The Ikhwân al-Safâ’ or “Brethren of Purity”, as their name is commonly translated, are the authors of one of the most complete Medieval encyclopedias of sciences, antecedent at least two centuries to the best known in the Latin world (by Alexander Neckham, Thomas de Cantimpré, Vincent de Beauvais, Bartholomaeus Anglicus, all dating back to the 13th century). The “encyclopedia” is a collection of Epistles, the Arabic title of which is Rasâ’il Ikhwân al-Safâ’ wa Khullân al-Wafâ’ (Epistles of the Pure Brethren and the Sincere Friends). It consists of extremely heterogeneous materials, reworked to represent the whole educational training intended for an élite (see later). It is very well known, and a great deal of research into it has been done by Eastern and Western scholars, but the variety of topics addressed and the questions raised as to the identity and ideology of its authors remain unsolved. In an isolated form, and under a false attribution, some of these treatises came to the Latin Middle Ages through the Spanish version by Maslama al-Majrîtî, which is traditionally placed at the beginnings of the 11th century. This already discussed chronology (Carusi 2000, 494–500) is recently questioned by several scholars. The development of research in this direction was encouraged by the pioneer study, Fierro 1996, part. 94 and 106–108; cf. also Hamdani 1978, 350; Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 11-12 (see infra).
- 1. Authorship
- 2. Naming and Dating
- 3. Ideological commitment
- 4. The extant corpus
- 5. The classical heritage
- 6. The religious component
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The authors introduce themselves as a kind of “brotherhood” (ma‘âshara) of sages. Their work is addressed to “beginners,” who may thereby increase their knowledge. The literary scholar Abû Hayyân al-Tawhîdî (922-32/1023), basing his work on the ideas of his master Abû Sulaymân al-Mantiqî (c. 912/c. 985), and the mu‘tazili theologian ‘Abd al-Jabbâr al-Hamadânî (c. 936/1025) have identified the names of these authors. They are understood to be the qâdî Abu ’l-Hasan ‘Alî b. Hârûn al-Zanjânî and his three friends, Abû Sulaymân Muhammad b. Ma‘shar al-Bustî, called al-Maqdisî, Abû Ahmad al-Nahrajûrî and al-‘Awfî. All of these men came from Basra and were linked to the Chancellery secretary Zayd b. Rifâ‘a (cf. Stern, 1946; Stern, 1964).The text of al-Tawhîdî is accurately examined in Kraemer 1986, 136, 230 ff. This authorship is now questioned by several scholars, because the learned who transmitted the Epistles to al-Andalus appears to be Maslama al-Qurtubî al-Majrîtî, not later than the first half of the 10th century.
With regard to the common denomination of “Ikhwân al-Safâ’,” the old hypothesis by I. Goldziher deserves mention: according to which the name could have been borrowed from the famous collection of fables of indo-persian origin Kalîla wa Dimna to indicate a group of loyal friends. Stern (1964, 421), however, considers the name as a way of hinting at Ismâ‘îliyya. The most convincing hypothesis seems to be that which links the name to the content and goals of the encyclopedia – the salvation of soul through attainment of knowledge and purification of heart (Diwald 1975, 16–22). Recently, Poonawala hypothesized “Ikhwân al-Safâ’” to be a pseudonym hiding the identity of the authors (Poonawala 2015a, 264 and 272).
As to the date, in the 19th century F. Dieterici proposed 961 to 986, basing his estimate on the work of the seventeenth century lexicographer Hâjjî Khalîfa and on the presence in the treatises of verses by the famous poet al-Mutanabbî (d. 965). Massignon (1913) used a verse by the poet Ibn al-Rûmî (d. 896) to establish these years as the earliest possible date (cf. also Hamdani 1999, 76; Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 12; 28–29), and took the latest possible date to be the one indicated by the definition of sine (al-jayb) given by the Ikhwân. Such definition is not yet the one provided by al-Battânî (d. 929; reference to vol. I, p. 46 of the Bombay ed., 1887-1889, corresponding to I, 86, 14–15 of the Beirut edition referred to in this article). The “expected event” frequently mentioned in the encyclopedia would then be the Fatimid conquest of Egypt, which can be traced back to those years. On the basis of astronomical data, Casanova (1915) moved the dates about a century forward, assigning the work to the years 1047–51.
Until some decades ago, the almost universally accepted dating was the one deduced from the testimonies of al-Tawhîdî and ‘Abd al-Jabbâr al-Hamadânî (see above, 1. Authorship). Marquet reconfirmed Dieterici's earlier hypothesis, placing the compilation of the work between 961 and 980 (al-Tawhîdî's testimony is dated 981), but he also brought the date back to 909, depending on the hypothesis of an Ismâ‘îlî affiliation of the authors. Two treatises have given rise to the idea of an Ismâ‘îli interpretation: Epistle 48 On the invitation (da‘wa) to God and Epistle 50 On the kinds of administration. The encyclopedia would therefore be the oldest exposition of the Ismâ‘îli doctrine, and consequently, the “expected event” might have been the proclamation of the Fatimid caliph ‘Abd Allâh al-Mahdî in Ifriqiyya, which happened in that year (Marquet 1981, 95; Marquet 1972, 66). Hamdani summarizes various opinions concerning the dates of the encyclopedia, and establishes that it was composed in its whole between 873 and 909 (Hamdani 1978; Hamdani 1999, 78; Hamdani 2008; Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 15–16; Poonawala sides with Hamdani’s chronology in Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 307–308). Hamdani also thinks that the Ikhwân awaited the advent of the Fatimids, the Fatimid character of the Rasâ’il not being in question (Hamdani 1979, 62); he configures a precise role of the imâm in this epistle (Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 6). The fourth section, apart from the first and the last treatises, is claimed to be the core around which the first three sections have been composed (Marquet 1998, 5), as well as the culmination of the epistles, which demonstrates the importance of the mystery of prophecy and of imâmate (Marquet 1998, 8–9 and note 21). Also Madelung recently sided with the hypothesis of an Ismâ‘îlism of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’. Recalling that the Ismâ‘îlis of Mashriq, Iraq and Iran did not recognize the claims of ‘Abd Allâh to be the expected imâm, being rather committed to the Qarmat mission, Madelung hypothesizes that the Ismâ‘îlis of Basra recognized as imâm the member of the family who had remained hidden in Khurâsân, the same person who would also become the founder of the secret brotherhood of the Ihwân al-Ṣafâ’ (Madelung in print; but cf. De Smet 2017, 152, note 1). Madelung’s claim that the epistles are “under the auspices of the hidden seventh imam” is rejected by Poonawala, since “Muḥammad b. Ismā‘īl’s name is never mentioned in the Rasā’il” (Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 303–305, also on the basis of Hamdani’s opinions).
A quite different chronology is proposed for astronomical cycles by de Callataÿ based on Epistle 36 On cycles and revolutions. He distinguishes three “medium conjunctions” of Saturn and Jupiter occurring every 240 years and a longer conjunction occurring approximately every 960 years. The year 571 (birth of the Prophet Muhammad) marks a “longest conjunction” (from Libra to Scorpio); the first “medium conjunction” in 809 is of no importance to the Ikhwân; the second (from Sagittarius to Capricorn) should take place in 1047, and would be the “imminent conjunction” described in Epistle 48; the third (from Capricorn to Aquarius) is awaited in 1286; and the “longest conjunction” (from Aquarius to Libra) will take place in 1524 and will correspond to the rising of the qâ’im of the Resurrection (de Callataÿ 2005, 55–57; Walker et al. 2015, 150–152, 156, 204–206).
The authors of the encyclopedia have also been confined to a Mu‘tazilite approach, or placed in an earlier age, under the Qarmat influence (Marquet 1977; Qarmats were the opponents of the Fatimid caliph ‘Abd Allâh al-Mahdî). So did Madelung many years ago; but considering his recent opinion, that the Rasâ’il repudiate the Fatimids’ claim to the imâmate on the basis of the fact that a new-born of eight months does not survive (that meaning that Muhammad ibn Ismâ‘îl did not reach the Prophet’s rank; the relevant texts are studied in Baffioni 2016 and 2018), Poonawala wonders how he could ascribe the epistles to the Qarâmita, since this is a a repudiation of the Qarâmita’s belief (Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 305–307).
More recent studies, on the line of a seminal article by Fierro (Fierro Bello 1996; cf. Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 11–12, but also Carusi 2000), have identified Maslama b. Qâsim al-Qurtubî, called al-Majrîtî (d. 964, previously confused with the scientist Maslama al-Majrîṭî, d. 1007) as the author of the encyclopedia (cf. Hamdani 1999, 75; de Callataÿ 2013, Kacimi 2014a, b, de Callataÿ, Moureau 2015). However, the one who introduced in Spain the whole work is still to be considered Abu ’l-Ḥakam al-Kirmânî, d. 1066). Because of this new discovery, the timing of the Rasâ’il has been anticipated of several decades at least. So, the old attribution of al-Tawhîdî and ‘Abd al-Jabbâr was revoked in doubt, beginning with de Callataÿ who had previously accepted it (de Callataÿ 2014; cf. Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 14–15; a reconstruction of the journey, material and intellectual, of Maslama al-Qurtubî in al-Andalus is in de Callataÿ, Moureau 2017). Maslama al-Qurtubî has been also recognized as the author of Rutbat al-ḥakîm (‘The level of the wise man’) and Ghâyat al-ḥakîm (‘The goal of the wise man’, being known in Latin as Picatrix), two important works on alchemy and magic respectively that are now both to be reported to the first half of the 10th century. Scholars have also emphasized the impact of the encyclopedia on these two works, and it has even been hypothesized Maslama to be one of the authors of the epistles (Carusi 2000), which should not date later than 950. In the light of this new chronology, de Callataÿ 2014 examines the possible influence of the Ikhwân on Ibn Masarra (d. 931), especially on his cosmology, reporting this author to the Andalusi bâṭinî context of the first half of the tenth century. If the epistles were circulating in al-Andalus already before 950, and their compilation must have begun some time before in the East, another consequence is that the Ikhwân influenced al-Fârâbî and not vice versa, as it was believed so far (Hamdani 2011). According to Poonawala, the encyclopedia was composed after al-Kindî (d. between 864 and 870) but before al-Fârâbî (d. 950; Poonawala 2011, Introduction, 59). Among those who sustain the attribution of the epistles to Maslama al-Qurtubî is also Madelung who, therefore, rejects a too high dating of the epistles. The scholar has speculated that Maslama not only brought the encyclopedia to Spain, but also contributed to its composition: there would have been a first version, no longer existing, compiled not long before 937, the one described by al-Tawhîdî, and consisting of previously existing epistles and of epistles especially composed for the purpose; the Brotherhood would have been founded a few decades earlier (Madelung 2018, 404).
In recent times, al-Tawhîdî’s and ‘Abd al-Jabbâr’s attribution has been reconsidered by emphasizing the Fatimid militancy of some among the pretended authors of the encyclopedia (Reymond 2011, 124–125). Hamdani recalls that, according to al-Tawhîdî, such personages were Qarmats, so that al-Tawhîdî could accuse of eresy Zayd b. Rifâ‘a, too (Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 7–8, where the testimony of al-Qiftî is also discussed – that the alleged authors were followers of the imâm ‘Alî). Hamdani even exploits al-Tawhîdî’s observation that the Rasâ’il were widely read, as further evidence that they would have been written long before (cf. also de Vaulx d’Arcy 2019b). Poonawala shares historians’ doubts on al-Tawhîdî’s reliability and concludes that his one “is certainly a hostile witness” that implies the authors’ affiliation with the Qarâmita of Basra (Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 294). Following Hamdani’s “deconstruction”, the witness is considered to be “very suspicious”, all the more so if one considers that most medieval authors and modern scholars are used to equate the Qarâmita with the Ismâ‘îlis (Poonawala in Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 298). Poonawala also emphasizes Stern’s remark on the qâdî Abu ’l-Hasan ‘Alî b. Hârûn al-Zanjânî – that ‘Abd al-Jabbâr writes against the Ismâ‘îlis without mentioning the Brethren at all (Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 301–302).
A new hypothesis on the real author of the Rasâ’il has been formulated in Guillaume de Vaulx d’Arcy’s doctoral dissertation. The author tries to demonstrate that Ahmad b. al-Tayyib al-Sarakhsî, a pupil of al-Kindî, composed the whole encyclopedia in about 894 in the form in which we read it now (de Vaulx d’Arcy 2016, partially reelaborated in de Vaulx d’Arcy 2019a [non vidi]).
But the questions of the identity and ideology of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ still remain unsolved. In recent times, Kacimi 2016 has come back to the relationship between the Ikhwân and the Sufi thought. Poonawala refuses them to have been Sufi, though some MSS, included the MS Atif Efendi 1618 (dated 1182, on which the new edition of the Institute of Ismaili Studies is based), bear in the title the mention of the Sufi school – or doctrines. Mayer thinks that to result from a later, Sunni manuscript tradition, “in which the acceptance, or at least toleration, of esoteric material was made likelier by presenting it as proper to Ṣūfī circles, whose respectability […] had been established by a figure of the magnitude of Ghazālī.” (Traboulsi et al. 2016, 7).
The traces of classical thought in the encyclopedia, as well as their literary form, equally give an indication that the work was assembled in the course of several decades between the 9th and the first half of the 10th century, and that it may have undergone further elaborations. Such a collective enterprise can be considered as the result of a “stratified” compilation. The supposed reworking of the whole by members of the Brotherhood might also have shifted some Epistles from their original to their present place. Even the headings of the four sections of the encyclopedia are misleading. The way in which the treatises follow one another is often inconsistent. The authors must have planned a special use of the enormous amount of foreign philosophical and scientific knowledge that is explained in the treatises and to develop it in relation to the doctrinal conflicts and political changes that were occurring in their own times. In this sense the presentation of the encyclopedia as a “popular” work (Rudolph, 2004, 39) should be rejected.
Because their aim is clearly salvation, it has often been supposed that the Rasâ’il were inspired by the Shî‘ites, or perhaps even the Ismâ‘îlis, both of whom claim the ideological commitment of the encyclopedia. For Marquet (1975, 585) the encyclopedia is the most ancient general exposition of the Ismâ‘îli doctrine. In 1150, the Sunni orthodoxy in the person of the caliph al-Mustanjid judged the work heretical and sent the existing versions to be burnt. Yet in spite of this, the encyclopedia survived and was translated into Persian and Turkish (Corbin, 1964, 193–194). A harsh judgment on the Ikhwân was delivered by the famous Mamlûk muftî and theologian Taqî al-Dîn Ahmad ibn Taymiyya (d. 1328). He considered them as Shî‘i esotericists whose doctrines contradict the religion of Islam. For this reason, he rejected the attribution of the Rasâ’il to such an eminent religious scholar as Ja‘far al-Sâdiq (Michot 2008).
Attempts to define the Ikhwân's ideological commitment have been made, but there has been no consensus on the matter. The Ikhwân's view of ‘Alî as the Prophet's legitimate legate (walî) persuaded some scholars to link them to the Shî‘a, though scattered references in negative terms to the “hidden” imâm appear contrary to twelver Shî‘ism. Other elements have been alleged as proofs of the Ikhwân's Ismâ‘îli inspiration, such as the hierarchical structure of universe, references to septenary cycles, distinction between elect and masses, the use of Ismâ‘îli symbols (e.g., the bee as symbol of the imâm, etc.). Already Stanislas Guyard in 1874 published a fragment of the Ikhwân reporting it to Ismâ‘îlism; and so Paul Casanova in 1898, discovering a manuscript of Risâla al-Jâmi‘a (Daftary 2007, 28 and 235; Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 10–11). Corbin (1964, 190) openly and radically affirmed that the Ikhwân belonged to Ismâ‘îlism. He gave an esoterical interpretation of the religious, philosophical, and the Brotherhood rites described in Epistle 50 On the kinds of administration (Corbin 1950). Hamdani (1996, 146) considers this treatise to be "the most explicitly Shî‘i or Ismâ‘îli" of the entire encyclopedia. The main lines of Corbin's presentation are shared, though in more nuanced terms, by Mattila 2016. Corbin was followed by Marquet (1968, 1071) who stressed their attacks on Mu‘tazili and Ash‘arite ideas. Stern (1964, 416–417) and Diwald (1975, 26ff.) remarked that the Epistles exercised their influence on the Ismâ‘îlis only from the twelfth century. The concepts and historical ideas that are at least close to those of the Shî‘a – such as deprecation of the slaughter of Karbalâ’, the allegorical interpretation of the Qur’ân and prophecy, or the aversion to political governments and the hope that they will fall when the present septenary cycle comes to an end (cf. Baffioni 2019b) – show according to Stern (1964, 421) and later Bausani that the authors were representative of an Ismâ‘îli tendency, but not of the official da‘wa (propaganda) (Bausani 1978, 14–16; Bausani 1977, 323; Bausani 1978-1, 267, note 1). Considering Epistles 50 and 48, Bausani agrees, albeit cautiously, on the hypothesis of an Ismâ‘îlism of the Ikhwân (Bausani 1978-1, 270; 278 and note 2), identified in their “encyclopedic” approach to knowledge (Bausani 1985, 145; cf. also Daftary 1998, 2 and 83). Marquet 1973, on the other hand, recognizes in the encyclopedia (in Epistle 48 in particular, On the invitation (da‘wa) to God) the official Ismâ‘îli organization at the time (see also Marquet 1981, 95; Marquet 1998, 5, 7–8), and remarks that the propaganda appeals here to philosophers, mystics, and rulers. According to Hamdani (1996, 150), the event expected by the Ikhwân is the advent of the Fatimids. Epistle 48, Marquet claims, was written before 910, and almost entirely preserved in its original form; but even if it was composed after the advent of the Fatimids, its meaning would not have been perverted (Marquet 1984, 77–78). Other scholars have remarked that even when discussing number seven, so linked to Ismâ‘îliyya, the Ikhwân criticize the "supporters of the seven" (Hamdani 1979, 68; Netton 1996, 28–29). Non-Ismâ‘îli ideas can also be found in the work, for example the invitation to celibacy proper of Sufism (but for contrary views see above). In general, the evidence supporting such theories derives mostly from doctrines or parts of doctrines hinted at in the encyclopedia. In denying the Brethren's Ismâ‘îli commitment, for instance, Netton (1996, 28) remarks that, if the issue of such an allegiance is widely debated, scholars have much less addressed the "broader topic [...] of whether the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ should even be considered to be Muslims." The enormous variety of its contents and, often, their inconsistency seem to have hindered scholars from reaching unanimous conclusions on the authors' religious (or rather ideological) commitment and, consequently, on their goals. The main lines of research in this field were resumed in Kraemer 1992, 165–178; cf. Hamdani 1999, 79 ; Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 10ff.).
The encyclopedia consists of 52 treatises divided into four sections on the introductory (al-riyâdiyya), natural, psycho-rational and metaphysical-theological sciences.
Two additional Epistles, entitled “Comprehensive Epistle” (al-Risâla al-Jâmi‘a) and “Supercomprehensive Epistle” (Risâla Jâmi‘a al-Jâmi‘a) are thought to complete the corpus and explain its esoteric (hidden) meanings. Two versions of the Jâmi‘a are extant. One is currently ascribed to al-Majrîtî, the Spanish scientist and astronomer who is alleged to have transmitted the Epistles to Spain. Godefroid de Callataÿ (2014, 200) identifies this personage with Maslama al-Qurtubî (see above). The other is ascribed to Ahmad ibn ‘Abd Allâh ibn Muhammad ibn Ismâ‘îl ibn Ja‘far al-Sâdiq, the second of the three “veiled” (mastûr) imâms who were intermediate between Muhammad ibn Ismâ‘îl and ‘Abd Allâh, the founder of the Fatimid dynasty. Recent studies on aspects of this work by Baffioni (2011b, 2012). According to De Smet, however, the existence of the imâm Ahmad is not grounded on any reliable historical evidence (De Smet 2017, 154–155). The attribution of the Rasâ’il Ikhwân al-Safâ’ and of Risâla al-Jâmi‘a to one of the “hidden imâm” would also be a late forgery dating not beyond the 13th century (De Smet 2017, 157 and 160). The Risâla Jâmi‘a al-Jâmi‘a is also (Tamir s.d., 18) ascribed to Ahmad, which strengthens the link of the corpus with the Ismâ‘îli tradition. While one cannot deny formal and substantial relationship between the encyclopedia and the “Comprehensive” Epistle, the “Supercomprehensive” Epistle is never cited in the Rasâ’il, and it has been recognized by Kacimi 2015, 331 as an outcome of the Ismâ‘îlization of the Ikhwanian corpus. Hamdani 2008 hypothesizes a more recent compilation for the Risâla al-Jâmi‘a. At present, scholars take the study of the manuscript tradition of this text, including an inquiry into its use and evidence in Ismâ‘îli literature, to be an urgent task.
Each Epistle starts by stating its particular goal. All of them contain a core of technical teachings and a conclusion regarding the haqîqa, the inner meaning of the contents. The texts contain frequent invocations to the learning “brethren” – that is, the elect who are studying the sciences – that enhance their didactical and exhortative style; these invocations mean that the students will be awakened “from the sleep of matter and the negligence of ignorance” if they apply themselves assiduously to study “with the assistance (ta’yyid) of a spirit coming by God.”
The Epistles vary in length and their style is plain. There are, however, numerous ambiguities, due to language and vocabulary, often of Persian origin, and to mistakes in the transmission of the text. Bausani (1978, 11) thinks the authors were of Persian origin (cf. now Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 5). In general, however, the doctrines are fully and clearly exposed, with repetitions where necessary to the didactic function of the treatises.
Diwald (1975, 12–15) has even wondered whether there were in fact several authors of the encyclopedia because of the use at times of the first person singular. The basic question, of course, is whether the authors unify the doctrines of more numerous groups, as suggested by the different contexts and even their inconsistencies.
The Ikhwanian encyclopedia is typical of the changes in Greek science and philosophy during the tenth century as a result of the increasing Shî‘a influence. In the ninth century and at the beginnings of the tenth century, the prominent philosopher Abû Yûsuf Ya‘qûb b. Ishâq al-Kindî (d. ca. 870) had already developed single philosophical doctrines (e.g. in cosmology or psychology; an examination of the contents of Epistle 41 On definition and descriptions in the light of al-Kindî’s treatise with the same title is made by Poonawala in Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 277 ff.). Though elaborating them in an original way, al-Kindî had not tried to combine such doctrines with the basics of Muslim faith. Theological considerations remain parallel with philosophical issues. The physician Muhammad ibn Zakariyyâ’ al-Râzî (d. ca. 925), mainly interested to natural philosophy, had even questioned the legitimacy of prophecy.
At the time of al-Fârâbî (d. 950), ancient knowledge will be considered as an organic whole – not only a sum of theoretical elaborations, but as a real encyclopedia of sciences. It should provide at every level, from the most elementary to the most complex, the necessary premises for the acquisition of ultimate knowledge – the knowledge of God. Then, authentically Muslim thought – religious in the strict sense – begins with the substitution of the schemes of Greek philosophy for those of the Sacred Text. This is what I. Netton (1989) defined as “the progressive estrangement from the Qur’anic Creator Paradigm.” Ancient knowledge is the basis on which the patrimony of faith is built: sciences are significant not merely in themselves so much as a partial reflection of the single and unique divine Being. See Heck (2008, 2002) for interesting articles that focus on both the Ikhwân’s and al-Fârâbî’s ‘willingness to turn to philosophy to explain religion and trace its boundaries.’
The sense of truly “Muslim” science is largely a product of the ideological commitment of the authors. Consequently, scholars arrived to consider the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ as representatives of a "humanistic approach" to Islam (e.g., Albert Reyna 2007). This view, however, is challenged by their attitude, to see the ultimate goal of their gnosiological experience as an attempt of separating the soul from the ties of matter and purifying it to achieve happiness in the hereafter (see also Reymond 2012, 126; Raymond 2014, 150). For them, purification can be reached by following prophetic revelation with the help of reason. Certainly, the study of ancient sciences is not viewed, as by "orthodox theologians", as a vehicle of heresy and even atheism. Rather, sciences explain the underlying reality of the universe and so allow rational understanding of the contents of Revelation and of religious Law. As Reymond (2012, 143) puts it, the Brethren's intellectual attitude demonstrates "une mentalité en construction," announcing "une avancée dans une mentalité forgée par le terminus ad quem prévisible d'une autorité du dogme achronique et indépassable."
The blending of scientific and religious issues is evident from the beginning in the encyclopedia. Sciences should be the main topic in the first and the second sections and, partially, in the third, and theology in the rest of the corpus. In spite of the fact that ancient texts are always quoted with great accuracy from a philological point of view, the Ikhwân deeply rework the Greek sources in line with their goals that are completely different from those of the ancients. Thus religion should not be underestimated in order to attain the best comprehension of its various contents and real aims.
Let us approach the first feature of the encyclopedia, that is, its reworking the of foreign “scientific” contents. Various cultural elements come together in the Epistles: Babylonian, Indian and Iranian astrology, Indian and Persian narrative, biblical quotations and cabbalistic influences, references to the New Testament and Christian gnosis. A good survey of these contents can be found in Netton 1991, 53ff., 89ff. More recently, the scholar has emphasized as "Philosophically, the Rasâ’il [...] constitute a marvelous epitome of the mixing of Aristotelianism and Neoplatonism in the caldron of Islamic intellectual endeavour" (Netton 2009, 109). In spite of the commixtion of Aristotelian and Neoplatonic ideas – e.g., for identifying Aristotle's active cause with the faculties of the Universal Soul, "Aristotle's terminology is all-pervasive in the Rasâ’il" (ibid., 111–112). Most attention is paid to the Greeks, from the so-called “pre-socratics” to Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus and the Stoics. The encyclopedia can thus be considered a compendium of foreign sciences, deserving attention even by those who are only interested to ascertain the extent of what the Arabs knew of ancient doctrines at that time.
Comparisons between the Ikhwân's quotations and the extant Arabic versions of classical works often show that they might have used the same translations at our disposal now. When such comparisons are not possible, the ancient excerpta usually correspond to the extant original texts. We should conclude, then, that in quoting, reporting – and, perhaps, translating – ancient sources the Ikhwân display the same philological and philosophical expertise associated with the scholars to whom we owe the flourishing of the translation movement in Baghdâd. In some cases, they have even preserved the only Arabic fragments of Greek authors known to us, as exemplified by the well-known case of the story of Giges from Plato's Republic in Epistle 52. (The story of Giges is analyzed in Baffioni 2001, 168–170, 175–178). Platonic references in the encyclopedia are also scarce. The majority of them are found in the fourth section and concern the trial and death of Socrates. There is also a hint at the doctrine of reminiscence, that is seldom mentioned in Muslim sources (cf. for the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ Epistle 42, III, 424, 15). The Ikhwân are also informed about the Platonic view on pleasures and about Plato's conception of the soul as consisting of three distinct parts: the rational soul, which resides in the head; the irascible soul, which resides in the heart and is the seat of courage; and the appetitive soul, the seat of desire, which resides in the abdomen (III, 68, 4–6). The Platonic references are religiously rather than philosophically oriented. That can perhaps be explained by the influence of the Hellenistic curricula scientiarum (courses of study) designed for philosophers. These began by a reflection on the Stoic bios theoretikòs (the philosophical attitude towards life), continued with Aristotelian works representing the “scientific” side of knowledge, and ended with Platonic writings, representing the “theological” knowledge (D’Ancona Costa 1996, 30–31). The religious approach to ancient heritage leads the Ikhwân to consider philosophy as an “imitation of God according to human capacity.” This definition immediately clarifies Hellenism as the authors' first theoretical and historical reference. Their source is here Plato or, rather, his Hellenistic reading (Kraus 1986, 99, note 4).
Although the Ikhwân appear widely Aristotelian (for instance, for their presentation of the terrestrial world or the theory of knowledge rooted in sensation), the wealth of the available sources led the “Pure Brethren” to support their doctrines by a variety of theoretical models, often melted together (which even affects the consistence of the Ikhwanian idea of God, Islamic and Neoplatonic at the same time, Netton 2009, 108).
The first topic addressed in the first section are the so-called “quadrivium” (a Latin term meaning “the four ways”) sciences (arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and music): Epistle 1 deals with arithmetic, Epistle 2 with geometry, Epistle 3 with astronomy and Epistle 5 with music. Arithmetic, geometry and music are later approached together in Epistle 6 On proportions. Between these two treatises another one is added, Epistle 4 On geography: ‘ilm al-hay’a (literally “cosmography”) was evidently considered part of astronomy – but Epistles 4 and 5 are copied in an inverted order in some MSS.
References for the various sciences are, generally identifiable: Euclid, Nicomachus and sometimes even Archimedes for mathematical tenets (Epistles 1, 2 and 6); Ptolemy supports astronomy and geography (Epistles 3 and 4); the Pythagoreans and again Nicomachus are the sources for musical theory (Epistles 5 and 6). The Greeks already saw arithmetic and geometry as the necessary, though not unique, means of attaining philosophical knowledge.
Much of this section is devoted to logic, the “instrument” of sciences according to Aristotle and a view widely shared by Muslims (see Epistles 10–14). These treatises take the place of grammar, logic and rhetoric, that in Middle Ages constituted the “trivium” (in Latin: “the three ways”) sciences and were the basis of a “liberal arts” education. There is no place for poetry or for rhetorical devices in the encyclopedia. Dialectics increases damaging opposition among the learned. Although the Ikhwân appear interested in spoken language and even in phonetics, they never approach grammar as a science. Rather, they examine the technique of the “universal” form of language – logic. In the well-known 10th century debate on the superiority of grammar or of logic, they might have sided with the Christian logician Abû Bishr Mattâ ibn Yûnus more than with the grammarian Abû Sa‘îd al-Sirafî (cf. Heck 2008, 11 for a new perspective on this issue). “Trivium” was considered preparatory for the “quadrivium,” which was in turn considered preparatory for the study of philosophy and theology. The “trivium” and “quadrivium” sciences are described in the encyclopedia in an original way as distinct from that of other Muslim writers as well as the Latin west (de Callataÿ 2005, 61–62). Hellenistic influence is remarkable even when the Ikhwân rely on Aristotelian logic. The logical treatises include paraphrases of Porphiry's Isagoges, which the later Greeks considered to be the first book of Organon (Rhetoric and Poetics were taken to be its last books). It is followed by Aristotle's Categories, De interpretatione, Prior and Posterior Analytics.
This choice of texts shows that the Ikhwân conform to the “old” tradition that restricted research to the first Books of the Organon, not to that of their great contemporary al-Fârâbî, who expanded it to the whole logical corpus. This might be due to the religious aims of the encyclopedia. Religious matters can only be treated by relying on the sound (sahîh) method for knowledge, while procedures aiming at mere persuasion or linked to the attainment of that which is useful (and not true) are not to be employed. Logic is no longer a simple instrument of science as it was for Aristotle, but a true science, perhaps the most important one. The Brethren call it “the scale of sciences” through which the wise men are able to discern “true from false in speeches, right from wrong in opinions, truth from vanity in beliefs and good from evil in acts” (cf., e.g., Epistle 7, I, 268, 14–16).
Epistle 7 On the theoretical arts carefully sketches the Ikhwân's epistemological vision. A sort of “table” of human sciences is given (I, 266, 14–274, 21). There are three kinds of sciences in hierarchical progression: the “propaedeutical” (or preparatory, al-riyâdiyya again; “a designation not absolutely unambiguous” according to de Callataÿ in El-Bizri; de Callataÿ 2017, 78 ff.), those imposed by religious Law (al-shar‘iyya al-wad‘iyya) and the “philosophical sciences allowing the full comprehension of truth” (al-falsafiyya al-haqîqiyya, higher than the religious sciences). The sciences listed first in the table are labelled “propaedeutical” just as the “trivium” and “quadrivium” sciences of the encyclopedia, but here the term is used in a totally different sense. It concerns matters of practical utility, such as reading and writing, grammar and poetry (someway close to the “trivium” sciences), but also magic, mechanics, arts, trades, history and so on. Although the Ikhwân state that the sciences of the third group – the “philosophical” in the higher sense of the word – are the object of their Epistles, they do not coincide exactly with the contents of the encyclopedia, at least, with those of the corpus now available. So, the table can be considered as evidence of the fact that the whole encyclopedia has been produced during a very long period of time. On the one hand, it might have been retained as a first draft of the future enterprise; on the other, it shows the further elaborations of the corpus over the centuries.
Epistles 7 and 8 explicitly recall the Aristotelian division of the theoretical and practical sciences. Epistle 7 is extensively based on Aristotle (when the Ikhwân introduce the nine “philosophical questions,” they are thinking of the Aristotelian categories, cf. I, 262, 14–266, 7; Epistle 29, III, 35, 6–7; Epistle 40, III, 345, 6–346, 6; Epistle 42, III, 513, 14–16 and 514, 13–516, 5). However, the ultimate goal of the scientific investigation is identified with the path towards hereafter and even connected to asceticism where scientists and prophets follow the same way: Aristotelian science is linked to the Isma‘ili teaching (ta‘lîm, cf. I, 274, 20–275, 4). The “programmatic” aim of Epistle 7 leads us to consider it as the ideal introduction to the whole corpus. On the other hand, the authors' Ismâ‘îli commitment is proven by the fact that in the complementary treatise On the practical arts the ancient “banausic” (utilitarian) activities are dealt with which were held in high esteem in Ismâ‘îlism (cf. Lewis 1943; Marquet 1961; and, more recently, Yasien 2006 and Daftary 2007, 115).
Although the content of the first section is the most “uniform,” inconsistencies are found already in it. This is especially clear in Epistle 9, which portrays the “ideal wise man” from the standpoint of the encyclopedia, where moral edification is never separated from theoretical teaching. The approach is more than an echo of the well known Aristotelian division of philosophy: it stems from the view of the Ikhwân that he who searches for true wisdom must be endowed with a true mind as well as a pure heart. Epistle 9 breaks the series of the scientific treatises. Various moral behaviours are considered, with the support of a long series of anecdotes about prophets and wise men, which provide textual evidence that the Ikhwân may in practice have found asceticism (Sufism?) as another way of attaining or “enhancing” purification (cf. Epistles 6, 16 and 24).
The composed and eclectic character of the whole is even more evident in the three other sections. In the second section, the Epistles 15–22 follow the Hellenistic arrangement of Aristotle's works on physics. Epistle 15 echoes the themes addressed in the Physics. In Epistle 16, entitled, On the heaven and the world, the Ikhwân are shown to be in line with the Muslim tradition which transformed the ancient De caelo into a new book De caelo et mundo. Epistle 17 deals with De generatione and corruptione. Epistle 18 about meteorological phenomena and Epistle 19 about minerals recall the contents of Meteorology I-III and IV respectively. Meteor. IV, sometimes considered spurious and “the first chemical work in ancient world” according to scholars, was the basis of the theories of “chemical” or “alchemical” transformations in Islamic sciences and of mineralogy. The Ikhwanian treatise deals with mineralogy, geology and gemmology and in the correspondence established between the celestial and sub-lunar worlds, between the stars and minerals, it expresses one of the main tenets of alchemy. Further Aristotelian echoes are found in Epistle 24 On sense and sensation, to which Epistle 35 On intellect and intelligible corresponds in the third section. After topics concerning nature, such as the human body in Epistle 23, conception in Epistle 25, and man as microcosm in Epistle 26 [on the relationship between micro- an macrocosm see Maukola, 2009 and, in quite a new perspective, Nokso-Koivisto, 2011) the most important topic for the Ikhwân, the human spiritual dimension is addressed. It is discussed in terms of the relationship between soul and body in Epistles 27 e 28, life and death in Epistle 29, and pleasures in Epistle 30. The Aristotelian theory of the immovable mover, which is introduced in Epistle 37 On love, to explain the movement imparted to stars by the heavenly Universal Soul accomplishes its religious meaning. It serves to confirm the love human beings feel for permanence and their hatred for death: God is the most beloved as the everlasting cause of all beings.
On the other hand, natural treatises reflect the availability of the rich range of mineralogical, botanical and agricultural works, but none of the works by Aristotle on minerals or plants were known to the Arabs. The corpus aristotelicum on animals reached them (apart from the De partibus and the De generatione animalium) in an abridged form under the title of Kitâb al-hayawân, but Epistle 22 On animals is quite far in its content and goals from the Aristotelian corpus. In fact, it places the whole matter within the well-known metaphysical dispute on the superiority of man on animals (besides some attempts of viewing it even in an "ecological perspective"; see, more recently, Darraz 2012; Raymond 2014, 151). .
The authors' view of embryology (Epistle 25) is also a collection from different sources. On the one hand, the Ikhwân were not physicians, though they display extensive knowledge of anatomy and share the Aristotelian thesis of the origin of the embryo from the sperm and menstrual blood, while they did not accept the ancient Hippocratic theory as developed by Galen, of a female sperm coexisting with that of the male in the formation of the human being. On the other hand, they emphasize an astronomical/astrological approach to embryology that was not in Greek sources. It is considered to be a new idea introduced by Islamic scientists, from whom it passed into the Latin world. Greek sources for Epistle 37 on love also vary.
The real deviation from Aristotelianism is Epistle 20 On nature. In that it shows how nature as taught by Aristotle was received and theorized by the authors, this treatise could serve as the perfect introduction to the section on natural sciences. However, its main part regards angelology. It also introduces a Neoplatonically inspired conception of Nature, suggestive of Ismâ‘îli philosophical positions, as Abû Ya‘qûb al-Sijistânî's representation of Nature as “agent power” and “principle of movement”.
Though the Ikhwân never mention Plotinus explicitly, the third section opens with two treatises that deal with rational beings as understood by the Pythagoreans (Epistle 32) and the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ (Epistle 33). These treatises demonstrate beyond doubt that these authors considered themselves true Muslim Pythagoreans. Pythagoras is said to be “a monotheist from Harrân.” The Pythagorean idea of the one as the principle of numbers, and not as a number itself explains that God is the origin of beings, and not a being like others. If God is like the one, the Active Intellect is compared to number 2, the Universal Soul to number 3 and Nature (or Matter) to number 4 (cf. e.g. Epistle 40, III, 347, 5). The encyclopedia resumes Pythagorean mathematical and musical theories and adopts a numerological approach on the basis of the Pythagorean tenet that “existing beings correspond to the nature of number.” The whole reality is considered under a numerological perspective. Every aspect of nature – and even of religion – follows a numeric pattern. This should demonstrate that the cosmos – also introduced as a “macranthropos” (man as the pattern of the external world as a whole) in Epistle 34 – is organized according to recurrent and well-determined quantitative models, being at the same time completely dependent on God, the principle of everything just as one is the root of each number. According to de Callataÿ, Aristotelian themes are “reshaped”, for didactic purposes, in a Neoplatonic frame (El-Bizri; de Callataÿ 2017, 88), so that those who organized the corpus in its final version “are definitely to be ranged amongst hard-line Neoplatonists in medieval Islam” (El-Bizri; de Callataÿ 2017, 89).
Among the other philosophical schools and doctrines quoted in the encyclopedia an important role is played by hermetism (the religion of the philosophical elite in Ancient Egypt, founded by Hermes Trismegistus), as in Epistle 3 On astronomy and, more broadly, in Epistle 52 (Marquet 1973, 1988). Ancient theories on the movements of the stars will finally evolve in Epistle 36 On cycles and revolutions into that which, following Cumont, G. de Callataÿ (1996, 36–37) has defined as a “fatalisme astral.”
Just like philosophy, as a way towards salvation, is an imitation of God and implies that the disciple is provided not only of an acute mind, but also of a pure heart (through which God will be recognized as the sole and the supreme teacher in knowledge and deeds, as the Holy Book demonstrates, cf., e.g., Qur., II, 31: ‘And He taught Adam the names', mentioned in Epistle 28, III, 18, 14–16 and in Epistle 31, III, 112, 19 and 141, 13–14; cf. also Epistle 23, II, 381, 17), the Ikhwân consider prophetic message (both esoteric and exoteric, hidden and clear) as the second necessary means for human salvation and happiness. This brings us back to the second aspect of the encyclopedia, its religious commitment.
We already saw that the Ikhwân rework the classical heritage in religious terms. They also deal with doctrinal questions linked to religion. Epistle 42 On opinions and religions, the other “programmatic” treatise of the encyclopedia that opens the fourth section, is a discussion of the basic ideas of the Brotherhood such as the multifaceted epistemological problems, the origin of the world, morals and theodicy and the imamate as well as the various doctrines critically considered by the Ikhwân, such as eternalism and dualism. It also develops the apologetic side of Ikhwanian thought.
Epistle 40 On causes and effects addresses the crucial problem of the origin of the world. The Ikhwân subvert to religious purposes Aristotle’s teleological approach that “nature does not make anything in vain.” Understanding creation, one of the basic Muslim tenets, is recognized as the highest attainment of knowledge. So, the ancients are defended from the charge of eternalism (cf. III, 356, 11–18) and, for the sake of the masses, creation is even explained through the comparison of God with a confectioner. However the Ikhwân – like the Ismâ‘îlis – adopt Neoplatonic views as the best explication of the origin of the world by God. The world, then, emanates from God through the hypostases of Intellect and Soul. Emanationism is the philosophical expression of creation; it also explains the encyclopaedic structure of the treatises. The various levels of reality down to the three kingdoms of the generated beings (animal, vegetable and mineral) originate continuously through intermediaries from the One. For this reason, by acquiring all the sciences from the lowest to the highest it is possible to attain the common source of everything, the ‘science of God’ in the double sense of pertaining to God and concerning God – the ancient metaphysics (metà ta physikà) no longer indicates what comes “after” physics but what is “beyond” it. Thus, rather than a mere foreign source, Neoplatonism (merged with Neopythagorism) can be considered as the Ikhwân’s proper philosophy. Philosophy as imitation of God continues as the guiding principle of the Ikhwân’s system, together with equal emphasis on divine revelation.
From Epistle 43 onwards, the Ikhwân build their own system from a religious point of view, often in the fragmentary style typical of Muslim esoteric writings. Epistle 43 considers the way towards God through purification; then the beliefs of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ and of the so-called “Divines,” the heirs of a prophetic tradition whose origin is ascribed to the ancient wise men (Epistle 44). Epistle 45 expounds the organization of the Brotherhood based on mutual help. Epistle 46 considers the faith, not only of Islam, but also of the former monotheistic religions and of the ancient wise men. Epistle 47 considers prophecy and the imamate. Epistle 48 discusses propaganda. Epistle 49 deals with a key theme in the encyclopedia – the existence of disembodied agents in the world, based on the Ikhwân’s idea that the full truth of the Qur’ân, obscured in their time by ignorance and distortions, could only be restored thanks to the study of the rational sciences developed by the Greek philosophers. In the surviving manuscript tradition, Epistle 49 appears in two versions, a short and a long one. The short one clearly preserves an older text. The long one contains a detailed elaboration of part of the short one. The short version also consists of two parts; the second is a commentary on the Epistle by an author other than that of the first, namely Maslama al-Qurtubî al-Majrîṭî, during his stay at Basra in 936-7. At the same time, Maslama should have also composed what de Callataÿ identified as the “short version” of Epistle on Magic, to which Epistle 49 was to be an introduction. In fact, both treatises aim to prove the existence of spiritual beings: magic in all its forms consists precisely in the acts of such spiritual beings. The long version would have been composed by Maslama after his return to Cordoba. In the printed editions, the final part of the short version is added to the text of the long version, but the addition is not found in any of the MSS examined in the new edition, while it might be found in the MS on which the first printed edition was based (that of Bombay, 1887-1889); but we do not know if such MS still exists (Madelung et al. 2019, 1–3). Epistle 49 is a complex exposition of Ikhwanian cosmology, remarkably different and richer than that exposed in any other epistle. This exposition is merged with the authors’ religious vision on the relationship between God and the world (Uy in Madelung et al. 2019, 8). A new vision of the Ikhwân’s magic as the “conceptual and practical pivot” of their religious-political reform based on inclusion and tolerance is in Saif 2019; a study of the so-called “longer version” of Epistle 52 in Saif 2020. Epistle 50 discusses the various kinds of 'administration' (physical, spiritual, personal, familiar, etc.), the core of the Epistle being the religious and philosophical approach to God. In the new edition, the treatise appears purged of all the passages that led Corbin to his esoteric interpretation (Baffioni in Madelung et al. 2019, 148 ; Baffioni 2019d). Some MSS provide additions and/or versions radically different from those reported in the other consulted manuscripts and in the printed versions available (Baffioni in Madelung et al. 2019, Appendices A–D, 237–364; with regard to additions to other epistles see Baffioni 2019a, 2019c). Noteworthy is the addition in MS Esad Efendi 3638 that explains the story of Adam meant as the progenitor of huimankind, the first speaking prophet and the heavenly imâm (ed. and tr. by Baffioni in Madelung et al. 2019, 237–277; cf. also Baffioni 2020b). Apparently, Epistle 51 duly gathers up the threads of the whole (often repeating contexts of previous treatises), but its recent editor has also ascertained the existence of two versions of it, maybe even three (Alshaar in Madelung et al. 2019, 381ff.). Epistle 52 On magic is the last in the corpus, missing in some editions and considered by some scholars (Bausani 1978, 12 and 279) as spurious, and of little value, so the Risâla al-Jâmi‘a would be the true fifty-second one (cf. de Callataÿ 2011, 3). However, de Callataÿ inclines to the view that the ‘short version’ of this treatise, namely, the part approximately corresponding to the first thirty pages of the Beirut edition, is genuine (de Callataÿ 2011, 5ff).
That a text exists in different versions is not an isolated case. Two versions of Epistles 32 have been found by Walker (Walker et al. 2015, 5, 7–8). Similarly, there are two versions of Epistle 48; one is based on a group of MSS that appear to have been copied from an Ismâ‘îli specimen; the other is based on a second group of MSS, including Atif Efendi 1618. Despite the permanence of Shî‘ite elements, Hamdani believes that the material in the second version has been rearranged in order to provide a version acceptable to Sunni-Sufi readers. Although one must believe to the story handed down by al-Tawhîdî, there must have been an earlier shî‘i version of the Rasâ’il (Alshaar in Madelung et al. 2019, 383).
The existence of different versions of a same epistle raises questions about the history of its transmission and about how such existence should be interpreted. Which version should have priority? Should the various versions be considered to be different stages or different aspects of the same authorial project? On what basis should they be assessed? The date of a MS, although of considerable importance for determining its value, cannot be taken as the sole criterion for deciding the authenticity or the greater antiquity of a textual tradition, since a late MS may have been copied from a very ancient one. Also, due to problems related to the transmission of MSS themselves, to their dating, and to the nature of the various epistles, it is difficult to decide which versions is older or more authentic (Alshaar in Madelung et al. 2019, 382–383).
The corpus addresses other main religious issues in Muslim faith: the unity and uniqueness, and the attributes of God, angels, human destiny, good and evil, resurrection. Divine will and power are also considered when trying to explain evil in the world, though, of course, Muslim faith does not allow identifying God as the cause of evil (Epistle 19). Ultimately, the Ikhwân attribute it to human responsibility, or, better, to the responsibility of creatures in general and they do so in quite a Mu‘tazilite perspective. In the hierarchical disposition of universe there are “intermediate” beings to which everything that happens in the world may be related. God, a quite remote “first beloved” is beyond all this, like the kings, whose orders are behind everything built during their reigns. Epistle 39 On the kinds of movement considers the movement of the whole cosmos, from that of the stars down to those (natural and voluntary) of human beings. Its aim is to demonstrate the existence of a God who created the world and who will bring it to an end. In Epistle 27 souls (that are self-subsistent according to the ancient doctrine) unite themselves to human bodies in order to ensure human salvation; hence wise men and prophets are said to be the “physicians of the souls” (III, 13, 7 ff.). The main religious topic is, however, resurrection, thoroughly examined in Epistle 38 where it is also considered as the supreme science (III, 288, 3–5). The theme was already addressed in Epistle 29 (wisdom is recognizable in death in that it allows the vision of God, hence the highest sorrow is damnation). On the same line, Epistle 30 states that the real “Hell” is earth, “Paradise” is heaven. However, the Ikhwân deem as “providential” the ignorance of the beauties of the afterlife, which might urge people to desire death before the natural end of life. In doing so, they are far from the Pythagorean doctrine that considered the soul as a fallen divinity imprisoned within the body as in a “tomb”.
In conclusion, whereas in Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm (“The Enumeration of the Sciences”), al-Fârâbî deals with Muslim sciences such as theology (kalâm) and law (fiqh), the Ikhwân mainly stress religion. In the Rasâ’il, the usual distinction between philosophy/sciences (the rational or ‘aqliyya knowledge) and theology (the received or naqliyya knowledge), or between reason and faith is not valid as both are combined.
On the formal side, the religious commitment appears in the frequent Qur’anic quotations in support of ancient doctrines, sometimes through interpretations that are not in line with the theological ones. Above all, the Ikhwân appropriate the Muslim ideal of attaining happiness in this world and the hereafter and indicate in the treatises how to reach it. In physical terms it is by caring for the body, which when healthy and balanced is the condition of the purification of the soul. In metaphysical terms, the purified soul is said to be capable of knowledge, so of being saved – even though, like the Ismâ‘îlis, the Ikhwân deny salvation as attainable through solely philosophy.
Prophethood is an undeniable part of the theoretical experience featured by the Ikhwân. Their political vision is linked to this and implies that attainment of happiness is considered in political terms, too, where it results in examination of what has to be accomplished to be worthy of entering the entourage of the imâm. In Epistle 40 the science of the esoteric interpretation of the Qur’ân (explaining its hidden meaning) is emphasized as the highest divine gift (in doing this the Ikhwân give an interpretation of Qur., III, 7 which precedes that, much more well-known, given by Averroes two centuries later, cf. III, 344, 10–345, 5).
The second pivot of the Ikhwân's philosophy in addition to creation is their discussion of the imamate. It has its first origin in Epistle 31 On the diversity of languages (now considered from the standpoint mentioned in the title by Albert Reyna 2009). Here the Ikhwân show that religious creeds change as a result of language transformations. More particularly, differences and contrasts within the umma due to changes in the Arabic language are linked to the debate regarding the identity of the Messenger's deputy, which is the main cause of schism in Islam “until their time,” the Ikhwân say (cf. Epistle 31, III, 153, 8–10 and 165, 8–12). While everybody agrees on the tasks of the imâm, there is a disagreement as to his identity. This is because imamate is of two kinds: prophetic and regal. Usually the tasks of the ruler are neatly distinguished from those of the prophet, because governance is a mundane business and prophecy is related to the life to come (III, 497, 5–6). On occasion these qualities are combined in a single person, who is then the delegated prophet and also the ruler (III, 495, 18–19). While the Prophet Muhammad was both prophet and ruler of the Muslim umma, so ensuring its best defence, his possible successors did not always match him in nobility. Subsequently, prophecy and governance are sometimes found in two different persons, one of whom is the prophet delegated to that community and the other the person who has been given power over them. They support one another (III, 495, 19–21). The real problem seems, then, to be the dignity of the person appointed as the caliph, which alone is the condition of a legitimate prophetical succession. The Ikhwân's specific idea on the identity of such a person is not clear. In addition, there is apparently no distinction between the prophet, the imâm or the ruler with regard to the required qualities, as Epistle 47 On the essence of divine Law demonstrates. The sole “doctrinal” solution offered in the encyclopedia seems that a ruler with ascetic tendencies can legitimately take the place of the imâm.
The political ideas of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ have not been extensively analyzed by scholars, except when they have been considered as a political movement. (The Ikhwân's interest in political issues is mainly emphasized by Eastern scholars who in general incline towards the hypothesis of their being [“filo]-Isma‘ili.” Cf. Hijab, 1982; Tamir, 1983, 89–108). In fact, the “Pure Brethren” are contrasted with the “philosophers,” who were understood to have taken an outsider position with regard to the political expectations of the society in which they lived, as a consequence of their evaluation of Plato's Republic (cf. e.g. Kraemer 1987 and Stroumsa 2003). However, the Ikhwân do not fail to approach policy from a theoretical standpoint and the philosophical doctrines developed in their Epistles can be understood to be a functional element of their political vision. In Epistle 48 On the invitation to God, a madîna fâdila (perfect city) is featured – less known but no less worthy than that proposed by al-Fârâbî. This time the Ikhwân do not hide themselves behind the ancient Platonic heritage: they openly adapt a Greek idea to a Muslim situation, and various aspects of the 'Ismailism' of the treatise have been highlighted in Baffioni, 2014a.
Were the Ikhwân Ismâ‘îlis? This of course opens the way to the second side of the argument – the Ismâ‘îli commitment of the Ikhwân.
The saying “dîn and mulk are twins” in reference to the prophet and the king empowered to perform the functions of the imâm in the sense preached by the Ikhwân perfectly fits the Fatimid rulers. If this hypothesis is tenable, the debated “traditions” mentioned in Epistle 31 with reference to the misunderstandings due to the diversity of languages might be understood as the Fatimid versions of the divine Law. If the Ikhwanian “Lawgiver” is identified with the historical incarnation of the Isma‘ili faith, that is, with the Fatimid caliph, and if the “perfect city” is the one ruled by these caliphs, then the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ are his du‘â’. Epistle 48, with the mention of the term da‘wa in the title, might further support the hypothesis of a project of concrete militancy by the Ikhwân.
The Ikhwân appear as the learned people who have the task of promoting propaganda (da‘wa). Sometimes they even seem to appropriate the qualities of the king-imâm; in Epistle 47 they introduce themselves as the best guides for the defence of Islam in terms of al-hukamâ’ wa al-falâsifa wa al-fudalâ’ (“wise men, philosophers and excellent people”) and of the anbiyâ’, khulafâ’ al-anbiyâ’ wa al-a’imma al-mahdiyûn (“prophets, successors of the prophets and well-guided imams,” IV, 126, 5-17). That the Ikhwân aim to be the guides of the elect community is further confirmed by a passage in Epistle 9. The ascetics are described as those “who know the shortcomings [of the world], who crave for the hereafter and are convinced of it, firmly rooted in its science, that is the sincere Friends of God, [His] faithful servants, the cream of all [His] creatures, whom the Creator – may [He] be exalted – called ‘persons of understanding, persons of view, persons of mind’” (I, 357, 5–9). These qualities correspond to those of the Ikhwân engaged, as the leaders of their community, in their philosophy of salvation; but they also fit the prophets and the imâms perfectly. From this point of view the reading of the Holy Book our authors have in mind – rather than a Shî‘i or Isma‘ili perspective – might be the ta’wîl performed in their own encyclopedia, where God's Word is continually quoted and commented (Baffioni 2012b; Gobillot 2013). And they refer to the spiritual city as “our spiritual city,” which coincides with Paradise.
In Epistle 47 the legacy of the Prophet is said to be inherited by “the most intelligent” (al-‘uqalâ’ al-akhyâr) which emphasizes the epistemological function of the Shî‘ite caliph. In this case a temporal ruler, the “ruler imâm,” is no longer necessary because the rational Law is the real guide, “incarnated” in the “rightly guided” imâm and in his reason and knowledge. In contrast to Baffioni 2006, 149–150, Heck (2008, 205–209) seems to side with Netton's reading of the intellect-guide in terms of a rational intellect.
Further elements allow a better defining of the Ikhwân's political position. The history of early Islam is approached from a Shî‘i perspective; some important events of the prophet Muhammad's life and mission are recalled; soon attention shifts to two fatal events which led to the defeat of Shî‘ism, the battle of Siffîn and the slaughter of Karbalâ’. In a passage on the struggles for imâmate, the “representatives of the Muhammadic (Muhammadiyya) Law and of the Hashimi federation” (cf. Epistle 31, III, 165, 11–12) are opposed. If the latter are the ‘Abbasids (or even the supporters of Abû Hâshim, son of Muhammad ibn al-Hanafiyya), the former should be understood as the direct descendants of the Prophet through Fâtima, whence the Ikhwân's strict ‘Alid militancy should be demonstrated.
Another passage from Epistle 31 (III, 153, 11–156, 9) might urge to suppose that the authors' target was the caliph al-Ma’mûn, in spite of his pro-‘Alid policy (and political support of Mu‘tazilism). The Ikhwân report on a ruler, who encouraged politico-religious controversies among the ‘ulamâ’ (learned) of different persuasions, claiming for himself the right to interpret the Law on the basis of the Mu‘tazili doctrine of the created Qur’ân. Juxtaposed to him is ahl bayt al-nubuwwa (the immediate family of the Prophet: Muhammad, his daughter Fâtima, his cousin and son-in-law ‘Alî and their sons, al-Hasan and al-Husayn) as the guarantors of the true tradition concerning prophetic succession. The Ikhwân could then still be identified with the supporters of the strict ‘Alid conception of the imamate, according to which the science of caliphate belongs to the family of the Prophet only.
If this hypothesis is tenable, Epistle 31 contains not only the core of the Ikhwân's political thought, but also of their Ismâ‘îli commitment. Their presentation of the “perfect city,” in which mutual love is the basis and the goal of the community, does not help us to ascertain whether the Ikhwân have in mind spiritual rule or a true government such as that of the Fatimid caliph, of whom they might be the du‘â’. Scholars tend to consider this “perfect city” as utopian as the Farabian (cf. e.g. Marquet 1973, 153; Hamdani 1999, 81). The defeat of evil people is also often foreshadowed in the encyclopedia (cf. e.g. Epistle 31, III, 154, 19–24 and 156, 2–3). In Epistle 4 the Ikhwân present a cyclical conception of ruling dynasties, and state that “the dynasty of the evil reached its apex,” hence only decline and diminution are to be expected in the future. According to Tibawi (1955, 37, note 4), the Ikhwân forebode here the fall of the ‘Abbasids. Cf. also Tibawi, 1978, 60.) The dynasty of the good begins when the learned agree “on a unique doctrinal school and a single religion,” commit themselves to mutual help, and desire the vision of God and doing God's will as their [sole] reward (I, 181, 14–182, 2). In Epistle 48, the Ikhwân declare that the one whose advent in the world is expected is coming, and it will be a wonderful event (IV, 190, 13), in which the welfare of both religion and the world will be gathered. Magic, astronomy and true dreams helped them establish even the year and month of the advent of the “lord of the cycle” (sâhib al-amr) – but, of course, the date is not mentioned in the encyclopedia.
Grounding himself on the Sîrat ibn Ḥawshab of the Fatimid dâ‘î Ja‘far b. Mansūr al-Yaman (d. second half of the 10th century), Hamdani hypothesizes the epistles to have been written under Ahmad b. ‘Abd Allâh b. Muḥammad b. Ismâ‘îl’s imâmate, who was considered as the expected imâm. Ahmad, however, was not their author, but their munshi’ (“issuer”). Therefore, the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ would have been a think-tank at the service of the Fatimid propaganda, a secret organization with the function of gaining support from the non-initiates (Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 1–2). Moh. Jalub Farhan, however, describes the Ikhwân as opposed to the Buyid regime, in spite of the fact that it supported science (1999, 30, 31). The Brethren who cooperated in the final version of the encyclopedia in the tenth century might have been disguised adversaries of the Buyids, who were Shî‘ites, not Ismâ‘îlis. Poonawala also proposes the Rasâ’il to have been written by propagandists belonging to the entourage of Ahmad, half a century after al-Ma’mûn (Walker et al. 2015, 66; De Smet 2017, 157–158). More recently, Hamdani has noted in the encyclopedia also Sunni-Sufi elements; thereby, the Ikhwân would be a secret think-tank made up of tafḍîlî Sunnis (that is, they assert the superiority of ‘Alî over all the successors of the Prophet), who hoped to replace the ‘Abbasids with a ‘alid caliphate, displaying in their work also liberalism and religious tolerance (Hamdani, Soufan 2019, 32–33).
On the whole, the political vision outlined above appears to be founded on doctrinal elements of Ismâ‘îli nature. The division between the “elect” and the “masses” destines the former only for investigation of the curriculum studiorum at the basis of the “philosophy of salvation”. A rigid hierarchy of universe links each level of existence, physical and spiritual, to that which precedes and that which follows it where the beings that belong to the various levels cannot go beyond them. (It should be noted that this may question the idea of “evolution” in the Ikhwân that some scholars have ascribed to them; cf. e.g. Vernet Ginés 1990, 190; Marquet 1992). The didactic aims of the ruler mirror the aspect of Ismâ‘îli propaganda known as ta‘lîm (lit.: “teaching”).
The influence of the Epistles on later (after the 12th century) Ismâ‘îli literature has been widely recognized (Stern 1964, 416–417; Diwald 1975, 26 ss.; Daftary 2007, 236). Their content has been transmitted and developed by subsequent thinkers of various persuasions. It is noteworthy, however, that extended literal quotations (and even translations) from the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ are found in the famous Ismâ‘îli thinker and missionary Nâsir-e Khosrow (1004–1074) (see Saccone 2007, 67–68; Baffioni 2013c and Poonawala in Baffioni, Poonawala 2017, 285 ff.): this may be a proof of the use of the Rasâ’il in 11th century Ismâ‘îli authors. If the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ were Ismâ‘îlis or in someway linked to Ismâ‘îlism, then Ismâ‘îlism influenced a much wider part of Islamic thought and culture than previously recognized.
With regard to an Ismâ‘îli commitment to the Ikhwân al-Safâ’, some aspects of their philosophy of nature (geology, mineralogy, and botany) have been recently examined (Baffioni 2008, 2009, 2010b; de Callataÿ 2008). Mineralogy and botany have been explored in order to find similarities with Ismâ‘îli philosophy, in particular with the Ismâ‘îli thinker and missionary Hamîd al-Dîn al-Kirmânî. The result is that they share many basic views, but the Ikhwân has greater detail. Moreover, some aspects of the Ikhwân’s cosmology, and in particular their use of the term and concept of ibdâ‘, are relevant in identifying the similarities (Baffioni 2011a; 2013b; 2013d).
However, the radical change of hypotheses about the dating of the epistles after the identification of the role that Maslama al-Qurtubî would have played in them, also led to rethinking the political (and possibly messianic) beliefs of the Ikhwân and the attempts to identify the polemical targets of their assertions. Madelung remarks that while the Fatimids were used to see both Umayyads and ‘Abbasids as usurpers and enemies of ‘Alî, the Ikhwân had no longer contacts with any hidden imâm, as they believe that the advent of the Mahdî has been delayed to a remote future. Therefore, they adopted a quietist attitude towards the existing regimes: their purpose was only to purify Islam through the study of ancient thought, thus preparing humanity for the advent of the true Mahdî. Maslama al-Qurṭubî remained a loyal subject of the Umayyad governor of Andalus, ‘Abd al-Raḥmân III. Hence, the Ikhwân no longer regarded the Umayyads as the inveterate enemies of the Family of the Prophet. The imâm, direct descendants of the Prophet, are instead described as the only ones entitled to rule humanity, and for this purpose divinely chosen; but their persecutors – although denounced as tyrants – are not identified. Kacimi 2019 returns on the anti-‘Abbasid polemic of the Ikhwân.
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