Hegel’s Social and Political Philosophy

First published Thu Jun 3, 2021

Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770–1831) developed a philosophy based on freedom within a wider philosophical system offering novel views on topics ranging from property and punishment to morality and the state.

Hegel’s main work was the Elements of the Philosophy of Right (“PR”) first published in 1821. Many of his other major works include discussions or analyses connected to his social and political philosophy. He also wrote various political essays during his career, many of which have been translated (Hegel 1999). His work has been a major influence on significant figures from Karl Marx to Charles Taylor and beyond.

This entry provides an overview about how Hegel’s ideas have been debated and the core contributions from his PR followed by further readings.

1. The Place of Hegel’s Social and Political Thought

Hegel’s social and political thought has been a subject of several debates in terms of its form and content.

1.1 Conservativism and Progressive Readings

One such debate concerned whether or not his views endorsed a dangerous conservativism, sometimes described as quietest or reactionary. His double-saying (Doppelsatz) in the Preface to the Philosophy of Right that the “the rational is actual and actual is rational” was read by some as saying that the absolutist Prussia that Hegel lived under was somehow rational and so justified (Haym 1857). Yet, the more detailed comments found in the main body of the Philosophy of Right consistently favour the aims of the Prussian Reform era which were opposed by the newly ascendant reactionaries after 1819 making it difficult to situate this work politically at that time.

This position was taken even further to some extremes by Karl Popper (1966) who claimed that Hegel was “the father of modern historicism and totalitarianism.” This view looked selectively at different remarks we can find in the PR about how the state is “the march of God in the world” found not in Hegel’s own text, but in the published lecture note “Additions” (or Zusätze) by his students included in most editions of the PR today (§258 Addition). Moreover, it was motivated by a philosophical and political stance that had little, if anything, to do with what is actually found in Hegel’s work.

This “conservative” reading of Hegel was challenged later by a more “liberal” interpretation that highlighted the reforms and divergences both cultural and political between Prussia and the PR that make clear that Hegel did not support an authoritarian government, but a new form of democratic institutions complete with jury trials that was more progressive (Avineri 1972, Knox 1970). Hegel held a lifelong admiration for the French Revolution toasting the fall of the Bastille throughout his adult life.

Today, most commentators agree that Popper and others were wrong to claim Hegel endorsed some view of authoritarianism. At the same time, Hegel’s social and political philosophy is more ideologically moderate than the conservativism versus progressivism debate had often admitted. While he did advocate for more democratic and progressive elements than a reality at his time, Hegel did also defend the traditional family and constitutional monarchy. Perhaps purposefully, Hegel’s thought is notoriously difficult to categorize given his interest to overcome and transform ordinary distinctions with a virtual consensus today that his work resists tidy classification as conservative, progressive or anything else.

1.2 Metaphysical and Non-Metaphysical Readings

A second long-standing debate among Anglo-American commentators has concerned the relation of Hegel’s social and political thought to his logic and wider philosophical system. For many decades, the non-metaphysical reading has been the dominant approach. The central position was summed up by Z. A. Pelczynski (1964: 136–37) who said: “Hegel’s political thought can be read, understood, and appreciated without having to come to terms with his metaphysics … some intellectual curiosity may be unsatisfied when metaphysics is left out; a solid volume of political theory and political thinking will still remain.” The non-metaphysical reading follows a broadly analytic philosophical post-Kantian interpretation which sees Hegel as accepting, and even extending, Kant’s critical philosophy (Neuhouser 2000, Pinkard 1994, Pippin 2012). This work is notable for typical focusing attention on the PR grasping it philosophically separately from other parts of Hegel’s system which are sometimes deemed to be overly dark with avoidable metaphysical commitments (Knowles 2002, Wood 1990).

In contrast, the metaphysical reading counters that anti-metaphysical interpretations take a one-sided approach to Hegel’s work (Beiser 2005, Rosen 1984, Taylor 1975). Hegel conceived his PR to be a part of a wider system. Isolating any one text from its wider context may appear to inoculate any such reading from metaphysical claims elsewhere in Hegel’s system. However, only a reading that grasps the full metaphysical foundations of his thought will do justice to his self-understanding (Houlgate 2005).

1.3 Systematic and Non-Systematic Readings

More recently, scholars have focused on a core contention between metaphysical and non-metaphysical readings about what relation, if any, Hegel’s PR has to his wider philosophical system. Most non-metaphysical readings interpret the PR independently of Hegel’s system whereas all metaphysical readings attempt to situate the PR within Hegel’s system. Viewing the debate from this perspective, the core contention is not about the place of metaphysics but the interpretive place of any work within the system.

A non-systematic reading interprets Hegel’s PR explicitly separately from his wider system. This view has few adherents. It runs clearly against Hegel’s own self-understanding stated in the PR’s Preface where he says the PR “is a more extensive, and in particular a more systematic, exposition of the same basic concepts which, in relation to this part of philosophy, are already contained in a previous work designed to accompany my lectures, namely my Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences” (PR, p. 9). The PR is explicit that it serves as an elaboration of the section “Objective Spirit” within his philosophical system, and so a part of it.

The now orthodox view is the systematic reading which accepts that Hegel’s logic and system have explanatory force in interpreting the PR (Brooks 2013). There is no denying their connection, only its character and strength. There remain differences about how much the system does or should figure as well as related metaphysical issues (Wood 2017). For example, there is a consensus that Hegel’s political philosophy should be understood within its systematic context, but there remains disagreement about whether we need to accept his arguments for the wider philosophical system in order to accept his contributions to political philosophy. This entry will broadly follow the dominant systematic reading, but acknowledges there is not a consensus on how strongly a justificatory role the system plays for his political thought.

1.4 The Philosophy of Right

Hegel’s main work of social and political thought was the PR. It was published in 1821 when Hegel taught in Berlin. This entry surveys his primary contributions in this work, but with reference to his other texts and political writings.

Hegel says the PR “is a more extensive” exposition of “Objective Spirit,” a section within his philosophical system called his Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences (see PM). The relevant sections of the Encyclopaedia were intended to accompany the lectures that became published as the Philosophy of Right. The full Encyclopaedia begins with an examination of logic and then applies itself to an understanding of nature and the human spirit, where the latter incorporates analyses of psychology, art, history, religion and philosophy in addition to social and political thought.

His approach to form and content is unique. The PR is mostly divided into numbered sections (§). These are occasionally supplemented by later Remarks (R) where Hegel elaborated further in a later edition or Additions (A) which took the form of edited lecture notes of what Hegel had said by his students when teaching the PR. Hegel argues his positions in a dialectical way that is not linear and designed to show how seemingly different perspectives can have their opposition somehow dissolve within a new and higher perspective.

For example, our first apperception of some thing or object of thought might be as a pure being. As it is pure, it may appear to lack determinations – and so be nothing. In this way, Hegel holds that our thought has moved from pure being to pure nothingness. But yet what we apperceive is a something and so this is seen as helping overcome the false opposition of pure being and nothingness to a new, higher category of becoming as what is before is taking further shape as we sharpen our grasp of it. This dialectical method is infused throughout the PR and Hegel says he has “presupposed a familiarity” with his approach found in his logic and wider system (PR, p. 10, see SL, EL).

Similarly, the PR moves from basic building blocks that have a somewhat “pure” nature not yet grounded in reality to their negation and then brought together in a higher, concrete reality. After an introduction establishing the PR as primarily a work concerned with freedom, the PR is divided into three parts. The first pure part is Abstract Right covering property and punishment followed by an opposite in Morality covering issues of conscience and moral responsibility. They become unified in a final part Ethical Life providing a more concrete reality that examines the family, civil society, law, the state and ending with war and international relations. Each part shall be discussed in turn.

2. Freedom and Right

Hegel conceives the PR primarily as a philosophy of freedom. This is made clear in the PR’s Introduction, which starts by declaring that “the subject-matter of the philosophical science of right is the Idea of right – the concept of right [Recht] and its actualization” (PR §1). The PR’s aim to provide a philosophical account of “right” and its realization in the world.

Hegel admits the existence of right is presupposed from his philosophical system, of which the PR elaborates one part (PR §2). The PR’s Introduction proceeds to summarise the dialectical argument for the free will discussed at greater length elsewhere in Hegel’s philosophical system. Our will “determines itself” (PR §4 Addition). The challenge is determining whether or not its content is a product of freedom or mere arbitrariness. We must be able to discern the bare pursuit of being a slave to our passions like, for Hegel, the animal world from the rational world of human beings. Hegel sees the PR as an examination into how “the free will which wills the free will” can be known in form and content (PR §27).

Hegel defines “right” [Recht] as the existence of the free will in the world (PR §29). So a philosophy of right is necessarily a philosophy of freedom that seeks to comprehend freedom actualized in how we relate to each other and construct social and political institutions.

Following his dialectical method, Hegel approaches the development of our comprehension of right through these stages: Abstract Right, Morality and Ethical Life. We progress from one stage to the next in a distinctive way where apparent contradictions arising in each stage are dissolved through attaining a higher stage, where this cycle is repeated and progress made since the beginning remains present where what was abstract and opaque at first becomes more concrete as we advance to the end of this work. This multi-layered, dialectical nature of Hegel’s argument does give his philosophical work an added complexity, but also a richness that close study rewards – while this entry only focuses on the broad outlines of his arguments.

3. Property

The first substantive stage is Abstract Right. Somewhat misleading its sections are entitled “Property,” “Contract” and “Wrong” giving the false impression that Hegel is discussing actual possession of property, its sale or punishment for breach of contract. Typically for Hegel, he uses common terminology in uncommon ways.

We must recall the main aim of Hegel’s project is to understand how the free will wills the free will, and not mere arbitrariness. This requires Hegel to find some ground for helping decide when the free will wills freely, versus when it does not. Hegel first turns to taking possession of property. It is noticeable that Hegel’s account is aimed at using property possession as a first step towards finding this ground rather than for building an economic system. For example, Hegel says that “what and how much I possess is…purely contingent as far as right is concerned” (PR §49). This is because Hegel does not intend to develop a full theory of property yet, but rather to locate a ground for the free will’s freedom.

The importance of property at this stage is its development of our self-consciousness (Benhabib 1984). For Hegel, I give my free will an external existence that others can engage with. My ownership of property is not determined by me alone, but something determined “within the context of a common will” shared between two persons (PR §71).

Hegel calls the mutual recognition between two persons about property ownership a “contract” (PR §71–75). This is no ordinary contract. The context in Abstract Right is a hypothetical space of two persons. There is no money or sale of goods. The “contract” is not a written agreement. All common terminology, but given different usages.

The key point, for Hegel, is that only the free will of an individual can ground the free will of another (Stillman 1980). Something is mine when mutually recognized as my possession by another. This is the first appearance of right where the activity of my free will in taking possession is free, and not mere arbitrariness. It is this agreement between two individuals forming a kind of contract which is so important for Hegel. This is because mutual recognition becomes a vehicle for how we can develop further a more concrete understanding of freedom as right in the world. If such recognition was under threat, this would unsettle how we can ground our free will in a free will of another.

4. Punishment

This failure of mutual recognition is taken up next at the end of Abstract Right in a section entitled “Wrong” [Unrecht]. This section has been widely interpreted by many scholars to offer a clear retributivist theory of crime and punishment (Cooper 1971, Primoratz 1989). At first glance, it is easy to see why.

Hegel distinguishes three kinds of wrongs. The first is unintentional (PR §84–86). This is where both individuals are adhering to what they believe has been mutually recognized, but one is unwittingly incorrect. This kind of wrong is thought to be unpunishable – and the reason is because both sides see “the recognition of right as the universal and deciding factor” (PR §85). One side is in error, but there is a strict appeal to the proper recognition of right.

The second kind of wrong is deception (PR §87–89). This is more serious than unintentional wrongs because while both parties claim to each other that they appeal to right, one side does so insincerely. Thus deception has a different and more serious character than unintentional wrongs.

The third and final kind of wrong is described as “crime” (PR §90). This is where one party makes no appeal at all to right. The wrong [Unrecht] that they seek is to deny an appeal to right. This is a direct and tangible threat to mutual recognition as one party is not merely insincere, but acts regardless of right – and to that extent acts arbitrarily, and so unfreely.

Hegel describes crime as an infringement of right, of mutual recognition (PR §95 Remark). This requires what Hegel calls punishment as “the restoration of right” whereby what was infringed is reasserted and reaffirmed (PR §99). For example, the punishment of theft sends a message to the thief and wider community that this crime should not have happened – and in punishing the crime Hegel believes it can help to restore the right violated.

His theory of punishment is widely characterized as retributivist and it is easy to see why. In this section, Hegel is critical of deterrence and rehabilitation approaches claiming “they take it for granted that punishment in and for itself is just” (PR §99 Remark). Indeed, Hegel says the cancellation of crime “is retribution” (PR §101).

But this commonly held view is controversial for several reasons. Hegel may call this third kind of wrong “crime,” but this view of crime is understood in a specific way (Nicholson 1982). There is no state or laws, no police or judiciary (Stillman 1976). A hypothetical scenario lacking prisons is hardly any complete theory of punishment. In fact, there is neither judge nor jury in Abstract Right to say who is right or wrong. This is because, when we view this section in its systematic context, Hegel is drawing attention to certain foundational ideas about wrongs more generally (e.g., that they are of three kinds) and how we should respond (e.g., that crimes can deserve punishment) without yet giving his full view at this point in the PR.

However, Hegel does foreshadow his later and more substantive discussion of punishment with a non-retributivist character at this point (Brooks 2017a). He highlights how determinations of crimes “such as danger to public security” have relevance in determining what punishment is ultimately justified (PR §96 Remark). While he says crimes “more dangerous in itself” are a more serious infringement of right, Hegel is clear from the start that consequentialist factors are relevant to the determination of punishment related to crime’s impact on society although he says little more at this point (PR §96 Remark). Hegel also rejects the view he is offering a full theory of punishment at this point claiming – in the absence of laws and courtrooms – any action taken by an individual against another to punish takes the form of “revenge” which “becomes a new infringement” creating new problems (PR §102). It is important to note at this point that these sections discussing commonly used concepts like property and contract as well as crime and punishment in uncommon ways all reappear when Hegel turns his attention to the final part of Ethical Life.

5. Morality

When Hegel concludes Abstract Right, he seeks to resolve a tension. Abstract Right had been focused purely on the external appearance of right through taking possession and forming a contract through mutual recognition. In reasserting and restoring right through “punishment,” we do not merely honour the universality of right for us all but this move “is also at the same time a further advance in the inner determination of the will by its concept” (PR §104). While we have discussed taking ownership and wrongs in relation to the mutual recognition of external property, this points us forward to our having to grasp the particularity of our inner ownership of right. This perspective leads Hegel to open a new, second stage he calls Morality, but again using common terms in uncommon ways.

The main point about Hegel’s theory of morality is he redefines it in an unusual way. For Hegel, “the moral point of view” is a purely abstract and hypothetical exercise that is logically prior and separate to how morality is related to the world (PR §105). Hegel focuses on the individual’s power of choice. To this end, Hegel is a champion, not an enemy, of individual liberty as he is clear that there must be space for subjective freedom.

The problem with our individual power of choice is that we may well be mistaken about what we choose (PR §140 Remark). Recalling our separateness from others in Morality, he says we may intend good but our only guide is our individual conception of the good (PR §140 Addition). A more substantive guide awaits reflecting about ourselves acting in relation to others concretely in Ethical Life.

Otherwise, the danger arising from such pure, inward abstraction is that morality is an “abstract universality … without content” (PR §135). Thus, for Hegel, moral philosophy of any kind is by its nature empty.

Perhaps no area of the PR has attracted more controversy than Hegel’s so-called “emptiness charge” against Kant: Kant is accused of offering no more than an empty formula of “duty for duty’s sake” where our task is to avoid contradicting a set formula (PR §135, see Hoy 1989, Freyenhagen 2012, Stern 2012). Hegel’s criticisms centre on Kant’s Formula of Universal Law stating we should “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (Kant 1997, 4:421). Undoubtedly, Kant does offer Hegel some ammunition for this criticism. For example, Kant says “All I need for morality is that freedom does not contradict itself and hence can at least be thought; I do not need to have any further insight into it” (Kant 1996, B xxix). At first glance, it might appear Kantian morality is about following a formula and no more.

But, of course, as Kant’s defenders are correct to point out, Hegel’s criticism is unfair and misses its mark (Wood 1989). In fact, Kant purposefully offers multiple versions of his formula to help draw our considerations of morality away from a purely rationalist exercise and bring it “nearer to feeling” (note 15). Our anthropology matters for Kant and he does not see our living ethically as merely living without contradiction.

We should recall that Hegel’s emptiness charge might be made against moral philosophy. This is because Hegel has redefined morality as a purely hypothetical armchair exercise that by itself is “without content” (PR §135). Of course, this is not how the targets of Hegel’s criticism conceive of morality – and, to some degree, Hegel is using his own redefinition of morality to critique how others understand the same term defined differently.

A more appropriate comparison might be drawn in relating Kant’s principled approach with Hegel’s comments about the relation of religion to the state (PR §270 Remark). Hegel claims a religious point of view can help furnish individuals with ethical principles and help us lead a more ethical life (PR §270 Addition). This kind of formulaic thinking in PR to help guide individuals to ethical, law abiding behaviour is perhaps closer to the kind of moral project that Kant was engaged in where there are clearer areas of commonality than in Hegel’s critique in Morality (Brooks 2013).

As should be clear, Morality can only make so much progress in individual abstraction. What is required is a transition bringing together the universality of Abstract Right enveloping us all and providing a foundation in mutual recognition with the particularity of Morality where we both outwardly and inwardly grasp the development of right. This bridge is to the concrete individuality found in comprehending right – not in abstraction – but now in the world and its institutions.

6. Ethical Life

Hegel’s concept of ‘Ethical Life’ [Sittlichkeit] plays a pivotal role in his political and legal thought. It is here that Hegel takes other concepts considered earlier found in Abstract Right (such as contract, property and punishment) and Morality to grasp them anew but now in their social – and more “concrete” context. The following discussion retains an abstract character insofar as Hegel discusses institutions that existed at his time – like the family, civil society and the state – but in ways meant to bring out the rational within the actual (and actual within the rational) (see Stern 2006). For example, core ideas about what constitutes a wrong from his discussion of punishment return, but with a deeper and evolved understanding of their place in a social context that brings out a different character and complexity to his views – which is intended to unpack the character and complexity of the inner rationality that Hegel believes we can discern in the world.

Ethical Life is divided into three parts where each builds off of the analysis thus far into the nature of Abstract Right and Morality, but where each part, in turn, develops after the other. This ordering is not chronological, but dialectical. We are not a member of civil society or the state after we join a family, but the concepts of the former are further developments from the latter as the following sections bear out.

7. Family

Hegel begins his discussion of the first emergence of right embodied in the world through the sphere of Family. As we should expect, Hegel uses common terminology in uncommon ways again.

In Abstract Right, separate abstract individuals connect together through mutual recognition by acknowledging the ownership of property. In Ethical Life, the Family is a sphere where concrete individuals come together bound in a love for each other (PR §158). This connection is not purely arbitrary, like animals seeking only to satisfy their needs and then seek another. For Hegel, the Family is a connection that, at least in principle, aims at a permanence he calls “marriage” (PR §161).

These marriages are not defined in contractual terms, but ethical. A contract is an agreement that different parties can enter or exit on mutual consent. Any shared commitment or unity has a temporary character. This is little better than the kind of mutual recognition we saw in Abstract Right.

However, in marriage, a more substantive unity is created that is a permanent bond unlike most contracts. This does not mean that Hegel forbids divorce. The termination of a marriage is seen as an unfortunate possibility born from marriage’s foundation in our feelings, like love, which can be unstable over time (PR §163 Addition).

While divorce is permitted, arranged marriages are not (PR §162). This is because marriage is a further development of our freedom – and it requires our being able to choose a life partner. In this way, marriage is an advance of our mutual recognition from a contract where we agree ownership of some thing to where we choose to create a unity with another longer term.

For Hegel, the Family achieves unity through its creation of children (PR §173 Addition). To this extent, he plainly endorses the traditional family model (see Haldane 2006). However, this is done on very non-traditional grounds. What guides Hegel’s thinking is his logic which brings together opposites in a creative unity producing some new, higher concept (PR §165). Likewise, Hegel saw men and women as embodying different features with their sexual union able to create children, not unlike the universal and particular giving birth to the concrete individual (PR §165).

These views have rightly been subjected to widespread criticism by feminists and others (Halper 2001, Knowles 2002, Ravven 1988, Stone 2002). A common argument is that Hegel’s justification of the Family is a poor defence of privileging men over women on the basis of his controversial dialectical method. Only men have the opportunity to engage outside the home in civil society and fully participate in the state. These critics claim that such a privilege should not be reserved for men alone for many, often obvious, reasons. It is also argued that his broad views about the essence of marriage as a permanent bond built on love can be achieved by non-traditional families, too. It is worth pointing out that Hegel’s talk of the Family is of an ideal. Hegel fathered a child outside of wedlock who he supported throughout his life. He sees himself as revealing the full development of right wherever it may take us, and what it requires from us or our institutions may be different from how we find them.

8. Civil society

Hegel’s civil society is primarily the place of work, as well as where he situates law and the legal system (see Sect. 5). Whereas the Family is ideally a relation of unity from a natural law for each other, this gives way to the pursuit of the particular individual within the system of needs (PR §182). The Family is a sphere where it is all for one and one for all. In civil society, the needs of all are met where I make my particular contribution in a pro-market economic vision accepting a natural division of labour (PR §189, 198).

Hegel sees the world of work as a home away from home, or “second family” (PR §252). Instead of familial love, there is a kind of brotherly love fostered through an individual’s connection to a corporation, grouped by the kind of trade all are engaged in which educates and supports its member.

Interestingly, Hegel sees market relations in modern society as a foundation for the acquisition by free individuals of social identities including social solidarity. We develop our sense of selves through our economic activities and the myriad of interconnections we forge with others in an extra-familial but non-political way.

A key problem is the problem of poverty. If possession of property is essential for the development of my sense of right and satisfaction of needs, a capitalist economic system which, Hegel accepts, makes poverty for at least some unavoidable raises a serious concern about whether Hegel’s ideal social and political philosophy is ideal for all its citizens.

The problem of poverty is more than a concern about material needs. Hegel describes those in poverty as forming a “rabble” saying “poverty in itself does not reduce people to a rabble; a rabble is created only by the disposition associated with poverty, by inward rebellion against the rich, against society, the government, etc” (PR §244, Addition). Thus we can understand the rabble as having a conviction about their alienation that may be more likely to find among those who are poorer, but not exclusively them. To be in poverty is to be alienated and see one’s state as a separate, unfriendly other (Brooks 2020). While Hegel was a strong believer that through work we could develop our freedom to become reconciled to our social and political work, he lacks any convincing solution to how the problem of poverty might be overcome short of changing the economic system (Plant 1972).

9. Law

Part of Hegel’s examination of civil society concerns law and the administration of justice. Hegel’s theory of law has been notoriously difficult to characterize. This is likely, in part, because Hegel uses common terms in an uncommon ways.

Hegel clearly accepts a strong link between morality and law suggesting he endorses some variety of natural law. Like other natural lawyers, Hegel claims “what is law [Gesetz] may differ in content from what is right in itself” (PR §212). Something can be lawful yet unjust – and this having a higher standard of justice by which he can assess posited law is a common feature of natural law jurisprudence.

But what is different is that, traditionally, natural lawyers have developed their understanding of the standard of moral justice to be applied to an assessment of law prior to that assessment. For example, the moral standard would be worked out first and then applied afterwards. This leads some critics of natural law to claim that this approach uses extralegal standards and reasoning to assess law and so really engaging in moral philosophy rather than legal thought.

Hegel’s perspective is unique (Brudner 2017). He accepts the positivist view that our understanding of law must be centred on the law itself rather than extralegal considerations. He says “what is legal [gesetzmāßig] is … the source of cognition of what is right [Recht], or more precisely, of what is lawful [Rechtens]” (PR §212 Remark). So we start first from a close look at the law before us – whatever it is – and not develop some normative standard separately beforehand. For Hegel, we do not comprehend this standard separately from the law, but immanently within it.

He says: “the scope of the law [Gesetz] ought on the one hand to be that of a complete and self-contained whole, but on the other hand, there is a constant need for new legal determinations [gesetzlicher Bestimmungen]” (PR §216). Hegel is claiming the law aspires to be a complete whole and, where we find gaps or inconsistencies, our task is to work out how these can be addressed within the law as a self-contained whole in language echoing Ronald Dworkin’s (1977) use of legal principles a century later. Thus, Hegel looks to the law for the ethical principles that can be used to continually reform our legal system into the complete whole it aspires to be. This “natural law internalism” discerns its principles from within the law rather than from outside it (Brooks 2017b).

The development of law is crucially not a project for professionals alone. Hegel makes a powerful case for the right to trial by jury (PR §228 Remark). His argument is that without a jury of ordinary citizens there is no guarantee that a citizen would have a reasonable chance of understanding the charges, evidence and outcome, especially if convicted and punished. This is because the law is a technical language which risks becoming the exclusive property of a professional class. The best guarantee of law’s publicity and connection to a public view of right is to ensure a jury is convinced – if they can understand the trial and come to a view, then Hegel finds it reasonable to expect the defendant on trial can, too.

It is here that Hegel revisits the justification of punishment. We now consider crime and punishment not in abstraction, but their concrete reality. Hegel begins by noting that the “outward existence” of a crime and its impact may not change the nature of a crime in its concept, but it does impact how we respond. This suggests that the same kind of crime can be punished more or less severely based, at least in part, on the circumstances. Such a view is starkly at odds with most retributivists where punishment should only be considered in relation to what an offender deserved on account of his moral responsibility for an offence.

Hegel makes clear that a crime’s “danger to civil society is a determination of its magnitude” where circumstances impact in how we determine whether to punish, how much to punish and what form this might take. He notes “a penal code is therefore primarily a product of its time and of the current condition of civil society” (PR §218 Remark). He adds that “punishments are not unjust in and for themselves, but are proportionate to the conditions of their time” (PR §218 Addition). So the same crime committed in different circumstances would be punished differently. For example, a crime committed during civil war poses a greater threat to civil society than when at peace – and so the former would see the crimes punished more harshly. There is no difference in the offender or her responsibility. While desert matters, it is not the only factor which does.

These comments make clear a non-retributivist picture. This is consistent with a passage in his Science of Logic (SL), the text Hegel claims is presupposed as the foundation for the PR:

Punishment, for example, has various determinations: it is retributive, a deterrent example as well, a threat used by the law as a deterrent, and also it brings the criminal to his senses and reforms him. Each of these different determinations has been considered the ground of punishment, because each is an essential determination, and therefore the others, as distinct from it, are determined as merely contingent relatively to it. But the one which is taken as ground is still not the whole punishment itself (SL, p. 465)

Hegel’s argument is clearer here. Desert grounds punishment: only the deserving can be liable to be punished. But it does not have a monopoly on the amount or form that punishment can take. This picture is consistent with Hegel’s comments in the PR where the outward existence of punishment may be different depending on circumstances. It should be unsurprising to find that Hegel, who repeatedly defends various groupings of three in his work would seek to combine retribution, deterrence and rehabilitation in a new format – taking common concepts in uncommon ways. This was not lost on his earliest interpreters in the UK, as British Idealists like Green, Bradley and others held similar three-in-one views on punishment and rejected traditional accounts of retributivism (Brooks 2003, 2011). This view has been called the “unified theory of punishment” (Brooks 2017a).

10. The State

Hegel’s final section of “Ethical Life” is the state. The love for others based on feeling in the family and then on the satisfaction of needs in civil society is transformed to a patriotic love for fellow citizens in support of a shared community, embodied by the modern state (see PR §268). Moreover, the individual pursuit of the satisfaction of needs leads to the development of the state.

For Hegel, it is only in the state that the family develops into civil society and where civil society gains greater “actuality” (PR §256–57). The state is where our “concrete freedom” is realized as we conceive of ourselves in our full social and political reality (PR §260). It is only here that the individual is conceived at once as a member of a family, as a part of civil society and as a citizen of a state. While the stage where our freedom is realized most concretely, it is not the case that individual freedom is somehow a problem – our individual freedom has greatest actuality when mutually recognized by others in law. Hegel reflects that “it has often been said that the end of the state is the happiness of its citizens. This is certainly true, for if their welfare is deficient, if their subjective ends are not satisfied, and if they do not find that the state as such is the means to this satisfaction, the state itself stands on an insecure footing” (PR §265 Addition). Hegel’s state is a community where individuals and their individuality are meant to flourish.

Hegel’s conception of the state’s composition is controversial. He seeks to unify the three traditional models of government – aristocracy, democracy and monarchy – under a new form of representative government with a constitutional monarch (Deranty 2001). Hegel proposes an Estates Assembly with the natural aristocracy of the agrarian class in one chamber and representatives from different trades in another. Hegel believed that representing a locality based on geography was arbitrary and lacking substance. He claimed a stronger ethical relation could be formed through representation of people through their work.

Hegel’s state is headed by a hereditary monarch (§273 Remark, Brudner 1981, Redding 1994). He claims the state requires someone to provide unity as an individual to the individual state, a someone to declare the state confirms a law as its law or agrees treaties with foreign countries. An elected monarch or president as head of state is objectionable because such a person would represent the interests of supporters. This would create a barrier for the monarch to truly speak with one voice on behalf of the country – and so the monarch should be above such partisanship. A hereditary monarch would provide some basis for there being a head of state that could represent all and provide the unity required.

While virtually no commentator is convinced by Hegel’s justification of constitutional monarch, the orthodox view is that the monarch is a rubber stamp (Yack 1980). Hegel remarks that “in a fully organized state … all that is required in a monarch is someone to say ‘yes’ and to dot the ‘I’; for the supreme office should be such that the particular character of its occupant is of no significance” (PR §280 Addition). Some have drawn comparisons with the UK’s constitutional monarchy, where laws require the Assent of Her Majesty The Queen but where this is automatically done when requested by Parliament for example (Findlay 1958).

The real power is behind the throne and held by an educated governing cabinet [Ministerium], often referred to as the bureaucracy. It is these advisors to the monarch who propose new laws, via the responsible cabinet minister. These ministers, and not the monarch, are answerable to the legislature whose role is to consider proposals and either enact or reject them.

There is reason to doubt this picture (Brooks 2007). The monarch cannot act arbitrarily. In being “bound by the concrete content of the advice he receives,” he must be able to discern this content (PR §279 Addition). And Hegel is critical of the UK’s constitutional monarchy post-Civil War noting that “since 1692 there has never been a case of the king’s vetoing a parliamentary decree” with the consequence that it “reduces him virtually to a cipher” and he should be more active on state matters – and, presumably, making his own judgements whether to support proposed legislation or not in recommending it for approval to the legislature (LNR §133 Remark). While the ministers advising him should be of rough equality making little difference who is in which role, the monarch has full discretion to hire and fire anyone at will from an eligible pool. Moreover, it is the monarch advised by his relevant minister who agree treaties and decide all matters of war and peace (PR §329). Given the monarch cannot be removed from office, this gives him considerable powers in foreign affairs raising questions about how relatively powerless, if at all, he really is.

11. War and International Relations

The state has an “immediate actuality” in terms of its internal organization as discussed above, but it further determines itself internationally in relation to other states (PR §259). This part of the PR is the least worked out and detailed.

Hegel accepts a broadly Westphalian and realist view of international relations whereby the primary actors are states each prioritizing the pursuit of their individual welfare (PR §336, Smith 1983). States interact with each other like individuals in an anarchic global space. Without any governing global authority, states can come into conflict with each other. He says “wars must be regarded as necessary because independent peoples exist alongside one another” (LNR §160 Remark). This is not a justification or glorification of war, but a recognition that states are in a state of nature where war is occasionally unavoidable (see LNR §162 Remark). States should aim to enable other states “to live at peace with it” and “war is that of something which ought to come to an end” (PR §338).

But it is also the case that Hegel saw war as testing the relative health of states where those most rationally organized should triumph over less well ethically structured states. Combined with his rejection of Kant’s proposals for perpetual peace, it has led some to question whether or not war plays a positive, and troubling, role in his philosophy (Avineri 1961, Black 1973, Shelton 2000, Walt 1989). Hegel also comments that “modern wars are accordingly waged in a humane manner, and all persons do not confront each other in hatred” which can give the impression that modern wars are of an improved ethical quality than past wars – when the opposite appears true (PR §338 Addition).

The only judge of relative rights and wrongs in the international sphere is “world history as the world’s court of judgement” (PR §340). The PR then transitions to the start of an account of the philosophy of history in the next part of his system, which presupposes all parts preceding it not least the PR itself.


Primary Literature

English Translations of Key Texts

  • [EL], The Encyclopaedia Logic: Part 1 of the Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences with the Zusätze, translated by T. F. Geraets, W. A. Suchting and H. S. Harris. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1991.
  • [LNR], Lectures on Natural Right and Political Science: The First Philosophy of Right, Heidelberg 1817–1818 with Additions from the Lectures of 1818–1819, translated by J. Michael Stewart and Peter C. Hodgson. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995.
  • [PW], Political Writings, edited by Laurence Dickey and H. B. Nisbet. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • [PM], Hegel’s Philosophy of Mind, translated from the 1830 Edition, together with the Zusätze by William Wallace and A.V. Miller, with Revisions and Commentary by M. J Inwood, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007.
  • [PR], Elements of the Philosophy of Right, edited by Allen W. Wood, translated by H.B. Nisbet, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • [SL], Science of Logic, trans. A. V. Miller. Amherst: Humanity Books, 1969.

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Thom Brooks <thom.brooks@durham.ac.uk>

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