Higher-Order Evidence

First published Tue Sep 6, 2022

Higher-order evidence is evidence which bears on a believer’s rational capacities, epistemic performance, or evidential situation. Many epistemologists hold that this kind of evidence can rationally affect our “first-order” beliefs as well: that is, those beliefs about the world that we form using the relevant rational capacities, or in the relevant evidential situation. It is easiest to get a grip on this phenomenon by looking at examples. Here is a paradigmatic case (paraphrased from Schoenfield 2018: 690, based on similar cases put forth by Adam Elga [2013 and 2008—see Other Internet Resources], Lasonen-Aarnio [2014], Christensen [2010a], and others):

Hypoxia: Aisha is out flying her small, unpressurized airplane, wondering whether she has enough fuel to make it to Hawaii. She looks at the gauges, dials, and maps, and obtains some evidence, E, which she knows strongly supports (say to degree .99) either the proposition that she has enough gas (G) or that she does not (~G). Thinking it over and performing the necessary calculations, Aisha concludes G; in fact, this is what E supports. But then she checks her altitude and notices that she’s at great risk for hypoxia, a condition which impairs one’s reasoning while leaving the reasoner feeling perfectly cogent and clear-headed. Aisha knows that at this altitude, pilots performing the kinds of calculations she just did only reach the correct conclusion 50% of the time.

Aisha’s “first-order” evidence is her evidence bearing directly on her beliefs about G: that is, the evidence she receives by consulting her dials, gauges, and maps. Her “higher-order” evidence is her evidence suggesting that she’s at risk for hypoxia. Higher-order evidence bears directly on Aisha’s epistemic situation in various ways, but does not bear directly on G. The primary question that this case raises, for the higher-order evidence literature, is: does Aisha’s higher-order evidence also rationally affect her beliefs about G? (That is, does it bear on G in some indirect way?)

Some say yes. It would be reckless for Aisha to head out over the Pacific after realizing that there is such a serious chance that she’s rationally impaired, which surely shows (some argue) that she should not be very confident of G. Others say no. As the case stipulates, Aisha’s first-order evidence strongly supports G; whether Aisha is hypoxic has absolutely nothing to do with whether she has enough gas to make it to Hawaii. (Why would her total evidence prompt her to revise confidence in G, when the new evidence she has gained is irrelevant to G?) Answering “yes” raises questions about exactly how and why this level-interaction works. Answering “no” raises questions about how to explain the intuitive unreasonableness of Aisha’s maintaining high confidence in G.

Higher-order evidence thus raises a puzzle. Two apparent features of Hypoxia are in tension with one another: it seems that Aisha is required to reduce her confidence in G, and yet it also seems that her evidence still strongly supports G. Some see this as a conflict between the belief state that seems intuitively rational (reduced confidence or suspension of judgment about G) and the belief state that seems strongly supported by her evidence (high confidence in G). Others see it as a conflict within her beliefs. If Aisha maintains high confidence in G, but also takes seriously the possibility that she could be hypoxic, she will be in a state of epistemic akrasia: she will have a belief state (her high confidence in G) which she also judges likely to be irrational, or unsupported by her evidence.

In what follows we will see these issues crop up in several different forms. This article will be organized around a few core questions about higher-order evidence, which will give us different ways to approach these central puzzles.

  • Is higher-order evidence different from ordinary evidence? If so, how?
  • Why might we deny that higher-order evidence has a rational effect on first-order beliefs? And if we take that approach, which problems and questions remain?
  • If higher-order evidence rationally affects first-order beliefs, how does this work? What sort of principle might govern that interaction?
  • Is there a way to split the difference, embracing both sides of the puzzle? For example, might there be different, incompatible epistemic norms at work in cases like Hypoxia, one telling Aisha to believe G and another telling her to suspend judgment?

A few quick notes before moving on. Following most of the literature, the term “higher-order evidence” is used here, although it would be more accurate to speak of higher-order evidential effects or higher-order evidential import (since one piece of evidence may be relevant to a person’s beliefs about many different subject matters, in a number of different ways). And like most of the literature, the focus is on higher-order defeat, rather than higher-order confirmation, even though these possibilities go hand in hand. Some of the issues discussed in this article are discussed in more detail in the entry on epistemic self-doubt. Finally, although the higher-order evidence debate has its roots in the literature on disagreement, this entry focuses on the simpler, single-person case introduced above and mostly omits disagreement.

1. What is Distinctive About Higher-Order Evidence?

Higher-order evidence was introduced above by example. We can come across higher-order evidence in a variety of ways: brain-altering conditions like hypoxia, or drugs, but also more mundane sources like bias and fatigue. Many epistemologists have discussed disagreement as a source of higher-order evidence: if an equally well-informed and thoughtful person looks at the evidence and draws a different conclusion from yours, this arguably gives you reason to worry that you’ve made a rational error (see, e.g., Kelly 2005, Feldman 2006, Christensen 2007b, Elga 2008 and much following literature). And some have argued that “irrelevant influences” on belief, such as one’s religious upbringing, can be a source of higher-order evidence as well: the realization that you would have had different religious beliefs if you had been raised in a different community, for example, might give you reason to doubt the rationality of those beliefs (see Elga 2008—see Other Internet Resources, White 2010, and Vavova 2018). It is hard to find an uncontroversial definition of higher-order evidence, as different authors understand it in different ways. But even without a general definition, we can look at cases like Hypoxia to see how higher-order evidence is importantly distinctive. (This section assumes that higher-order evidence has some first-order rational import, as this is where the distinctive features arise.)

At first glance, one might think that Hypoxia is simply a case of undercutting defeat, and Aisha’s justification for believing G is defeated just as one’s perceptual beliefs might be defeated by, for instance, evidence of tricky lighting. But as Feldman (2005) argues, higher-order defeat and undercutting defeat are importantly different. Compare Hypoxia to a case in which you find out that a certain wall, which appears to be red, is illuminated by a red light. In the latter case, you might recognize that your experience as of a red wall generally supports the belief that the wall is red, and also recognize that you responded appropriately to that evidence before finding out about the tricky lighting. But in Hypoxia it seems that Aisha is not in a position to recognize either of these things. If she takes her higher-order evidence seriously, she will come to doubt whether her first-order evidence ever supported G in the first place. And she will also doubt whether she evaluated it correctly. (See Coates 2012 and Christensen 2010a for similar discussion.) So higher-order defeat is not simply undercutting defeat.

Joshua DiPaolo (2018) argues that higher-order defeat is also distinctive in that it is “object-independent”. For instance, learning that there is a red light on the wall will undercut your belief that the wall is red, but will have no effect if you believe that the wall is not red. Higher-order evidence, on the other hand, typically does not discriminate based on the contents of the beliefs it targets. Extending DiPaolo’s argument to our case above, Aisha’s higher-order evidence targeted her belief about G, but could have easily targeted a belief with different contents if she had been reasoning about a different matter while flying at that altitude.

Christensen (2010a) argues that higher-order evidence is distinctive because its import is agent-relative. While Aisha's information about hypoxia gives Aisha reason to doubt her beliefs about whether she will make it to Hawaii, it would have no such effect on another person looking at the same charts and dials from the safety of the ground. However, merely treating higher-order evidence as indexical does not seem to make it less puzzling; see Schoenfield 2018 for further discussion.

Perhaps the most puzzling feature of higher-order evidence is that it seems to obligate agents to ignore or set aside parts of their total evidence. (See Christensen 2010a for an early defense of this idea; others, including Elga (2007), also defend it in the context of disagreement.) Even as Aisha comes to doubt her conclusion about G, her first-order evidence and reasoning is still plainly before her. But she cannot rationally appeal to it in forming her beliefs. If she could, Aisha might argue:

although I’m at an altitude that renders me susceptible to hypoxia, I must be immune. After all, my first-order evidence in fact supports the conclusion that I have enough fuel to make it to Hawaii, and that’s the very same conclusion I reached!

To a supporter of higher-order defeat, such reasoning looks irrational and dogmatic. (Furthermore, if she could reason this way, Aisha could arguably keep her high confidence in G—which his just to say, her higher-order evidence wouldn’t have a rational effect after all.) In order to rule out the rationality of such reasoning, while acknowledging that Aisha’s first-order evidence has not vanished, some epistemologists say that Aisha must set aside the targeted first-order evidence and reasoning once her higher-order evidence comes in. This thought is often called “Independence”. Section 3.1 discusses it in more detail.

Finally, related to this last observation, Horowitz (2019) and Schoenfield (2015b, 2018) both argue that higher-order evidence is predictably misleading: if it has first-order effects, we can predict a priori that it will lead ideally rational thinkers away from the truth. We expect first-order evidence to generally make us more accurate, provided that we respond to it rationally. And we expect higher-order evidence to lead us away from what our first-order evidence supports. So when we accommodate all of that evidence rationally, we’ll tend to end up with a less accurate belief state than we would if we had ignored the higher-order evidence.

In all of these ways, higher-order evidence presents distinctive problems for epistemology. (Though distinctive does not necessarily mean rare: Hedden and Dorst [forthcoming] argue that almost all evidence has higher-order import.) As we will see in the next section, the difficulties presented by higher-order evidence have prompted some epistemologists to deny that it has first-order import altogether.

2. Denying the Import of Higher-Order Evidence

Higher-order evidence raises special problems. One very general problem is that it is hard to see how we could make sense of higher-order evidence within a consistent, total picture of rationality. Maria Lasonen-Aarnio (2014) brings out this point especially forcefully and comprehensively, so this next section will largely follow her presentation. (See also Schechter 2013 for discussion of many similar concerns.) We will then look at a slightly different objection to theories that accommodate higher-order evidence: the charge that they are self-defeating. The section will conclude with some options for theories according to which higher-order evidence does not rationally affect first-order beliefs.

2.1 Structural problems for higher-order evidence

Lasonen-Aarnio begins with the observation that respecting higher-order evidence can compel a rational agent to violate genuine epistemic rules. (This is very similar to the idea presented in the introduction: that after Aisha receives her higher-order evidence, her total evidence still supports G.) Since this thought is common to much of the higher-order evidence literature, it will be worth spelling out in detail the reasoning behind it. One simple way to make the thought plausible is to focus on a case of entailment—so, let’s suppose Aisha’s first-order evidence entails G. Then we can argue as follows:

Aisha’s first-order evidence entails G.
After Aisha receives her higher-order evidence, her total evidence entails G.
It is a rational requirement to believe what our evidence entails.
After Aisha receives her higher-order evidence, she is rationally required to believe G.
After Aisha receives her higher-order evidence, she is rationally required to suspend judgment on G.
After receiving her higher-order evidence, Aisha is rationally required to violate a rational requirement.

P1 is built into (this version of) our case. P2 follows from P1, assuming that Aisha’s body of total evidence grows monotonically over the course of the story. P3 is plausible, and would nicely explain our verdict at the beginning of the story: that, before she receives her higher-order evidence, Aisha should believe G. P4 follows from P2 and P3. And P5 is the intuitive verdict that many epistemologists share about cases like Hypoxia. (Though see Henderson forthcoming, Staffel forthcoming, and Steglich-Peterson 2019 for alternative views on which higher-order evidence does not require suspension of judgment, but still has a rational effect.) So if P5 is right, this means that Aisha is required to disobey an epistemic rule which applies to her current situation: she must suspend judgment in a proposition that is entailed by her evidence, rather than believe it.

Though focusing on entailment makes the argument above particularly clear, it’s not essential. The same problem can, plausibly, arise with non-entailing evidence as well. Lasonen-Aarnio focuses on a perceptual case, and Christensen (2010a) argues that cases involving inductive reasoning can lead to the same conclusion. (Both argue for versions of P2 in non-entailing contexts: they argue, respectively, that the perceptual or inductive support remains even in the face of higher-order undermining.)

How can we make sense of Aisha’s situation, in light of this apparent conflict? Lasonen-Aarnio (2014) surveys several possible ways to make room for the conflict within our overall epistemological theory. One strategy we might try is to say that epistemic rules have built-in exceptions for higher-order defeat. That doesn’t solve the problem, Lasonen-Aarnio argues, but just pushes it back: if any rule can be defeated, then so can rules with built-in exceptions. A second strategy is to say that epistemic rules are hierarchical, with some taking precedence over others; but again, the higher-level rules must themselves be defeasible, leading to an infinite hierarchy. The rules must also be ordered by a “meta-rule” which determines which rule governs one’s current situation; what if the meta-rule itself is defeasible? It seems that we are either left with an infinite regress, or that we must accept a stopping point—a rule which itself cannot be rationally defeated. Another strategy is to posit an “Über-rule” which specifies the rational response for each unique situation. This fails, Lasonen-Aarnio argues, because it is too complex for us to grasp, too different from the epistemic rules we ordinarily take ourselves to follow, and endorsing it leaves us with an unsatisfying kind of particularism about rationality. This proposal also runs into the same problem we saw above. If the Über-Rule is always correct, we must say that it cannot be rationally defeated. If we are willing to accept indefeasible rules, why should we think that higher-order defeat happens at all? (Why not just accept the rules governing Aisha’s belief in G as themselves indefeasible by higher-order doubt?) Lasonen-Aarnio concludes that in light of these problems, we should reject higher-order defeat. (See Bradley 2019 for response to Lasonen-Aarnio, and a defense of the Über-rule.)

2.2 Higher-order defeat and self-undermining

Another route to doubt about higher-order defeat is what’s sometimes called the “self-undermining” objection. As several epistemologists have pointed out, there are strange consequences for anyone who believes a theory on which higher-order evidence has first-order effects: it seems that this belief is liable to undercut its own justification. Let’s consider a candidate principle on which higher-order evidence can defeat first-order beliefs; call it “HOD” (for “higher-order defeat”). Now consider a person, Sam, who believes that HOD is a true principle of rationality. What happens if Sam’s belief in HOD is itself a target of higher-order defeat? This might happen through peer disagreement (which is the focus of most of the literature on this objection) or other means. Afterwards, according to HOD, Sam cannot rationally believe HOD.

This might already seem like a problem to some: a true theory of rationality should not (arguably) undermine our justification for believing it. And taking it a step further, it can look like the theory is either paradoxical or incoherent. If HOD can call for its own rejection (in the cases where belief in HOD is itself undermined), how can it give us coherent directions? Suppose Sam’s higher-order evidence targets two beliefs simultaneously: his belief about some proposition P, and his belief about HOD itself. HOD tells him to reduce confidence in P. But since HOD is undermined as well, it is arguably also telling him not to reduce confidence (or to reduce confidence to a lesser degree). These recommendations are incompatible, yielding the worry that HOD is internally inconsistent. On the other hand, the worry about paradox arises when we consider what happens when Sam begins to revise his beliefs. Once HOD is undermined, suppose Sam no longer believes it, and goes back to revise the beliefs that he formed on its basis. But his last application of HOD was what led to his doubting HOD—so if he “undoes” that step, he’ll believe HOD again! But then his belief in HOD will be undermined by his higher-order evidence, and the loop will start over. (For further discussion see Elga 2010, Weatherson 2013, Christensen 2013 and 2021a, and Bradley 2019. See Roush 2009 for discussion of a related phenomenon.)

Advocates of higher-order defeat have offered a few different responses to this class of objections. One option, proposed by Elga (2010), is to say that principles like HOD are exempt from undermining. (Elga’s view draws on an argument found in Lewis 1971 and H. Field 2000, for the conclusion that our most fundamental belief-forming methods must be self-recommending.) Another option is to say that our attitude towards principles like HOD is not one of belief, but some other type of attitude. (See Goldberg 2013, Barnett 2019, and Fleisher 2021 for examples of this approach.) Finally, one might simply deny that Sam is obligated to enter the paradoxical loop once his belief in HOD is undermined. Christensen (2013, 2021a, 2021b) argues along these lines. The loop gets started if we think that once Sam rationally doubts HOD, he is rationally required to stop adopting the beliefs that HOD recommends, and instead adopt whichever beliefs he now regards as most rational. But this thought is not part of HOD, and we are free to deny it—we can maintain that HOD is true, and rationally binding even for those who rationally doubt it. (This is different from saying that HOD must be self-recommending; on Elga’s proposal, one should believe that one should always follow HOD, and also always follow it. On Christensen’s, one should always follow HOD, regardless of what one should believe one should do.) This response would bypass the paradox. But it comes at what some defenders of HOD see as a cost: it means we must accept some instances of rational epistemic akrasia. If Sam revises his belief in HOD, but continues to follow it, as this suggestion would have him do, he will end up with a belief state whose rationality he doubts.

In the face of these difficulties, some epistemologists conclude that higher-order defeat is simply not a genuine phenomenon. These views are discussed next. In sections 3 and 4, we will come back to the options for accommodating higher-order defeat.

2.3 Consequences of denying the import of higher-order evidence

If we hold that higher-order evidence does not have first-order rational effects, what should we say about cases like Hypoxia? There are two mainstream options defended in the literature. “Level-Splitters” suggest that Aisha’s first-order belief (about G) should follow her first-order evidence, so she should be highly confident of G. But her higher-order belief (about her own rationality, or about what her first-order evidence supports) should follow her higher-order evidence. “Steadfasters” argue that Aisha should just dismiss the higher-order evidence altogether—believe G, and believe that her evidence supports it. (See Alexander 2013, however, for an argument that no response is justified in Aisha’s case, and Leonard 2020 for an argument that it is indeterminate what Aisha should believe.)

Defenders of the Level-Splitting view include Lasonen-Aarnio (2014), Coates (2012), Weatherson (ms–see Other Internet Resources), Williamson (2014), and Wedgwood (2012). The obvious advantage is that this view straightforwardly takes all of Aisha’s evidence into account: her evidence about G affects her beliefs about G, and her evidence about her epistemic situation affects her beliefs about her epistemic situation. An obvious upshot of this view is that epistemic akrasia can be rational: in particular, in Hypoxia, Aisha should end up believing G, while also believing that her evidence likely doesn’t support G.

But admitting rational epistemic akrasia in this case incurs a large intuitive cost. As Horowitz (2014) argues, if epistemic akrasia is rational in cases like Aisha’s, then so is bootstrapping: if Aisha finds herself in this situation a number of times in a row, or regarding a number of different beliefs, she can use her first-order beliefs to establish a fantastic track record of success, ultimately dismissing the possibility that she was ever rationally impaired. This reasoning looks absurd—because, presumably, there is a tension between strongly holding a belief while also believing one’s evidence doesn’t support it. So why allow this tension in even one case? Horowitz also illustrates other examples of irrational reasoning and action that seem warranted by epistemic akrasia; see also Brown 2018, Littlejohn 2018, and Silva 2018 for further discussion of intuitively irrational reasoning and action licensed by epistemic akrasia in these cases, as well as Feldman 2005 for an earlier rejection of epistemic akrasia in similar circumstances.

The second possibility is to say that higher-order evidence simply has no effect on first-order or higher-order beliefs. (Following the peer disagreement literature, we could call this a “steadfast” view; Smithies [2019] calls it “upward push”.) Kelly (2005) seems to tentatively support this view in the context of peer disagreement (though his later work defends a more moderate “total evidence” view; see, for example, Kelly 2010). Titelbaum (2015) argues for the nearby position that a rational agent can never be mistaken about the rational requirements that apply to her situation (although she might be rationally uncertain as to which situation she is in); he writes that “mistakes about rationality are mistakes of rationality”. Titelbaum’s argument for this rests on the assumption that epistemic akrasia is irrational. (See also Titelbaum 2019. See C. Field 2019 for criticism of this position.) Tal (2021) also defends the steadfast view, in part appealing to the irrationality of epistemic akrasia.

Smithies (2019; see especially ch. 10) gives an extended defense of a steadfast view. He argues that ideal rationality requires rational omniscience—that is, omniscience both about what the rational requirements are and which requirements apply to one at all times. This means that misleading higher-order evidence is, in an important sense, impossible to come by. While non-ideal agents like Aisha may be mistaken about what evidence they have or what it supports, these mistakes are themselves departures from ideal rationality. (Smithies also supplements this with a view about non-ideal rationality, which is discussed below.)

One of the primary objections to the steadfast view is that ignoring higher-order evidence appears to be blatantly dogmatic: it is hard to see how it could be rational for Aisha to continue believing G with no reduction in confidence, after hearing that her altitude puts her at risk of hypoxia. (Though Tom Kelly has argued [see Kelly 2013, for example] that dogmatism in such cases is not inherently irrational.) Additionally, acting on her belief that G—say, setting off for Hawaii with a plane full of passengers—would be shockingly irresponsible, suggesting that something is wrong with the belief that G. (See Christensen 2010a, for example.)

Cases like Hypoxia therefore leave us with three choices. If we say that Aisha should maintain confidence in G, but reduce confidence that it’s rational for her to belief G, we must explain why epistemic akrasia can be rational. If we say she should maintain confidence in G and dismiss the possibility of hypoxia, we must explain why dogmatism can be rational. And if we say she should reduce confidence in G, we must explain how this type of defeat works, and how it fits into our broader theory of rationality. Let us now return to that last question.

3. Accommodating the Import of Higher-Order Evidence

In this section we will look more closely at the possibilities for accommodating higher-order defeat. Even setting aside questions about how such defeat fits into the rest of our epistemological theory, there are several more local questions about how higher-order defeat works. What sort of principle could explain the intuitive verdicts in cases like Hypoxia? Which evidence and reasoning can agents like Aisha rely on in forming their beliefs, and under what circumstances? What determines which attitude, exactly, Aisha should have towards G after taking both her first-order and her higher-order evidence into account?

There are a couple of different ideas that epistemologists sympathetic to higher-order evidence typically aim to capture. One is the thought that higher-order evidence requires us to “bracket” or set aside some of our first-order evidence and reasoning. This is often called “Independence”. The second is the thought that, in accommodating one’s higher-order evidence, one should somehow adjust one’s first-order belief to match what one has learned from the higher-order evidence: either to match what one believes or has reason to believe would be rational, to match one’s expected level of reliability, or some variation on one of these. Principles dictating how one should calibrate one’s first-order beliefs in light of higher-order evidence are often called “level-bridging principles” or “calibration principles”.

Many specific proposals for how to accommodate higher-order evidence (often focusing on the case of disagreement, which we can think of as a variety of higher-order defeat) combine both of these ideas. For example, here is Elga’s (2007: 490) formulation of the “Equal Weight View” of disagreement:

Equal weight view Upon finding out that an advisor disagrees, your probability that you are right should equal your prior conditional probability that you would be right. Prior to what? Prior to your thinking through the disputed issue, and finding out what the advisor thinks of it. Conditional on what? On whatever you have learned about the circumstances of the disagreement.

Calibrating your confidence to the probability that “you would be right” is a way of matching your confidence in P to your expected reliability about P, so the Equal Weight View is in part a level-bridging principle. And the “prior” and “conditional” clauses commit Elga to an Independence principle as well: he is saying that we must set aside the specific first-order evidence and reasoning about the relevant matter, and consider only the surrounding “circumstances”. In the very next paragraph Elga clarifies that “whatever you have learned about the circumstances of the disagreement” must be independent from the reasoning leading to the disagreement itself. Instead, it should include facts about the situation that would affect your or your peer’s reliability, such as how much coffee you have each had, how absurd you find the other person’s answer, and whether the reasoning invites a type of mistake that you or your friend is especially likely to make.

The next two subsections discuss Independence and level-bridging separately. But many authors who endorse one of these (in one form or another) also endorse the other.

3.1 Independence principles

Independence principles say, roughly, that higher-order evidence calls for us to set aside some of our evidence, and not rely on it in our reasoning. This thought is required to rule out the kind of dogmatic response to higher-order evidence discussed above: if we did not have to set aside our first-order evidence and reasoning, it would be rational to rely on it to dismiss any higher-order doubt. Independence raises a number of questions. How can it be rational to ignore evidence? What, exactly, do we have to ignore? And does Independence open the door to skepticism?

Some balk at Independence because it simply seems irrational to ignore evidence (see Kelly 2005, 2010, for example). Kelly (2010) presents the objection roughly like this: if higher-order evidence requires us to ignore our first-order evidence, he asks, doesn’t that make rationality far too easy to come by? It appears that someone could botch their first-order reasoning completely, adjust their confidence in the face of higher-order evidence, and (since they are now obligated to ignore the first-order considerations) have all of their earlier rational mistakes forgiven. Christensen (2011) disagrees, arguing that while someone in this situation may have responded to part of her evidence correctly, we can still distinguish between her final belief state and the belief state of someone who didn’t make the initial mistake: someone who did every step properly is more rational than someone who did not. (See Sliwa & Horowitz 2015 for further discussion; see Schoenfield 2015a for an objection.)

If Independence is right, there are remaining questions about exactly what needs to be set aside—evidence? Reasoning? Something else?—and under what circumstances. As several authors have brought out, it is not quite right to simply say that our assessment must be independent of our first-order reasoning; often, facts about that reasoning, sometimes involving very specific aspects of our evidence, are highly relevant and it would be irrational to ignore them. (See Arsenault & Irving 2012, Kelly 2013, and Lord 2014 for versions of this objection; see Christensen 2018 and 2019 for replies.) It is also not quite right to say that our assessment must be independent of our first-order evidence; often, a single piece of evidence has several different effects, some of which should be set aside and others of which should be taken into account. See Christensen 2019 for detailed discussion of these complexities and others.

A different sort of question concerns how much evidence, information, or background beliefs we must set aside, and whether there are any limits on this. Intuitively, the scope of what we must set aside depends on the scope of higher-order undermining we receive, and which instances or types of reasoning are called into question. But how far can it go? What if everything is called into question? Considering this possibility leads to paradox. On the one hand, reason to universally doubt our reasoning seems to justify skepticism across the board. On the other hand, the way we would arrive at that skeptical state would be by using our reasoning… which has been, by hypothesis, called into question. Some epistemologists have suggested that since there is no stable and consistent response to such cases, we ought to conclude that universal defeat is impossible. But this response is hard to reconcile with the fact that defeat comes on a spectrum; if the extreme cases are impossible, what about the intermediate cases? (For further discussion, see Egan & Elga 2005, Enoch 2010, Sliwa & Horowitz 2015, Schoenfield 2015a, Christensen 2010a, 2019. See also the entry on epistemic self-doubt for further discussion.)

Even if we restrict our attention to more moderate cases of undermining, one still might wonder whether rationality can ask us to doubt so much that we end up skeptics about large and important domains (even if we are not skeptics across the board). Could it be rational for us to come to doubt, for example, all of our moral or religious beliefs on the basis of higher-order undermining? Elga (2007) argues (again in the context of peer disagreement) that we should not worry about this possibility. In order to doubt all of our moral beliefs, for example, we must have independent grounds to judge these beliefs to be unreliable. But if we set aside all of our moral beliefs, Elga argues, we won’t have enough left over to make any sort of reliability judgment—and therefore, won’t have rational grounds for doubt. So undermining can only happen locally. (And even then, he argues, many of our religious and moral beliefs will be safe, since on any particular occasion, the targeted religious or moral belief will be supported by our other moral and religious beliefs—the ones that aren’t called into question.) See Vavova 2018 and Christensen 2011 for further discussion of this point. Vavova and Christensen both differentiate between two possible ways to formulate Independence: one on which you must revise your beliefs insofar as you fail to have good independent reason to trust them, and one on which you must revise insofar as you have good independent reason to think that you’re mistaken. They argue that the first formulation has skeptical results, while the second avoids them.

3.2 Level-bridging principles

While Independence principles tell us what to set aside, level-bridging principles specify how our first-order beliefs should cohere with our higher-order beliefs. (As mentioned above, however, these principles aren’t always presented separately. Level-bridging principles also often include some element of Independence, or are meant to apply alongside an Independence principle.)

Some epistemologists argue that our first-order beliefs should line up somehow with our beliefs about rationality. (See Smithies 2019 and Titelbaum 2015, 2019, for example.) Others argue that our first-order beliefs should line up somehow with our beliefs about reliability. And still others incorporate elements of both. Some literature discusses both notions together and other literature distinguishes explicitly between the two. (See Christensen 2016b, Sliwa & Horowitz 2015, and Schoenfield 2015a for a few examples of more explicit discussions. See also Dorst [forthcoming] for a comprehensive overview of some of the principles proposed in the literature and the relationship between them, and the entry on epistemic self-doubt for discussion of some other level-bridging principles in greater detail.)

I will highlight the choice by first describing an intuitively plausible level-bridging principle that focuses on rationality, and a problem case for this principle which has motivated some epistemologists to move towards reliability instead. Although the second principle, too, has come under criticism, the case is a useful illustration of some of the complications that arise in this choice.

3.2.1 Rationality-focused principles

The general thought behind rationality-focused level-bridging principles is that your beliefs about the world should line up with your beliefs about what’s rational for you to believe. If you think it’s rational to believe P (or, if it’s rational for you to think that’s rational…) you should believe P. If you think it’s rational to believe ~P, you should believe ~P. This line of thought involves deferring to rationality as you would defer to an expert.

What if you’re uncertain about what’s rational? Arguably, this is Aisha’s situation: she’s unsure whether her evidence rationally supports G, as she initially thought it did, or whether hypoxia has confused her and her evidence doesn’t support G after all. One initially plausible response to this sort of situation is to say that when we’re uncertain, our beliefs should reflect a kind of weighted average of the responses we take to be possibly rational. This yields the result that if we’re about equally confident that we should believe P and that we should believe ~P, the thing to do is to suspend judgment.

The principle Rational Reflection makes this thought more precise in a degreed-belief, or “credence” setting. (Christensen [2010b] introduces and discusses the principle at length. Salow [2018] and Skipper [2021] are proponents of the principle. Elga [2013] and Dorst [2020] amend it, as we’ll see later.) Roughly, according to Rational Reflection, one’s credences (“Cr” in the formulation below) should align with those that one regards as rational (“Pr”):

Rational Reflection: \(\Cr(A\mid \Pr(A) = n) = n\)

If this principle were a true rational requirement, then rational agents in situations like Aisha’s would end up with a strong coherence between their first-order beliefs and their beliefs about what is rational. Rational Reflection says, for instance, that it cannot be rational for Aisha to be rationally certain that it is rational to have .9 confidence in G, without also having .9 confidence in G. And it cannot be rational for Aisha to be uncertain, without also adopting a weighted average of the credences that she regards as possibly rational (weighted by her credence, in each, that it is rational). In the version of the case discussed in the introduction, one might interpret Aisha’s higher-order evidence as indicating that her high confidence in G is only 50% likely to be rational, given her first-order evidence. If it is 50% likely that high confidence is rational, and 50% likely that low confidence is rational, Aisha should plausibly adopt the weighted average of these possibilities and arrive at a middling level of credence. Rational Reflection supports this explanation of the story.

However, Rational Reflection has counterintuitive consequences in some cases, such as the “Unmarked Clock” case, introduced in Williamson (2014). Here is that case (based on the presentation in Christensen 2010b; see also Elga 2013; see Horowitz 2014 for a similar case, discussed in connection with epistemic akrasia, and see also Sliwa & Horowitz 2015 for a non-perceptual case with similar features):

The Unmarked Clock: Chloe is looking at an unmarked clock with just a minute hand, which jumps discretely between its positions. The hand is pointing somewhere around where the 4 would be, if it were marked, which of course it isn’t. Chloe is wondering: is the hand pointing to the 19? The 20? The 21? (call those propositions “P19”, “P20”, and “P21”).

Williamson, Christensen, and Elga (among others) all agree on the following about this case:

Chloe shouldn’t be certain of any of P19, P20, or P21.
Chloe’s credence in whichever of these propositions is actually her evidence should be highest, and should taper off as possibilities become more remote. (In other words, if the hand is really at 20 minutes after the hour, she should have highest credence in P20, a bit lower credence in P19 and P21, and lower credence still in P18 and P22.)

And finally,

Chloe can figure out all of these facts about her epistemic situation simply by thinking about the setup of the case, as we just have.

The problem is that (1), (2), and (3) together entail that Chloe should violate Rational Reflection.

Here is why: suppose the hand is at 20 minutes after the hour, and Chloe’s credence is in fact distributed as it should be, with P20 receiving the highest value. Since Chloe is rational, then by (2) above, she should also give significant credence to P19 and P21. Now consider the implications for what Chloe thinks her credence should be. In P20, Chloe’s current credence is rational. But in P19 and P21 (which we have just said she gives significant credence to), her current credence in P20 is too high. So she is in a position to conclude the following about her credence in P20: it’s definitely not too low, but it may well be too high. This unbalanced state violates Rational Reflection, and also looks like an instance of epistemic akrasia.

Adam Elga (2013) argues that this sort of situation motivates a different principle, which he calls “New Rational Reflection” (following Ned Hall’s “New Principal Principle”, and the argument in favor of it; see Hall 1994). Elga argues that just as we should not in general defer (directly) to experts when we know more than they do, we should not in general defer to rationality in cases where it is rational to doubt one’s rationality. If we use “Cr” for an agent’s credence, and “Pr” for a candidate ideally rational credence, we can express Elga’s principle as follows:

New Rational Reflection: \(\Cr(A\mid \textrm{Pr is ideal}) = \Pr(A\mid \textrm{Pr is ideal})\)

Both Rational Reflection and New Rational Reflection have us defer to rationality as we would defer to an expert. But whereas Rational Reflection has us defer to rationality as an expert with exactly our evidence, New Rational Reflection has us defer to rationality as an expert who has our evidence and is certain that it is an expert. Elga argues that this is the right way to defer to experts more generally, making New Rational Reflection (on his view) simply a more carefully-formulated expert deference principle. (See Pettigrew & Titelbaum 2014 for a concurrent view.)

In the clock case, New Rational Reflection also allows for epistemic akrasia: Chloe’s beliefs about the clock come apart from her estimate of what’s rational for her to believe about the clock. But New Rational Reflection offers us an explanation for why this is unproblematic. In normal cases, what’s rational is a good guide to what’s true: if it’s rational to believe it will rain, it’s also likely to be true that it will rain. But in the clock case, this generality doesn’t hold. We can predict that rationality and truth will come apart. So when Chloe’s belief matches her best estimate of what’s true, it will diverge from her best estimate of what’s rational. Furthermore, this divergence comes about because of uncertainty about what’s rational. So by eliminating that uncertainty—by deferring to rationality only on the condition that rationality is not uncertain about its own expertise—New Rational Reflection aims to eliminate that gap between rationality and truth. (See Elga 2013, as well as Horowitz 2014, for further discussion of this feature of the case.)

Several authors agree with this line of thought, accepting both the setup of the clock case and Elga’s general line of thought regarding how it should be treated. These authors take the clock case to be one in which epistemic akrasia is rationally permissible after all, showing that any anti-akrasia norms must be formulated carefully. For similar discussion, see Horowitz’s (2014) discussion of the dartboard case (which is modeled after the unmarked clock). There, Horowitz argues that epistemic akrasia is rationally permissible when we expect the evidence to be “falsity-guiding”; though see Weatherson (2019: ch. 10), and Hawthorne, Isaacs, and Lasonen-Aarnio (2021) for arguments that this condition is too narrow. Sliwa and Horowitz (2015) present an alternative level-bridging principle, “Evidential Calibration”, and argue that, like New Rational Reflection, it can help differentiate between rational and irrational cases of epistemic akrasia, as well as rule out bootstrapping. Christensen (2016a) proposes what he calls the “Idealized Thermometer Model”, and makes similar points in its favor. Dorst (2020; see also his 2019) proposes another principle, “Trust”, which is a weakening of Rational Reflection. Dorst argues that Trust allows us to be uncertain about rationality, while still treating rationality as an expert; this vindicates the idea that we should defer to our evidence, and (following I. J. Good) that more evidence is always epistemically beneficial. All of these level-bridging principles take higher-order evidence into account, but also allow some instances of epistemic akrasia.

If we agree with this line of thought, we might draw two lessons. First: treating rationality as an expert is a complicated job, and any rational expert deference principle must be formulated carefully. If we can predict that rationality and truth will come apart, we should not defer unrestrictedly to rationality. And relatedly, we might take cases like this to show that epistemic akrasia can be rational: it can crop up even on some views according to which higher-order evidence is epistemically significant.

Some epistemologists disagree with these lessons, and moreover, with the entire setup of the clock case. One camp of detractors objects to claims (1), (2), and (3) as set out above. These epistemologists argue that we cannot be rationally uncertain about what our evidence is (as Chloe is) or about what it supports. See, for example, Stalnaker (2009), Smithies (2019: ch. 11), and Skipper (2021). Salow (2018) argues that the conception of evidence required to get the puzzle going can be used to allow “biased inquiry”. Cases like the unmarked clock thus present a choice point for epistemologists who want to accommodate higher-order defeat: accept that such cases are possible and reject Rational Reflection, or reject such cases and adopt a strong transparency requirement about evidence and rationality.

Others disagree from the opposite side: Maria Lasonen-Aarnio (2015) argues that even the modified principle, New Rational Reflection, presupposes too much self-knowledge. She advocates rejecting all level-bridging principles, at least as far as our theory of evidential support is concerned (though see section 4 for discussion of her view on cases like Aisha’s).)

Finally, Christensen (2021a) argues that New Rational Reflection doesn’t go far enough. New Rational Reflection says we should defer, to some extent, to any theory of rationality we think might possibly be right. But what if we think it’s possible that rationality can come apart from the truth—as it does in the clock case, or even more broadly, as it does on views that allow moral encroachment? (On the extreme end, consider views on which rationality is about believing what makes you happy.) Surely we should not defer to them, even a little bit. (If one of them is right, of course, we should follow it—but the present question is just about whether we should treat different candidates for rationality as experts.) So Christensen argues we should reject New Rational Reflection, and focus on attaining beliefs we take to be accurate, rather than beliefs we take to be rational. This may mean moving away entirely from rationality-focused level-bridging principles.

3.2.2 Reliability-focused principles

So far we have focused on Rational Reflection and New Rational Reflection, which are motivated by the thought that in accommodating higher-order evidence, we should calibrate our first-order beliefs to our higher-order beliefs about rationality. Another way to approach the question begins with reliability. The thought here is that higher-order evidence affects our first-order beliefs because of its bearing on our reliability—that is, our propensity to get to the truth, under the relevant circumstances. Examples of this approach include Elga’s “Equal Weight View”, quoted above; Christensen (2007a)’s “Integration”; the “Calibration Rule”, discussed by White (2009); Weatherson’s (ms—see Other Internet Resources) “Judgments Screen Evidence” (which he argues against); “Guess Calibration”, discussed in Sliwa and Horowitz 2015; “Calibration”, discussed in Schoenfield 2015a; and the “Simple Thermometer Model” discussed in Christensen 2016a. As a representative example, here is White’s “Calibration Rule”, which he presents as a consequence of the Equal Weight View:

Calibration Rule: If I draw the conclusion p on the basis of any evidence e, my credence in p should equal my prior expected reliability with respect to p.

There are various complications involved in interpreting this rule (for instance, it refers to “drawing a conclusion”, which is an all-or-nothing judgment, as well as credences). But notice that, unlike Rational Reflection, the Calibration Rule makes no reference to rationality. (It does specify that the conclusion is drawn on the basis of some evidence, but as White points out in his discussion of the rule, the evidence plays no part in determining what we should believe.)

Reliability-based level-bridging principles must also be formulated carefully in order to navigate worries in the vicinity of the generality problem. (Among other things, one’s reliability estimate on a particular occasion must take base rates into account; see Isaacs 2021.) But just as we saw before, such principles are always put forth in conjunction with—or incorporate some element of—Independence principles. If we can answer the question of how to circumscribe Independence, presumably that will answer the generality problem in this domain as well.

Focusing on reliability, rather than rationality, has advantages and disadvantages. An important advantage is that this approach allows us to accommodate cases like the unmarked clock, discussed in the previous section. But the disadvantage is that reliability-based level-bridging principles do not answer certain questions which, for many epistemologists, lie at the heart of the higher-order evidence debate: can epistemic akrasia be rational? And should we in some sense treat rationality as an expert to which we should defer? If our level-bridging principle does not mention rationality, it will not have immediate consequences for these questions, which may seem unsatisfying to some.

Distinguishing between rationality-focused and reliability-focused level-bridging principles highlights another choice point for epistemologists. Some take questions about akrasia to be central, and defend rationality-based level-bridging principles for that reason (Smithies 2019 is a paradigmatic example; see also Neta 2019). Others—even those who support level-bridging—take cases like the unmarked clock to show that these questions aren’t so central after all, and that perhaps epistemic akrasia is not so significant (Christensen 2016a and 2021a are paradigmatic examples of this approach). A third strategy is to say that anti-akrasia, or level-coherence principles, have a special sort of normative status that differs from other rational requirements. Some of the proposals discussed in the next section defend this view.

4. Dilemmas and Two-Norm Views

We began by discussing a puzzle raised by higher-order evidence: it seems that agents in situations like Hypoxia should reduce confidence, but also that if they do, they will be ignoring evidence in a problematic way. We have seen some arguments against reducing confidence, and some proposals for how Aisha should reduce confidence. But some epistemologists think that neither of these possibilities gives us the full story. Maybe level-bridging principles are genuine rational requirements, but there is still something wrong with Aisha if she reduces confidence. Or maybe they are not genuine rational requirements, yet there is something else wrong with Aisha if she does not reduce confidence. Maybe they are both rational requirements, and Aisha is facing an epistemic dilemma. (An alternative way to frame the puzzle focuses on epistemic akrasia: maybe Aisha is rationally required to be epistemically akratic in her situation, but there is something else wrong with her if she is epistemically akratic, and so forth.)

This section discusses two strategies which acknowledge the remaining puzzle and attempt to solve it. One, defended most prominently by David Christensen, holds that higher-order evidence gives rise to epistemic dilemmas, where there is no fully rational response available (though there may be a rationally best response). So Aisha is both required to believe G and to doubt G, and she is just unfortunately unable to do both. Another family of responses, here called “two-norm views”, aim to separate different modes of epistemic evaluation, and argue that Aisha’s conflicting requirements somehow issue from different normative realms. The common goal of all these strategies is to explain the apparent conflict of norms in cases like Hypoxia, without denying the legitimacy of any of these conflicting norms.

4.1 Dilemmas

Christensen takes the puzzles surrounding higher-order evidence to show that the requirements of rationality sometimes conflict with one another, putting agents like Aisha in an epistemic bind. This proposal differs from the two-norm views discussed below, in that there is just one notion of epistemic rationality at work. According to the dilemma view, in some circumstances, it is impossible to satisfy all the rational requirements at once.(see Christensen 2007a, 2010a, 2013, 2016b, and 2021c). In his more recent work (see Christensen 2021c), Christensen sees the norms in conflict, in Aisha’s case, as one requiring us to believe what our evidence entails, and another requiring us to revise in light of higher-order evidence. (An alternative possibility, which Christensen suggests in earlier work [see his 2013], is that the second norm is explicitly an anti-akratic norm.)

An important feature of Christensen’s view is that, although Aisha is subject to conflicting requirements, there is still a best epistemic response in her situation. (Christensen holds that the best response is to reduce confidence.) This raises a question: what determines which response is best? See Leonard 2020 for arguments against the dilemma view; Leonard defends a nearby view according to which there are conflicting norms, but it’s indeterminate (among a restricted set of possibilities) what Aisha should believe. Knoks (2021) defends a view along similar lines, arguing that Aisha’s situation is permissive (again, among a similarly-restricted set of possibilities). The possibility of dilemmas in epistemology raises several questions: how can epistemic requirements relate (or not) to notions of epistemic blame, and how can they guide our beliefs? See Hughes 2019 and 2021, e.g., for further discussion of these issues (though mostly focused on a different putative source of conflicting requirements); Hughes defends the position that we should accept epistemic dilemmas.

4.2 Ideal vs. non-ideal modes of evaluation

A few authors have suggested that while higher-order evidence has genuine normative significance, this significance belongs only to some non-ideal normative realm. So while a rationally ideal agent’s higher-order evidence would have no effect on her first-order beliefs, a non-ideal agent’s evidence should have such an effect—precisely because she is non-ideal.

Joshua DiPaolo (2019) develops one version of this view. Drawing on work in political philosophy, he argues that we need an epistemological “theory of the second best”. On his proposed view, the norms that apply to ideal agents are different from the norms that apply to non-ideal agents. While the ideal norms define a standard of perfection for all of us, non-ideal norms tell us how to approach that standard, taking our imperfections into account. DiPaolo argues that this approach allows us to resolve the apparent tensions involved in accommodating higher-order evidence: ideal rationality requires ignoring higher-order evidence, but non-ideal rationality requires respecting it.

While non-ideal agents are limited in their reasoning abilities, they are also limited in their abilities to double-check and “police” themselves. Appealing to this consideration, Joshua Schechter (2013) makes a suggestion that cuts in the opposite direction from DiPaolo’s: he argues that perhaps our epistemic imperfections cap our responsibility to respond to higher-order evidence. This means that while our available evidence may call for extensive belief revision—and while a more ideal agent would revise her beliefs in response to higher-order evidence—non-ideal believers like us are permitted to stop when we’ve done what we can.

Declan Smithies (2019) also defends a view on which the ideal/non-ideal distinction comes into play. This is discussed in more detail below.

4.3 Best plans to follow vs. best plans to make

Another kind of two-norm view comes from Miriam Schoenfield (see her 2015b and 2018). Schoenfield interprets judgments about rationality, in cases like Aisha’s, as plans. She points out that we can evaluate plans in (at least) two different ways: by looking at what will happen if they are followed perfectly, and by looking at what will happen if they are made. If you need to leave the house at 10:30, but are habitually running late, “leave the house at 10” might be the best plan to make, even if “leave the house at 10:30” is the best plan to follow. This is similar to DiPaolo’s suggestion in that the difference between the best plan to make and the best plan to follow depends on a person’s (predicted) rational shortcomings: the best plan to make is one that takes these shortcomings into account in a particular way. However, Schoenfield’s view is not that higher-order evidence only has rational import for non-ideal agents; rather, it has the import it has for anyone who rationally believes that they are non-ideal.

An advantage of this approach is that it allows us to focus on accuracy as the primary target of epistemic rationality. Schoenfield frames both modes of evaluation in terms of accuracy: specifically, the accuracy-related consequences of the plan. So if she is right that the best-plan-to-make/best-plan-to-follow distinction can explain higher-order evidence, we would end up with a relatively uniform two-norm view. See Horowitz 2019 for two objections: first, that focusing on consequences seems to open the door to non-epistemic plans, such as “have a sandwich before reasoning”; second, that the best plan to make might differ among different believers, in which case this strategy would not yield anything like a general defense of revising in response to higher-order evidence. This second worry also raises questions about DiPaolo’s proposal and how universal we can expect a non-ideal rationality to be.

4.4 Reasons vs. rationality

Alex Worsnip (2018) argues that we can explain the oddness of higher-order evidence by distinguishing between two kinds of epistemic requirements: evidence responsiveness and coherence. If Aisha maintains her belief that G, and believes that her evidence may well not support this belief, she will believe everything her evidence supports. If she revises her belief that she has enough fuel (aligning it with her estimate of what the evidence supports) she will be coherent. This view is one that explicitly appeals to epistemic akrasia, as Worsnip’s coherence norms are effectively anti-akrasia norms.

4.5 Evidence vs. dispositions

Maria Lasonen-Aarnio (2020) argues that the conflict comes from two different modes of evaluation which we can apply to Aisha’s case. In addition to evaluating whether believers have correctly followed the epistemic requirements that apply to them, or have correctly accommodated their evidence, we can also evaluate their belief-forming dispositions. If Aisha holds onto her belief about G, while recognizing the danger of hypoxia in her own case, she is responding appropriately to her evidence and is (if her belief is formed in the right way) following the requirements that apply to her. But she is also manifesting a disposition that is unlikely to serve her well in the long term: ignoring what appears to be a conclusive reason for belief (her belief that she’s likely to be hypoxic, and therefore likely to be responding inappropriately to her evidence) will often involve actual conclusive reasons for belief. We can criticize Aisha for manifesting this disposition, even if this particular case is not one of the situations in which it goes wrong. (A relevant comparison here is Rule versus Act Utilitarianism: a good rule might occasionally lead to imperfect outcomes, whereas a good outcome might occasionally be the result of a bad rule. See Coates [2012] for a similar suggestion about rules in this context.)

Smithies (2019) defends a similar view, discussed in more detail in the next subsection.

4.5 Propositional justification vs. doxastic justification

Finally, Paul Silva (2017) and Declan Smithies (2019) each argue—though in different ways—that we can resolve the conflict by distinguishing between propositional and doxastic justification. (Also see Ye 2020 for objections to the move to doxastic justification in this context.) Let us consider Silva’s proposal first. An agent like Aisha, he argues, is propositionally justified in believing G, and in believing that her evidence may well not support G. But she cannot come to rationally hold the belief that G: in other words, she cannot be doxastically justified in believing G. Silva’s argument for this claim is in part an inference to the best explanation: although Aisha’s evidence supports G, it seems irrational for Aisha to act on that belief, suggesting that Aisha lacks knowledge of G. If Aisha’s belief is propositionally justified but not known, this in turn suggests that the belief is not doxastically justified. (See also van Wietmarschen 2013 for a similar proposal in the case of peer disagreement. Van Wietmarschen’s argument does not appeal to knowledge; rather, he argues directly that an agent’s belief is not well-grounded, or doxastically justified, if her basis for holding it does not respond to her higher-order evidence.)

Smithies (2019) invokes this distinction to a slightly different end. As mentioned above, he argues that we can never be propositionally justified in believing falsehoods about what our evidence supports—so, Aisha is propositionally justified in believing G, and propositionally justified in believing that her evidence supports this. But assuming that Aisha is a normal, non-ideal believer, her own doxastic dispositions won’t be sensitive enough to the evidence to safely track her propositional justification. This means that she can’t be doxastically justified in believing that her evidence supports G. Interestingly, Smithies argues that in this case a non-ideal agent like Aisha should be epistemically akratic; the ideal, non-akratic state isn’t available to her, and an akratic state is, he argues, the best she can do.

5. Conclusion

We began by noting that higher-order evidence gives rise to a puzzle. It seems that “higher-order evidence”—information about our own irrationality or unreliability—should prompt us to revise our beliefs about the world, but if we do so, we must ignore evidence and reasoning that is directly relevant to the truth of those beliefs. Much of the literature on higher-order evidence revolves around this puzzle: arguing that we should reject one side of the puzzle or the other, or finding ways to hold onto both.

As of this writing, two related questions emerge as central to the debate going forward. First: is higher-order evidence significant because it gives us information about our own rationality? Or because it gives us information about our own reliability? And second: are there genuine norms prohibiting epistemic akrasia? (So, should our beliefs about what’s rational line up with our beliefs about the world?) Or does the appearance of these norms merely arise because of nearby norms regarding reliability—or, perhaps, because there are multiple, conflicting modes of epistemic normativity? Untangling the puzzles surrounding higher-order evidence will ultimately involve answering these questions as well, as well as broader questions about the relationship between rationality and truth.


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Other Internet Resources


I would like to thank David Christensen for helpful comments and suggestions.

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Sophie Horowitz <shorowitz@umass.edu>

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