Richard Mervyn Hare

First published Wed Jun 4, 2014; substantive revision Fri May 10, 2019

Richard Hare left behind at his death a long essay titled “A Philosophical Autobiography”, which was published after his death. Its opening is striking:

I had a strange dream, or half-waking vision, not long ago. I found myself at the top of a mountain in the mist, feeling very pleased with myself, not just for having climbed the mountain, but for having achieved my life’s ambition, to find a way of answering moral questions rationally. But as I was preening myself on this achievement, the mist began to clear, and I saw that I was surrounded on the mountain top by the graves of all those other philosophers, great and small, who had had the same ambition, and thought they had achieved it. And I have come to see, reflecting on my dream, that, ever since, the hard-working philosophical worms had been nibbling away at their systems and showing that the achievement was an illusion. (2002: 269)

Yet his imagination could also be less modest: a gaggle of moral philosophers is trapped beneath the earth in a smoke-filled chamber; they talk at cross purposes, and refuse to take the way out into the open air that he alone has discovered. It was his ambition to have united elements from Aristotle, Kant, and Mill in a logically cogent way that solved the fundamental problems of ethics (though leaving unfinished business), and he usually believed himself to have achieved this. For much of his career, his “prescriptivism” formed an important part of the curriculum, certainly in Britain. His disappointment was not to have persuaded others (an occasional “we prescriptivists” was always uncertain of reference), and to have left no disciples; he once told John Lucas that this made his life a failure. Yet he leaves behind generations of pupils grateful for the transmission not of a doctrine but of a discipline; and posterity, while unlikely to ratify the logical validity of his theory, will have reason to admire it for its uniting of apparent opposites, freedom and reason, tradition and rationalism, eclecticism and rigor.

1. The Life and the Man

Richard Mervyn Hare was born at Backwell Down, outside Bristol, on 21 March 1919. He was to be known professionally as R.M. Hare, and personally as Dick Hare. His father, Charles Francis Aubone Hare, was director of a firm, John Hare & Co., making paint and floor-cloth; his mother was Louise Kathleen Simonds, of a brewing and banking family. His parents died while he was still young. He was then cared for chiefly by guardians and relatives on his mother’s side, being sent to school first at Copthorne in Sussex, and then, from 1932 to 1937, as a classical scholar at Rugby. He was awarded a scholarship to Balliol College in 1937, where he read two years of Greats before the outbreak of war.

Despite a largely classical education, Hare’s mind was already turning towards moral philosophy. He ascribed this to two things, the need to define an attitude towards fighting, and a feeling of guilt at living in moderate comfort. He spent much time while still at Rugby working with the unemployed, and finally decided not to be a pacifist, but to join the OTC. When war broke out, he volunteered for service in the Royal Artillery, and circumvented the results of a medical test in order to be permitted active service overseas. He was eventually put on a ship for India in autumn 1940. He had a year training Punjabi soldiers, and enjoying some adventures (twice finding his own way back through the jungle, once after losing his guns to the Japanese). He was finally taken prisoner when Singapore fell in February 1942. He then suffered a long march up the River Kwai to near the Three Pagodas Pass, with a group of officers whose task was to work as coolies building the railway from Siam into Burma. So he knew too well the “violent untiring labours” that Aristotle associates with virtue in an ode to a dead friend that was dear to Hare’s heart. He writes in his autobiography, “I prefer to pass over our sufferings during the eight months we were there” (2002: 283); he rarely mentioned them (except when more fortunate critics of his views rashly imputed to him the exemption from a wider experience of life that can be the privilege of an Oxford fellowship). He was eventually imprisoned with fellow officers in Singapore, whence he was released after exactly three and a half years when the War ended.

After the war, Hare returned to Balliol to complete the four years of Greats. Even before he sat Finals, he was offered a lectureship at Balliol, which almost immediately became a fellowship. Hare always claimed to have learnt a lot from his pupils, and his early years at Balliol granted him outstanding ones—four of whom, Bernard Williams, David Pears, Richard Wollheim, and John Lucas, were to join him both as professional philosophers, and as Fellows of the British Academy. Lucas narrates how he and his contemporaries would plan a day’s campaigning, with a succession of tutees concerting, through the day, objections to some settled opinion of Hare’s, and replies to his replies—with Williams sent in last to deliver the coup de grâce that was never, in the event, fatal. No one who never experienced Hare’s impromptu fielding of objections can really understand the resilience of even his less plausible convictions. And yet, despite some impressions, he was quite capable of admitting the force of fair counter-arguments. He had a faith that apparent disagreements can usually be resolved once confusions are removed (whence the over-sanguine title of his last book, Sorting Out Ethics, 1997a). This went with a presumption that objections to his views rested on confusion, one that could lead to a degree of asperity. He recognized that the brusquely economical format of his “Comments” within Hare and Critics (which he seriously wanted to be titled, after a pub-name familiar in England, “Hare and Hounds”) might be taken amiss (1988a: 201):

In case anybody thinks that I have been discourteous to my critics in writing notes instead of essays, I must point out that this is what we commonly do to Plato and Aristotle (as in the Clarendon series of commentaries), taking their arguments one by one and treating them briskly but seriously.

There could be a complaint that Hare was most interested in his own ideas. John Lucas had from Tom Braun a Balliol rhyme (of which he cites a variant version in Lucas 2002: 31) dating from soon after the publication of The Language of Morals (1952):

My pupils I have always taught
You cannot get an “is” from “ought”.
This is the burden of my song:
“It’s in my book, or else it’s wrong.”

It is true that Hare was most appreciative of points helpful to his own reconsiderations; he could then be depended upon to be over-generous. He always disparaged his own scholarship, though from a demanding point of view. (Few writers of long books on Plato can have first re-read the whole of Plato in Greek, as Hare did before writing his very short one, 1982.) Yet his interests were wider in range than his publications, and extended through Frege, Chomsky, Davidson, and a fair range of contemporary philosophy of mind and language. Though he was keen to claim ancestry (in a late encyclopedia article he counts Socrates and Aristotle as, in part, the first prescriptivists; 1998: 20), his love of philosophy did not reduce at all to a love of his own philosophy.

His most amiable aspects were apparent to the undergraduates (by preference) whom, from early on, he invited to one of his reading-parties, first at Plas Rhoscolyn in Anglesey, and later also at Saffron House in Ewelme, beneath the Chilterns. It was there above all that he vividly communicated a sense of how worthwhile and enjoyable it is not just to read but to do philosophy. He was thus, however exacting his standards, a most positive figure as a mentor, giving of himself in discussion in a manner that could be opinionated but was also self-forgetful. He was a Puritan of the traditional kind who shared Dr Johnson’s approval of “harmless pleasures”. He was concerned about the case against eating meat; but his eventual virtual vegetarianism was rather caused, he said, by gardening than by argument. Some of his dislikes were distinctive: the music of Beethoven (which he came to find superficial), wearing socks (which he ascribed to commercialism), drinking coffee (which he said affected his temper), travelling by train (which caused him anxiety), giving and receiving presents (when the recipient best knows what he wants). Ved Mehta (1962) recalls his working, for freedom from interruption, in a caravan on the front lawn of his house in Oxford. He had the courage, though not the extravagance, to be an eccentric.

It was initially at reading parties that his pupils encountered a part of his life equally important to him as philosophy, his wife and children. What he describes as “a night of mostly bad dreams”, starting with his mother’s death in 1935, ended with his marriage in 1947 to Catherine Verney, which he calls “the best thing I ever did, and a source of lasting happiness” (2002: 272 & 292). They shared a love of traditional Anglicanism (though her beliefs were more orthodox than his), and of music (especially choral and a cappella). A Hare reading party at Ewelme was always in part a music camp, with (for all those able to join in) a piano to play and madrigals to sing. Everything equally involved their four children, John (who has published about his father, 2007: 184–248), and three daughters. Without them, he would have felt incomplete even as a moral philosopher; for Aristotle’s question “What sort of person should I be?” gave way, for him, to the question “What sort of person should I bring up my children to be?”

Hare remained a tutor at Balliol for twenty years, and always felt attached to that institution above all others (whence the bequest of his Nachlass). It was still during his time there, in 1964, that he was elected a Fellow of the British Academy. However, ineluctable promotion eventually removed him, in 1966, to the White’s Chair of Moral Philosophy at Corpus Christi. There he took on a responsibility for the supervision of research students. (Balliol and Corpus Greats pupils still had the benefit of his reading parties, which for a time, while John was at Balliol, became biennial.) He also took his turn as chairman of the Philosophy Panel, which admits and oversees graduates, and chairman of the Faculty Board. Administration, it may be said, was a task with which he coped admirably, but, also admirably, refused to identify.

He recalls that most of his cousins on his mother’s side were Americans; and two of his children emigrated to America and married Americans. Like all distinguished Oxford philosophers, he received many invitations there (of which the most welcome was to the Center for Advanced Study in the Behavioral Sciences at Stanford, where he wrote both Moral Thinking, 1981, and his little book Plato, 1982). All this made less improbable his early retirement from Oxford in 1983, and his appointment as Graduate Research Professor of Philosophy at the University of Florida at Gainesville. One desire was to escape from faculty politics at Oxford. A contributing factor was the publication of Moral Thinking, which left him immediately, he confessed, nothing new to say in his staple lectures. Yet his main motive was the prospect of helping to set up a Center for Applied Philosophy.

The very phrase “applied ethics”, now so familiar (and yet, one may think, tendentious), presupposes a tradition of ethical theories, such as his, that invite practical applications. In fact, he published his first paper in practical ethics, titled “Ethics and Politics”, in the Listener (1955). (Part of it is collected, under the title “Can I be Blamed for Obeying Orders?”, in Hare 1972a; there it is followed by three papers originally published in the 1950s, and more from the 1960s.) Better known is the last chapter of Freedom and Reason (1963), which addressed the issue, then (it seemed) wholly recalcitrant, of apartheid. And much else followed, with a stream of papers, and memberships of various advisory bodies (Hare 2002: 294–5). He was engaged especially by urban planning, where he favored radial over ring roads, and biomedical ethics, in which he labored to be logical and not just bien pensant. When a Society for Applied Philosophy was formed, he became its first President. So he looked forward to a profitable refocusing of his energies; and this, to an extent, occurred, even when the Center partly disappointed. As he notes, three out of four volumes of essays published between 1989 and 1993 fall within practical ethics (Hare 1989b, 1992a, 1993a).

His time in Gainesville was disturbed by the first, and slightest, of his strokes. When he fully returned with Catherine to Ewelme in 1994, further attacks cheated him of his hopes of continuing to combat “the usual misunderstandings” (2002: 304–5). He gave his last paper, appropriately, to an undergraduate audience at King’s College London. He was still able to put together Sorting Out Ethics (1997a), deriving from the Axel Hägerström Lectures that he had given at Uppsala University in 1991 (when he also received an honorary doctorate—his first doctorate—from the University of Lund). His eightieth birthday was marked by the publication of a final collection of papers, Objective Prescriptions and other essays (1999). He died suddenly but peacefully on 29 January 2002.

2. The Language of Morals

Philosophically, Hare came under two influences that together led him to views that he could always retain. One was emotivism. He followed this in accepting a broadly empiricist view of facts that excluded moral facts in any unetiolated sense of “fact”. However, he never adopted the verification principle of meaning in any thorough-going way. He also recoiled from any causal account of “emotive meaning” that reduced moral discourse to emotional manipulation. It became a recurrent theme that emotivism went wrong by connecting the meaning of moral language with its perlocutionary, rather than its illocutionary, force (1997a: 112–14), that is, with what we do by or through using it, rather than what we do in using it.

The other influence was Kantian. From H.J. Paton’s lectures on Kant, and articles by Reginald Jackson, he learnt that imperatives fall within the realm of reason. This led him into a study of imperative logic, a topic already being explored in Scandinavia (especially by Alf Ross), but unfamiliar in Britain. In his first published article, “Imperative Sentences” (1949), in his essay “Practical Reason” entered for the T.H. Green Moral Philosophy prize in 1950, and in his first book, The Language of Morals (1952), he explored the possibilities of inferring imperative conclusions from imperative, or a combination of imperative and indicative, premises.

The Language of Morals introduced a distinction between prescriptive and descriptive meaning. Prescriptive meaning is defined in relation to imperatives: a statement is prescriptive if it entails, if necessary in conjunction with purely factual statements, at least one imperative; and to assent to an imperative is to prescribe action. Descriptive meaning is defined in relation to truth-conditions: a statement is descriptive to the extent that factual conditions for its correct application define its meaning. It is taken for granted, in the tradition of Hume, that the factual is only contingently motivating: desire is no part of sincere assent to a purely factual statement. A moral statement has prescriptive meaning, but may also be partly descriptive. Thus “A [a person] ought to φ” entails the imperative “Let A φ”, so that to assent to it sincerely is to have an overriding desire (which in application to oneself will amount, if its satisfaction appears practicable, to an intention) that A φ. If there are agreed reasons for φ-ing within a linguistic community, say that it is enjoyable, “A ought to φ” may take on the descriptive implication of “φ-ing is enjoyable”. “X is a good F” prescribes choice within a certain range (e.g., for someone who is choosing an F); it takes on a descriptive connotation if there are agreed standards for assessing Fs.

Hare never said that ethical statements are imperatives; however, it is striking that non-descriptive or evaluative meaning is defined in terms of imperatives. This at once gave a clear sense to his endorsement of Hume’s denial that one can derive an “ought” from an “is”. It also coincided, at least in appearance, with Kant, and was to become essential for later developments that brought results comparable to Kant’s. However, a Humean who lacked Kant’s belief in a purely rational will might prefer to make ethical statements more loosely expressive of wish or desire, or even aspiration; and this could avoid what is everyone’s first objection to prescriptivism, that, intuitively, “I ought to φ” does not entail “I will φ” (expressing intention). Hare took courage from the fact that Socrates and Aristotle incur much the same objection; as he liked to urge, Socrates wasn’t simply making a mistake. His initial reply was that cases of failing to try to do what one admits one ought to do may involve psychological incapacity, or an off-color use of “ought” that sheds its full prescriptive meaning. He was to return more fully to the issue in a chapter of his second book, Freedom and Reason (1963), and again in a late encyclopedia article, “Weakness of the Will” (1992). In this last piece he acknowledges that different things go wrong in different cases. At times, the true story may even involve something like Plato’s partition of the soul (which was designed to accommodate conscious self-contradiction).

3. The Logic of Imperatives

Hare’s attempt to ground a logic of imperatives was innovative, but problematic. One uncertainty is about its field. He supposes that there is a genus of tellings to that extends over commands, orders, instructions, givings of advice, and even—when the imperative is self-addressed—forming desires and intentions. These belong together in sharing a direction of fit or onus of match that contrasts them with tellings that which convey information and express states of belief or of knowledge. Crudely, if I tell you that p, and p is false, then, if anything, it is my utterance that is out of order; if I tell you to do X, and you don’t do X, then, if anything, it is your action that is out of order. The general idea is that, just as, if I tell you that p, I am implicitly telling you that q, if it is common knowledge between us that p entails q, so, if I tell you to do X, I am implicitly telling you to do Y, if we know that—well, this is what has to be determined.

It is arguable that the notion of implicitly prescribing fails to determine any logic of imperatives (Price 2004b: §4). Later papers of Hare’s focused upon various problem cases. I shall consider three of these here, all of which admit possible solutions either proposed, or proposable, by Hare.

(1) The simplest examples involve only imperative sentences. These may invite the simple thought that one imperative entails another if the first cannot be satisfied without the second being satisfied also (Hare identifies this as a “logic of satisfaction”, 1971a: 63). This may seem plausible in the following case:

  • (A) Do X and Y.
    So, do X.

Less plausible, however, may appear to be this:

  • (B) Do X.
    So, do X or Y.

(Hare discusses the following instance, “Post the letter; so post the letter or burn it”, 1967: 25–34). And yet it is equally true with (B) as with (A) that the premise cannot be satisfied without the conclusion being satisfied. Moreover, (B) can be derived from (A) by contraposition and substitution. If (A) is valid, so should (C) be:

  • (C) Don’t do X.
    So, don’t (do X and Y).
    So, do not X or not Y.

Then we have only to replace “don’t” by “do”, and we have (B).

Williams (1962/3) judged (B) to be invalid, on the ground that its conclusion carried a “permissive presupposition” that the hearer may do X or do Y. Hare defended it on the ground that the permission is a conversational implicature that is cancelled in the context defined by the premise “Do X”. However, even (A) may be less plausible than it looks. Take this example (which comes from Bob Hale):

  • (D) Light the fuse and step back three paces.
    So, light the fuse.

It is certainly true that the conclusion reiterates part of what was prescribed in the premise. And yet I may hesitate to tell someone to light the fuse, even when I am happy to tell him to light the fuse and step back, if I know that, given his tendency to be carried away, he is most likely, if he lights the fuse, not to remember to step back. (As we might put the point in terms of possible worlds, I won’t tell him to light the fuse if the closest world to this one in which he lights the fuse is one where he forgets to step back; indeed, one solution is to require, for the inference to go through, the addition of a factual premise to the effect that if he lights the fuse, he will remember to step back.) And how can I be telling someone implicitly to do a thing that I would be unwilling to tell him to do explicitly?

Again, however, Hare would presumably say that any suggestion, implicit in the entailed “Light the fuse”, that the hearer should focus upon lighting the fuse is corrected in context by the initial instruction that he then step back.

(2) New problems arise when we have mixed inferences, involving indicative as well as imperative premises. The simplest way of extending a logic of satisfaction to these is by the following rule: a set of premises entails a conclusion if the premises cannot be true (if indicative) or satisfied (if imperative) without the conclusion being true or satisfied also. However, we also need restrictive rules of which an example (already stated in 1952: 28) would be that no imperative conclusion can be drawn from purely indicative premises—but that is doubtless too simple. Take an example from Aristotle’s De Motu Animalium (7, 701a19–22). It involves reasoning from one intention to another. Given Hare’s willingness to represent intentions as self-addressed imperatives, we can rewrite it as follows:

  • (E) Let me make a cloak.
    If I make a cloak, I must do such-and-such.
    So, let me do such-and-such.

Here, if the second premise is true, the first premise cannot be satisfied without the conclusion’s being satisfied also; so the inference goes through on a logic of satisfaction.

Now this evidently needs to be restricted. Take the following:

  • (F) Let me get drunk.
    Whoever gets drunk is bound to have a hangover.
    So, let me have a hangover.

It is true that, if I advise someone “Get drunk”, he might respond “Are you telling me to have a hangover?” Yet this inference is not acceptable as leading from one intention to another; for predicted side-effects of realizing one’s intentions are not thereby intended, even if (in another case) they are welcome. Inferences that may take one from one intention to another need rather to relate, as Aristotle intended (E) (though its wording is actually ambiguous), to means towards, or ways of, achieving a given goal.

Yet further problems arise. Suppose that I intend to achieve some unforgettable end, and recognize that it will require, in due course, a presently forgettable means. (Suppose that I am already set on making a cloak, an end which already looms large in my mind; but some subsidiary means that I know to be necessary in due course can only become salient when the time approaches—I cannot now form an intention to realize the means since I know that I would at once forget it until my intention to realize the end reminded me of them at an opportune moment.) I then already intend the end, but cannot as yet seriously intend the means; for it is plausibly part of having a present intention to do something that one expects one’s intention to play a role in a causal sequence culminating in one’s doing it.

What would Hare say to all this? He can reply that while a self-addressed imperative may express an intention, it can also fail to do so, and that this puts no limits on a logic of prescriptions. If I tell someone to get drunk, knowing that this will produce a hangover, I am telling him to have a hangover, even without intending this. Further, it was already a condition on a prescription’s expressing an intention that its realization appears to the subject to be practicable; it can now be added that I can only form an intention now if I expect it to contribute to the satisfaction of the prescription. This then becomes a refinement, and not an objection.

(3) A problem that we all face is how to reconcile the following two conditional imperatives. (I take my example from Price 2008: 60; but it is of a kind that Hare was long conscious of, and discusses in Hare 1968.)

  • (a) If you want to get drunk every evening, you should work in a bar.
  • (b) If you want to get drunk every evening, you shouldn’t work in a bar.

These look contradictory, but need not be in any way inconsistent: (a) may be true in that working in a bar is the only way through which you can manage to get drunk every evening; (b) may be true in that, given that you are a potential alcoholic with a weak will, not working in a bar is a necessary condition of your maintaining your health (which you either are much concerned about, or ought to be). We can distinguish (a) and (b) most clearly by asking how to detach the consequent. This seems straightforward in the case of (b): one can detach “You shouldn’t work in a bar” from (b) by asserting “You (do) want to get drunk every evening”. But how, if at all, can we detach the consequent of (a)?

One answer might be that one can’t. Another might be that one can, and by asserting “You (do) want to get drunk every evening”, but only by deriving the consequent “You should work in a bar” in a heavily qualified and contextualized sense: working in a bar may fit getting drunk every evening as a necessary means; hence one might say “You should work in bar”, but only if it is implicit that the fittingness that “should” connotes exists only in relation to the goal in question. (So, of course, no recommendation of working in a bar follows.) Hare, however, permits himself a bold solution. He takes the clause “you want to get drunk every evening” to be have different meanings in (a) and (b). In (b), it is an embedded indicative, ascribing a desire to you—which is why the consequent can be detached by asserting “You want to get drunk every evening”. In (a), it is an embedded imperative, which would serve on its own for advising you to get drunk every evening; therefore the consequent can be detached, but only by prescribing “Get drunk every evening”.

The logic is then essentially the same as that of (E) above (but with a disambiguation of its second premise):

Get drunk every evening.
To get drunk every evening, you must work in a bar.
So, work in a bar.

This then invites rewriting, by what Hare takes to be an analogue of a licit logical manoeuvre, as follows:

To get drunk every evening, you must work in a bar.
So, if get drunk every evening, work in a bar.

However, since grammar excludes following “if” by an imperative, it is replaced in the antecedent by a special use of “you want”.

This might be thought no less problematic than convenient for Hare: doesn’t it break the simple—if too simple—rule that no imperative conclusion can be derived from premises that contain no imperative? However, that simple rule lacks application here; for the operator with widest scope in the conclusion is “if”, and not an imperative.

Of course, this proposal by Hare makes salient what has always been the gravest objection to a prescriptivist analysis of practical “ought”s (and “must”s): moral judgments cannot entail imperatives; for the content of a moral judgment can occur, whereas an imperative cannot occur, embedded in various contexts, such as an “if”-clause (forming a conditional antecedent), or a “that”-clause (giving the content of a belief or assertion). The objection was made strongly by Peter Geach in an article (1965) citing Gottlob Frege; so it has come to be known as the “Frege-Geach” objection. Hare’s response is to be found in Hare (1970). His solution to the problem as it arises with conditionals derives from Gilbert Ryle’s notion of “inference tickets” (1950). The role of the quasi-English “If get drunk every evening, work in a bar” is to yield an implicit prescription to work in a bar out of any prescription to get drunk every evening. To press the utterer of (a) on what he is hypothesizing, and what might make it true, is therefore out of place. What looks like a truth-apt proposition with a complex structure is really playing a quite different role: it is not a proposition, but a kind of rule.

Hare (1989c) further hoped to reduce the paradox of an embedded imperative by making a distinction between two elements within the expression of a speech act: when a speaker says “Do X”, thereby telling a hearer to do X, he both issues a sentence in the imperative mood, fit for the communication of a command, and indicates that he intends so to be using it. He calls a sign of the first a tropic, or sign of mood; this is to be distinguished from a neustic, or sign of subscription (like Frege’s assertion-sign). When “Do X” is embedded within a conditional antecedent, as can be expressed in English by “If you want to do X”, the tropic remains though the neustic disappears. This is why it is the imperative “Do X”, and not the indicative “You are about to do X”, that releases the consequent.

Many attempts have been made since to solve what is essentially the same problem, which arises with any view of moral judgments that denies that they are truth–apt in the substantive sense of describing things, or presenting possible contents of belief about the way things are. Indeed, the topic has come fully to life again during the past ten years or so. Of recent treatments, that which owes the most to Hare, both actually and explicitly, is that of John Eriksson (2009); cf. also Eriksson (2015), and for discussion Eggers (2016). Take the following example (which is more straightforward than Eriksson’s):

  1. It would be bad of you to lie to me.
  2. If it would be bad of you to lie to me, it would be bad of me to lie to you. Therefore,
  3. It would be bad of me to lie to you.

We may call the speaker “S”, and the addressee “A”. Eriksson’s proposal is that the validity of the reasoning depends upon the descriptive meaning of “bad” (one that it has in general, or, more likely, one that it takes on in this context). Suppose that S judges A’s lying to him to be bad. This must be because, in his view, it has some general bad–making characteristic (or set of characteristics) B*; this lies behind Premise 1. Then, in a simple case (which should suffice for making the present point), what lies behind Premise 2. will be the equal but conditional ascription of B* to A’s lying to him. Premise 1. becomes the antecedent that discharges the consequent of Premise 2., and we have the conclusion stated in 3.

Hare was aware that such an inference goes through unproblematically (and uninterestingly) once we limit ourselves to the descriptive meaning of “bad” that is spelled out in B*; but, of course, we want to have an inference to a prescriptive, and not just a descriptive, conclusion. Eriksson now draws on a point that is already recurrent in Hare: in virtue of universalizability, S faces a problem if he wishes to mean 1. prescriptively while refusing to mean 3. prescriptively. If he is to forbid A’s lying to him, but not his lying to A, he will need to identify some relevant alternative to B* that fits A’s lying to him, but not his lying to A; this is where descriptive meaning becomes crucial. What here defines “relevance”? A mere difference of identity between S and A is excluded from counting as relevant by universalizability. Yet no doubt S is also distinguishable from A by various general features, and any of these might serve to make a permissible distinction between the two cases. Here we need to appeal to the full force of the Golden Rule Argument that we shall come to in the next section: what is likely to exclude the speaker from making some artificial distinction that permits him to lie to A, but not A to lie to him, will be his inability sincerely and prudently to select his prescriptions in accordance with it.

There can be no doubt that Hare would have welcomed this solution. Two obvious objections to it arise from problems that anyway attach to his conception of “descriptive meaning”:

  1. S may have only a vague notion of the content of B*.
  2. Even if S has a clear (or sufficiently clear) notion of B*, A may well have a different notion himself, and/or no clear understanding of S’s notion.

Evidently, Hare needed to give further thought, within a philosophy of thought and language, to what must be a concept of speaker’s meaning. (At reading parties and in informal discussion, he took a keen interest in the work of H.P. Grice; yet, perhaps out of an awareness of its complications, he never engaged with it in print, or in this connection.) A local reply, which keeps away from any such general philosophy, must have to be on the lines of the following. Evidently, it wasn’t material to the validity of the inference as I presented it how we choose to specify B*. Hence S and A can share a grasp of the validity of the inference even if they both lack, or fail to share, any suitable conception of B*. All that Eriksson offers, and that I have presented, is a schematic grounding of the inference; and, for the reasons given, we can grasp, before we are able to spell out the details in a way that can reliably underpin S and A’s reasoning together to an ethical conclusion, how the schema confirms the validity of the inference. And one real possibility that may ease the situation is this: S and A may agree that there is no relevant general characteristic that distinguishes S’s lying to A from A’s lying to S, though they disagree – or are each unclear – about what characteristic makes both wrong.

Discussion has focused upon the special problems that arise over embeddings within the antecedents of conditionals. With the occurrence of moral predicates within indirect speech Hare faced separate difficulties, and ones to which he offers no explicit solution. However, if there is to be any hope of a solution, he may need, in this case, to exploit his notion of descriptive meaning. Take as an example, “S believes that lying is wrong”, or alternatively (and indifferently) “S holds lying to be wrong.” A direct analysis of what he believes in believing this is hardly going to be available. Yet one may be able to specify, taking Hare’s analysis of “Lying is wrong” as a hypothesis, what has to be true if S is to count as believing that lying is wrong. S needs to have a conception of some feature that characterizes lying in virtue of which, once he is prescribing universally, he forbids it. (Or else, S may be unable to say what it is about lying that makes it wrong to lie, yet without doubting that lying has some feature that does this.) What then gives intelligibility and determinacy to the content of his “belief” is not a set of truth-conditions, but an act of will that rests upon a factual basis, and does not simply reiterate what his nanny has taught him to will. He holds what is straightforwardly a factual belief about lying (though he may be variably able to articulate it), and forbids lying in the light of that.

4. Decisions of Principle

The two features of prescriptivity and universalizability remained the twin pillars of Hare’s theory ever afterwards. The term “universalisability” was to become the title of a slightly later paper (1954/5) which also sorted out a confusion that causes real trouble in Aristotle and Kant. “General” terms (such as “man” or “Greek”) contrast with “singular” ones (such as “Socrates”). However, in the case of maxims, one needs to keep two distinctions apart: a maxim may be “universal”, rather than “singular” or (ambiguously) “particular”, in referring to no individuals (unless within the scope of a preposition such as “like” which converts the name of an individual into the vague specification of a kind); a maxim may also be “general”, rather than “specific”, in identifying a wide class of agent or act—a difference that is one of degree (so that the universal rule “Always give true evidence” is more specific than “Always tell the truth”, and more general than “Always give true evidence on oath”). Any discussion of the practicality and acceptability of “general principles” needs to keep these distinctions apart. Hare’s clarity on the matter is his most important non-disputable contribution to philosophy.

In his essay “Practical Reason” (1950), he had already argued that many decisions are decisions of principle not in deriving from a principle, but in establishing one. As he remarked there,

It is not easier, but more difficult, to decide to accept a very general command like “Never tell lies” than it is to decide not to tell this particular lie … If we cannot decide even whether to tell this lie, we cannot, a fortiori, decide whether to tell lies in innumerable circumstances whose details are totally unknown to us.

What, then, is to guide decision? In the second part of his essay, he attempted to find a secure basis for moral reasoning in such concepts as “friend”; but he discarded that approach before trying it out in print. His paper “Universalisability” (1954/5) stressed one’s personal responsibility in making decisions that are also decisions of principle. The next important development came in a second book, Freedom and Reason (1963), in which the formal features of prescriptivity and universalizability generate a “Golden Rule” form of argument (as stated in Luke 6:31 (KJV), this ran, “And as ye would that men should do to you, do ye also to them likewise”). Hare offers a simple scenario (1963: 90–1): suppose that A owes money to B, who owes money to C, and that the law allows creditors to exact their debts by putting their debtors into prison. If B simply decides “I will put A into prison”, there may be nothing to say to him. But can he say “I ought to put A into prison”? If he does, he commits himself to a principle such as “If this is the only way to exact the debt, the creditor should imprison the debtor”. B is unlikely to be willing to prescribe a likely implication of this, “Let C put me into prison”, since that would frustrate his own interests. Hare argues that the form of argument retains its force even if, in fact, B is not himself a debtor; for the judgment “I ought to put A into prison”, and the principle that it invokes, will still entail conditionals, such as “Let me be put into prison if I am ever in A’s situation”, to which B is unlikely to be able honestly to subscribe.

In Freedom and Reason, Hare allows the argument to be evaded by the “fanatic” who is so committed to some impersonal ideal (say that debtors deserve a hard time) that he is willing to disregard his own personal interests (including the interests that he has himself as a debtor, or would have if he were a debtor). A later tightening of the argument (first set out fully in 1972c), hoped to close off this possibility. In their practical force, ideals are equivalent to universal preferences that differ from personal preferences in their content, but owe their moral weight to the prevalence and intensity of whatever preferences their realization would satisfy. That B would really rather go to prison himself than have debtors be treated leniently is possible, but improbable. A more likely fanatic is guilty of a kind of imprudence in failing to give due weight to his own interests, actual or counter-factual. The emergent ethical theory is a distinctive variety of utilitarianism, one that identifies the moral good with the maximization not of some subjective state such as happiness, but of the satisfaction of preferences.

The argument excited almost as much skepticism as attention. It seemed implausible that the very activity of prescribing universally should commit a speaker to a substantive ethical position, let alone one so distinctive. However, the logic of Hare’s position became perspicuous in his third book, Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Method, and Point (1981). It is there set out as follows. In wondering whether he should assent to the statement “A ought to φ”, the speaker has to reflect whether he can prescribe that everyone should act in the same way, whatever his own situation. “I” connotes no essence (e.g., human): each of us might be anything, and so has, when prescribing for all situations, actual or possible, to be concerned on behalf of everybody. There is further a prescriptive aspect to the meaning of “I”: to take a role to be possibly one’s own, and to prescribe for that possible situation, is to give weight to the preferences of the occupant of that role as if they were actually one’s own. Hence, the speaker can rationally assent to a particular “ought”-statement only if it is derivable from some universal principle that he will accept if he gives impartial and positive weight to all preferences whose satisfaction would be affected by its observance. Thus moral reflection generates a universalized prudence. Moral ideals register within this framework simply as universal preferences; to allow one’s own ideals to override more intense or prevalent desires or ideals of others is a kind of egoism, and so excluded. Human decision remains free, however rational and informed, because anyone can avoid the constraints of morality by declining to moralize; for this reason, it remains true that no “is” entails an “ought”.

This is an extraordinary, and extraordinarily bold, intellectual construction, which invites debate at many points. Zeno Vendler (1988: 181) urged that we keep apart the semantic thesis (which may be true or nearly true) that “I” is a pure indexical, from any metaphysical claim (which may baffle us) that it denotes a pure subject which can take on any state or role. In his reply, Hare clearly shies away from adopting a metaphysical position stranger than Vendler’s own (which rejects Cartesian egos but does admit a transcendental ego). Yet he still supposes it to be true that “I might be Napoleon”, and that “the world in which I was Napoleon would be a different world than this, though not in its universal properties” (1988a: 285). He even supposes that I can consider situations in which I am a stove, a mountain, or a tree—although, since I cannot care what happens to me if I become such a thing, the consideration is idle (1988a: 283). Hare seems here to have entered rather unexpected territory. It would have suited his usual common sense to permit me to imagine not that I am Napoleon, but being Napoleon, i.e., what it was like to be Napoleon; and that can suffice to incline one to ambivalence about the outcome of Waterloo. But he requires there to be a possible situation in which I am, at any rate, relevantly just like Napoleon if he is to maintain that prescribing, say, “All men like Napoleon should receive their come-uppance” applies even to oneself, and so may be imprudent.

A danger remained of deriving a kind of imperative from an indicative. No doubt Napoleon very much wanted to win the battle. Does awareness of that fact commit me to prescribing, on the counter-factual supposition that I am Napoleon, that Napoleon be victorious? Here Hare makes further use of his thesis that the meaning of “I” is partly prescriptive: to hypothesize “if I were Napoleon” is already to “identify with his prescriptions”, in the sense of prescribing that, other things being equal, they be satisfied within the scope of the hypothesis (1981: 96–9).

The solution is equally elegant and audacious. It may confirm doubts whether the situation of my being Napoleon is a situation at all. (For if it were a possible situation, of the same kind as an actual situation, how could I be logically—as opposed to humanly—constrained in what attitude I adopted towards it?) It also throws open questions about what identifying with Napoleon’s prescriptions comes to. One might think that, if “I” is fully prescriptive, I cannot prescribe that Napoleon be defeated in the situation in which I am Napoleon, since that is certainly not what he wanted or would ever have wanted; if so, I cannot honestly prescribe that all men like Napoleon be defeated, since, for one case (that in which I am Napoleon), I do not want that. What Hare requires is a weaker identification: given that I am moralizing, and hence prescribing for all situations of a given general kind, I must give some weight to the preferences that are mine in the situation in which I am Napoleon, but not more weight than that which I give to the preferences that are mine in any of the other situations; hence, in deciding what to prescribe universally, I must weigh all relevant preferences equally (relative to their prevalence and intensity). This is exactly where Hare intends to lead us; but he invites the question how he can prove that one is taken that way by the logic of “ought” and “I”.

5. Attending to Preferences

A related query (which Moral Thinking leaves as “unfinished business”; 1981: 105, cf. 1997) arises about the range of preferences that prescribing universally commits one to taking on board. If “I” is fully prescriptive, it may further follow that to suppose that I am some person is to take on board all his preferences, including “external” ones about matters (say his neighbors’ sexual or dietary practices) that may never impinge upon his consciousness. Yet sometimes Hare only demands impartiality between interests, which is narrower. To accommodate precisely that, we might distinguish a sympathetic “I”: to suppose that I am some person might be to give full weight to his preferences regarding his own experiences. This would still leave open whether I should take into account his prudential preferences (now-for-then) for his future, or only his synchronic preferences (now-for-now) regarding his present state. Alternatively, we might admit an egocentric “I”: this would let us give weight to Cheops’ desire that he receive a big funeral after his death, but not to external desires that do not essentially refer to their possessor. Yet such options embarrass if the aim was to derive a precise ethical theory from the very logic of the concepts.

As Hare notes (1981: 103), restrictions upon the relevant range of preferences may have the effect of bringing together a utilitarianism that aims to maximize pleasure or happiness, and one that aims to maximize the satisfaction of preference. Yet to have any hope of achieving this we would need a double restriction: the only preferences to be considered must be now-for-now or then-for-then, and they must be fully internal in relating only to conscious states of the subject—indeed, more precisely, to features of those states of which the agent is conscious, or, for short, what it is like to be in those states. However, this position is doubly insecure. First, when discussing the treatment of now-for-then preferences, Hare takes over from Richard Brandt the idea that rational agents seek to maximize the satisfaction of their present preferences after they have been adjusted in the light of full exposure to logic and the facts (1981: 101–5, 214–16). This makes the practical question for the agent not “What do I now prefer?”, but “What would I prefer after full exposure to logic and the facts?” The same issue arises even with now-for-now preferences. Hare discusses, though in a different context (1981: 142–4), the pleasure machine imagined by J.J.C. Smart (Smart & Williams 1983: 18) that maximizes the pleasures of a subject through generating a stream of illusory but enjoyable experiences. He sees it as an advantage of his variety of utilitarianism that, not being “formulated in terms of pleasure”, it can give weight to whether “we prefer a life for ourselves plugged into the machines to one devoted to pursuits now considered normal and enjoyable” (1981: 143). That suggests that we should give weight to now-for-now preferences whose objects are not restricted to conscious features of current mental states. Further, if we follow Brandt, we should ask not what now-for-now preferences an agent actually has, but which he would have after subjection to Brandt’s “cognitive psycho-therapy”. Yet this implication may trouble us, not only because of the indefinite scope it offers to paternalism, but because it would seem undeterminable what an agent would want if indefinitely informed.

The other source of insecurity is doubts about whether, within Hare’s framework, we are justified in restricting the relevant range of preferences. If, in deciding what ought to be done, I am rationally bound to identify with the agents whose preferences, internal or external, bear on it, how can I fail to take on the widest range of actual preferences, now-for-then as well as now-for-now and then-for-then, external as well as internal, and uninformed as well as informed? Hare inclines this way, writing “It is still my belief that a full account of the matter would assign weight to all preferences” (1981: 103–4). However, how might this best be done? Let us take them in turn.

  1. Now-for-then preferences. Hare is clear that we take into account how much an agent prefers one thing to another, also to how many agents prefer it. This suggests that we should also attend to how long an agent has a preference; for it would seem arbitrary to count a preference twice if two men have it, if only for a day, but only once if one man has it for two days. We might assimilate the questions how long and how many by dividing people into time-slices within which their relevant preferences are stable, and asking how many person-slices shared some given preference. Yet the effect is curious. Within the life of an individual, a preference may become overriding because he has entertained it for a long time, even if it has been replaced by conflicting preferences at the time of action. (And the theory would not allow one to give precedence to the preferences of the person-slice who acts on the grounds of agential autonomy; for agents enjoy no such privilege.)
  2. External preferences. One difficulty here is in assessing the intensity of an external preference that is idle, but perhaps because the agent can do nothing towards satisfying it. Apparent intensity may be deceptive: it is the mark of a sentimental attitude that it may be warmly felt, and yet at the same time inactive and insincere. However, the same problem arises elsewhere; it is not peculiar to external preferences.
  3. Uninformed preferences. It is hard to see how Hare’s framework itself justifies disregarding these. However, subjects may have a higher-level preference that, where they hold or lack a lower-level preference only out of ignorance, its presence or absence should be discounted—thought perhaps only so long as this does not give rise to a denial of autonomy within spheres where each of us expects to be free to act at will according to his own judgment.

There is further unclarity in the notion of a preference. Hare had long distinguished being in pain, to which one may be indifferent (if the pain is slight, or if one has undergone prefrontal lobotomy), and suffering, which entails having a desire (not necessarily overriding) to escape it. Now it is plausible to suppose that, of any variety of suffering, there is such a thing as what it is like to be subject to it. (So Hare can write of a group of sufferers, “I shall not know what it will be like for them … unless I know what it is like to suffer like that”; 1981: 92.) This applies so long as the desire that is an aspect of suffering is of a kind that is bound to be felt. Yet we all are subject to an indefinite range of desires that are dispositional; and even occurrent desires may be manifest in how we think or act without being felt. Hare appears to overlook such variations when he writes of preferences in general, “If I do not feel the preference with the intensity which the person in the situation feels it, I have not fully represented his situation to myself” (Seanor & Fotion 1988: 288). And yet, when he considers failures to act as one prescribes (e.g., 1981: 21–2), he shows an awareness that how one chooses and acts can be equally indicative as anything one feels of what one prefers. No doubt this could be sorted out, and precisely by recognizing (as Hare doubtless could have, though the language is not his) that the criteria of preference are multiple. However, this would have for him two drawbacks. First, it multiplies the possible ways in which one might count as “identifying with” another. Hare has written, “In identifying myself with some person either actually or hypothetically, I identify with his prescriptions” (1981: 96–7). Yet another way might be imagining what it is like to be him at some time or in some situation—which is different, though it may (to the extent that his preferences come to his mind as objects of attention) be overlapping. Secondly, it confirms a doubt that one is likely to have anyway about the comparability of preferences. If I feel like doing something but, for no compelling reason, fail to do it, whereas you do it without any prior or accompanying consciousness of the preference, who has the stronger preference to do it? The question is liable to be unanswerable.

6. Possible People

Outside Moral Thinking itself, a striking application of Hare’s framework was to possible people, that is, to people who may exist, with preferences and interests to be satisfied, if we choose to bring them into existence. Ought we to do so, so long as this will increase the total satisfaction of preference? A positive answer has implications—though not, Hare argued, very radical ones—for population policy, and the morality of such practices as abortion and IVF. Hare reasons that, if I am glad that I exist, I tenselessly prescribe, ceteris paribus, that my parents bring me into existence; universalizing the prescription, I must prescribe, ceteris paribus, the bringing into existence of others relevantly like me (1975, 1988b, 1988c).

This is intriguing, though not unproblematic. We may be struck by its invocation, in effect, of past imperatives (such as Gerald Manley Hopkins’s “Have fair fallen, O fair, fair have fallen”, addressed to Henry Purcell, which Hopkins explained, in a letter to Bridges on Feb. 3 1883, as ‘the singular imperative (or optative if you like) of the past, a thing possible and actual both in logic and grammar, but naturally a rare one’). Not that this is new: Hare had had already to defend them in prescriptivist analysis of “I ought to have done that”. A further question is whether Hare has correctly isolated the initial attitude. If what I am glad of is the kind of life I experience, in preference to there simply being less life of this kind in the world (cf. 1988c: 173–4), then, if universalization generates a golden-rule argument, it should indeed lead me to prescribe, ceteris paribus, creating other similar lives (unless it is the uniqueness of the life that I value). But Hare also supposes that what Jane Doe is grateful for is that she, Jane Doe, exist and not someone else, even equally privileged, in her place (1988b: 87–8). Yet it is less clear that we can expect her to have that attitude, let alone its analogue, within Hare’s framework, of being specially glad that Dick Hare (or someone with all his universal qualities) exists—supposing that he is glad to exist—in that possible world in which she is (or has all the universal qualities of) Dick Hare.

7. Levels of Moral Thinking

A different feature of his theory, first presented (in different terminology) in “Ethical Theory and Utilitarianism” (1976), and fully explored in Moral Thinking (1981), is a distinction between a “critical” level of thinking, conducted by “archangels” with the use of “Golden Rule” arguments, and an “intuitive” level, conducted by “proles” with the use of simple principles (often articulating emotional responses) whose acceptance can be justified at the critical level. These two levels define not two social castes, but two roles between which each of us learns to alternate as appropriate. The complication is actually inevitable within consequentialism, which has to separate the question how one should act from the question how one should think about how to act—for ways of thinking have consequences no less than ways of acting (and thinking that one should act in a certain way entails no success in so acting, nor even any attempt). A utilitarian assessment of practical principles has to consider not only their observance utility (OU), which is what good will come of enacting them, but also their acceptance utility (AU), which is (roughly) what good will come of intending to enact them. (Note that intending to act in a certain way is itself a mental act. There is no ground here to shift to a different form of utilitarianism, “rule” rather than “act”, or “indirect” rather than “direct”; rather, so far we are simply extending act-utilitarianism to a wider range of acts, mental as well as physical.) A broad generalization that Hare favored is that the highest OU is likely to attach to highly specific principles, though a higher AU may attach to some fairly general ones. This comes of human ignorance and self-deception. A principle, say, permitting adultery when a marriage is breaking up anyway might have a higher OU than one simply forbidding adultery; but, if there are potential Don Juan’s around with a talent for false rationalization, its AU may be lower.

This complication was both convenient, and problematic. Hare had long been wearied by familiar objections citing concrete cases where utilitarian theory appears to conflict with moral intuition, as when an American sheriff might judicially execute one suspect in order to prevent a mass lynching of others. He could now hope to accommodate these at the “intuitive” level of thinking. An inability ever to countenance judicial murder may be recommendable by critical to intuitive thinking as a constraint upon practical reflection in an emergency. And given that the attitude is approved, if not reasserted, by critical thinking as Hare conceives it, how can it in itself tell against his conception of critical thinking? (It would be a case, so to speak, of biting the hand that fed one.)

However, there is a difficulty. It is one thing to make do with intuitive ways of solving problems that are the best available within limits of time and information, while leaving them subject to correction at leisure or in retrospect; it is another to accept a theory that approves one’s actually assenting to certain principles whose contents it cannot endorse. And yet a rule that is a mere “rule of thumb” is a paper shield against temptation. All is well if the theory can be self-effacing, so that the agent discards it as and when he adopts an intuitive viewpoint; but, in Hare’s scenario, in which the agent has internalized both critical and intuitive ways of thinking, how is he to keep out of mind, as he tests his practical commitment to some intuitive principle, that it is simply not of a kind (being absolute, and yet evidently equivalent to no principle of utility) to be critically endorsable?

This objection was to be raised both by Williams (1988) and by J.L. Mackie (1985: 110–11) (cf. also, though not explicitly about Hare, Hunt 1999: §5). Hare anticipated it as follows:

To say that it is impossible to keep critical and intuitive thinking going in the same thought-process is like saying that in a battle a commander cannot at the same time be thinking of the details of tactics, the overall aim of victory, and the principles (economy of force, concentration of force, offensive action, etc.) which he has learnt when learning his trade. (1981: 52; cf. 1988a: 289–90)

This is evidently true of what he had called “rules of thumb”, which an agent applies just so long as this remains the best way in context of achieving his goals. However, Hare came to deprecate that phrase (1981: 38), and to emphasize that the “prima facie principles” he prefers to speak of have the power to produce compunction even where their neglect, since well grounded, cannot produce remorse (1981: 30). Yet how is this to work? No doubt it is possible to combine being convinced both that one has to do X in some difficult situation (say when only lying will save my father), and that doing X remains in some significant way bad. Yet this thought requires the possession of a distinctive concept of being bad whose application, on occasion, though lacking the power to determine an ethical decision, remains obstinately significant and inexpungible. Without such a concept, talk of “compunction” is out of place. Hare makes room for this when he concedes that moral concepts may suffer a sea-change when they are applied at the intuitive and non-critical level. The only particular proposal he makes is that “ought” becomes overridable; yet he should surely be willing to concede that quite new concepts may come into being—all, of course, under the arching guidance of critical thinking. And one such concept might be expressed by a use of “morally bad” of a kind associated with moral philosophies that Hare would otherwise reject.

However, it must remain a problem that, precisely to the extent that intuitive thinking can draw upon conceptions of its own, a clear-eyed intuitive thinking that does not occlude the judgments of critical thinking must be as problematic for Hare as a clear-eyed acrasia that unites conscious and voluntary infringement of a prescription with continued acceptance of it. Force still attaches to an objection by Williams (1988: 190):

The theory ignores the fact that the responses are not merely a black-box mechanism to generate what is probably the best outcome under confusing conditions. Rather, they constitute a way of seeing the situation; and you cannot combine seeing the situation in that way, from the point of view of those dispositions, with seeing it in the archangel’s way, in which all that is important is maximum preference satisfaction, and the dispositions themselves are merely a means to that.

8. Traces of Positivism in Religion and Metaethics

Hare did not suppose that the modern thinking man could long remain what he called a “simple believer”; so he welcomed attempts by R.B. Braithwaite and others to empty religion of dogmatic content. He called himself a “Christian empiricist”, but thought the question whether he was really a Christian terminological. What he retained for himself was what he once called a “blik”, an attitude to the world which somehow gave him confidence to live and think morally, trusting (as he put it) “in my own continued well-being (in some sense of that world that I may not now fully understand) if I continue to do what is right according to my lights”, as also “in the general likelihood of people like Hitler coming to a bad end” (1950/1: 38). John Hare (2002: 307) connects the inhibitions that held his father back from belief not just with modern skepticism, but with “a philosophical doctrine about meaning which he inherited from Carnap and the logical positivists”; for “He thought he could not make meaningful assertions about subjects, like God, which lay beyond the limits of possible sense experience”. Thus he denied that the transcendental has anything to do with prayer, asking “What is the difference between there being a transcendental God who listens to the prayer and directs events accordingly, and it just being the case that the events take place?”, and answering “None at all” (1973: 27). The upshot is fatal to the orthodoxies of belief as of unbelief:

Where the transcendental is concerned, there is no difference between a true story and a myth; it is therefore wrong to speak of the person who prays having an illusion that there is somebody that he is praying to. (ibid.)

Simple belief, it turns out, lacks even a content.

Also traceable to positivism was a recurrent tendency to doubt the substantiality of philosophical disagreement. Presumably Plato was making a mistake of a kind when, as Hare diagnosed it, he

interpreted the experience which we call “having a particular mental image of a square” as “having, on a particular occasion, a mental look at the Square”. (1964: 67)

Within meta-ethics, however, Hare was inclined to suppose that such variations fail to be more than verbal. This suspicion was first expressed in an unpublished paper “Moral Objectivity” (1949–50). Here Hare imagines a White (an objectivist) who calls “a moral intuition” what a Black (a subjectivist) calls “a feeling of approval”, and wonders about the point at issue:

Now we may well ask, seeing that we are all agreed that there is this experience, no matter what you call it, what on earth is the point of having long philosophical arguments about what you do call it.

Take a case of disagreement about pacifism:

The Whites describe this situation by saying that there is a difference of opinion between us as to whether fighting does or does not possess the quality right; the Blacks, on the other hand, describe it by saying that we have different feelings about fighting. But the situation which they are both trying to describe is precisely the same, and they know it … They are disagreeing merely about words.

Hare pursued this skepticism in two published papers, “Nothing Matters” (1959), and “Ontology in Ethics” (1985). Here he suspects of vacuity certain terms that get overworked, “true”, “fact”, “world”, “objective”, “realist”, “cognitivist”; hence he thinks it much harder than many have done to define a position that is distinctively objectivist. (It is certainly not enough to reassert “Murder is wrong” in a peculiar and, as it were, metaethical tone of voice, firm and yet unemotive.) What I have traced back to a verificationism that may now seem dated becomes well-grounded when applied to abstractions that, as appropriated by philosophers, await a clear sense.

9. Afterword

Hare’s unpublished paper “Moral Objectivity” contains a striking passage, unparalleled elsewhere, that confirms Lucas’s supposition (2002: 31) of a connection between his war experience and a vein of existentialism. He imagines being an interpreter in a Japanese prisoner-of-war camp who is trying to persuade the Japanese commander not to send sick people out to work on the railway:

I ask him to visualise, not certain non-natural properties, but the very natural, real properties of the situations that the alternative courses of action will bring about … It is not by any appeal to intuition that I can conduct my argument; … it is by revealing to him the nature of his choice, and showing him what it involves, what in fact he is choosing. And when I have done all this, I can only leave him to choose; for it is after all his choice, not mine … At any rate I have myself chosen, so far as in me lies, my own way of life, my own standard of values, my own principle of choice. In the end we all have to choose for ourselves; and no one can do it for anyone else.

What makes Hare arguably unique, though at the same time closer in approach to Kant than to the utilitarians whose ally he became, was that he combined this insistence upon the ineluctability of individual choice with an optimistic view of the possibilities of making choices rationally. (Indeed, he played with the idea that Kant could have been a utilitarian, 1993b.) What reconciles these two features of moral thinking, in his view, is nothing other than the logic of the practical “ought”. That this is crucial and central was already a claim within his early and unpublished monograph “An Essay in Monism”. There, criticizing “materialists” (among whom he counts utilitarians) for letting “the word ‘ought’ slip out of their vocabulary”, he remarks,

Both the Greeks of the Fourth Century B.C. and we in our own times have seen how quickly people like Thrasymachus spring up, and with what dire results, once men have forgotten the meaning of “ought”. (ch. 19, p. 62)

This may already seem curious in two ways. First, one might suppose that language is rather our servant than our master, and that the rationality of reasoning in the ways he recommends needs to be established on general grounds, and not made to depend upon theses about the connotations of a word. Secondly, one of the theses in question—that practical “ought”s entail imperatives—is hardly obviously true; one might rather expect an Oxford philosopher, in the heyday of ordinary language philosophy, to be sensitive to the objection that the modal “You ought to do X” no more entails the imperative “Do X” than the modal “He ought to have got home by now” entails the indicative “He has got home by now”. (Think how much more plausible it is to infer the second from “He must have got home by now”.)

Hare had replies to both objections, which he sets out briefly in Moral Thinking (1981). He insists that we need our words to mean what they do mean if we are to answer the questions that we want to ask:

If we were to alter the meaning of our words, we should be altering the questions we were asking, and perhaps answering, in terms of them … If we go trying to answer those questions, we are stuck with those concepts. (1981: 18)

And yet, at the same time, he asserts no more than that the practical “ought” is a “near neighbour” to the deontic “must” (1981: 7), acknowledging

It is much odder to say “I must” at the moment at which one is backsliding (i.e. doing what one says one must not do) than it is to do this with “ought”. (1981: 24)

Here he may seem to vacillate between two different roles, that of describing our language as it is, and that of tightening it in order to make it more rigorous. Perhaps one may reconcile these through making much of the following qualification:

But “ought” aspires to the status of “must”, and … in rigorous, critical moral reasoning has to be used like it. (1981: 24)

In Hare’s view, it is human weakness that is served better by “ought” than by “must”, and we reveal our commitment to the logic of “must” in uses of “ought” that fall short of that logic, and yet constantly aspire to live up to it. “Intuitive” thinking may be as necessary as “critical”, and yet it is never such as to enjoy a secure resting-place in our hearts and minds.

At the heart of Hare’s ethical theory, therefore, lies a vision of human beings as unable to live up to a way of thinking towards which they are nonetheless ineluctably drawn. He perceives there to be a drama inherent in the human condition to which no fully integrated and unified system could do justice. His philosophy is currently somewhat out of fashion, in part through a reversion to various forms of cognitivism in ethics, in part through changes in the style of philosophy, which now pursues the clarity that he desired through a new complexity and professionalization. At least in the short term, it is probable, and in accord with the “strange dream” from which we started, that his thinking will come to be viewed from a distance, as playing a once important role within the non-cognitivist strain in ethics that was dominant through much of the 20th century. And yet it may yet come to hold the attention of a new audience through its recognition of the tensions inherent in any practical thinking that responds without complacency to the aspirations of our ethical ideals, and the limitations of our moral capacities.

Supplementary Document: Hare’s “An Essay on Monism”


Primary Literature

(For a complete listing of publications, see Hare 1997a: 167–82, updated in 2000 reprint.)

  • unpublished (early 1940s), “An Essay in Monism”, Balliol College Archive. (I quote from the typescript, within which chs 1–12 are numbered in type pp. 1–120, after which a new pagination starts in pencil.)
  • unpublished (1949–50), “Moral Objectivity”, Balliol College Archive.
  • unpublished (1950), “Practical Reason”, Balliol College Archive.
  • 1949, “Imperative Sentences”, Mind, 58: 21–39; reprinted in Hare 1971a: 1–21.
  • 1950/1, “Theology and Falsification”, University, 1 (Winter); reprinted in 1992a: 37–9 (page-reference in text to reprint).
  • 1952, The Language of Morals, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1954/5, “Universalizability”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 55: 295–312; reprinted in Hare 1972b: 13–28.
  • 1955, “Ethics and Politics”, The Listener, 54 (13 October): 593–4; 55 (20 October): 651–2; the first installment was reprinted as “Can I Be Blamed for Obeying Orders?”, Hare 1972a: 1–8.
  • 1957, “Geach: Good and Evil”, Analysis, 18: 103–12.
  • 1959, “Nothing Matters”, published in French in La Philosophie Analytique, Paris: Les Éditions de Minuit; reprinted in English in 1972a: 32–47.
  • 1963, Freedom and Reason, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1964, “A Question about Plato’s Theory of Ideas”, in M. Bunge (ed.), The Critical Approach, Essays in Honor of Karl Popper, Glencoe IL: Free Press of Glencoe; reprinted in 1971b: 54–79 (page-reference in text to reprint).
  • 1967, “Some Alleged Differences between Indicatives and Imperatives”, Mind, 76: 309–26; reprinted in Hare 1971a: 25–43 (page-reference in text to reprint).
  • 1968, “Wanting, Some Pitfalls”, in R. Binkley (ed.), Agent, Action and Reason (Proceedings of the University of Western Ontario Colloquium); reprinted in Hare 1971a: 44–58.
  • 1969, “Practical Inferences”, in V. Kruse (ed.), Festskrift til Alf Ross, Copenhagen: Juristvorbundets Vorlag; reprinted in Hare 1971a: 59–73 (page-reference in text to reprint).
  • 1970, “Meaning and Speech Acts”, Philosophical Review, 79: 3–24; reprinted in Hare 1971a: 74–93.
  • 1971a, Practical Inferences, London: Macmillan.
  • 1971b, Essays on Philosophical Method, London: Macmillan.
  • 1972a, Applications of Moral Philosophy, London: Macmillan.
  • 1972b, Essays on the Moral Concepts, London: Macmillan.
  • 1972c, “Wrongness and Harm”, in 1972b: 92–109.
  • 1973, “The Simple Believer”, in G. Outka & J.P. Reeder (eds), Religion and Morality, New York: Anchor Press; reprinted in 1992a: 1–36 (page-reference in text to reprint).
  • 1975, “Abortion and the Golden Rule”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 4: 201–22; reprinted in 1993a: 147–67.
  • 1976, “Ethical Theory and Utilitarianism”, in H.D. Lewis (ed.), Contemporary British Philosophy 4th Series, London: Allen & Unwin; reprinted in 1989a: 212–30.
  • 1978, “Relevance”, in A.I. Goldman & J. Kim (eds), Values and Morals, Dordrecht: Reidel; reprinted (with second thoughts) in Hare 1989a: 191–211.
  • 1981, Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Method and Point, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1982, Plato, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1985, “Ontology in Ethics”, in T. Honderich (ed.), Morality and Objectivity: A Tribute to J.L. Mackie, London: Routledge; reprinted in 1989a: 82–98.
  • 1988a, “Comments”, in Seanor & Fotion (eds) 1988: 199–293.
  • 1988b, “When does Potentiality Count?”, Bioethics, 2: 214–26; reprinted in Hare 1993a: 84–97.
  • 1988c, “A Kantian Approach to Abortion”, in M. Bayles & K. Henley (eds), Right Conduct, New York: Random House; reprinted in Hare 1993a: 168–84.
  • 1989a, Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1989b, Essays on Political Morality, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1989c, “Some Sub-Atomic Particles of Logic”, Mind, 98: 23–37; reprinted in Hare 1999: 28–42.
  • 1992a, Essays on Religion and Education, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1992b, “Weakness of the Will”, in L. Becker (ed.), Encyclopedia of Ethics, New York: Garland; reprinted in Hare 1999: 109–14.
  • 1993a, Essays on Bioethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1993b, “Could Kant have been a Utilitarian?”, Utilitas, 5: 1–16; revised in 1997a: 147–65.
  • 1997a, Sorting Out Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1997b, “Preferences of Possible People”, in C. Fehige & U. Wessels (eds), Preferences, Berlin: De Gruyter; reprinted in Hare 1999: 126–31.
  • 1998, “Prescriptivism”, in E. Craig (ed.) The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy,London: Routledge; reprinted in Hare 1999: 19–27 (page-reference in text to reprint).
  • 1999, Objective Prescriptions and Other Essays, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 2002, “A Philosophical Autobiography”, Utilitas, 14: 269–305.

Secondary and Other Literature

  • Adu-Amankwah, P.A., 1997, The Moral Philosophy of R.M. Hare: A Vindication of Utilitarianism?, New York: Peter Lang.
  • Alwood, A., 2010, “Imperative Clauses and the Frege–Geach Problem”, Analysis, 70: 105–17.
  • Biesenbach, H., 1982, Zur Logik der moralischen Argumentation: Die Theorie Richard M. Hares und die Entwicklung der analytischen Ethik, Düsseldorf: Patmos Verlag.
  • Brandt, R.B., 1979, A Theory of the Good and the Right, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Eggers, D., 2016, “Nothing New in Ecumenia? Hare, Hybrid Expressivism and de Dicto Beliefs”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 19: 831–47.
  • Eriksson J., 2009, “Homage to Hare: Ecumenism and the Frege-Geach Problem”, Ethics, 120: 8–35.
  • –––, 2015, “Hybrid Expressivism”, in M. Ridge & G. Fletcher eds, Having it Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 149–70.
  • Fehige, C. & U. Wessels (eds), 1998, Preferences, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Foot, P., 1978, Virtues and Vices and Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; reprinted in 2002, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2001, Natural Goodness, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Forschler, S., 2013, “Kantian and Consequentialist Ethics: The Gap Can Be Bridged”, Metaphilosophy, 44: 88–104.
  • Geach, P.T., 1956, “Good and Evil”, Analysis, 17: 33–42.
  • –––, 1965, “Assertion”, Philosophical Review, 74: 449–65; reprinted in his Logic Matters, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1972: 254–69.
  • Hallich, O., 2000, Richard Hares Moralphilosophie, Freiburg/München: Alber Verlag.
  • Hare, J.E., 2002, “A Memorial Address”, Utilitas, 14: 306–8.
  • –––, 2007, God and Morality, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hudson, W.D., 1983, Modern Moral Philosophy, 2nd edn, London: Macmillan.
  • Hunt, L., 1999, “Flourishing Egoism”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 16: 72–95.
  • Ibberson, J., 1986, The Language of Decision: An Essay in Prescriptivist Ethical Theory, London: Macmillan.
  • Irwin, T., 2009, The Development of Ethics: A Historical and Critical Study (Volume III: From Kant to Rawls), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kalokairinou, E.M., 2011, From Meta-Ethics to Ethics: An Overview of R.M. Hare’s Moral Philosophy, Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.
  • Kenny, A., 1966, “Practical Inference”, Analysis, 26: 65–75.
  • –––, 1975, Will, Freedom and Power, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Lucas, J.R., 2002, Obituary of R.M. Hare, Balliol Annual Record: 30–2.
  • Lucien, P., 1976, Empirisme, logique et langage religieux: Trois approches anglo-saxonnes contemporaines: R.B. Braithwaite, R.M. Hare, I.T. Ramsey, Montreal: Bellarmin.
  • MacKay, A.F., 1969, “Inferential Validity and Imperative Inference Rules”, Analysis, 29: 145–56.
  • Mackie, J.L., 1977, Ethics, Inventing Right and Wrong, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • –––, 1985, Persons and Values: Selected Papers Volume II, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mehta, V., 1962, Fly and the Fly-Bottle: Encounters with British Intellectuals, London: Weidenfeld & Nicolson.
  • Murdoch, I., 1956, “Vision and Choice in Morality”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 30: 32–58.
  • Price, A.W., 2004a, “Richard Mervyn Hare, 1919–2002”, Proceedings of the British Academy, 124: 117–37.
  • –––, 2004b, “On the so-called Logic of Practical Inference”, in A. O’Hear (ed.), Modern Moral Philosophy, Philosophy, Supplement 54: 119–40.
  • –––, 2005, “Hare, Richard Mervyn”, in Oxford Dictionary of National Biography.
  • –––, 2008, Contextuality in Practical Reason, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Ridge, M., 2006, “Ecumenical Expressivism: Finessing Frege”, Ethics, 116: 302–36.
  • Rønnow-Rasmussen, T., 1993, Logic, Facts and Representation: An Examination of R.M. Hare’s Philosophy, Lund: Lund University Press.
  • Ryle, G., 1950, “If, So, and Because”, in M. Black (ed.), Philosophical Analysis, Cornell: Cornell University Press; reprinted in Collected Papers (Volume 2), London: Hutchinson, 1971, 234–49.
  • Seanor, D. & Fotion, N. (eds), 1988, Hare and Critics: Essays on Moral Thinking, Oxford: Clarendon Press; contributions by D. Seanor & N. Fotion, W.D. Hudson, R.B. Brandt, W.K. Frankena, A. Gibbard, J. Griffin, J.C. Harsanyi, T. Nagel, D.A.J. Richards, T.M. Scanlon, P. Singer, J.O. Urmson, Z. Vendler, B. Williams.
  • Shibasaki, F., 1994, Formalismus und Fanatismus: Eine Untersuchung zur Moralphilosophie R.M. Hares, Sydney: Kovac.
  • Singer, P., 2002, “R.M. Hare’s Achievements in Moral Philosophy”, Utilitas, 14: 309–17.
  • Smart, J.J.C. & Williams, B., 1983, Utilitarianism, For and Against, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Smith, M., 2001, “Some Not-Much Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics”, Ratio, 4: 93–115.
  • Timmermann, J., 2005, “Why Kant Could Not Have Been a Utilitarian”, Utilitas, 17: 243–64.
  • Varner, G.E., 2012, Personhood, Ethics, and Animal Cognition: Situating Animals in Hare’s Two Level Utilitarianism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Vendler, Z., 1988, “Changing Places?”, in Seanor & Fotion (eds): 171–83.
  • Warnock, G.J., 1967, Contemporary Moral Philosophy, London: Macmillan.
  • Wiggins, D., 2009, Ethics: Twelve Lectures on the Philosophy of Morality, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Williams, B., 1962/3, “Imperative Inference”, Analysis, suppl. 23: 30–6.
  • –––, 1988, “The Structure of Hare’s Theory”, in Seanor & Fotion (eds): 185–96.
  • Wym, K.D., 2005, Crucible of Reason: Intentional Action, Practical Rationality, and Weakness of Will, Lanham MD: Rowman & Littlefield.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


With the kind permission of the British Academy, this present piece abbreviates the biographical, and extends the philosophical, parts of Price 2004a. I am grateful to John Hare for permission to use and copy unpublished material from the Balliol College Archive.

Copyright © 2019 by
Anthony Price <>

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