Solomon Ibn Gabirol [Avicebron]

First published Thu Sep 23, 2010

A prolific poet and the author of the Fons Vitae, Ibn Gabirol is well known in the history of philosophy for the doctrine that all things —including soul and intellect—are comprised of matter and form (“Universal Hylomorphism”), and for his emphasis on Divine Will. Ibn Gabirol is moved first and foremost by the Neoplatonic theological sense that God's reality infuses all things, and by the concomitant ethical and existential ideal of Neoplatonic Return—the notion that we must strive, through mind and deed, to reclaim our own truest being and likeness to our source. Thought wrongly by centuries of Christian scholastics to be either a Christian defender of Augustine or a Muslim misreader of Aristotle, Ibn Gabirol is in fact a Jewish Neoplatonist who, under the additional influence of Pseudo Empedoclean ideas, paints for us a modified Plotinian universe in which all things are rooted in various “layers” of matters and forms which reveal the mediating graces of God's own Will/Wisdom/Word. For Ibn Gabirol, everything (even the simple unity of intellect itself) reveals a matter+form complexity, mirroring in this way the complex unity of God's own “essential” and “active” moments. Where God reveals himself as the “Fountain of Life,” our material core acts as the river through which we may return always to our source.

1. Bio, Works, Sources and Influences

Jewish Neoplatonist Solomon ben Judah Ibn Gabirol (Shelomoh ben Yehudah Ibn Gabirol in Hebrew; Abu Ayyub Sulaiman ibn Yahya Ibn Jubayrol (or Ibn Jabirul)[1] in Arabic; Avicebron / Avicembron / Avicenbrol / Avencebrol in Latin) was born in Málaga Spain in 1021/2 (Guttman offers 1026) and died, most likely in Valencia, most likely in 1057/8 (Guttman offers 1050; Sirat offers 1054–8; Joseph Ibn Zaddik offers 1070).[2] From his own autobiographical remarks in his poems, it appears that this important poet-philosopher was orphaned, infirm and unattractive (it seems he suffered a disfiguring skin ailment).[3] While there was a time during which he was involved with a circle of Jewish intellectuals in Saragossa, and while he did enjoy the patronage of a respected (though, eventually murdered) Jewish patron for a short while, it is also clear that Ibn Gabirol had an anti-social disposition[4] and a mostly strained relationship with the Jewish community. This latter point has perhaps been overemphasized to full blown misanthropy due to a translation error: in his sharp criticism of Ibn Gabirol's philosophy (as repetitive, wrong-headed and unconvincing), Ibn Daud concludes (in his ha-Emûnah ha-Ramah) that through his philosophy Ibn Gabirol “led the Jewish people into error,” which through a mistranslation of the Arabic into Hebrew got wrongly conveyed as the claim that he slandered the Jewish people (dîber sarah gedôlah al ha-ûma) (see Pines 1977a; for brief discussion in English, see Sirat 1985, p. 81). That aside, a poem he wrote upon leaving Saragossa does lambast the community (“…giants they deem themselves, for me to rate no more than grasshoppers…I am away, beneath my feet like mire I stamp them hard…”) (for translation and references for this poem, see Loewe 1989, p. 21, and footnote 9, p. 170), and it does seem that he had a hard time finding patrons and friends (legend tells of his having created some sort of female automaton for house chores [apparently this story circulated in the 17th century; see Ashkenazi 1629, part 1, 9; see Bargebuhr 1976, p. 62; Loewe 1989 fn. 9 p. 170]—perhaps a legend built on his reputation as having had few companions). Perhaps we may root his generally surly disposition in his rather hard life or, on the other hand, in his self-assured sense of what was, to be sure, his own keen intellect and poetic genius. On this latter point, we might consider another Ibn Gabirol legend—a mythic tale of his death: killed by a jealous poet, Ibn Gabirol's remains are discovered when curious townsmen dig under a fig tree to determine why its flowers, fruit, and fragrance exceed the beauty of anything they've ever experienced (see Loewe 1989, p. 23 with reference details in footnote 14, p. 170).

Complementing a vast corpus of Hebrew poetry (see section 7 below), Ibn Gabirol's most expansive work is his philosophical treatise, the Fons Vitae (The Fountain of Life, or yanbû‘ al-hayâh in Arabic,[5] and the meqôr hayyîm in its later Hebrew translation).[6] Originally written in Arabic in the 11th century in the form of a dialogue between a teacher and his student, the Fons Vitae was translated into Latin in the 12th century by the translation team of Dominicus Gundissalinus and John of Spain (Johannes Hispanus),[7] and made into an abridged Hebrew version (one which loses the dialogue format and is something more of a summary of the original) by Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera in the 13th century. The original Arabic text is lost to us, though we do have some extant fragments in the form of citations of the original Arabic version in the Arabic language texts of other Jewish medieval philosophers.[8] Because the Arabic fragments are sparse, the main version of the text is the Latin 12th century translation—it is considered more true to the original than the later 13th century Hebrew translation both because it is an earlier translation, but also because unlike the Hebrew summary translation, the Latin edition is (ostensibly) a complete translation, maintaining—as the Hebrew summary does not—the original dialogue format of Ibn Gabirol's original text. That said, it is worth noting that sometimes the 13th century Hebrew translation is more helpful than the Latin because it is able to resonate with various Hebrew terms at play in Ibn Gabirol's own vast corpus of Hebrew poetry which is often helpful in shedding light on some given philosophical point in the Fons Vitae.

Ibn Gabirol also authored (in Arabic) On the Improvement of the Moral Qualities (islâh al-’akhlâq in the Arabic, or tîkkûn mîdôt ha-nefesh, the Hebrew title of the translation by Judah Ibn Tibbon) a blend of physiological and philosophical insights on the nature of the human soul. We also have evidence in other medieval Jewish authors of what might be part of an allegorical commentary on the Bible by Ibn Gabirol (as found in Abraham ibn Ezra's commentary on the Bible; see Friedlaender 1877, p. 40; Kaufmann 1899, p. 63ff.; for English see Sirat 1985, p. 79), and it is debated whether he might also be the author of Choice of Pearls (mukhtâr al-jawâhir, lit. Choice (or: Selection) of Jewels; or Mivhar ha-Penînîm, Choice of Pearls, in its Hebrew translation),[9] a collection of maxims aimed at cultivating a virtuous soul. It might be further noted that there are medieval lists by later thinkers enumerating a total 21 treatises by Ibn Gabirol (see Loewe 1989, pp. 24–5) including an entire [non-extant] treatise on Divine Will to which Ibn Gabirol himself alludes in his Fons Vitae. All this, of course, in addition to his having authored a vast corpus of Hebrew poetry, including a number of lengthy philosophical poems (see section 7).

Although we are not certain of what traditions most influenced his work, we might certainly see in the pages of his philosophy and poetry a unique blend of Jewish, Islamic, Neoplatonic, Pythagorean, philosophical, Biblical, and mystical (Jewish and Islamic) source materials. We find overt use of Biblical quotes throughout his poetry, though (and this is something for which other Jewish thinkers criticized him) no overt references to the Bible or Jewish tradition in his Fons Vitae (though the title arguably references Psalms 36:10). In his notion of a Divine Word (in the Fons Vitae), we might hear resonances of the Longer Theology of Aristotle; in his interest in a Divine Throne (in the Fons Vitae and in his Keter Malkhût [Kingdom's Crown] poem), we might hear resonances of Muslim and Jewish “Throne theologies”;[10] in his reference to God creating out of letters, we might hear resonances of the Sêfer Yezîrah (The Book of Formation, possibly known to Ibn Gabirol through the commentary edition of Saadya Gaon; for discussion of Sêfer Yezîrah and Ibn Gabirol, see Schlanger 1965 and Liebes 1987); in his causal metaphysical hierarchy we might discern the influence of the Liber de Causis;[11] and in his emphasis on a principle called “al-‘unsur al-awwal” in his Arabic writing (generally translated as first matter) and called “yesôd” (foundation) in his Hebrew poetry, we might hear resonances of a tradition which scholars have dubbed “Pseudo Empedoclean”—an imprecisely understood tradition of ideas found in an eclectic array of medieval Jewish and Islamic texts (where authors sometimes refer overtly to Empedocles by name) in which there emerges a notable focus on a principle of pure supernal matter (al-‘unsur al-awwal, literally “the first element”) at the core of being which is itself either coupled with a principle of first form or described as itself composite of the duality of “love and strife.” The exact nature of this tradition or traditions remains unclear, but can be found in al-Shahrastani, al-Shahrazuri, Ps. Ammonius, and al-Amiri (for references, see the entry on “anbaduklîs”—the Arabic transliteration of “Empedocles”—in Encyclopedia of Islam), in some medieval Hebrew Kabbalistic traditions,[12] and has been linked to ideas in Ibn Masarra (see Asín-Palacios 1978), Isaac Israeli and Ibn Hasday (See Stern 1983a). Linking Ibn Gabirol to this tradition seems warranted not only in light of his own emphasis on al-‘unsur al-awwal (followed in turn by an unusual focus on the role of matter/s in the cosmos), but in light of a claim by his 13th century translator Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera who in the introduction to his Hebrew edition of Meqôr Hayyîm (Fons Vitae) writes that Ibn Gabirol seems to have been influenced by “Empedocles' Book of the Five Substances” (cf. Falaquera in Fons Vitae 1962, p. 435). Leaving aside what this might refer to (scholars debate both the title as well as what it refers to), it does seem that Ibn Falaquera was right to note some link between Ibn Gabirol's Fons Vitae and some set of ideas circulating under the name of Empedocles.[13]

While some later medieval Jewish thinkers—such as Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera, Moses Ibn Ezra, Abraham Ibn Daud, Joseph ibn Zaddik and Isaac and Judah Abrabanel—were familiar with his philosophy, Ibn Gabirol is probably most well-known among medieval and modern Jewish authors for his Hebrew poetry, the best known of which being the Keter Malkhût (variously translated as Kingdom's Crown, The Kingly Crown, The Royal Crown, et al.),[14] a long devotional poem exploring the ineffable splendor of the divine and tracing God's presence throughout the various cosmological spheres which make up the universe. In fact, this poem is included in many Jewish prayer books for recitation on Yôm Kippûr (The Day of Atonement), the highest of Jewish holy days.

The Fons Vitae is arguably the most influential of his works, though mostly among medieval Christians. Available in Hebrew summary form by the 13th century, and quoted in Arabic in Moses Ibn Ezra's work,[15] the Fons Vitae left its strongest imprint not on medieval Jews but on the medieval Christian world. Translated into Latin in the 12th century, and circulating no longer under Ibn Gabirol's name per se, but now under the Latinized version of his name (variously as Avicebron, Avicembron, Avicenbrol and Avencebrol), the Fons Vitae was engaged (variously criticized and hallowed) by centuries of medieval Christian scholars, who either assumed the author to be a Muslim or a Christian, none suspecting the author to be the accomplished medieval Jewish poet, Solomon Ibn Gabirol.

Following the Christian reception of Ibn Gabirol's text further, we might note that whole groups of medieval Christian philosophers assumed the text to have been written in particular by an Augustinian Christian. Taken up by many Franciscan philosophers in just this way, Ibn Gabirol's Fons Vitae text became a cornerstone in many theologically charged debates between Franciscans and Dominicans, the Franciscans pointing to many of the Fons Vitae doctrines in support of what they took to be true, untainted Christian ideas as laid out by Augustine—in contrast to the more heavily Aristotelianized ideas of Dominicans like St. Thomas Aquinas. It was not until the middle of the 19th century that the Fons Vitae began its return to its Jewish roots when Solomon Munk uncovered the 13th century Hebrew summary by Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera in which the text is attributed to Solomon Ibn Gabirol. In this way, Munk recognized the Fons Vitae to have in fact been penned by the 11th century Jewish poet.

It is worth noting that in spite of this discovery, many scholars continue to tacitly read Ibn Gabirol's Fons Vitae through Augustinian and other inappropriate lenses. (See section 2 on methodology below).

2. A Word on Method: Moving Beyond Aristotle, Augustine, and Kabbalah

While there is no neutral lens through which to engage the history of ideas, it is important to guard against three particularly distorting lenses in the study of Ibn Gabirol: Aristotelian, Augustinian, and Kabbalistic.

2.1 Aristotelian Lenses in the Study of Ibn Gabirol

One of Ibn Gabirol's key interests in his Fons Vitae is a study of matter and form (and in particular a doctrine which later thinkers have called “Universal Hylomorphism”). While there is no question that Ibn Gabirol is in some sense influenced by Aristotelian concepts of form, matter, substance, categories, etc., there is no reason to think that he is generally using those concepts in anything even close to an Aristotelian way. As hopefully will become clear in this study, the primary notions of matter and of substance in Ibn Gabirol are deeply (and obviously) non-Aristotelian [see sections 5.1, 5.2 and 5.3], revealing instead deeply Platonic and Neoplatonic sensibilities, and—even more uniquely—deeply “Empedoclean” influence. (In this regard, Pessin 2009 (pp. 287–288) uses the novel term “Grounding Element” to replace the Latin “materia prima” and its English translation as “prime matter” as a translation for Ibn Gabirol's Arabic “al-‘unsur al-awwal”; see too Pessin 2004). It is critical to note that “prime matter” is a misleading term to use in a study of Ibn Gabirol as it at imports undue Aristotelian resonances to—and masks Pseudo (henceforth, “Ps.”) Empedoclean resonances at play in—Ibn Gabirol's Arabic terminology.

Noting that Ibn Gabirol is not an Aristotelian goes a long way to invalidating the deepest grounds (as opposed to the details) of Thomas Aquinas' and other medieval thinkers' criticisms of Ibn Gabirol's metaphysics as essentially being some kind of misunderstanding of Aristotle. Since Ibn Gabirol is not trying—tacitly or otherwise—to do what many scholastics are trying to do (viz. to “get Aristotle right”), it is methodologically strained to critique Ibn Gabirol from an Aristotelian vantage point. An Aristotelian lens does not open us to understanding the metaphysical picture that Ibn Gabirol is trying to paint for us.

2.2 Augustinian Lenses in the Study of Ibn Gabirol

Another of Ibn Gabirol's key interests in the Fons Vitae is the Divine Will. This focus in part explains why many Christian Franciscans thought the Fons Vitae to have been authored not only by a Christian but by what they would have seen as a right-minded Augustinian Christian. While we have known since the 19th century that the Fons Vitae was in fact authored by a Jewish poet, this has arguably not altered much of the Augustinian-lensed scholarship on the Fons Vitae. Some scholars, for example, have concluded simply on the basis of the idea of a Divine Will in Ibn Gabirol that he (like Augustine) must mean by this some divine power at odds with emanation. While the details of Ibn Gabirol's cosmogony are complex, and while it is indeed possible that his notion of Will rules out emanation, another equally strong option is that he uses the term “Divine Will” in a way that (contra Augustine) is deeply compatible with Plotinian emanation. My point here is simply to caution the reader: just because something sounds Augustinian does not mean that it is, and if it is not, we need to keep all our conceptual options open. Certainly “will” is consistent with emanation in the pages of Plotinus; we should not start out—tacitly wearing Augustinian lenses—with any assumptions to the contrary in the Fons Vitae.[16] (In this regard, Pessin 2009, p. 286 with note 54, uses the term “Divine Desire” to replace the Latin “voluntas” and the English “Will” as a translation of Ibn Gabirol's Arabic “al-irâda”).

For our current purposes, we must at least bear in mind that since Ibn Gabirol is not a Christian Augustinian, it is methodologically strained to read Ibn Gabirol from an Augustinian vantage point. An Augustinian lens does not open us to understanding the metaphysical picture that Ibn Gabirol is trying to paint for us.

2.3 Kabbalistic Lenses in the Study of Ibn Gabirol

In his elaboration on the metaphysics of matter, Ibn Gabirol frequently uses the Arabic term “al-‘unsur” (instead of the more common Arabic terms “al-hayûlâ” and “al-madda”) for matter. In fact, as outlined in section 1, this is one of the key pieces of evidence for identifying a uniquely “Empedoclean” strain in his thinking. That said, many readers instead simplistically fall into a Kabbalistic reading of Ibn Gabirol since the Arabic “al-‘unsur” is correlated to the Hebrew term “yesôd” both in Ibn Gabirol's own Hebrew poetry as well as in Falaquera's 13th century Hebrew translation of the Fons Vitae. While to be sure, the Hebrew term “yesôd” (literally “foundation”) is a cornerstone term and concept in Jewish mysticism, the desire to read Ibn Gabirol Kabbalistically (as a proto-Zoharian) is simply under-supported by the mere fact that he (and his Hebrew translator) use the term “yesôd”. While there might be Kabbalistic traces in Ibn Gabirol, it is methodologically inadvisable—and distorting—to simply start out assuming there are. We might note, for example, F. E. Peters' boldly claiming—with no stated evidence—in his “Avicebron” entry in the New Catholic Encyclopedia: “The true philosophical home of Avicebron is in the Zohar and in the speculative sections of the Cabala” (see Peters 1967, volume 1, p. 1130). Such a claim is not prima facie evident. In an obviously more methodologically careful spirit, there are scholars of Jewish mysticism who recommend connections to Ibn Gabirol (usually with reference to Ibn Gabirol's poems, not his Fons Vitae) (see, for example, Idel, who offers the suggestion of mystical overtones in an Ibn Gabirol poetic reference to “ten sefirôt” (Idel 1982, p. 278); see too: Idel 1992; Liebes 1987; Heller-Wilensky 1967). While we needn't dismiss the idea of links between Ibn Gabirol and Jewish mysticism (he was most likely familiar with the Sêfer Yetzîrah tradition, and possibly other traditions, of sefîrôt), we must be methodologically cautious to not over-Kabbalize Ibn Gabirol (and especially his Fons Vitae): use of terms like “sefîrôt,” “yesôd,” et al. do not necessarily reveal Jewish mystical overtones or influence. Scholem reminds us (in his study of Ibn Gabirol's influence on Kabbalah) that even after many studies of the link between Ibn Gabirol and the Kabbalah, we have no clear conclusions (Scholem 1939, p. 160). (Avoiding reading Ibn Gabirol as a proto-Zoharist is not to deny any impact of Ibn Gabirol on later Kabbalists; but even this question of forward-influence must be treated with care; as Scholem also notes, the mere use of the term “Divine Will” in Kabbalistic thinkers after Ibn Gabirol does not necessarily reveal a Gabirolean influence (Scholem 1939, p. 161)).

Since we have strong reason to claim that Ibn Gabirol's use of the term “yesôd” reflects a Ps. Empedoclean tradition, it is methodologically strained to read Ibn Gabirol from a Kabbalistic vantage point. A Kabbalistic lens does not open us to understanding the metaphysical picture that Ibn Gabirol is trying to paint for us.

3. Knowledge and Deeds: the Purpose of Human Being

Like any engaged Neoplatonist, Ibn Gabirol is first and foremost interested in understanding the nature and purpose of human being: we must understand what we are (our nature) so that we know how to live (our purpose). This set of interconnected human questions is what Ibn Gabirol is interested in even in the midst of what might sometimes seem to be rather laborious cosmological and metaphysical explorations. Ibn Gabirol, like other Neoplatonists, explores layers of cosmological and metaphysical realities in an attempt to understand how to live the best human life possible.

Emphasizing that this is Ibn Gabirol's main concern, we find in the opening pages of his Fons Vitae text a reminder that the goal of the entire inquiry is to understand why human beings were made (“Quare factus est homo?,” “Why was man made?”—Fons Vitae 1.1, p. 2, line 8)—which is to say, to understand the ends (or purpose) of human being (the Fons Vitae teaches that a human ought to “pursue knowledge of his final cause [or: purpose] according to which he was composed,” Fons Vitae 1.2, p. 4, lines 8–9). In spelling out the true, divinely ordained goal of human life (the purpose of the human life is described as a product of God's Will at Fons Vitae 1.2, p. 4, lines 10–12), the text describes a twofold endeavor: the pursuit of knowledge and the doing of good deeds (Fons Vitae 1.2, p. 4, line 27).

While the remaining hundreds of pages of the Fons Vitae go on to offer highly obscure elaborations on matter and form, the overall point of the entire study (and one might argue, of Ibn Gabirol's entire oeuvre of poetry as well) is not obscure at all: his goal is to understand the nature of being and human being so that he might better understand and better inspire the pursuit of knowledge and the doing of good deeds:

Knowledge indeed leads to deeds, and deeds separate the soul from the contraries which harm it…In every way, knowledge and deeds liberate the soul from the captivity of nature and purge it of its darkness and obscurity, and in this way the soul returns to its higher world. (Fons Vitae 1.2, p. 5, line 27–p. 6, line 4)

“And in this way, the soul returns to its higher world.” The ends of humanity (reached through the pursuit of truth and goodness) are imagined by Ibn Gabirol—as we find is the case among Neoplatonists more generally—through the evocative image of a “return” coupled with the image of a “higher world”:

Student: What is the purpose of man?
Teacher: The inclination [applicatio] of his soul to the higher world in order that everyone might return to his like.
(Fons Vitae 1.2, p. 4, lines 23–25)

The joint imagery of a “return” and a “higher world” are themselves part of a conceptual framework in which all of existence is seen to follow a principle of similitude whereby lesser beings mirror higher beings. This idea, often expressed as the idea that “the microcosm mirrors the macrocosm”—a common Platonic, Pythagorean, and Neoplatonic trope—has a strongly prescriptive overtone: it's not simply that lesser things mirror greater things, but that in this mirroring, we find the purpose of the lesser things, viz. to be just like the greater things. Depending on the context, the “lesser things” and “greater things” might vary, but the most popular version of this “microcosm mirrors the macrocosm” idea, and the one at play in the above Ibn Gabirol passage, envisions the human being (sometimes human soul, sometimes human intellect) as the “lesser thing” and the wisely ordered cosmos (and sometimes, relatedly, the mind of God or, alternatively, the cosmic Intellect) as the “greater thing.” In this descriptive idea that humans mirror something greater there emerges the strongly prescriptive reminder that we ought to emulate that which is better than ourselves (viz. through the pursuit of knowledge and good deeds). This prescriptive call to human perfection through truth and goodness is the essence of the idea of Neoplatonic Return, and it is this idea which lies at the core of Ibn Gabirol's claim that we ought purge our souls of darkness and “return to our like[ness]”.

In one especially important Fons Vitae passage, we find a description of this Neoplatonic return which very much reflects Plotinus' own famous ascent passage (at Enneads 4.8.1), a passage reproduced (with important changes) in what misleadingly became known as the Theology of Aristotle, an Arabic compilation-edition of books 4–6 of Plotinus' Enneads.[17] Here is the final part of Ibn Gabirol's version:

…But if you should lift yourself to the first universal matter and [are] illumined by its shadow, you will then see the most wondrous of wonders. Devote yourself to this and be filled with love for it, since here lies the meaning for which the human soul exists, and here lies too amazing delight and utmost happiness (Fons Vitae 3.56; my translation from the Arabic and Latin; for Wedeck translation, see his Fountain of Life (Ibn Gabirol 1962/2008), pp. 110–111)

In addition to many other changes from Plotinus and the Theology of Aristotle, one special point of difference is the reference here to universal matter (see section 5). It is precisely Ibn Gabirol's unique focus on “universal matter” (a grade of spiritual materiality at the very core of existence) which leads him to uniquely envision the ultimate moment of Neoplatonic return as a moment of “illuminated shadow”: since there is a material element just “above” Intellect for Ibn Gabirol, the return to Intellect will be characterized by the light of Wisdom set within the shade of the supernal first matter.

In the closing sentences of the Fons Vitae, Ibn Gabirol further describes this state of “return” as a liberation from death and a cleaving to the source of life (“Evasio mortis et applicatio ad originem vitae,” Fons Vitae 5.43, p. 338, line 21). Following on general Neoplatonic intuitions, this means that when one has attained the heights of truth and goodness, one will have reverted to one's truest life, a pure state of soul which transcends mortal life—we might describe it as a kind of immortality while in the mortal body. This directly resonates with what A.H. Armstrong, in his study of Plotinus, has described as the Neoplatonic doctrine of “Double Selfhood,” a sensitivity to the human condition being at one and the same time (1) already fully imbued with the fullest state of intellect, but somewhat paradoxically also (2) fallen from—and needing to return to—the fullest state of intellect.

While Ibn Gabirol's quest towards the Neoplatonic Return centers, as we have seen, on the pursuit of truth and goodness, it also includes an attempt to know the unknowable God. In laying out the kinds of truth that the human soul must aim to acquire, the Fons Vitae speaks of “the knowledge of all things according to what they are” (Fons Vitae 1.4, p. 6, lines 13–14), and most of all of the knowledge of the First Essence [Latin, essentia prima, Arabic, adh-dhât al-’ûlâ, as evidenced in some of the extant Arabic fragments of the Fons Vitae; see Pines 1958/77 and Fenton 1976] that sustains and moves all things. While we are asked to know God—understood by Ibn Gabirol in tripart terms as a hidden First Essence and as an active, manifesting Will and Wisdom—we are cautioned a few lines later that it is impossible to truly know the First Essence, and that we can only aspire to know the things which He makes and sustains (Fons Vitae 1.4, p. 6, lines 19–22). As it relates to Ibn Gabirol's more general characterization of God in the Fons Vitae in tripart terms as an essential hidden reality and an active manifesting Will and Wisdom, we might say that for Ibn Gabirol, we can only know God through the manifestation of his Will and Wisdom in the ordered structure of existents in the universe (i.e. through the things which He makes and sustains, and in particular, through the wisdom revealed by them).

4. The Divine Creative Act

Ibn Gabirol describes God's creative act in many ways across his philosophical and poetic writings. While it is certainly possible to find a single overall theological picture emerging from across Ibn Gabirol's work, it is at least worth noting a degree of tension between a range of different and sometimes seemingly conflicting ideas. In what follows, we will look at the complex play of creation, emanation, Will, Wisdom, Word, and desire in Ibn Gabirol's cosmo-ontology.

4.1 Creation ex nihilo and the Fountain of Life

To begin with, Ibn Gabirol's God is described as a Creator God who is an absolute simple unity—so simple as to exceed the grasp of the human mind and tongue. This apophatic theme (a theme which in any philosopher highlights the absolute unity of God) can be seen for example, in the very first canto of his Keter Malkhût [Kingdom's Crown] depiction of God: “Yours is the name hidden from the wise…” God, for Ibn Gabirol, is, in proper Neoplatonic fashion, an absolute unity. That said, God is nonetheless described in the Fons Vitae by Ibn Gabirol in dual—and in some sense, tripart—terms: God's unity consists on the one hand in a purely hidden Essence and on the other hand in the manifesting activity of a Divine Will. We also learn (thirdly) of God's Wisdom (and in related fashion, of the Divine Word). Emphasizing more of a dual—and less of a tripart—vision of this absolutely simple Creator, Ibn Gabirol sometimes directly identifies the Divine Will with the divine Wisdom (though that does not always seem clear throughout Ibn Gabirol's writings).

While God's creative act is described by Ibn Gabirol as a creation ex nihilo (see Fons Vitae 3.3, p. 79, line 18; FV 3.25, p. 139, lines 24–25) a view normally seen in opposition to doctrines of emanation, he also uses common emanation metaphors—the flow of light and the flow of water—to describe the origins of the cosmos. For example, drawing on the Psalms 36:10 image of a “fountain of life,” in the very title of his Fons Vitae text[18] Ibn Gabirol seems to at least beckon to Greek and Muslim Neoplatonic visions of an emanating God.[19] Similarly stressing an emanating cosmos (though not necessarily the idea of an emanating God per se), Ibn Gabirol—in what appears to be part of a commentary on Genesis—likens the material core of being (to which we will return in section 5) to a river. Allegorically rendering the Garden of Eden waters to the pure matter which sits at the root of the unfolding cosmos, Ibn Gabirol envisions the pulse of existence as a River of Life—a vibrant outpouring which links all of existence to a single overflowing source (see Sirat 1985, p. 79). Of course, this particular image does not necessarily suggest that God Himself emanates (i.e. the idea that existence emanates forth from matter is still consistent with God creating that matter ex nihilo, and not via emanation).

Attempting to put all the pieces of Ibn Gabirol's complex cosmogony together, we can find pieces of creation ex nihilo, emanation, and creation ex aliquo; God's formative act begins with creating matter and form (possibly a creation ex nihilo, but described fluidly enough as to leave open other interpretations), and He then draws out, in an emanating flow, the remainder of existence from these dual starting points (emanation, but also creation ex aliquo in the sense that all of existence is being formed through the mediation of matter, as opposed to each existent being created directly—in the sense of ‘unmediated’—by God as in other versions of creation ex nihilo accounts).[20] In the end, Ibn Gabirol's conceptual play—with notions of creation and emanation side by side—ought leave us open to various interpretations of how precisely to understand his cosmogony.

In his Keter Malkhût poem (Kingdom's Crown), Ibn Gabirol further describes God's creative act as a splitting open of nothingness: “…ve-qara el ha-’ayîn ve-nivqa…,” (“…and He called out to the nothing and it split open…”; in Gabirol's poem, Keter Malkhût, canto 9; See Schirmann 1967, p. 262, line 82; for a treatment of this line, see Pines 1980). Here, the void of precreation—the pre-existent ’ayîn, or “nothingness”—is split open by God's own voice in the moment of creation—a moment arguably described by Ibn Gabirol in his poem ahavtîkha (“I Love You”) as the material “proto-existence” (kemô-yêsh) awaiting its fulfillment through form,[21] and described in the Fons Vitae as a complex unfolding of and downward manifesting of a first pure matter through the introduction of (or unfolding of) forms by the Divine Will. The material nothing—in all three images—is the ground of existence, as it is at once the site of desire, a yearning to be en-formed, which is to say, to become more and more manifest. We will say more about this emphasis on desire below (see section 4.3).

Central to Ibn Gabirol's cosmogony is also the notion of the Divine Will, an emphasis for which the Fons Vitae is highlighted in the history of ideas.

4.2 Will, Wisdom, Word, Intellect and the Cosmos

Early on in the Fons Vitae, we learn that the Divine Will is one of three central concepts that the human mind must set out to grasp (the workings of matter and form, and the reality of a divine Essence as primal cause are the other two central concepts). We also learn of Will that it is some sort of cosmic “intermediary between the extremes,” a role described as central to the basic underpinning of the universe (Fons Vitae 1.7, p. 9, lines 28–30; see too Fons Vitae 5.36, p 322, line 20–p. 323, line 1 for another statement of the three divisions of knowledge; in this latter context, Will is identified with Word). We learn that Will is the power of God infused in and penetrating through all things, that it is the power of unity in the universe, and that it is that which both brings forth and moves all of existence. It is also described as the divine force that maintains and sustains the essence of all things (see Fons Vitae 5.39, p. 327, lines 14–15: Will is the power [virtus] of God infused in and penetrating all things; 5.39, p. 327, lines 26–27: Will is the power [virtus] of unity; 1.2, p. 4, lines 14–15: Will is the divine power [virtus] bringing forth and moving all things; 1.5, p. 7, line 15: Will maintains and sustains the essence of all things).

Turning further to Will's mediating cosmic role, while the Latin text translates “intermediary between the extremes,” the Arabic text uses a dual grammatical form, translating more specifically as “intermediary between the two extremes.” In the context of this claim, the “intermediation” role between the “two extremes” is ambiguous between two different claims which are both equally true within the context of Ibn Gabirol's worldview: on the one hand, Ibn Gabirol might mean that Will intermediates between (1) matter and form on the one hand and (2) divine Essence on the other (the items corresponding to two of the three “divisions of knowledge” which he describes [see section 5]); on the other hand, Ibn Gabirol might mean that Will intermediates between (1) matter and (2) form, the two cosmic “building blocks” out of which all reality is comprised.

Will is further described as taking its own root in God's Essence, and is sometimes (but not always) described as the immediate creative source of (and not just intermediary between) matter and form.[22] Complicating this picture of Will's creation of matter and form, we also learn on the contrary that Will is the direct source only of form (and not matter)[23]—a point supported further by the claim that Will is (1) identical to Wisdom (and the source of form; see Fons Vitae 5.42, p. 335, lines 4–5), and (2) that Wisdom is the source only of form (and not matter), with the divine Essence itself being the direct source of matter: “…materia est creata ab essentia, et forma est a proprietate essentiae, id est sapientia et unitate…” (“…matter is created from Essence, and form is from the property of Essence, viz., from Wisdom and Unity…”; Fons Vitae 5.42, p.333, lines 4–5; see too 5.42, p. 335, lines 4–5).

Leaving the complexities of these competing claims aside in the context of this study, it is sufficient here to emphasize that Ibn Gabirol's theology includes a Divine Will not only responsible for the generation of one or both of matter and form, but responsible in some way for the “connection between matter and form” in all things, and, as such, responsible for sustaining all existing things (all of which are, for Ibn Gabirol, form and matter composites; see section 5). By sustaining the matter and form composition of all things, Divine Will signifies the permeation of God's creative force at the core of Being itself, and as such at the core of every individual being.

In addition to identifying Will with Wisdom, Ibn Gabirol also identifies Will with Word (Fons Vitae 5.36, p. 323, line 17). Following on this identification, in a rather evocative set of passages, Ibn Gabirol likens the act of creation to God's utterance of word (Fons Vitae 5.43). While this theme is certainly not new within the history of Neoplatonic and Jewish ideas (suggesting resonance with the Longer Theology of Aristotle's reference to the Word [Ar. kalima], as well as resonance with Sêfer Yezîrah's emphasis on God's creation via Hebrew letters[24]), what is new is Ibn Gabirol's unique way of fleshing that idea out in light of his overall metaphysics: Creation, writes Ibn Gabirol, is like a word that God utters, and that word is itself the coming together of voice (the universal matter), the audible sounds that make up a given word (manifest forms), and the actual meaning of the word (the hidden universal form which contains and sustains all manifest forms). For Ibn Gabirol, this analogy helps highlight his view of the unfolding divine Wisdom / Will giving way to a cosmos which is a complex blend of matters and forms, with a principle of pure universal matter and pure universal form at the very root of all existence.

Here, we may speak of a revised Neoplatonic cosmos in which principles of form, matter and Will (if we are to think of that as something separate from God's Essence) emerge “between” God and the principle of Intellect (the principle which follows directly upon God in standard chartings of the Neoplatonic cosmos):

Standard Neoplatonic talk of the “first reality” after God Gabirolean Neoplatonic talk of the “first realities” after God
1. One/God 1. God
2. Intellect 2–4. Pure Matter, Pure Form, Will/Wisdom/Word
[leaving undecided the relationship between all of these and the relationship between all of these and God]
5. Intellect

In Ibn Gabirol's cosmology, Intellect is highlighted as the first created being, as the Divine Glory (Kavod),[25] and as the first occurrence of “form in matter” composition (see Fons Vitae 5.10, p. 274, line 19; 5.11, p. 277, line 4; for the related idea that God creates esse in a composite way out of matter and form, cf. Fons Vitae 5.40, p. 329, line 4). At times, Ibn Gabirol emphasizes that this matter is pre-existent (that it does not have existence on its own without form), and at times, he can be taken, on the contrary, as emphasizing the “per se existens” nature of matter (as for example in his very definition of matter at Fons Vitae 1.10, p. 13, lines 15–17 and 5.22, p. 298, lines 13–7). While the precise meaning of Ibn Gabirol's idea is open for interpretation, Schlanger suggests that matter per se exists for Ibn Gabirol only as an idea in the mind of God, and not as an actual reality prior to Intellect (see Schlanger 1968, p. 294). In this vein, we may note Ibn Gairol's claim that the existence (esse) of matter is in the wisdom of God (Fons Vitae 5.10, p. 275).

Reflecting on Ibn Gabirol's idea of some kind of “form and matter before Intellect” (either in an actual or in some conceptual sense), it is worth considering to what extent this suggests (as the above two discrete charts seem to suggest) a genuine departure from Plotinian Neoplatonism. On the face of it, Plotinus does not emphasize a principle of matter and form prior to Intellect. As such, we may say that Ibn Gabirol's emphasis introduces a Ps. Empedoclean change (either an actual ontological change or a conceptual “shift in focus”) into the standard Plotinian picture. That said, Plotinus certainly is sensitive to the duality of the unity of Intellect (as compared with the unity of the One), and even occasionally overtly emphasizes the notion of Intellect's composition out of “intelligible matter” (See Enneads 2.4.1–5, 5.4.2 and 5.5.4; on the conceptual resonance of “intelligible matter” in Plotinus and Ibn Gabirol, see Dillon 1992). While these sections of the Enneads in which Plotinus overtly emphasizes this theme are not part of the Arabic Plotinus materials which we would presume Ibn Gabirol to have had access, it is worth noting that Ibn Gabirol's emphasis on “form and matter prior to intellect” does not necessarily represent any conceptual departure from Plotinus (or, we might add, from Platonic and Pythagorean sensitivities to the principle of an indefinite dyad at the core of reality). Clearly Plotinus is sensitive to the “duality” of any grade of reality outside of the One: while Intellect is for Plotinus a unity, it is clearly a “dual” (or even plural) sort of unity as compared with the utter unity of the One. In this sense, Plotinus is deeply sensitive to the “duality” outside of God (and, as such, the duality of Intellect), even in passages where he is not overtly referencing the composition of Intellect/Being out of intelligible matter (which is to say, even in passages where he is not emphasizing the dual nature of Intellect). In this sense, it is arguably conceptually appropriate to align even Ibn Gabirol's most emphatic sense of the dual “matter-with-form” composition of Intellect (or, relatedly, his emphasis on a grade of matter “prior to” Intellect) with even Plotinus' staunchest insistence on the unity of Intellect (as for Plotinus, the unity of Intellect, as compared with the unity of the One, is dual by nature).

4.3 God, Matter and the Omnipresence of Desire

Returning to our earlier discussion, Ibn Gabirol describes pure matter as stemming directly from the Divine Essence itself, with form, on the contrary, arising somewhat secondarily from the Divine Will. While this is not to suggest that God is Himself made up of matter (as concluded by some fans of Ibn Gabirol such as David of Dinant in the history of Christian philosophy who ran into trouble with the Church for theorizing God as matter), there is arguably in Ibn Gabirol an intimate link between God and matter. Such a link between materiality and God is not much of a conceptual stretch (though in standard Platonic, Neoplatonic, and Aristotelian contexts we would tend to link God with form): both matter and God are utterly hidden and utterly grounding for all else, while form (and the Will/Wisdom with which it is associated) mark the lesser “active” or “manifesting” mode of divinity and of the cosmos. While of course for Ibn Gabirol God is an utter unity, we may nonetheless theorize with Ibn Gabirol as follows: As God's essential hiddenness moves forward into action (Wisdom/Will/Word), so too pure material pre-existence moves forward into manifest being (i.e. becomes more and more en-formed). Here, in an important sense, the images of “darkness and the hidden” trump the images of “light and the manifest” both as they relate to God and to the cosmos: as God's hidden Essence precedes and grounds his acts, so too matter precedes and grounds enformed being (and as such, all existents). Here, God and matter—in their dark / hidden respects—have something very important in common. (See Pessin 2009, p. 290, for chart mapping the superiority in this regard of the material over the formal).

It ought be noted that herein lies a paradox found in one form or another in all versions of Neoplatonism: on the one hand, there is a sense that moving forward (or downward) in the great chain of being is a tragic fall away from the purity of divine unity; on the other hand, there is a sense (not, for example, found in Gnostic materials) that there is beauty and light in the creation, which is to say that in the continual downward manifesting of being we find the trace of Divine Will. In the context of Ibn Gabirol's conceptual space in which (as we will see in more detail in section 5) reality is seen as the process of moving from a more hidden / material to a more manifest / formal reality, the result is at once (1) a sense of loss in the move away from God's own hiddenness (with a sense that darkness is sublime) and (2) a sense of beauty and increasing grace as more and more forms continue to manifest (“joining” to matter through the intermediation of the Divine Will), resulting ultimately in the fullness of the cosmos (with a sense that light is sublime). These dueling images of the sublimity of unity (or pre-creation) on the one hand and manifestness (or creation) on the other (here in terms of the sublimity of darkness on the one hand and light on the other) offer an insight into what we may call a Neoplatonic “theology of paradox” which is very much at play in Ibn Gabirol.

In his conception of God's relation to matter in the act of creation, we must also emphasize Ibn Gabirol's focus on desire. Providing a bit more context to (and a different translation of) Ibn Gabirol's Keter Malkhût [Kingdom's Crown] rehearsing of God's “splitting of the nothing” (see section 4.1), consider:

You are wise, and your wisdom gave rise to an endless desire in the world as within an artist or worker—to bring out the stream of existence from Nothing…He called to Nothing—which split; to existence—pitched like a tent…With desire's span he established the heavens… (Canto 9 of the Keter Malkhût; translation from Cole 2001, p. 149)

In these poetic lines, as elsewhere throughout his writing, Ibn Gabirol emphasizes the central motion of desire at the core of the universe. This can be seen throughout the Fons Vitae in the dual reminders that (1) all things have matter at their core, and (2) matter's own reality consists essentially in desire (viz. a desiring-after-form). These two simple ideas lead to a much more arresting insight, viz. inasmuch as all things are grounded in matter, and inasmuch as matter is a marker of desire, it follows that all reality is grounded in desire. Desire—in the guise of matter—is in this sense a central principle of Ibn Gabirol's universe.[26]

5. Matter, Form and “Universal Hylomorphism”

In his vision of the world, Ibn Gabirol's focus is on God, Divine Will, and the duality of form and matter. From an early section in his Fons Vitae, we learn:

In the whole of existence, there are three divisions of knowledge: (1) the knowledge of matter (al-‘unsur) and form (as-sûra), (2) the knowledge of Will (al-irâda), and (3) the knowledge of the First Essence. Among substances, there is nothing other than these three. First Essence is cause; matter and form, effect; and Will is the intermediary between the two extremes (Fons Vitae 1.7; for Arabic, see Pines 1958/77, p. 71; for slightly different translation with reference to “The All of Existence,” see Pessin 2009, p. 286 and note 53 in that study)

Matter and form—referred to in his Hebrew poetry under the alluring Hebrew labels of “yesôd” (foundation) and “sôd” (secret)—are, along with the doctrine of Divine Will, cornerstones of the Fons Vitae. In particular, the Fons Vitae teaches (rather unusually within the history of ideas) that all things—including spiritual simples such as soul and intellect (but not God)—are comprised of matter and form. This doctrine is called “Universal Hylomorphism” by later scholastics in contrast to ordinary Aristotelian hylomorphism in which all substances other than soul/intellect are said to be comprised of matter (Greek: hûlê) and form (Greek: morphê). This doctrine of Universal Hylomorphism emerges as a central theological and philosophical point of contention between Augustinian Franciscans (who embrace it) and Aristotelian Dominicans (who reject it). (It might be noted that one popular way that the Fons Vitae doctrine comes up in medieval Christian debates is on the question of whether angels (the separate intellects) are made up of matter and form, or just form).[27]

Hand in hand with the doctrine that all things (including spiritual simples) are matter+form composites is Ibn Gabirol's idea of a pure spiritual matter at the core of being which grounds even Universal Intellect in the great Neoplatonic chain of being. In the extant Arabic, we find that Ibn Gabirol uses the term “al-‘unsur”, or the more descriptive “al-‘unsur al-awwal,” first matter (in contrast to other more common Arabic philosophical terms for matter which Ibn Gabirol himself uses at other points in his work).[28] In spite of the fact that this term is translated as “materia prima” in the Latin, and is as such often translated as “prime matter” in English, we need to keep in mind that whatever Ibn Gabirol is talking about is not best thought of as Aristotelian prime matter (which is what may readers undoubtedly overtly or covertly think of when they hear the term “prime matter”; see section 2). First of all, Ibn Gabirol's pure matter is part of an overtly Neoplatonic world-view which, contra Aristotle, privileges spiritual/intelligible substances over sensible/corporeal reality, and which, contra Aristotle and Plato, emphasizes the emanation of the sensible realm from the spiritual realm. Further emphasizing that we are not talking of Aristotelian prime matter is the fact that Ibn Gabirol's use of the Arabic term al-‘unsur (literally “the element,” and translated by the 13th century Hebrew editor as “yesôd” (foundation)) expressly mirrors a Ps. Empedoclean tradition of a spiritual matter (called al-‘unsur) immediately outside of God. For these reasons, it is important to avoid Aristotelian resonances when constructing Ibn Gabirol's ontology, and as such, one ought use the term First Matter over “prime matter.”

Of this first pure matter we learn at the very start of the Fons Vitae that it is “…per se existens, unius essentiae, sustinens diversitatem, dans omnibus essentiam suam et nomen” (“…existent in and of itself, of a single essence, sustaining diversity, and giving to everything its essence and name”; Fons Vitae 1.10, p. 13, lines 15–17). And, in similar manner we learn at the very close of the Fons Vitae that it is: “…substantia existens per se, sustentatrix diversitatis, una numero; et…est substantia receptibilis omnium formarum” (“…a substance existent in and of itself, the sustainer of diversity, one in number; …it is a substance receptive to all forms”; Fons Vitae 5.22, p. 298, lines 13–7; compare with facing Arabic text at Pines 1958/77, p. 53, section 9:2). Related to its status as the “sustainer of diversity,” pure matter is presented as the fundamental receiver that always seeks to receive its partner, viz. form. Pure universal matter is thus coupled—in a process overseen by Divine Will—with a pure universal form to yield the first fully existing substance, Universal Intellect. In their coupling, matter and form thus mark the permeating presence of Divine Will in the universe. Related to his vision of a matter-to-form coupling through Will, Ibn Gabirol envisions the Neoplatonic emanating chain of being as an ever-descending series of matter-to-form couplings, and so:

Intellect (matter + form)1
Soul (matter + form)2
Celestial Body (matter + form)3
Terrestrial Body (mater + form)4

Here, a hylomorphic lens is put onto the standard Neoplatonic hierarchy emphasizing the composition of all things (spiritual simples as well as bodies) in terms of matters and forms (and highlighting three kinds of matter: spiritual, celestial, and terrestrial).[29] And with this hylomorphic lens emerges too the emphasis on Divine Will, the active presence of God responsible in some way for “mediating” between these matters and forms.

In the context of this hylomorphic vision, we find a confounding flipping in the Fons Vitae between ordinary negative and unexpected positive descriptions of the notion of matter.[30] The universal pure matter certainly has a positive set of associations with it in Ibn Gabirol as compared with “corporeal” (or “lower”) matter: in contrast to “lower” matter which carries the 9 Aristotelian categories, “higher” matter is the matter of pure spiritual simples and carries no quantity or quality (or any of the 9 categories). Again, mindful of the Empedoclean tie-in and of his Hebrew terminology of “yesôd” (foundation), we are looking at something quite sublime, a reality which sits, as it were, directly outside of God prior even to Intellect, which he likens to a Divine Throne (see Fons Vitae 5.42, p. 335, lines 23–4), and which he correlates to the more essential (and hidden) reality of God. In these and related contexts in Ibn Gabirol, matter often emerges (somewhat unexpectedly within the history of ideas) as more sublime than even pure form. And yet, there are plenty of passages in the Fons Vitae in which it is form which reigns supreme (as we would expect in standard Platonic, Aristotelian, and Neoplatonic traditions): for example, form is identified as the cosmic source of unity and light, and it is form which is said to perfect or complete matter by bringing being to it (although, as we have emphasized, it is still plausible that for Ibn Gabirol matter per se still has some kind of pre-existent—and perhaps superior—subsistence prior to and independent of this gift of being from form). Further highlighting form's supremacy, Ibn Gabirol argues, for example, that the substance of Intellect is superior to the substance of body precisely because the former contains all forms and the latter contains only some forms (see Fons Vitae 3.9, p. 98, line 24– p. 99, line 3), an argument which relies on the intuition that formality (not materiality) is the ontological marker of supremacy (and an argument which seems directly at odds with the intuitions behind another of his ideas, viz. that we ought call a higher substance “matter” with respect to a lower substance). In the final account, we can see Ibn Gabirol as uniquely sensitive to the equal importance of both matter and form, their intimate interdependence one upon the other, and, ultimately, their unity as a single whole—a dynamic arguably mirroring his vision of God's own reality in terms of essential and active “moments” which are ultimately one inseparable unity.

5.1 Ibn Gabirol's Neoplatonic Hylomorphism 1: Plato's Participation Revised

One way to think of Ibn Gabirol's hylomorphic levels of reality (although Ibn Gabirol does not himself theorize it in this way overtly) is in terms of his Neoplatonizing the Platonic notion of participation. For Plato, participation is in a form, and a highest form—participated in by all—is the form of being. For the Neoplatonist, as for Ibn Gabirol, the focus on the form is replaced (or amplified) by the focus on the Universal Intellect that contains all forms (simultaneously, in potency, as one nested in the next). Imagine the conceptual implication of this Neoplatonic focus on Intellect (versus a Platonic focus on the form of being) for a participation theory—if we think of it carefully, we will find that the Neoplatonic model can quite organically gives rise to the kind of hylomorphic focus we find in Ibn Gabirol: In a Neoplatonic Intellect, all the forms are “in” Intellect, a notion which can easily be seen as emphasizing Intellect's material role as sustainer. This would mean that the move from Platonic talk of forms to Neoplatonic talk of Intellect organically invites a new focus on the role of [spiritual] matter (viz. the matter of Intellect by which it receives or holds all the forms). This immediately transforms the Platonic concept of participating in form/s to the concept of participating in matter (the receiver) (or, we might say, participating in matter as the means to participating in forms). And so, whereas for Plato all things participate in the form of being, for Ibn Gabirol, all things are grounded in / have as their underlying “true substrate” the substance of Intellect which is to say, they participate in matter (viz. the spiritual matter of pure intellect) plus forms.

5.2 Ibn Gabirol's Neoplatonic Hylomorphism 2: Aristotelian Substance Revised

Ibn Gabirol's metaphysics are obviously influenced by Aristotle's talk of substance and its 9 categories. And yet, it would be a mistake to think of Ibn Gabirol as an Aristotelian in much of his use of the term “substance.”

To confuse things, Ibn Gabirol does use the term substance in an at least somewhat Aristotelian sense when he talks of corporeal substance—the substance which, a la Aristotle, receives the 9 categories. Ibn Gabirol argues that this substance is first enformed by the form of corporeity, or quantity (one approach among many ancient and medieval interpretations of Aristotle, even if not actually Aristotle's view).[31] Moving already, though, from anything even loosely Aristotelian and manifesting a more Platonic impulse, this substance is seen by Ibn Gabirol as “lower substance” marking the lowest extremity of reality. Continuing on this Platonic move away from Aristotle, Ibn Gabirol's main talk of “substance” refers, contra Aristotle, to “simple substances,” by which he means the Neoplatonic Universal Intellect and Soul(s), each understood by Ibn Gabirol as a joining of spiritual matter to spiritual form, and each devoid of any of the 9 categories plaguing the “lower” corporeal (i.e. Aristotelian) substance. These simple substances (exemplified in the simple substance of Intellect) are theorized as the intermediaries between God and lower substance.

We may begin to understand this sense of substance by noting that with other Platonists and Neoplatonists, and deviating from Aristotelian sensibilities, Ibn Gabirol envisions a “higher realm” as that which is most real. However, whereas standard Platonisms identify forms as the truest realities within that realm, Ibn Gabirol adopts a hylomorphic (but by no means Aristotelian) sensibility in his conception of the higher realities: unlike Aristotle for whom only items in the corporeal realm are form+matter composites, for Ibn Gabirol, the realities in the “higher realm” (a Platonic idea avoided by Aristotle) are also comprised of form+matter. This move turns a number of standard Aristotelian, Platonic and Neoplatonic sensibilities on their heads in a Gabirolean metaphysics, including the notion of substance.

Speaking of substance in the sense of “true substance” separate from (and higher than) corporeal substance, Ibn Gabirol, in line with other Platonisms and contra Aristotle, is referring to a “higher realm.” However, unlike Plato, Ibn Gabirol focuses (with Neoplatonists) on the substances of Intellect and Soul(s)—which is to say, the reality of all forms “in” the simple spiritual substances (of Intellect and Soul), not on forms per se (see section 5.1 above). In this sense, the spiritual simples are primarily not the forms (as we might expect in Plato), but (in Neoplatonic spirit) the Universal Intellect and Soul. Relatedly, unlike other Platonisms, Ibn Gabirol's higher realm is not theorized as a realm of forms but as a realm of form and matter (again see section 5.1 on how the talk of Intellect leads us to the talk of forms “in” matter). This also means that with Aristotle, Ibn Gabirol employs a lot more hylomorphic talk than Platonists (though applied to a completely non-Aristotelian “higher realm”).

This also means that contra the standard Neoplatonic (and Platonic) rhetorics of “matter as evil,” there emerges in Ibn Gabirol a concurrent discourse of “matter as supreme”: for Ibn Gabirol, both form and matter in the “higher realm” carry with them all the positive associations which form carries in standard Platonic pictures (including a trajectory of thought in Ibn Gabirol on which pure matter arguably emerges as more sublime than pure form).

5.3 Ibn Gabirol's Neoplatonic Hylomorphism 3: Plurality of Forms

In the context of this analysis, we might also say a word about the doctrine of “the plurality of forms,” a doctrine associated with the Fons Vitae by later Christian scholastics. Taken in contrast to the Aristotelian doctrine that each existent has a single substantial form (ensuring its unity as a substance), “the plurality of forms” doctrine describes the Universal Hylomorphic sense in which each existent has a number of essential forms (and matters). In our highly Neoplatonic Gabirolean context (but less so in Roger Bacon and other Christian Universal Hylomorphists), we can simply take this doctrine as an extension of the standard Plotinian idea that, as part of the great chain of being, any given existent is saturated through with the reality of the hypostases Soul and Intellect: in this sense, each existent has a number of essences, corresponding to the various “layers” (for Ibn Gabirol, “form+matter” spiritual simples) in the great chain of being.

6. Cosmic Landscape, Soul Landscape: From Heavenly Circuits to Human Return

Ibn Gabirol can be seen as offering us a revised version of the Neoplatonic great chain of being, adding an emphasis on Will, matter and form (and, in light of section 5, we might say a number of levels of matters and forms). With other Jewish Neoplatonists (see Isaac Israeli for example), Ibn Gabirol also envisions not one but three World Souls, and a Universal Intellect which he describes in his Keter Malkhut [Kingdom's Crown] as “the Sphere of Intellect” (in his Hebrew, galgal ha-sâkhel), an odd and creative locution which blurs astronomical and metaphysical conceptions: generally the languages of “sphere” and “intellect” do not mix, the former referring to the celestial realm, and the latter referring to something well beyond the celestial realm. To these Neoplatonic layers of Intellect and Souls, and following mostly in the spirit of astronomy of his day (with the exception, that is, of his positing Intellect as a so-called “10th sphere” in contrast to the more accepted Ptolemaic system of 9 spheres; see Tanenbaum 1996 and Loewe 1979), Ibn Gabirol also envisions a hierarchy of star fields and planetary orbs, a cosmic picture which he lays out in great detail in his Keter Malkhut poem. Moving from God outward, we find the layers as follows:

10. “Sphere of Intellect” (galgal ha-sêkhel) (cantos 24–25)
9. Encompassing Sphere (canto 23)
8. Zodiac / Fixed Stars (cantos 21–22)
7. Saturn (canto 20)
6. Jupiter (canto 19)
5. Mars (canto 18)
4. Sun (cantos 15–17)
3. Venus (canto 14)
2. Mercury (canto 13)
1. Moon (cantos 11–12)

Above even the “Sphere of Intellect” is the Divine Throne, which we know from the Fons Vitae refers to pure universal matter “between” God and Intellect (on matter as Throne, see Fons Vitae 5.42, p. 335, lines 23–4; for a great diagram see Loewe 1989, p. 114).

It should be noted that it is in reference to the above chart of the celestial levels of stars and planets that we find in various medieval Muslim and Jewish thinkers—for example in al-Farabi and in Maimonides—a Neoplatonized Aristotelian focus on a hierarchy of “separate intellects,” the last of which (generally construed as the 10th intellect lowest down—with God conceived either as the first such Intellect or as an Intellect above this enumeration altogether) being described as the “Active Intellect” which governs the sublunar realm, and is that to which human minds “conjoin” (through the process of ittisâl).[32] It is important to distinguish this system from the one at play in Ibn Gabirol: whereas al-Farabi, Maimonides, and others focus their attention on a Return to (or a “conjunction with”) the 10th lowest down of the separate intellects (the Active Intellect as the intellect associated with our earthly realm below the moon), Ibn Gabirol's focus is, as in Plotinus, on an Intellect at the very heights of the celestial world, and just outside of God's own being: Whereas Ibn Gabirol's “10th sphere” is a Sphere of Intellect just outside of God, Maimonides' “10th Intellect” corresponds to the sphere of Moon (just above Earth). This point is often confused in secondary literature, and can lead to problematic misunderstandings and misconstrued correlations between philosophical systems.

Returning full circle to our start (see section 3), Ibn Gabirol's emphasis even in his elaboration on a celestial hierarchy centers on the Neoplatonic concern with the cultivation of the human soul—its Return to its highest fullness in Intellect: from a series of planets, we immediately move to Intellect (“galgal ha-sêkhel”), the ground and goal of the virtuous human life.

Student: What is the purpose of man?
Teacher: The inclination of his soul to the higher world in order that everyone might return to his like.
(Fons Vitae 1.2, p. 4, lines 23–5)

7. The Poet

In addition to his philosophical writing, Ibn Gabirol is author to an extensive corpus of Hebrew poems (generally categorized into “religious” and “secular” poems) which it is beyond the scope of this entry to address.[33]

Aside from Ibn Gabirol's technical prowess as a poet, it is worth noting that Ibn Gabirol's own self-conception as a poet (a theme overtly and self-referentially explored in many of his poems) opens important philosophical questions about the nature of language, selfhood and divinity. In, for example, drawing parallels between God's act of creation (by Word), and the poet's / philosopher's own act of writing, Ibn Gabirol arguably invites us to reconceptualize human subjectivity, the sacred, and the relationship between philosophical theory-building and imagino-poetic play.


Works by Ibn Gabirol

Fons Vitae. Original 11th century Arabic text

  • For Arabic fragments of Fons Vitae, see main bibliography: Pines 1958/77 and Fenton 1976.

Fons Vitae. 12th century Latin translation (and translations of the Latin translation)

  • 1892. Avencebrolis (Ibn Gabirol) Fons Vitae, ex Arabico in Latinum Translatus ab Johanne Hispano et Dominico Gundissalino, edited by Baeumker. Münster. In Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, Texte und Untersuchungen, edited by Baeumker and Hertling. Münster.
    Contains the Latin text of the Fons Vitae as translated from Arabic in the 12th century by Dominicus Gundissalinus and John of Spain
  • 1950. La source de vie; livre III, translated with commentary by Fernand Brunner. Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    French translation of book three of the Fons Vitae, with commentary by Brunner.
  • 1954. Fountain of Life, translated by A. B. Jacob. Philadelphia.
    This is a full English translation of the Fons Vitae, but its idiosyncratic terminology greatly obscures philosophical points in the text (e.g. matter and form are translated as “material and structure”).
  • 1962. Ozar Ha-Mahshavah shel Ha-Yahadut, edited by Abraham Sifroni. Israel: Mosad Ha-Rav Kuk.
    This volume includes a contemporary Hebrew translation by Blovstein of the Latin Baeumker text (see pp. 3–432): Rabbi Shlomo ben Gabirol, Sefer Meqor Hayyim, translated [into Hebrew from Latin] by Yaakov Blovstein.
  • 1962/2008. The Fountain of Life, (Book 3), translated by Henry E. Wedeck. New York: Philosophical Library. [Reprinted as Solomon Ibn Gabirol, The Fountain of Life. Bibliobazaar, 2008.]

Fons Vitae. 13th century Hebrew translation (and translations of the Hebrew translation)

  • 1853/1955. Extraits de la source de vie de Salomon Ibn Gebirol. In Solomon Munk, Mélanges de Philosophie Juive et Arabe. Paris: Chez A. Franck, Libraire. (Reprinted Paris, 1955).
    Contains text of Falaquera's 13th century Hebrew summary of the Fons Vitae, as well as Munk's French translation and commentary.
  • 1962. Ozar Ha-Mahshavah shel Ha-Yahadut, edited by Abraham Sifroni. Israel: Mosad Ha-Rav Kuk.
    The volume includes Shem Tov ibn Falaquera's 13th century Hebrew summary translation of the original Arabic text; see pp. 433–532.
  • 2001. Shelomoh ibn Gabirol, Fons Vitae, by Roberto Gatti. Genova: Il Melangolo.
    A new edition of Falaquera's 13th century Hebrew summary of the Fons Vitae (based on new manuscripts not used by Munk) and Italian translation.
  • 2008. “Solomon Ibn Gabirol and Shem Tov b. Joseph Falaquera, Excerpts from ‘The Source of Life’ ”, in Medieval Jewish Philosophical Writings, edited by Charles Manekin. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 23–87.
    English translation of selections of Falaquera's Hebrew excerpts by Charles Manekin.

The Choice of Pearls/Mivhar ha-Peninim

  • 1484. Mibhar ha-Peninim (Choice of Pearls: Maxims, Proverbs, and Moral Reflections) [microform]. Soncino (Italian books before 1601); roll 352, item 5; Cambridge, Mass., General Microfilm Co.
  • 1925. Solomon Ibn Gabirol's Choice of Pearls (Library of Jewish Classics, Volume IV), translated from the Hebrew with introduction and annotation, A. Cohen (trans.). New York: Bloch Publishing Co., Inc., 1925.
  • 1947. Sefer Mivhar ha-Peninim. A. Habermann, (ed.), Jerusalem: Sifriyat haPo'alim.

Book on the Improvement of the Moral Qualities of the Soul

  • 1962. Ozar Ha-Mahshavah shel Ha-Yahadut, edited by Abraham Sifroni. Israel: Mosad Ha-Rav Kuk.
    Contains contemporary Hebrew translation by Bar-On of the Arabic text; see second half of the volume after p. 549 (i.e. after the Blovstein and the Falaquera Hebrew translations of Fons Vitae), pagination starts again from p. 1; see pp. 1–112. Also contains Hebrew translation of Ibn Tibbon; see third section of the volume after the Bar-On translation; pagination starts again from p. 1; see pp. 1–85.
  • 1966. The Improvement of the Moral Qualities, Columbia University Oriental Studies, Vol. I, Stephen S. Wise (trans.). New York: AMS Press.
    Arabic text and English translation of Gabirol's Sefer Tiqun Midot ha-Nefesh

Hebrew Poetry Editions

(Note: For some editions of Ibn Gabirol's poetry in English translation, see main bibliography: Cole 2001, Gluck 2003, Lewis 1961, Scheindlin 1986 and 1991.)

  • Bialik and Ravnitsky, eds. 1924/1925. Shirei Shlomo ben Yehudah Ibn Gevirol, Vol. I–II (Shirei Hol). Tel Aviv; Berlin: Dwir-Verlags-Gesellschaft.
  • Schirmann, Y., ed. 1967. Ibn Gabirol: Shirim Nivharim. Jerusalem; Tel Aviv: Schocken.
  • Yarden, Dov, ed. 1975. Shirei ha-Hol le-Rabbi Shlomo Ibn Gevirol. Jerusalem: Kiryat Noar.

Some Related Primary Texts

  • al-Shahrastânî (Abu’ l-Fath Muhammad). 1923. Kitâb al-Milal wal-Nihal (Book of Religious and Philosophical Sects), Part II, edited by W. Cureton (Leipzig), pp. 260–65. [This is a reprint of 1846 edition; also see 2002 reprint: The Book of Religious and Philosophical Sects, Al-Shahrastani. Edited by W. Cureton. Piscataway: Gorgias Press].
  • Plotinus. The Enneads, translated with notes by A.H. Armstrong. The Loeb Classical Library. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1966.
  • Plotinus, Die sogenannte Theologie des Aristoteles: aus arabischen Handschriften (Theology of Aristotle), F. Dieterici (ed.), Leipzig, 1882. [Reprint: Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1965.]
  • Proclus. Liber de Causis (The Book of Causes)/ (in Arabic: kalâm fî mahd al-khayr / Discourse on Pure Goodness)
    • Bardenhewer, Otto, (ed.). Die pseudo-aristotelische Schrift Ueber das reine gute: bekannt unter dem Namen Liber De Causis [Arabic text]. Freiberg-im-Breisgau: Herder, 1882 / Frankfurt am Main: Minerva, 1957.
    • Badawi, A (ed.). Liber (Pseudo-Aristotelis) de expositione bonitatis purae. In Neoplatonici apud Arabes. Islamica 19 [Arabic text]. Cairo, 1955; pp. 1–33.
    • St. Thomas Aquinas' Commentary on the Book of Causes, translated and annotated by Vincent A. Guagliardo, Charles Hess, and Richard C. Taylor. Washington: Catholic University of America Press, 1996.
  • Proclus, De Philosophia Chaldaica:
    • 1971. De Philosophia Chaldaica, ed. É. des Places. Paris (Oracles Chaldaïques, text établi et traduit, pp. 202–12)
    • 1988. The exhortation to philosophy. Including the Letters of Iamblichus and Proclus' commentary on the Chaldean oracles. Iamblichus, Johnson, T. M., Neuville, S., & Proclus. [EST: De philosophia Chaldaica <engl.>]. Grand Rapids, Mich: Phanes Press.
  • Simplicius, 1882. Simplicii in Aristotelis Physicorum libros quattuor priores commentaria, edited by Herman Diels. Berlin.

Secondary Literature

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  • Asín-Palacios, Miguel. 1978. The Mystical Philosophy of Ibn Masarra and his Followers. Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Bargebuhr, Frederick P. 1976. Salomo Ibn Gabirol, Ostwestliches Dichtertum. Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz.
  • Brunner, Fernand. 1965. Platonisme et aristotélisme—la critique d'Ibn Gabirol par St. Thomas d'Aquin. Louvain: Publications universitaires de Louvain.
  • –––. 1956 / 1997. “La doctrine de la matière chez Avicébron,” Revue de Théologie et de Philosophie, trois. série, 6: 261—79. Reprinted in Fernand Brunner, Métaphysique d'Ibn Gabirol et de la tradition platonicienne. Great Britain; USA: Ashgate, Variorum.
  • –––. 1965. Platonisme et Aristotélisme: la critique d'Ibn Gabirol par Saint Thomas D'Aquin. Louvain: Publications Universitaires de Louvain.
  • –––. Fernand Brunner, Métaphysique d'Ibn Gabirol et de la tradition platonicienne. Great Britain; USA: Ashgate, Variorum.
  • Cole, Peter. 2007. The Dream of the Poem: Hebrew Poetry from Muslim and Christian Spain, 950–1492. Lockert Library of Poetry in Translation. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––. 2001. Selected Poems of Solomon Ibn Gabirol. Princeton University Press.
  • Crowley, Theodore. 1950. Roger Bacon: The Problem of the Soul in his Philosophical Commentaries. Louvain; Dublin: James Duffy and Co., Ltd.
  • Damascius. 1889. Dubitationes et Solutiones, C. É. Ruelle (ed.), Paris: Klincksieck.
  • Davidson, Herbert A. 1992. Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Averroes on Intellect: Their Cosmologies, Theories of the Active Intellect and Theories of Human Intellect. Oxford University Press.
  • –––. 1972. “Alfarabi and Avicenna on the Active Intellect,” Viator, 3: 109–78.
  • Dillon, John. 1992. “Solomon Ibn Gabirol's Doctrine of Intelligible Matter,” in L. Goodman (ed.), Neoplatonism and Jewish Thought, pp. 43–59. Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Fenton, Paul. 1976. “Gleanings from Môseh Ibn ‘Ezra's Maqâlat al-Hadîqa,” Sefarad, 36: 285–298.
  • –––. Philosophie et exégèse dans le Jardin de la méthaphore [sic] de Moïse IbnʻEzra, philosophe et poète andalou du XIIe siècle. Leiden; New York: Brill.
  • Friedlaender, M. 1877. Essays on the Writings of Abraham Ibn Ezra. London. [Reprinted: Jerusalem, 1964].
    Contains (in Hebrew) Abraham ibn Ezra's recounted version of Gabirol's commentary on Genesis.
  • Frank, Daniel H. 1998. “Ibn Gabirol, Solomon (1021/2–57/8),” s.v. Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Version 1.0. London and New York: Routledge.
  • Gersh, Stephen. 1978. From Iamblichus to Eriugena: An Investigation of the Prehistory and Evolution of the Pseudo-Dionysian Tradition. Leiden: E.J. Brill.
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  • –––, 1954. hayûlâ,” s.v. Encyclopedia of Islam, New Edition, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 1954. “Kursî,” s.v. Encyclopedia of Islam, New Edition, Volume V, p. 509, Leiden: Brill.
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  • –––. 1880. Die Spuren al-Batlajûsi's, Studien Über Salomon ibn Gabirol and Die Sinne, Budapest. [Reprint with an introduction by Louis Jacobs: London: Gregg International Publishers Ltd., 1972.]
  • –––. 1899. Studien über Salomon Ibn Gabirol (Jahresberichte der Landes-Rabbinerschule zu Budapest für das Schuljahr 1898/99). Budapest. [Reprint: New York : Arno Press, 1980]
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  • –––. 1979. “Ibn Gabirol's Treatment of Sources in the Kether Malkhuth,” in Studies in Jewish Religious and Intellectual History (Presented to Alexander Altmann on the Occasion of His Seventieth Birthday), edited by S. Stein and R. Loewe, pp. 183–194. Tuscaloosa: The University of Alabama Press.
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  • –––. 2004. “Loss, Presence, and Gabirol's Desire: Medieval Jewish Philosophy and the Possibility of a Feminist Ground,” in Women and Gender in Jewish Philosophy, edited by Hava Tirosh-Samuelson, pp. 27–50. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––. 2005a. “The Manifest Image: Revealing the Hidden in Halevi, Saadya and Gabirol,” in History of Platonism: Plato Redivivus, edited by John Finamore and Robert Berchman, pp. 253–270. New Orleans: University Press of the South.
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  • –––. 1980. “Ve-qara el ha-Ayin ve-Nivqa,Tarbiz, 50: 339–47.
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