organization in, for example, religion, education, language, and folklore (see FSPN: 1–137, 138–60; SPN: 26–43; SCW: 167–95). Popular attitudes, he underlined—drawing on his linguistic training—should not be dismissed but, rather, understood as part of how ordinary people lived and experienced their world (see Ives 2004). They were also the medium through which hegemony was exercised.

The tendency among Marxists to diminish “ideology and politics”, reducing them to an immediate expression of an economic structure, was dismissed by Gramsci as “primitive infantilism” (SPN: 407). Instead, ideology should be grasped as a conception of the world that “serves to cement and unify” human practice (SPN: 328). It had a lived “psychological” validity that enabled people to become conscious of their practical situations, however inadequately (SPN: 377). It was therefore important to explore and understand that practical function. Gramsci did this in his remarks on “common sense” (senso comune).

Common sense—popular attitudes and beliefs, frequently accepted as “eternal” truths by ordinary people—denoted, for Gramsci, a largely uncritical and “fragmentary” mode of consciousness (SPN: 419). Consisting of superstitions and forms of “folklore” concerning the nature of reality and ethical conduct, common sense was a “philosophy of the popular masses”, often born from religion, that differentiated “simple” folk from educated intellectuals. Its danger was that it tended to invite resignation and passivity rather than collective action. That was a problem for what Gramsci referred to as “subaltern” groups—marginalized and subordinate classes such as the peasantry and the proletariat—who, despite periodic rebellions, never adequately challenge dominant classes (see Green 2002). Yet, common sense thinking often had a “healthy nucleus” in “good sense”, that is, in the practical and realistic attitudes that could be made “more coherent and unitary” (SPN: 328) if joined to a systematic and critical conception of the world. It was necessary not to dismiss common sense thinking (nor the struggles of subaltern groups) but to critically engage the “contradictory consciousness” of ordinary people (SPN: 326)—that is, the tendency to hold beliefs contradicted by actual conduct—and educate it.

Gramsci understood that educative task to belong to intellectuals—not merely to advance a superior and abstract philosophy but to work on common sense, thereby “renovating and making ‘critical’ an already existing activity” (SPN: 331). A hegemonic worldview had to connect to the “simple” to become embedded in everyday life. The past success of traditional intellectuals in this regard explained the ongoing influence of the Catholic Church in Italy.

3.5 The Philosophy of Praxis

The Notebooks present an extensive critique of what Gramsci saw as the prevailing orthodoxy in Marxist philosophy. Exemplary here was the analysis by the Russian philosopher and economist, Nikolai Bukharin, in his Theory of Historical Materialism: A Popular Manual of Marxist Sociology (published in 1921), a text Gramsci had utilized in party schools. Gramsci now rejected Bukharin’s treatment of Marxism as a deterministic science of society and used his text as a foil to present an alternative account of historical materialism that he labelled the “philosophy of praxis”, following the late nineteenth century Hegelian Marxist philosopher, Antonio Labriola. Gramsci probably used Labriola’s term to evade the prison censor but, undoubtedly, it captured the primacy he gave to practical, political questions in his approach to theorizing. He saw Marxism as a philosophy aimed at critically engaging popular common sense, laying the basis for a new hegemony.

The Popular Manual, as Gramsci referred to it, demonstrated the worst of what he called “vulgar materialism” (SPN: 407). It reduced Marxism to a search for the causal laws of social evolution and accepted, without reflection, the positive sciences as the sole model of knowledge. It took up a speculative “method” positioned outside of history to observe supposedly “objective” mechanical regularities and to make predictions about their development (see SPN: 425–40). This view was mistaken for various reasons: instead of treating Marxism as an original philosophy, it subordinated it to the natural sciences; it failed to grasp the “dialectic” in Marxism, which underscored the critical struggle against established thought (SPN: 434–35); and it separated thought from action, “science and life”, and therefore divided intellectuals with knowledge from the experiences of “the great popular masses” (SPN: 442).

To remedy these defects, Gramsci argued that Marxism, or historical materialism, be understood as a philosophy rooted in history, as an expression of the practical struggle to rethink those circumstances anew. As such it “contains in itself all the fundamental elements to construct a total and integral conception of the world” (SPN: 462). Thought and action should be understood as dialectically intertwined in a developmental process that can “bring into being a new form of State […] a new intellectual and moral order […] a new type of society” (SPN: 388). Historical materialism was not an abstract framework from which merely to observe historical change; it was the philosophical vehicle whose expansion into a cultural outlook aimed to bring about that change (see FSPN: 395–96). Gramsci affirmed Labriola’s designation of Marxism as a “philosophy of praxis” because it insisted on the unity of thought and action (praxis)—and, through that, the gradual formation of an autonomous moral and cultural worldview—as the guiding principle of Marx’s philosophy (SPN: 388).

Gramsci also proposed that Croce’s idealism could be of “instrumental value” to a renewed philosophy of praxis. Influenced by Marxism, Crocean historicism conceived thought and expression as entirely “immanent” to history, that is, as responses to concrete problems, undetermined by any transcendent scheme or teleology. Croce presented “liberty” as the unifying ethical principle expressing this historicist sensibility; the basis to what he conceived as a modern religion. Gramsci acknowledged that Croce had

forcefully drawn attention to the importance of cultural and intellectual factors in the development of history […] to the moment of hegemony and consent. (FSPN: 357)

Yet, he claimed, Croce also erased class conflict in his historical writing, emphasizing only periods of liberal hegemony—the consensual, ethical aspects of history and not the violence or political struggles that ushered in bourgeois society, such as the French Revolution (SPN: 119; see also GPL: 213–14, 215–16). By contrast, a philosophy of praxis would build on Croce’s insights, focusing instead on “ethico-political” history—the socio-economic divisions that bring, dialectically, a new culture into existence—without his partial, liberal gloss. It would vigorously critique received common sense beliefs, philosophies, and hierarchies that prevented the advance of ordinary people (SPN: 330–31). Gramsci described the philosophy of praxis as an “absolute ‘historicism’, the absolute secularisation and earthliness of thought” (SPN: 465).

In rejecting the scientific model of knowledge in favor of a form of historical consciousness, Gramsci radically shifted Marxism’s epistemological bearings. The measure of historical materialism lay not exclusively in the immediate empirical “truth” of its propositions or predictions but, moreover, in the cultural and political efficacy of its overall intellectual and moral reform, which enabled creative subjective engagement with objective conditions: “it is a philosophy which is also politics” (SPN: 395). He suggested that mass “adhesion or non-adhesion to an ideology is the real critical test of the rationality and historicity of modes of thinking”, not just direct correspondence of theory to an independent reality (SPN: 341); and that “prediction” was not so much “a scientific act of knowledge” as “the abstract expression of the effort made, the practical way of creating a collective will” (SPN: 438). Gramsci compared the philosophy of praxis to the Protestant Reformation in so far as its success resided in generating cultural agreement to cement civil and political unity (SPN: 395).

Gramsci was not suggesting that truth was only a matter of shared agreement. The philosophy of praxis still aligned to the foundational Marxist principle that social consciousness “corresponds” to material relations of production, knowledge of which was necessary for any practical effort. Marxism therefore required “the critique of ideologies” which “tend to hide reality” (FSPN: 396) and, in this, it sought to bring thought and action into rational correspondence. But the philosophy of praxis could achieve that only if it were grasped as a form of politics, not an abstract science.

These comments are consistent with Gramsci’s general line of argument in the Notebooks on the strategic importance of building consent prior to revolution. They indicate that such a strategy was not a momentary, tactical initiative. It aligned with his aspiration for a cultural transformation over the longer term. His focus on the subjective, “superstructural” element of class politics certainly put Gramsci at odds with more objectivist accounts of Marxism, but it was far from an aversion to the reality of “structural” and empirical constraints (see Morera 1990). Whatever its shortcomings as a generalizable Marxist theory, Gramsci’s philosophy of praxis was in keeping with his attempt to conceive revolutionary politics as the preparation of a “total, integral civilisation” (SPN: 462; see Thomas 2009).

3.6 The Modern Prince

Gramsci still considered the agent of a revolution to be, by necessity, a centralized and ideologically disciplined party. But now he presented the party as the vehicle of a “total and integral conception of the world” that, in advance of the revolution itself, would organize across civil society.

The character of the revolutionary party, for Gramsci, could be grasped by reference to Niccolò Machiavelli’s treatise on political leadership, The Prince. The figure of the prince combined in one person both tactical calculation and an ambition to lead the people in building a state (see SPN: 125). That image of leadership, Gramsci continued, was later exemplified in Georges Sorel’s notion of “myth”, that is, a motivating ideal or “concrete phantasy which acts on a dispersed and shattered people to arouse and organise its collective will” (SPN: 126). Elaborating and diffusing “conceptions of the world” was what modern political parties were designed to do (SPN: 335). Gramsci’s reflections on communist party strategy were therefore formulated as a treatise on what he conceived as “The Modern Prince” (il moderno Principe).

Drawing from the experience of the French Revolution, a modern Prince (or revolutionary party) must present itself as the type of “Jacobin force” which then had “awakened and organised the national-popular collective will, and founded the modern States” (SPN: 131). Its strategy could not be oriented exclusively to the moment of revolutionary rupture but, moreover, “to the question of intellectual and moral reform, that is to the question of religion or world-view” (SPN: 132). The party’s aim was to realize “a superior, total form of modern civilisation” rooted in economic relations (SPN: 133). Yet the “national-popular” dimension required it to do this by transcending the corporate interests of one class alone, presenting its goals on a “universal plane”: “thus creating the hegemony of a fundamental group over a series of subordinate groups” (SPN: 182). The party would lead by making itself the repository of popular common sense, gathering the support of allied intellectuals, and developing its own distinct worldview built on the philosophy of praxis. Gramsci’s conception of the party’s role, therefore, went beyond a temporary or mechanical alliance of separate classes; it meant mobilizing a wholly new and inclusive vision of modern society.

The modern Prince was to be organized in such a way as to maintain contact with workers, but also to ensure disciplined leadership. It would be a party of “ordinary, average men”, with a leadership “endowed with great cohesive, centralising and disciplinary powers”, and an “intermediate element” to keep the two in mutual contact (SPN: 152–53). The party would thus be a mass-based organization under firm direction. To ensure “organic” discipline, Gramsci endorsed the principle of “democratic centralism” whereby decisions would be open to discussion by rank-and-file members. But, once taken, those decisions would be unquestioningly obeyed. That way “bureaucratic” rigidity would be avoided and

there would be a continual adaptation of the organisation to the real movement; a matching of thrusts from below with orders from above. (SPN: 188)

This hybrid of classically “Leninist” and mass-based models of the party reflected Gramsci’s concern to steer a course between sectarian closure and reformist, representational politics. Gramsci was not optimistic that ordinary members could participate effectively without strong direction from a disciplined cadre, however much he thought revolution would eventually overcome the separation of leaders and led (SPN: 144). Hegemonic strategy inevitably meant creating a new leading elite (SPN: 340) whose superior philosophy would “in the masses as such, […] only be experienced as a faith” (SPN: 339). Although some see in Gramsci’s politics the basis of a radically democratic politics (Sassoon 1987), his was not a particularly liberal conception (see Femia 1981: 172–85).

4. Reception of the Prison Writings

Gramsci’s prison writings were first published in Italy after the Second World War: his letters from prison in 1947 (see GLP), winning the Viareggio literary prize that year; and his Notebooks in six, thematic volumes of selections between 1948 and 1951. A complete, “critical” edition of the Notebooks (in four volumes) was published in 1975 (see QC).

The distance in time since their drafting, and the fragmented nature of the texts themselves, meant that the prison writings did not directly address the new environment into which they emerged. The meaning and implications of his thinking were therefore heavily mediated by national and geopolitical concerns through which, inevitably, the Notebooks were read. Over time—as his writings became available and scholarship on his thought improved—recognition of his distinctiveness as a thinker has grown around the world. Gramsci’s account of hegemony, especially, has been a highly effective resource for cultural and political analysis (see Martin 2022).

Where precisely did Gramsci’s philosophical innovations lie for his later readers? Over the years, different, interpretations of Gramsci have tended to emphasize competing aspects of his thought as its philosophical “core” (see Liguori 2012 [2022]).

The initial reception of Gramsci’s writings was shaped by the Italian Communist Party (Partito comunista italiano, or PCI), particularly by its leader since the mid-1920s, Palmiro Togliatti, who emphasized their significance for a renewed communist strategy. To demonstrate allegiance to Stalin and the USSR, Togliatti presented an “acceptable” version of Gramsci that suited the PCI’s cautious post-war politics. Selective editing of the Notebooks downplayed overt conflict with Stalin, emphasizing Gramsci’s continuity with the Soviet philosophical orthodoxy of “dialectical materialism” and a Leninist model of revolution. However, following Stalin’s death in 1953 Togliatti underscored Gramsci’s unique formulation of Marxism and his continuity with native Italian currents of philosophy. This endorsed Togliatti’s own view of the PCI as a pragmatic, mass-based party pursuing its own “Italian road to socialism”; operating as a “collective intellectual” to mobilize the proletariat and its allies in a uniquely national and democratic project (see Togliatti 1979).

Now a canonical figure in Italian Marxism, Gramsci’s reading of history—particularly his view of the Risorgimento as a failed bourgeois revolution—was called into question in the late 1950s. In one notable debate, liberal historian Rosario Romeo disputed that economic conditions could have permitted the nineteenth-century bourgeoisie to act as a “Jacobin” force by mobilizing the peasantry and other subaltern classes. Gramsci’s reasoning (and, by extension, the PCI’s sense of its distinctive national strategy) was premised on a moral and political, rather than genuinely objective, interpretation of history (Liguori 2012 [2022: 121–23]; Davis 1979).

Although Romeo’s critique was disputed by Gramscian historians, from the 1960s, as more of his writings were published and translations became available, Gramsci was increasingly read independently of (and in opposition to) the PCI’s strategic concerns (see Mouffe 1979). His seemingly “heretical” formulation of Marxist theory came to occupy his readers, especially as regards his debt to Crocean historicism, his ambiguous relation to materialism and to Leninism (see Bobbio 1979). More widely, Gramsci’s exploration of cultural and political superstructures resulted in a tendency to categorize him as a “western” Marxist, concerned less with economic conditions or coercion and more with ideological barriers to class consciousness (see Anderson 1976, 1976–77). Hegemony was associated with a general theory of cultural and ideological domination relevant to the critique of consumer capitalism.

Through the late 1960s and 70s, as western states experienced economic and ideological crises, Gramsci’s analyses were applied separately from communist strategy or philosophical idealism. Marxist sociologists such as Nicos Poulantzas (1968 [1973]) and, later, Bob Jessop (1990) found in hegemony a resource to explore the permutations of the capitalist state and its shifting class coalitions. British Cultural Studies—especially the work of Raymond Williams and Stuart Hall—saw in Gramsci an inventive, “cultural Marxist” framework for examining popular lived experience of class domination. Debates over the functions of mass media and populist ideology, particularly with the emergence of “Thatcherism” in the 1980s, were uniquely attuned to the dynamics of hegemonic politics suggested in Gramsci’s writings (see Hall 1988; Jessop et al. 1988).

“Post-Marxist” approaches to hegemony from the 1980s built on the established popularity of Gramsci’s thought, particularly its application in the field of ideology studies. Ernesto Laclau and Chantal Mouffe’s Hegemony and Socialist Strategy (1985) recast hegemony as the theoretical basis to a strategy of “radical democracy”, aimed at unifying multiple and diverse social struggles. Drawing on “poststructuralist” philosophies, hegemony was conceived as a general principle of “discursive articulation”—the contingent formation of a collective identity—with no “necessary” foundation in economic class. For them, Gramsci’s core philosophical insight lay in demonstrating hegemony’s political “logic”, rather than any sociological concerns. They sought to discard the residual economism in his thinking and thus the automatic privilege granted by Marxism to class agency in hegemonic politics. In their view, various hegemonic formations co-exist, and a radical democratic politics does not require working class leadership.

Gramsci’s Notebooks continued to attract scholarly interest after the demise of the Soviet Union and the dissolution of the PCI. Recent approaches have been drawn, increasingly, to the nuances and inflections in his analyses, often neglected in the tendency to focus on “hegemony” and its relation to Marxist theory. While the concept remains important, there is growing appreciation of other themes in Gramsci’s philosophy of politics and their relevance to a variety of fields. His ideas remain a source of insight for non-orthodox Marxisms (see Thomas 2009), and his concepts have been extended to academic fields such as International Relations and Global Political Economy (see Gill 1993) and to socio-political contexts beyond Europe and the “West” (see Morton 2007; Fonseca 2016). Gramsci’s own experience as an internal migrant who “looked at modernity from the bottom of its peripheries” (Urbinati 1998: 371), and his particular attention to the struggles of “subaltern” classes in the formation of national cultures, have inspired forms of postcolonial literary criticism and politics quite at odds with the communist frame in which his ideas originated (see Srivastava & Bhattacharya 2012).


Primary Literature

All works below are by Antonio Gramsci.

  • [FSPN] Further Selections from the Prison Notebooks, Derek Boothman (ed./tran.), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1995.
  • [GPL] Gramsci’s Prison Letters: A Selection, Hamish Henderson (trans.), London: Zwan Publications, 1988.
  • [GTW] A Great and Terrible World: The Pre-Prison Letters 1908–1926, Derek Boothman (ed./tran.), London: Lawrence and Wishart, 2014.
  • [PPW] Antonio Gramsci: Pre-Prison Writings, Richard Bellamy (ed.), Virginia Cox (trans.), (Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • [QC] Quaderni del Carcere, Valentino Gerratana (ed.), 4 vols, (Nuova Universale Einaudi. Nuova Serie, 1), Torino: G.Einaudi, 1975.
  • [SCW] Selections from Cultural Writings, David Forgacs and Geoffrey Nowell-Smith (eds.), William Boelhower (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • [SPN] Selections from the Prison Notebooks of Antonio Gramsci, Quintin Hoare and Geoffrey Nowell-Smith (eds/trans), London: Lawrence & Wishart, 1971.
  • [SPWI] Selections from Political Writings (1910–1920), Quintin Hoare (ed.), John Mathews (trans.), London: Lawrence and Wishart, 1977.
  • [SPWII] Selections from Political Writings (1921–1926), Quintin Hoare (ed./tran.), London: Lawrence and Wishart, 1978.

Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, Perry, 1976, Considerations on Western Marxism, London: NLB.
  • –––, 1976–77, “The Antinomies of Antonio Gramsci”, New Left Review, I/100: 5–78.
  • Bellamy, Richard, 1987, Modern Italian Social Theory: Ideology and Politics from Pareto to the Present, Cambridge: Polity in association with Blackwell.
  • Bellamy, Richard and Darrow Schecter, 1993, Gramsci and the Italian State, Manchester: Manchester University Press and: New York: St. Martin’s Press.
  • Bobbio, Norberto, 1979, “Gramsci and the Conception of Civil Society”, in Mouffe 1979: 21–47.
  • Clark, Martin P., 1977, Antonio Gramsci and the Revolution That Failed, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Croce, Benedetto, 1914, Cultura e vita morale: intermezzi polemici, (Biblioteca di Cultura 69), Bari: Laterza & Figli. Reprinted 1993, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Davidson, Alistair, 1977, Antonio Gramsci: Towards an Intellectual Biography, London: Merlin and Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • Davis, John A. (ed.), 1979, Gramsci and Italy’s Passive Revolution, London: Croom Helm.
  • Femia, Joseph V., 1981, Gramsci’s Political Thought: Hegemony, Consciousness, and the Revolutionary Process, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198275435.001.0001
  • Fonseca, Marco, 2016, Gramsci’s Critique of Civil Society: Towards a New Concept of Hegemony (Routledge Studies in Social and Political Thought 108), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315644196
  • Francioni, Gianni, 1984, L’officina gramsciana: ipotesi sulla struttura dei “Quaderni del carcere” (Saggi Bibliopolis 18), Napoli: Bibliopolis.
  • Gentile, Giovanni, 1919, Guerra e fede: frammenti politici, Napoli: Riccardo Riccardi.
  • Gill, Stephen (ed.), 1993, Gramsci, Historical Materialism and International Relations, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Green, Marcus, 2002, “Gramsci Cannot Speak: Presentations and Interpretations of Gramsci’s Concept of the Subaltern”, Rethinking Marxism, 14(3): 1–24. doi:10.1080/089356902101242242
  • Hall, Stuart, 1988, The Hard Road to Renewal: Thatcherism and the Crisis of the Left, London/New York: Verso.
  • Ives, Peter, 2004, Language and Hegemony in Gramsci, (Reading Gramsci), London/Ann Arbor, MI: Pluto Press.
  • Jessop, Bob, 1990, State Theory: Putting the Capitalist State in Its Place, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Jessop, Bob, Kevin Bonnett, Simon Bromley, and Tom Ling, 1988, Thatcherism: A Tale of Two Nations, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Laclau, Ernesto and Chantal Mouffe, 1985, Hegemony and Socialist Strategy: Towards a Radical Democratic Politics, London: Verso.
  • Levy, Carl, 1999, Gramsci and the Anarchists, Oxford/New York: Berg.
  • Liguori, Guido, 2012 [2022], Gramsci conteso: interpretazioni, dibatti e polemiche 1922–2012, Nuova edizione riveduta e ampliata, Roma: Riuniti University Press. Translated as Gramsci Contested: Interpretations, Debates, and Polemics, 1922–2012, Richard Braude (trans.), (Historical Materialism Book Series 250), Leiden: Brill, 2022. doi:10.1163/9789004503342
  • Martin, James, 2022, Hegemony (Key Concepts in Political Theory), Cambridge, UK/Medford, MA: Polity Press.
  • Morera, Esteve, 1990, Gramsci’s Historicism: A Realist Interpretation, London/New York: Routledge.
  • Morton, Adam D., 2007, Unravelling Gramsci: Hegemony and Passive Revolution in the Global Economy (Reading Gramsci), London/Ann Arbor, MI: Pluto Press.
  • Mouffe, Chantal (ed.), 1979, Gramsci and Marxist Theory, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Poulantzas, Nicos, 1968 [1973], Pouvoir Politique et Classes Sociales, (Textes à l’appui), Paris: François Maspero. Translated as Political Power and Social Classes, Timothy O’Hagan (trans.), London: NLB, 1973.
  • Sbarberi, Franco, 1986, Gramsci, un socialismo armonico, (Il Pensiero politico contemporaneo 19), Milano, Italy: F. Angeli.
  • Schecter, Darrow, 1990, “Gramsci, Gentile and the Theory of the Ethical State in Italy”, History of Political Thought, 11(3): 491–508.
  • –––, 1991, Gramsci and the Theory of Industrial Democracy (Avebury Series in Philosophy), Aldershot: Avebury.
  • Schwarzmantel, John, 2015, The Routledge Guidebook to Gramsci’s Prison Notebooks, Abingdon: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315733852
  • Sassoon, Anne Showstack, 1980, Gramsci’s Politics, New York: St. Martin’s Press. Second edition, 1987, London: Hutchinson.
  • Spriano, Paolo, 1977 [1979], Gramsci in carcere e il Partito, (Biblioteca di storia ; 67), Roma: Editori riuniti. Translated as Antonio Gramsci and the Party: The Prison Years, John Fraser (trans.), London: Lawrence and Wishart, 1979.
  • Srivastava, Neelam and Baidik Bhattacharya (eds.), 2012, The Postcolonial Gramsci, (Routledge Research in Postcolonial Literatures 36), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203128916
  • Thomas, Peter D., 2009, The Gramscian Moment: Philosophy, Hegemony and Marxism, (Historical Materialism Book Series 24), Leiden ; Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/ej.9789004167711.i-478
  • Togliatti, Palmiro, 1979, On Gramsci, and Other Writings, Donald Sassoon (ed.), London: Lawrence and Wishart.
  • Urbinati, Nadia, 1998, “From the Periphery of Modernity: Antonio Gramsci’s Theory of Subordination and Hegemony”, Political Theory, 26(3): 370–391. doi:10.1177/0090591798026003005

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