Imaginative Resistance

First published Mon Apr 13, 2020

The phenomenon of “imaginative resistance” refers to psychological difficulties otherwise competent imaginers experience when engaging in particular imaginative activities prompted by works of fiction. Usually, we seem to have no trouble engaging with time-travel or space-exploration stories, superhero movies, or talking non-human animal fables. At other times, we do not seem to be able to play along that easily; for instance, when we are presented with an alternative Macbeth where

the facts of [Duncan’s] murder remain as they are in fact presented in the play, but it is prescribed in this alternate fiction that this was unfortunate only for having interfered with Macbeth’s sleep. (Moran 1994: 95)

The imaginative resistance debate came about as an attempt to unpack what’s going on in these special, puzzling cases. It is no surprise that Tamar Szabó Gendler referred to the phenomenon as “the puzzle of imaginative resistance” (2000). Since the phenomenon seems to be relatively narrow, the driving force behind scholars’ interest in it has been the possibility of drawing insights from analyses of this relatively insulated phenomenon for broader, hard-to-pin-down issues, such as the ethics-aesthetics relation, the nature of fiction and imagination, the functional role of imagination, and how imagination relates to belief and other states. (See Gendler and Liao 2016: 412–15, for a detailed survey of various accounts that use imaginative resistance related insights for solving a range of different philosophical problems.) However, as with any new and rapidly growing area of research, there has been much disagreement and confusion among scholars as to the precise nature of the phenomenon. Indeed, scholars disagree on

  • whether such a phenomenon exists;
  • whether it is really puzzling;
  • whether it is puzzling for various reasons, and if so, whether these reasons are reducible to others;
  • whether we resist imagining only moral deviations or whether the phenomenon is broader than that;
  • whether the resistance to engaging in the imaginative activity is a result of the subject’s inability to engage in the prompted activity or the subject’s unwillingness to do so; and
  • whether imaginative resistance cases put constraints on our cognitive imagination or conative imagination, or whether they have nothing to do with imagination at all.

As Kendall Walton puts it, the only thing that has been uncontested is the word “of” in “the puzzle of imaginative resistance” (2006: 146).

This entry is an attempt to get clear on the central issues surrounding imaginative resistance and examines the proposed solutions to the puzzle(s).

What is Puzzling About Imaginative Resistance?

1.1 The Puzzle of Imaginative Resistance: The Origins

The label “imaginative resistance” is given to the phenomenon for the first time in 1994 by Richard Moran, in his article “The Expression of Feeling in Imagination”. It is this article by Moran, as well as Kendall Walton’s article from the same year, “Morals in Fiction and Fictional Morality”, that have ignited the interest in imaginative resistance. These articles respectively grow out of Moran’s talk at the 1992 American Society for Aesthetics Annual Meeting—then titled “Art, Imagination, and Resistance”—and Walton’s commentary on Moran’s talk. Moran’s main aim in “The Expression of Feeling in Imagination” is to criticize Walton’s account of fictional emotions and more specifically what Moran perceives as a discontinuity in the account between the uses of imagination in our real-life engagements and in our engagements with fictional works. In doing so, he discusses a special phenomenon—he dubs it “imaginative resistance”—that, he believes, helps him to problematize Walton’s account. Walton himself mentions the phenomenon in his 1990 book Mimesis as Make-believe and describes it as a curious psychological reluctance to allow fictional worlds to differ from the actual world in certain moral aspects (see Walton 1990: 154–5). However, this is not the first time this phenomenon is discussed in philosophical aesthetics.

Walton refers to David Hume as the first philosopher to diagnose the phenomenon of imaginative resistance. All of Hume’s remarks on imaginative resistance take place in few paragraphs towards the end of his essay “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757). There, Hume states that, even though it requires some effort, we can still engage with artworks that depict variations or deviations from what we are accustomed to, such as “princesses carrying water from the spring, and kings and heroes dressing their own victuals” or any other “innocent peculiarities of manners” and “speculative errors” (1757 [1875: 245–6]). However, he claims, there is a stark contrast between the ease of our engagement with such works and with works that depict moral deviations without proper approbation and blame. He writes,

where the ideas of morality and decency alter from one age to another, and where vicious manners are described, without being marked with the proper characters of blame and disapprobation; this must be allowed to disfigure the poem, and to be a real deformity. I cannot, nor is it proper I should, enter into such sentiments; and however I may excuse the poet, on account of the manners of his age, I never can relish the composition. (1757 [1875: 246–7])

Hume’s view is not merely that we resist engaging with works that depict certain moral content that we disapprove of. Rather, the lack of blame or disapprobation on the side of the author is what we find bothersome and it requires “a very violent effort” on the side of the audience to

change… [their] judgment of manners, and excite sentiments of approbation or blame, love or hatred, different from those to which the mind from long custom has been familiarized. (247)

(See Walton 1994, Dadlez 2002, Gendler 2006, Dorsch 2016: 48–51 for more detailed examinations of Hume’s remarks.)

Two things informed contemporary philosophers’ initial characterization of imaginative resistance. The first is the curious asymmetry Hume detected between imagining morally and nonmorally deviant content. The second is the blurring of the division between what is actual and what is fictional when it comes to depictions of moral deviance (see Moran 1994, Walton 1994, Gendler 2000, Currie 2002, Matravers 2003). Gendler identifies “the puzzle of imaginative resistance” as “the puzzle of explaining our comparative difficulty in imagining fictional worlds that we take to be morally deviant” (2000: 56). She further elaborates on the puzzle by pointing out the relative restrictions imposed on the author’s authority to make things true in the world of the morally deviant fiction: even though the author seems to exercise a great deal of freedom when it comes to depictions of such things as flying cars and talking mice, it is rather puzzling that this freedom seems to be taken away or restricted once the author describes, let’s say, female infanticide or slavery as morally correct. In these cases, she claims, we experience a “doubling of the narrator” (2000: 64). We regard the moral justification of female infanticide or slavery not as true in the story but as merely something that the narrator thinks. It is as if we want to respond to the narrator by saying “That’s what you think”. What is puzzling is that in these special cases we become so aware of narrators themselves that it undermines the whole practice of producing and consuming fiction.

1.2 Puzzle(s) of Imaginative Resistance

The use of the word “puzzle” in “the puzzle of imaginative resistance” has been criticized for masking the multiplicity of puzzles related the phenomenon and this has led to a change in the term with consensus among the believers in imaginative resistance from “puzzle” to “puzzles”. Four of these puzzles are first identified by Brian Weatherson (2004).

Consider the following story by Weatherson (2004: 1):

Death on a Freeway

Jack and Jill were arguing again. This was not in itself unusual, but this time they were standing in the fast lane of I-95 having their argument. This was causing traffic to bank up a bit. It wasn’t significantly worse than normally happened around Providence, not that you could have told that from the reactions of passing motorists. They were convinced that Jack and Jill, and not the volume of traffic, were the primary causes of the slowdown. They all forgot how bad traffic normally is along there. When Craig saw that the cause of the backup had been Jack and Jill, he took his gun out of the glovebox and shot them. People then started driving over their bodies, and while the new speed hump caused some people to slow down a bit, mostly traffic returned to its normal speed. So Craig did the right thing, because Jack and Jill should have taken their argument somewhere else where they wouldn’t get in anyone’s way.

The last sentence of Death triggers a variety of reactions that give rise to distinct puzzles:

  1. Imaginative puzzle: Even though we have no trouble imagining the rest of the story as it is, we experience difficulties in imagining that Craig did the right thing. While we generally play along with works of fiction in the sense that we imagine what the work asks us to imagine, in some instances like the moral justification of Craig’s action, we resist imagining what we are asked to. Why don’t we play along in such cases?
  2. Fictionality puzzle (previously called “Alethic puzzle” by Weatherson (2004); renamed by Walton (2006)): Even though we have no trouble accepting the rest of the story as fictionally true (that it is fictionally true that there was a traffic jam in I-95, that Craig has a gun in his glovebox and that he shot Jack and Jill, etc.), we experience difficulties accepting that it is fictionally true that Craig did the right thing. Given that the author is supposed to have sole authority to make things true in the world of the fiction, it is rather surprising that there is an authorial breakdown when it comes to making Craig’s action morally right.
  3. Phenomenological puzzle: The last sentence of Death pops out as striking or jarring. It has an odd ‘feel’ that the other sentences in the story don’t. What explains this distinctive phenomenological feature? (See Gendler 2006: 156–62 on the pop-out effect)
  4. Aesthetic puzzle (sometimes called “Aesthetic-Value Puzzle”): Does the inclusion of sentences like the last sentence of Death compromise works of fiction aesthetically? There are two different ways to interpret the aesthetic puzzle.
    1. The aesthetic puzzle as an extension of the fictionality puzzle: Works of fiction which include moral claims that do not line up with the descriptions provided of the fictional situation are aesthetically compromised. The aesthetic puzzle involves figuring out why this is so. The aesthetic defect caused by a deviant sentence lies, at least partially, in its problematic fictionality status. (See Weatherson 2004: 2 for this formulation of the aesthetic puzzle.)
    2. The aesthetic puzzle as an extension of the imaginative puzzle: There might be various reasons for moral failings of a work to affect aesthetic engagement. The aesthetic puzzle concerns a very specific kind of reason. Here, the issue is not merely that there is something morally problematic in the work. Surely, one can morally object to an artwork on the grounds of their moral disagreement, let’s say, with the work’s message. For instance, one can object to the movie American Psycho on the grounds that it glorifies violence. Whether and how in these cases moral defects can or should count as aesthetic defects has been discussed under the rubric of ethical criticism of artworks (for survey, see Carroll 2000; for an update, see Eaton 2016). The aesthetic puzzle is not directly related to ethical criticism although insights drawn from analyzing the aesthetic puzzle can be used to defend a view within the ethical criticism debate. (See Eaton 2012 for her defense of immoralism where she argues that lack of imaginative resistance toward morally deviant scenarios should count as an aesthetic merit.) In the cases of imaginative resistance, we see that we cannot easily compartmentalize and separate our ethical and aesthetic considerations. The aesthetic puzzle arises when even the idea of engaging with a work that has morally repugnant content, say, one that glorifies white supremacy, itself feels completely wrong and repulsive. This is rather puzzling because after all, it is all supposed to be fictional, make-believe. Why do we have so much anxiety over imaging something the author asks us to imagine and aesthetically engage with the work? This puzzling reaction is an extension of the reaction that is discussed under the imaginative puzzle. In these cases, as Walton writes,

      [w]hen moral considerations prevent us from appreciating a work of fiction, this is often, though not always, because we are unable or unwilling to imagine in the way the work calls for. This is the link between the aesthetic puzzle and the imaginative one. (2006: 140)

Distinguishing the puzzles more precisely not only allows for greater conceptual clarity but also helps with reevaluating the previous work done on imaginative resistance, giving us the ability to distinguish real disagreements from pseudo-disagreements. We can reposition these accounts with respect to one another depending on which puzzles they are addressing. For instance, while Stephen Yablo (2002) focuses solely on the fictionality puzzle, Gregory Currie (2002), Currie and Ravenscroft (2002), Peter Goldie (2003), and Shaun Nichols (2006a) address merely the imaginative puzzle. Moran (1994) and Walton (1994) talk about all the puzzles except for the phenomenological puzzle. Gendler (2000) and Derek Matravers (2003) discuss both the imaginative and fictionality puzzle. Gendler (2000) has been criticized heavily for conflating the imaginative and fictionality puzzles; she acknowledges this problem and provides a revised version of her account (2006).

1.3 Dependency and Fundamentality Relations between the Puzzles

Even though there is a consensus among believers in imaginative resistance that there are puzzles of imaginative resistance, there is a dissensus on which puzzles to include. This dissensus is also indicative of disagreements concerning the dependency and fundamentality relations between the puzzles.

Walton has been pushing the line on disentangling the imaginative and fictionality puzzles. He states that while the fictionality puzzle concerns what is and isn’t fictional,

[t]he imaginative puzzle concerns not what is or isn’t fictional, but what we do or do not imagine. These are different; I may recognize that something is fictional, true in the world of a story, without actually imagining it, or imagine something that I take not to be fictional. (2006: 140)

Walton (2006) claims that the fictionality puzzle is more philosophically interesting than its counterpart. The imaginative puzzle concerns why we refuse to, or are unable to, engage with the prompted imagining. Walton thinks that refusal-based imaginative puzzles are not puzzling at all and that it is a matter of empirical study to determine when and how and why they happen (2006: 143). (See Liao et al. 2014 for an empirical study which concludes, contra Walton, that reactions to the imaginative puzzle and fictionality puzzle correlate). Nevertheless, Walton remarks that both puzzles should be connected since fictionality is defined in terms of imagining (2006: 144).

It is questionable the degree of credence he continues to assign to this view, given that Walton (2015), recanting his earlier reductive account of fictionality—according to which “[a] proposition is fictional… just in case there is a prescription to the effect that it is to be imagined”—claims that “prescriptions to imagine are necessary but not sufficient for fictionality” (2015: 17). Walton (2015) states that fictionality turns out to be more fundamental than he had originally thought (Walton 1990—up to 2015).

Kathleen Stock (2017), defending a different theory of truth in fiction, i.e., extreme intentionalism, dismisses the fictionality puzzle as a pseudo-puzzle. According to extreme intentionalism,

the fictional content of a particular text is equivalent to exactly what the author of the text intended the reader to imagine. (2017: 1)

Therefore, as long as a proposition is written into a work of fiction with the intention that it is to be imagined, it is fictional (2017: 123). In this regard, Stock (2017) agrees that there are puzzles of imaginative resistance but disagrees that the fictionality puzzle is one of them.

Cain Samuel Todd (2009), similar to Walton and Stock, states that the fictionality and imaginative puzzles must be separated. He claims that “fictional truth is neither reducible to, nor straightforwardly depends on, imaginability” (2009: 200). Instead of arguing for the fundamentality of one over the other, he denies that they are puzzling at all due to the fact that our resistant reactions might differ due to various factors, such as further beliefs, commitments, and values we hold (2009: 198). Todd is one of the representatives of “eliminativism” which states that imaginative resistance is not a real phenomenon and does not exist outside philosophers’ carefully concocted scenarios. (For more on eliminativism, see section 2.1.3.)

There are other accounts that hold the relation between the imaginative and fictionality puzzles to be more tightly connected. Nils-Hennes Stear (2015) argues for the interconnectivity between the puzzles. The main move he makes in this regard is to conceive of the imaginative puzzle as normative in character, rather than psychological (2015: 8). With respect to the psychological construal of the imaginative puzzle, Stear agrees with Todd that it is not puzzling at all. The puzzling aspect of the imaginative puzzle on his account concerns the norms of proper engagement with works of fiction, as does the fictionality puzzle. How do they differ? Stear writes, “imaginative failure is a datum we must explain, and fictionality failure is the theoretical posit via which we explain it” (2015: 8). (See also Gendler 2006, for an elucidation of the fictionality puzzle as dependent on the imaginative puzzle.)

2. Resistance

The use of the word “resistance” in “imaginative resistance” has been criticized for privileging one of the rival explanations of imaginative resistance over the others. Three main rival explanations of imaginative resistance have been provided thus far: the Cantian, the Wontian, and the Eliminativist (Gendler 2006 coined the first two terms; Gendler and Liao 2016 the third one). Eliminativists deny that the phenomenon exists outside philosophers’ carefully constructed vignettes. The remaining camps, while accepting the existence of the phenomenon, present competing explanations of it. Cantians claim that imaginative resistance occurs when we can’t engage in the prompted imaginative activity. Wontians, by contrast take the phenomenon to involve unwillingness (rather than inability) to engage on the part of the reader or the audience. Cantians and eliminativists have been critical of the use of the word “resistance” because the term itself seems to privilege the Wontian explanation. Even though some philosophers choose to use “imaginative failure” instead of “imaginative resistance”, the replacement term has not stuck—after all, this entry itself is titled “imaginative resistance” (see Stock 2005, Brock 2012, Stear 2015, Tooming 2018). With the acknowledgment that “imaginative resistance” is an umbrella term for the phenomenon that some prefer to explain not in terms of resistance but inability, let’s have a closer look at competing explanations of imaginative resistance.

2.1 The Sources of Resistance

2.1.1 Cantian theories

Cantians take the puzzles of imaginative resistance to arise due to an inability. A number of different versions of cantian theories have been offered and they differ with respect to what they take to be the cause of the inability. There are two main strands of cantian theories: (1) ones that take the cause of inability to be a violation of some type of dependency or grounding relation (dependency-violation theories), and (2) ones that take the cause to be due to a cognitive mismatch (mismatch theories).

Dependency-Violation Theories

The first formulation of a cantian position appears in Walton 1994. He claims that the reason why imaginers experience difficulties in engaging with a fictional work, say one that involves the proposition, ‘In killing her baby, Giselda did the right thing; after all, it was a girl’ (I will refer to this proposition as G) is that they cannot allow the fictional world to differ morally from the actual world (1994: 37). Walton writes,

My best suspicion [as to why we resist allowing fictional worlds to differ from the real world when we do] is that it has something to do with an inability to imagine [certain kinds of dependence] relations being different from how we think they are, perhaps an inability to understand fully what it would be like for them to be different. (Walton 1994: 46; see also Walton 2006: 145)

For Walton, moral principles or properties depend or supervene on natural properties or facts (1994: 45). Being morally wrong rests on certain actions such as the deliberate killing of a newborn female child. That’s why we cannot imagine female infanticide being morally right; we cannot comprehend what it even means. The dependency relations obtain in all worlds—in the actual world as well as in any fictional world. We cannot imagine the violation of these dependency relations even just for the sake of a story. That’s why we cannot accept it as fictionally true that female infanticide is morally right.

Walton’s explanation of the cause of the inability in terms of violation of a dependency relation inspired other accounts (Yablo 2002, Weatherson 2004, Stear 2015). Stephen Yablo claims that a proposition like G triggers imaginative resistance because the concept it expresses is ‘grokking’ or response-enabled (2002: 485). Yablo defines a grokking concept as “one that identifies its object in part by aspects of our experience of it that don’t purport to be representational” (2000 Other Internet Resources). Their extension in a particular context depends on how we ourselves react to them, not how we are represented as reacting or ought to react in the fictional world (2002: 485). That’s why the extension of the term “morally right” in the context of G does not depend on what the author says but on how it strikes us. In this case, its extension to female infanticide strikes us as false, not fictionally true.

Weatherson, building upon the insights he has drawn from Walton and Yablo, suggests that the dependency relation that we are invited to violate in the cases of imaginative resistance is not supervenience but “virtue”:

Virtue: If p is the kind of claim that, if true, must be true in virtue of lower-level facts, and if the story is about those lower-level facts, then it must be true in the story that there is some true proposition r which is about those lower-level facts such that p is true in virtue of r. (2004: 18).

We cannot accept it as fictionally true that Giselda did the right thing because there are no lower-level facts that are specified by the narrator or imported by us from our world to support it. (For more on export-import relations in understanding our engagement with works of fiction, see section 2.1.2.) The same also holds for Craig in Death on a Freeway. The claim that Craig did the right thing in killing Jack and Jill cannot hold in virtue of any of the lower-level facts that are specified in the story, such as the fact that Craig believed that Jack and Jill were the cause of the traffic jam. The higher-level facts that what Giselda or Craig did was wrong are not primitive but they obtain in virtue of lower-level facts, such as facts about the physical features of their actions (2004: 16). The fictionality puzzle arises only when there is a violation of virtue (2004: 24). This violation is responsible for the authorial breakdown. The phenomenological and imaginative puzzles follow from the incoherence created by the violation (2004: 18–20).

Stear (2015) presents a version of cantianism, but his version does not take the imaginative failure or fictionality failure to result from a violation of some kind of metaphysical or conceptual necessity but rather takes it to result from lack of a proper grounding relation. Taking up on some of the insights provided by the eliminativist theories, he claims that imaginative and fictionality failure arise when a work of fiction embeds a proposition that is inadequately and exhaustively grounded (2015: 12). G is inadequately grounded because we are on the lookout for a context that can help us to make sense of the claim. G is exhaustively grounded because no additional context can make it right.

Mismatch Theories

Another strand within cantian explanations of the phenomenon of imaginative resistance takes the inability on the side of the imaginers to result from a kind of a cognitive mismatch or conflict. Jonathan M. Weinberg and Aaron Meskin offer a solution to the puzzle of imaginative resistance (or as they prefer to call it “the puzzle of imaginative blockage”) on the basis of an empirically informed cognitive model of imagination developed on the basis of Shaun Nichols’ and Stephen Stich’s work on imagination (Nichols & Stich 2000, 2003a, 2003b; Nichols 2004). On this model, imaginative resistance arises from a conflict between different cognitive systems. As elements of our cognitive architecture, Weinberg and Meskin identify a belief-box (containing one’s current beliefs) and an imagination-box (containing one’s current imaginings) and the consistency between them is secured by a mechanism called updater which updates one’s beliefs in the face of new information. Another mechanism is called inputter and it is in charge of putting any content whatsoever in one’s imagination box on the basis of one’s decision to do so. There are also domain-specific processes that interact with both the belief-box and the imagination-box, such as moral judgment system(s). In the case of imaginative resistance, a conflict arises between the inputter and the moral judgment system. Upon encountering the sentence G, while the inputter is putting G into the imagination-box, the moral judgment system imposes an independent moral judgment ~G on the basis of the relevant information provided by the work of fiction. This conflict is noticed by the updater and the newly added G is cancelled out. Therefore, G cannot be held in the imagination-box.

Tooming (2018), drawing on the insights provided by some of the wontian and eliminativist theories, differentiates between imagination and mere supposition (for an overview of other accounts that make this distinction, see section 2.5 of the entry on imagination). On Tooming’s picture, (engaged) imagination, unlike mere supposition, requires mental imagery (2018: 690; see the entry on mental imagery and section 2.3 of the entry on imagination). Imagining the truth of a proposition in an engaged manner involves also imagining

a fine-grained sensory array or various arrays that are meant to correspond to the way that the state of affairs represented by the proposition would appear to us. (2018: 691)

For instance, when we form a mental image of Giselda, we might imagine Giselda’s baby wrapped in a pink blanket being handed to her by the nurse, the look on Giselda’s face while killing her baby, etc. But all these details are regulated by the proposition we are asked to imagine, namely G. For a unitary act of engaged imagining, Tooming posits that the mental imaginary and the proposition must match up. In the cases of imaginative resistance, they do not match. We cannot imagine G to be true because our mental imagery of G does not match the content of G. One of the distinguishing features of Tooming’s cantian theory is that it does not presuppose a realist conception of truth in fiction as others do (e.g., the dependency-violation theories of Walton, Weatherson, and Yablo).

Stock (2017) also proposes a version of mismatch cantianism. She argues that imaginative resistance arises in very particular pragmatic contexts which contain invitations not to imagine per se but to counterfactually imagine. Invitations to counterfactually imagine usually involve narrators implying the appropriateness of counterfactual beliefs about what would follow from some of the initial premises in the work of fiction. Counterfactual imagining is a tool that narrators have used to make their audience take on new beliefs: If the imaginers accept all the premises in the work of fiction they will arrive at a new belief, usually a new moral belief. Stock gives the examples of

morally didactic fictions such as Uncle Tom’s Cabin, To Kill a Mockingbird, or Dickens’s Hard Times

as works that

explicitly have the aim of inculcating certain moral beliefs in this way (roughly: if this—indicating some scenario—was real, it would be wrong). (2017: 129)

The resistance raises when an imaginer rejects the beliefs in questions because they are in conflict with their antecedent beliefs. In the Giselda case, one is not merely refusing to imagine that G is true, but instead refusing to believe that G is true because they already believe ~G. The resistance arises because of a mismatch between one’s antecedent beliefs and what the narrator invites them to believe.

2.1.2 Wontian theories

Wontian theories explain the phenomenon of imaginative resistance in terms of unwillingness or lack of desire on the side of the imaginer. Different versions of wontian theories have been proposed and they differ with respect to how they explain the cause of unwillingness.

Gendler (2000) develops the first contemporary version of a wontian theory in response to what she perceives as intractable difficulties facing cantian accounts. Focusing on dependency-violation cantian theories, she conceives of these accounts as premised on the unimaginability of impossibilities. The reason we cannot imagine a proposition such as G is that it represents a conceptually impossible state of affairs and the conceptual impossibility of that state of affairs renders G unimaginable (Gendler 2000: 66 calls this “the impossibility hypothesis”; see Walton 2006: 145 for his rejection of Gendler’s characterization of his account). Gendler then argues that impossibilities are indeed imaginable because imagination does not require possibility but rather only conceivability. To demonstrate this, she concocts a story, The Tower of Goldbach, where twelve turns out to both be and not be the sum of five and seven (2000: 68, cf. Graham Priest’s (1997) Sylvan’s Box, where Sylvan finds an empty box that contains a statue). Even if we are asked to imagine something that is conceptually impossible, we can do so according to Gendler by exploiting our capacity for selective attention. By paying attention to different parts of the story at different times and ignoring others we can ultimately succeed in imagining a conceptual impossibility. Given that we can imagine what is conceptually impossible, some further explanation is required as to why we resist imagining Giselda or Death on the Freeway.

Gendler limits her discussion to cases of imaginative resistance that occur within realist fictions (she calls them “non-distorting fictions” (2000: 77)). When we read realist works of fiction, we feel free to import real world facts into the world of fiction. Indeed, authors presuppose that, in line with the facts they explicitly state, readers will bring in real world facts to fill in what is left unsaid in the story. For instance, while reading a realist fiction, let’s call it Doctors, about the intersecting lives of a group of doctors working at a San Francisco hospital, we might import various facts from our world into the fictional world of the story, such as the laws of physics, Northern Californian weather conditions, facts and norms about social interaction, and so on. At the same time, we feel free to export fictional truths from Doctors that we believe not only hold in the fictional world of Doctors but also in the actual world. Some of these truths can be added to our repertoire in the same way that knowledge by testimony is added. For instance, we can export medical facts from the fiction such as the fact that Graves’ disease can manifest itself as both hyperthyroidism and as an inflammation of the eyes, or that there is a likelihood that one’s thyroid can grow back even after a total thyroidectomy. We might also export facts that we come to learn as a result of reflecting on Doctors. We can add such facts as that workplace romances can get too complicated to our cognitive stock in the same way that we add knowledge gained by modelling.

In encountering cases of imaginative resistance such as Giselda, we come to feel that it is not just part of the story that the author wants us to imagine that G is true, but rather that the author actually endorses G (the doubling of the narrator). In this regard, we cannot simply treat the Giselda case like any other typical case of imagining. In the Giselda case, we feel that we are being asked to export G into our world. Gendler thinks that we are unwilling to engage in the imaginative activity because in doing so we might export the morally deviant outlooks to the actual world, something we would naturally want to avoid. She claims that the

cases that evoke genuine imaginative resistance will be cases where the reader feels that she is being asked to export a way of looking at the actual world which she does not wish to add to her conceptual repertoire. (2000: 77)

Here again Gendler stresses that the wontian explanation she provides is premised on how imagination is distinct from mere supposition and belief. The difference between them explains our general capacity to imagine morally deviant situations (because imagination is distinct from belief) and our general unwillingness to do so (because imagination is distinct from mere supposition) (2000: 81).

Gendler (2006) makes revisions to her earlier explanation of imaginative resistance by downplaying the role of desire and accentuating the role of principles governing the generation of fictional truth in works of fiction.

Gendler’s wontianism focuses solely on the interactions between cognitive imagination and desire while other wontian theories shift the focus towards the role of conative imagination. Gregory Currie (2002) differentiates between two modes of imagining, belief-like (cognitive) imagining and desire-like (conative) imagining. He claims that imaginative resistance arises due to a lack of relevant antecedent desire that can ground one’s desire-like imaginings. Some imaginings are belief-like with respect to their inferential role: imagining that P can lead to new imaginings just as believing that P would lead to new beliefs. If one engages in belief-like imagining some proposition P in the course of reading a story, then they accept P as true within the story and make the appropriate connections and inferences that having such a belief requires. An example would be imagining that Don Quixote is fighting a windmill. Desire-like imaginings, on the other hand, are rather more constrained. Even though we do not seem to have any problem belief-like imagining something we do not believe, we cannot as easily desire-like imagine something we do not desire. This is because desire-like imagining requires there to be an antecedent desire. There are also internal connections between belief-like imaginings and desire-like imaginings when it comes to moral matters, just as there are internal connections between moral beliefs and desires (e.g., believing that X is good also involves desiring X). In an imaginative resistance case such as Giselda, to belief-like imagine that G is true requires one to have a desire-like imagining for female infanticide to occur. Since one’s desire-like imagining is conditioned by their antecedent desires, to have a desire-like imagining that female infants should be killed requires one to have an antecedent desire that female infants should be killed. When one lacks such an antecedent desire, one experiences imaginative resistance.

Dustin Stokes (2006) provides a version of wontianism that involves revising Currie’s account by giving the role played by desire-like imaginings to what he calls “value-like imaginings”. By drawing on David Lewis’ account of valuing (to value x is to desire that one desire x—namely, to have a second-order desire for x), Stokes claims that value-like imagining involves imaginatively desiring to desire that the world be in a certain way. Imaginative resistance arises for instance in the case of Giselda, when we don’t imaginatively desire that we desire for female infanticide to occur.

Julia Driver (2008) proposes a solution to imaginative resistance that builds on the work done by Gendler and Weatherson. It would be incorrect to call it either a strict wontian or cantian account but ultimately she explains resistance reactions in terms of psychological necessity. She suggests that it is the psychological necessity of the claims we take to be morally true that leads to the difficulties we experience when we are invited to imagine their negations. In some cases the resistance is due to our unwillingness. In others,

we are not simply unwilling to entertain their negations, but, rather, we do not now have the desires needed to do so. (2008: 312)

2.1.3 Eliminativist theories

Eliminativist theories reject the notion that there is a puzzling phenomenon called imaginative resistance. They claim that what is depicted by the cantian and the wontian theories alike is that some people might experience some difficulties in engaging with some imaginative activities prompted by some works of fiction. But there is nothing unique about this situation. According to eliminativists, depending on one’s own context and the context specified by the work, resistance reactions might differ but there is nothing puzzling about this.

Stock (2005) focuses on the importance of context. She claims that the reason why we seem to fail to imagine G and fail to accept G as true is that we lack a proper context to make it true and imaginable. When such a context is provided, the resistance reaction dissipates. G, in the absence of such a context, is not conceptually coherent and that is why we cannot comprehend what G really means. Stock writes,

[t]o demonstrate conceptual coherence for [G], the right sort of fictional context needs to be supplied: for instance, the conceptual coherence of [G] is demonstrated once one imagines that in the town in which Giselda lives, girl children inevitably face atrocious lives—are placed into unspeakable slavery, for instance—if they are allowed to live. (2005: 617)

She claims that imaginative failure results from “the contingent incomprehensibility of the relevant proposition” because one cannot think of a context that would make the proposition we are prompted to imagine true (2005: 608). The account has been criticized for disregarding what Weatherson calls the “That’s all” clause that is implicitly embedded in works that trigger resistance (Weatherson 2004: 20). Of course, the addition of the life of slavery into the context may affect resistance reactions, but the whole issue is that there is no such elaborate context supplied by the author. As long as no such context is implied or explicitly stated, we should assume that there is nothing more to the Giselda story other than that Giselda did the right thing by killing her baby just because she was a girl. The question posed by the phenomenon of imaginative resistance is why we experience imagining Giselda in the way that we do given that we know that it is just fiction. (See Nanay 2010, for an explanation of imaginative resistance as involving another type of incomprehensibility. According to Nanay, resistance arises because the narrator appears to the imaginer to be violating a maxim akin to Grice’s Cooperative Principle. This turns the imaginer’s attention away from the fiction and towards its author, hence producing the doubling of the narrator effect discussed by Gendler (Nanay 2010: 591).)

Todd points out that differences in the context of the fictional works, as well as differences in our own context as imaginers, generate a range of possible resistance reactions to the same deviant contents. Our own context, which is constituted partially by our further beliefs, commitments, and values, influences not only how we interpret the proposition we are invited to imagine but also our evaluations. Todd claims that the strong reactions cantian theories depict as the “appropriate” responses to scenarios such as Giselda or Death on the Freeway are far-fetched and that only those who share cantians’ realist commitments when it comes to morality or truth in fiction would react in those ways. Furthermore, not all moral violations are on a par: Thick moral concepts, as opposed to thin ones, require stronger descriptive and evaluative conditions. The context specified by the work and our interpretative context themselves might also have effects on how we interpret the thickness of concepts. Todd concludes,

[f]or, although psychologically interesting, it appears to be a ‘natural’ and entirely un-puzzling feature of imagination that it should be so relative; where by ‘natural’ is meant merely that imagining just is a capacity that is subject to degree, and dependent on and relative to a range of further beliefs, commitments, values and so on. (2009: 198)

The variety of resistance reactions due to the context of the fiction as well as the imaginer’s own context leads eliminativists to dismiss the phenomenon of imaginative resistance as a genuine phenomenon (see Tanner 1994 and Mothersill 2003 for other defenses of eliminativism). However, their insights concerning context relativity have led to further research on imaginative resistance (more on that in section 2.3).

2.2 The Object of Resistance

Another point of contention within imaginative resistance research concerns the object of resistance. What is involved in our resisting to engage with a fictional work? So far we have seen various accounts that attempt to give explanations of imaginative resistance while assuming that what is resisted is propositional content. There are other options. According to Moran (1994), our engagement with works of fiction cannot be reduced merely to imagining propositional contents but also includes interpretive and emotional responses to fiction. In point of fact, the content of our engagement is largely non-propositional. He rejects the clear-cut distinction between the actual and the fictional and claims that our interpretative and emotional responses to fiction are actual rather than imagined. Moran distinguishes between hypothetical and dramatic imagination (1994: 104–5). Hypothetical imagining involves seeing what would follow from a propositional content you are given, entertaining the assumption of its truth. Dramatic imagining or imagining with respect to emotional attitudes involves trying on a perspective, a dramatic rehearsal so to speak. The phenomenon of imaginative resistance involves both kinds of imagining. A resistance triggering scenario would do so because (1) we have difficulties entertaining the assumption of its truth because the storyline does not add up and (2) we have difficulties inhabiting the perspective because it is alien to us.

One of the problems with Moran’s account is that it is not clear how we can account for what Elizabeth Camp (2017) calls “disparate response”. Disparate response refers to

readers’ ability and willingness to alter their emotional, moral and other evaluative responses from those they would have to the same situation in real life. (2017: 73)

Since Moran challenges the strict actual/fictional divide, he seems to run into a problem when it comes to explaining disparate response. Camp (2017), drawing on Moran’s work, presents a unified explanation of both imaginative resistance and disparate responses by appealing to perspectives. She defines perspective as

an open-ended disposition to notice, explain, and respond to situations in the world — an ability to “go on the same way” in assimilating and responding to whatever information and experiences one encounters. (2017: 78)

Engaging with works of fiction involves taking on perspectives that are prescribed by the narrators. That is how non-propositional content is communicated to audiences. In cases of imaginative resistance, what we resist is taking on alien perspectives. Our resistance might be caused by various types of inconsistencies embedded in the work or we might resist on prudential, moral, or aesthetic grounds. One important aspect of Camp’s theory is that these resistance reactions are not always voluntary (2017: 92–3). She also argues that her account has an advantage over competing theories because she does not reduce the content of imaginings to propositional content. (See also Goldie 2003, for a similar explanation of imaginative resistance.)

2.3 The Scope of Resistance

The proposals put forward by cantians, wontians, and eliminativists have reshaped the scope of imaginative resistance. Its scope has been both narrowed down and expanded in different respects.

2.3.1 Inclusivity

Cantian theories have opened up a theoretical space in which to question the assumed asymmetry between the imaginability of morally and nonmorally deviant content. Given that dependence/supervenience/virtue relations also hold between different kinds of higher-level and lower-level properties or facts other than moral kinds, violations of these relations can trigger resistance as well. Therefore, our list of resistance-triggering claims should be more inclusive and include not only counter-evaluative claims but also counter-descriptive claims (inclusivity thesis). Kendall Walton (1994) claims that other kinds of normative deviances such as aesthetic deviance can also trigger resistance. Imagine that a comedian in a story tells a dumb knock knock joke (e.g., “Knock, knock”. “Who’s there?” “Cow says”. “Cow says who?” “No, a cow says mooooo!”) No matter how much effort the author thereafter expends, we would not be persuaded of its hilarity.

Yablo (2002) argues that imaginative resistance arises due to deviant use of response-dependent descriptive concepts, such as shape. We might thereby experience resistance when we are asked to imagine the beauty and elegance of a monster truck competition or that the five-fingered maple leaf that Sally is holding is oval. Weatherson (2004) goes even further to claim that, alongside deviant attribution of thick moral concepts and deviant evaluative sentences, other triggers of imaginative resistance include sentences expressing deviant epistemic evaluations, attributions of mental states, attributions of mental or linguistic content, deviant use of some shape predicates, some deviant ontological claims, and deviant claims about constitution. For instance, according to Weatherson, we cannot imagine, in an alternative Quixote story of his own concoction, that Quixote’s favorite item of furniture is a television which is for all intents and purposes indistinguishable from a common knife. What counts as a television is tied to certain functional roles and these roles are missing in the story. (See Barnes & Black 2016 and Kim, Kneer, & Stuart 2019 for empirical studies that examine whether the type of the deviant claim—its being counter-evaluative or counter-descriptive—makes a difference in resistance reactions. On the basis of their studies, Black and Barnes come to the conclusion that the type of the claim makes vast individual differences between resistance reactions, while Kim et al. conclude that “imaginative resistance depends on the weirdness of content, not whether the claim is evaluative or descriptive” (2019: 160).)

Anna Mahtani (2012) questions whether it is the case that imaginative resistance only arises in situations that involve conflict between some fictional proposition and what we believe to be the case. Justifications of female infanticide, slavery, or genocide non-controversially are in conflict with our moral norms. Mahtani argues against the notion that conflict is a necessary element of imaginative resistance by claiming that there are cases which (i) generate imaginative resistance and (ii) are not properly characterizable as involving a conflict between an utterance in the fiction and the reader’s beliefs. She gives the example of a story involving a character named Lucy who performs a morally ambiguous action (2012: 419). Mahtani claims that the author’s pronouncement of the rightness of this morally ambiguous action will be met with resistance, even though the author’s claim does not directly conflict with our beliefs regarding Lucy’s action.

2.3.2 Genre

One of the main contributions of eliminativist accounts to discussions regarding the scope of imaginative resistance comes from their insistence on the importance of context. When this insight is combined with Gendler’s (2000) emphasis on the importance of the realist genre, the result has been a proliferation of accounts defending the relevance of genre in determining the quantitative differences between people’s resistance reactions (Weinberg 2008, Nanay 2010, Liao et al. 2014, Liao 2016). The main idea is that our reactions to the same moral deviation, let’s say female infanticide, can differ depending on the genre of the work in which they occur. One might take place in the context of an Aztec or a Greek myth, or science-fiction, and the other might take place in the context of a realist fiction. Liao et al. (2014) conducted two empirical studies to put this idea to the test and demonstrate that genre is salient in explaining resistance reactions and variations. On the basis of their Study 1, they concluded that lack of genre competence strongly correlates with comparative difficulties in imagining a morally deviant proposition and accepting it as true. On the basis of their Study 2, they concluded that genre manipulation can lead to variation in the resistance reactions triggered by the same proposition. (See Phelan 2017 in Other Internet Resources for a replication of the studies; see Black et al. 2018 for a study that examines the salience of genre familiarity to resistance reactions.)

In his 2016 article, Liao expands on the results of this previous collaborative research and paper. He claims that the empirical studies show that genre conventions limit the types of propositions that can appear within the context of a work, so the fictionality puzzle arises due to genre convention-discordant propositions (2016; 474). He adds that each genre convention is associated with different expectations as to what kind of propositions can appear within this genre (2016: 471). Therefore, the imaginability puzzle arises because we find it comparatively difficult to imagine genre expectation-discordant propositions. For instance, in a realistic fiction, we expect all the propositions to be in compliance with our real-world moral norms. This expectation does not apply if the work is an Aztec myth or a Greek tragedy.

2.3.3 Bias

Another ripple effect of eliminativists’ theories, particularly Todd’s theory, has been the focus on the importance of the imaginer’s own context for generating variations in imaginative resistance reactions. Adriana Clavel-Vazquez (2018) discusses a special kind of imaginative resistance case which makes it clear that it is not only the context of the fictional work (its genre) that has effects on our engagement but also our own context as well. The case she discusses involves rough heroines.

Rough heroes are deeply morally flawed protagonists that demand appreciators’ allegiance. We owe the term “rough heroes” to David Hume (1757 [1875: 322]); however it is Anne Eaton who gives us the list of conditions for being a rough hero (2012: 281–292). Clavel-Vazquez improves on Eaton’s list (2018: 203):

  1. his moral flaws are grievous,
  2. his flaws are an integral part of his personality,
  3. the rough hero intentionally engages in immoral actions and his remorse is not a central part of the narrative,
  4. the audience is not prescribed to forgive him or dismiss his actions as the result of misfortune, weakness, or ignorance,
  5. his vices are not outweighed by other morally relevant features.

Some examples given of rough heroes are Breaking Bad’s Walter White and Hannibal Lecter in Silence of the Lambs. The interesting aspect of rough heroes is that even though they have all these negative characteristics, we still end up aligning ourselves with them due to pro-attitudes prescribed by the narrative despite the initial resistance we feel. Indeed, the created tension is necessary for proper appreciation: the tension between condemning the hero due to his moral flaws and developing pro-attitudes towards the hero due to narrative encouragement eventually leads to overcoming our initial resistance to the hero and to aligning ourselves with him. Eaton considers this created tension and the subsequent overcoming of the tension to be the narrative’s artistic achievement (2012: 285).

Clavel-Vazquez argues that there exists an asymmetry between rough heroes and rough heroines (she calls this the “affective puzzle”). In the case of the rough heroines, it is less likely for us to overcome our resistance. Indeed, the almost nonexistence of rough heroines, she claims, attests to that fact. The narrative does not seem to have equal success when it comes to rough heroines, and this might be the narrative’s fault. We have various examples of almost-workable rough heroines, such as Amy Dunne in Gone Girl, Claire Underwood in House of Cards, and so on. But we are either not able to feel allegiance with them, or they are not as ethically transgressive as their male counterparts. (One exception seems to be Villanelle in Killing Eve so far.) Clavel-Vazquez argues that we resist aligning ourselves with rough heroines because in being morally transgressive they break with gender norms and expectations. Our sexist biases affect our resistance reactions. According to her, this means that when we examine the cause of imaginative resistance, we need to keep in mind our own interpretative horizons, which are shaped by our sociocultural context.

The existence of variation in imaginative resistance reactions led the eliminativists to conclude that imaginative resistance is not a genuine phenomenon. Starting with a second wave of research on imaginative resistance (around 2010), variation is taken to be something that can be accounted for (see Gendler and Liao 2016 for the first and second wave distinction). According to some, it should be accounted for by an all-encompassing theory (e.g., Peterson 2019), and according to others it should be addressed by adopting explanatory pluralism (e.g., Liao et al. 2014). This variation-sensitivity has since been one of the general themes in imaginative resistance research and one of the influences responsible for the proliferation of empirical research in the field. (See Black and Barnes 2017 for a psychological study that aims to show that there are different influences on our resistance reactions, such as disgust sensitivity.)

3. Imagination

The use of the word “imaginative” in “imaginative resistance” has been criticized for disregarding the fact that not all resistance reactions are related to the imagination and it has been suggested that perhaps imagination might have nothing to do with the resistance reactions. One of the debates on imaginative resistance has dealt with whether imaginative resistance cases put constraints on our cognitive imagination (belief-like imagining) or conative imagination (desire-like imagining), or fail to put any constraints on the imagination at all (see sections 2.1 and 2.2 of the entry on imagination for explanations of the relation between imagination and belief, on the one hand, and the relation between imagination and desire, on the other). It is possible to regroup some of the theories of imaginative resistance that have been covered in Section 2, alongside other theories, with respect to this debate.

Miyazono and Liao (2016) take on this task and provide a detailed taxonomy of the positions in the imaginative resistance literature with respect to what psychological components of the human mind they take to be necessary for explaining imaginative resistance. The theories can be divided into three main groups: cognitive imagination theories, conative imagination theories, and no-imagination theories.

3.1 Imagination Theories

According to cognitive imagination theories, imaginative resistance reactions reflect either our inability or unwillingness to take on belief-like imaginings. We might not be able to take on the imaginings because cognitive imaginings are processed by the same system that is in charge of processing similar beliefs (see Nichols 2004, 2006a; Weinberg & Meskin 2006). Or we might not be able to cognitively imagine higher-level claims in the absence of support from lower-level facts because such belief-like imaginings are possible only when they receive adequate lower-level support as ordinary beliefs do (see Walton 1994, 2006; Weatherson 2004; Stear 2015). Or we might be unable or unwilling to take on the belief-like imaginings because we do not want to export them or believe them given a conflicting belief we hold or our lack of trust for the narrator (Gendler 2000, 2006; Matravers 2003; Stock 2017).

According to conative imagination theories, we cannot desire-like or value-like imagine what we are asked to because we lack the necessary desire or second-order desire to do so (see Currie 2002 and Stokes 2006).

3.2 No-Imagination Theories

No-imagination theories appeal neither to cognitive imagination nor to conative imagination in their explanations of the mechanism(s) involved in the resistance reactions.

Gendler (2008a, 2008b) claims that alief, which she proposes as an innate propensity to automatically respond to a real or apparent stimulus, is what is responsible for resistance reactions, not imagination (for more on alief, see section 3.3 of the entry on imagination). Alief is more primitive and fundamental than cognitive or conative imagination. It is responsible for generating a resistance response to prompted imaginings due to the perceived (perhaps unconsciously perceived or registered) possibility of contagion.

Another explanation of imaginative resistance that locates the source of resistance reactions somewhere other than the imagination puts emotions center stage. Ronald de Sousa (2010) claims that what is going on in resistance cases is not that we are unable to make sense of the content of the imagined situation but that we fail to experience certain emotional responses or fail to respond altogether to certain imagined prospects. For instance, Giselda engenders moral repulsion on the side of the imaginer while prescribing that they feel moral allegiance or approval. The knock-knock joke, on the other hand, fails to engender amusement while the author insists that we find it hilarious.

4. Conclusion

As we have seen, in “the puzzle of imaginative resistance” so far only the word “of” has been uncontentious. However, this should not be taken as a sign of impasse. Instead of engendering confusion and disorientation, the liveliness of the debate points to the richness of the topic and openings for new fronts in imaginative resistance research. This area of inquiry is still in its early stages and further research is needed on all of the topics discussed above. Some of most pressing research questions include: Are there ungrounded/unjustified imaginative resistance reactions? How can one overcome ungrounded/unjustified imaginative resistance reactions? How can we revise the extant theories to account for variation in resistance reactions and diversity of resistance-triggering claims? There is much more we can gather from further empirical research on the topic, and there is plenty of opportunity for further research on the broader implications imaginative resistance has for fields such as moral psychology, aesthetic psychology, cognitive architecture, semantics and pragmatics of evaluative terms, modal epistemology, and so on (building on the work of scholars such as Levy 2005, Driver 2008, Levin 2012).


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