Philosophy of Immunology

First published Thu Dec 22, 2016; substantive revision Thu May 7, 2020

Philosophy of immunology is a subfield of philosophy of biology dealing with ontological and epistemological issues related to the studies of the immune system. While speculative investigations and abstract analyses have always been part of immune theorizing, until recently philosophers have largely ignored immunology. Yet the implications for understanding the philosophical basis of organismal functions framed by immunity offer new perspectives on fundamental questions of biology and medicine. Developed in the context of history of medicine, theoretical biology, and medical anthropology, philosophy of immunology differs from these related branches of study in its focus on traditional philosophical questions concerning identity, individuality, ecology, cognition, scientific methodology and theory construction. This broad agenda derives from immunology’s multifaceted research program that has developed from its initial clinical challenges of host defense, transplantation, autoimmunity, tumor immunology, and allergy. In addition to these well-established research areas, immunity is now understood to play a central role in other physiological functions, development, ecology, and evolutionary mechanics. Holding together these diverse domains of inquiry lie philosophical commitments oriented by organismal identity. In this regard, pertinent issues are raised concerning

  1. cognition (organization of immune perception and information processing),
  2. the character of individuality (framed by the ecological context of immune-mediated assimilation and rejection), and
  3. the dynamics of complex systems (understood as holistic systems biology).

Indeed, immunology, in the context of cognitive science, evolutionary biology, environmental sciences, and development provides multi-focal perspectives for philosophy of science.

1. Introduction

The immune system is typically represented as a system of defense that protects the organism from pathogens. However, this system is known to play other functions in the organism that include

  1. regeneration and repair of damaged tissues, scar formation, and wound healing (Forbes and Rosenthal 2014);
  2. surveillance against malignancies (Swann and Smyth 2007);
  3. regulation of ontogenetic transformations (Ramos 2012);
  4. modulation of nutrient metabolism (Zmora et al. 2017);
  5. establishment of mutualistic relationships with commensals (Kurashima and Kiyono 2017);
  6. regulation of sexual partner selection and prevention of fusion between genetically discordant individuals (Davis 2014);
  7. modulation of neuro-functions by affecting mood, memory, cognition, social behavior and spatial learning (Derecki et al. 2010; Filiano et al. 2016); and
  8. participation in a bidirectional crosstalk with other bodily cells by means of a variety of growth factors and metabolic regulatory signals (Burzyn, Benoist, and Mathis 2013; Davies et al. 2013).

Thus, by responding to the inner and outer environments of the organism, the immune system participates in many capacities to coordinate diverse physiological functions and to provide communication between them. Immunity thus relies upon cognitive functions coupled to an array of effector mechanisms that have wide-ranging regulative, reparative, and defensive capabilities. Beyond the philosophical significance of these immune-mediated functions, studies of immunity are uniquely positioned to address central problems in philosophy of biology (see entry) and, more broadly, philosophy of science. These include the reductionism/holism debate, the characterization of the goals and methods of systems biology, the organization of cognition and information, and the challenge of integrating complexity theory with big data studies.

Despite the multifaceted role of the immune system and its importance in promoting survival and persistence of all forms of life (Pradeu 2012: 22–32), immunology has traditionally been of minor interest to philosophers of biology (cf. Hull and Ruse 2007; Sarkar and Plutynski 2010). However, increased attention has recently been directed to address a range of ontological and epistemological problems related to immune phenomena. These studies have focused upon the “immune self”, the central motif of biological identity in the context of immunity (Tauber 1994; Pradeu 2012). Ranging over diverse topics, including personal identity (Howes 1999), ethical and anthropological concerns with human self-image (Sontag 1990; E. Martin 1994), and poststructuralist, constructivist and feminist notions of identity (Derrida 2003; Haraway 1989; Weasel 2001), philosophers have invoked immunological conceptions of selfhood. Moreover, the examination of immunology has proven increasingly useful in addressing philosophical problems pertaining to other fields of study such as ecology (Tauber 2017), neuro- and cognitive sciences (Varela et al. 1988), developmental biology (Fagan 2007), microbiology (Méthot and Alizon 2014) and evolutionary biology (Hull, Langman, and Glenn 2001). This increased recognition of immunology in philosophy of biology not only reflects a growing trend towards more inclusive approaches, more generally, but also contributes to the intensifying effort to understand ecological dynamics that range from microbial interactions to climate change (O’Malley and Dupre 2007; O’Malley 2014).

Immunologists have long applied philosophy to elaborate conceptual frameworks for understanding the immune system and to shed light on the character of experimental conduct in this biomedical field (Anderson 2014). To highlight the common culture of immunology and philosophy, a prominent Australian immunologist, Macfarlane Burnet, wrote in 1965: “Immunology has always seemed to me more a problem in philosophy than in practical science” (Burnet 1965). He was inspired by Whitehead in elaborating his notion of immune selfhood and by his attempts to apply cybernetics and information theory to immunology (Anderson and Mackay 2014). Another influential, philosophically-oriented immunologist, Niels Jerne, admitted to having been influenced by Kierkegaard’s discussion of Plato’s Meno when elaborating his key conceptual ideas (i.e., the selection theory of antibody production) (Jerne 1966, Söderqvist 2003: 186). And perhaps most prominently, Ludwik Fleck’s immunological and bacteriological research served as the case example of a “thought collective” that has served as the founding study of the social character of scientific change in biology and science (Löwy 1986; Fagan 2009; see the entry on Ludwik Fleck). Many other prominent immunological researchers, including Metchnikoff, Zinsser, Medawar, Edelman and Salk, were also humanist thinkers who, in addition to active laboratory research, conspicuously expounded philosophical ideas on the nature of reality, the character of cognition, the limits of science, the condition of humankind, and the like. Thus, a rich bidirectional exchange between philosophy and immunology has been established over a long tradition.

2. Organism-Level Functions of the Immune System

The basic schema of vertebrate immunity consists of two evolutionary distinct ways to perceive the organism’s external environment and to monitor its inner state. The first modality, more primitive and less refined in its perceptive mechanisms, is referred to as the “innate” or “natural” immune system. This arm of immunity is composed of a variety of primordial phagocytes—“eating cells”—possessing distinctive characteristics based on their tissue distribution. They ingest particulate microbes and destroy effete, cancerous, and damaged host cells. These immunocytes constitute the first line of the immune encounter and comprise the “resting” state of physiological immunity as they “police” on-going processes of surveillance and restoration. This system has autonomous functions, but the incorporation of antigen (a substance that stimulates an immune response) may also lead to integration with the second mode of immunity, the so called, “acquired” immune system. This second arm of immunity has evolved mechanisms that are highly specific in their recognition capabilities and exhibit immune “memory” of previous sensitization. Acquired immunity is mediated by several classes of lymphocytes that may be stimulated by phagocyte first-encounters or as primary responders under certain pathological conditions. The B-lymphocytes produce antibody that recognizes antigens by structural homology and, correspondingly, T-cells have specific antigen-matching receptors on their cell surface. The initial recognition event leads to activation of a variety of effector reactions that destroy the immune target. However, the decision not to respond is also a recognition event and results in immune “tolerance”. Both the innate and acquired immune cellular elements are regulated by a vast array of soluble molecular factors that serve to either activate or dampen immune responses. The complexity of diverse cell types, the mediators of their interactions, the contextual determinants that determine immune reactivity, and the wide range of physiological functions in which immunity participates, has defied comprehensive modeling. Consequently, immunology offers a fecund example of biological organizational complexity, which, in turn, leads to the fundamental philosophical question: On what basis is organismal identity established and maintained?

Immunology, from its earliest inception, has been concerned with biological identity—its establishment and maintenance. In its original iteration, immunity was conceived as that function that preserved the integrity of the organism in terms of protecting and restoring its individuality. Thus, immune functions testified to the persistence of a stable, core identity defined in terms of its insularity and autonomy. Indeed, individuality undergirded the science from its inception, for the defense against pathogens was framed by an attacked patient (individual) pitted against alien others, the invaders. In this scenario, distinct borders mark individual identity, and immunity is the response to the violation of those boundaries. However, challenges to this conception of immunity have recently appeared. Emphasizing the contextual placement of the organism, notions of demarcated boundaries that have characterized traditional definitions of the organism are being revised.

Generally understood, an individual replicates itself and possesses anatomic borders, a harmonious communication between its parts, a division of labor for the benefit of the whole, and a system of hierarchical dominance and control. By these criteria, the immune system is responsible for establishing and maintaining the integrity of such an individual (Pradeu 2016). However, symbiosis challenges this entrenched definition of the individual organism: shared physiologies govern homeostasis; anatomic margins lose clear definition; development is intertwined among several phylogenetically defined entities; and the unit of evolutionary selection becomes a multiplex genome (see the entry on the biological notion of individual). On this consortium view, notions of individuality are replaced with complexes of organisms that defy any singular definition of organismal identity as independent agents (Löwy 1991; S. Gilbert, Sapp, and Tauber 2012). In terms of commensal relationships, symbiosis, mediated by immune tolerance, signifies stabilized adaptation to the complex of diverse living elements that live in a cohesive ecology, both within and external to the traditional borders of the organism. When oriented by ecological relationships, immunology moves from its dominant concern with autonomous individuality to include the science of cooperative assemblies of organisms. The ontological implications of this re-formulation are highly significant for philosophical considerations of identity as discussed below (see the entry on identity).

2.1 Diachronic identity

The diachronic identity of an organism, its capacity to remain the same despite transformations, has puzzled philosophers since ancient Greece. Aristotle postulated the existence of immutable forms, that, being distinct from fluctuating matter, ensure the continued identity of living creatures (Categories, 3b22–33; Metaphysics, Book D). Dissatisfied with this solution, Locke proposed that temporal identity of animals and plants is not ensured by their unvarying forms, but rather by the continuity of their lived life (Locke 1689, II.27.4 and II.27.8; Kaufman 2016). In the context of contemporary philosophy of biology, the importance of continuous identity was emphasized by Hull who argued that species lack essences and thus should be considered historical individuals with their own inner coherence and persistence conditions not unlike those of other living creatures (Hull 1978). He assumed that these persistence conditions are provided by continuity of changes in biological organization of these individuals so that only an abrupt disruption could cause a loss or change of identity (Hull 1992; Hull 1978: 355). This latter perspective has recently been adopted by advocates of animalism, who argue that continuity of physiological processes (organic animalism) or maintenance of characteristic structural organization (somatic animalism) are necessary for diachronic identity (Olson 1997; van Inwagen 1990; Mackie 1999; see the entry on animalism).

Immunology steps into the diachronic identity debate with Burnet’s hypothesis that during embryonic development, the immune system learns to tolerate a defined set of molecules as “self” (Burnet 1959: 59). He proposed that autoreactive immune cells (lymphocytes) were purged during embryonic development to leave only those lymphocytes that ignore specific antigens encountered during this early stage (Burnet 1957). Defined negatively by a gap in the lymphocyte repertoire, immunological selfhood was assumed to persist in the adult as an invariant molecular ‘essence’ of the organism, analogous to an unwavering psychological ego (Burnet 1959; Tauber 1994: 194). As observed by Pradeu and Carosella, this self/nonself model supported a substantialist view of identity in so far as it presupposed that the immune system ensures integrity of a preserved metaphysical core (Pradeu and Carosella 2006a: 246).

To provide a distinct view of the immune system’s role in diachronic identity, Pradeu advocates the so-called “genidentity” view (Pradeu 2018). On this view, two objects are identical if their states are continuously connected over time (Lewin 1922). To specify which continuous states ensure temporal identity of an organism, Pradeu refers to those “immune interactions [that] isolate some continuous biochemical interactions, which in turn individuate the organism” (Pradeu 2012: 248–249). Accordingly, the immune system reacts to rapid molecular alterations in the pattern of biochemical interactions and thus helps to ensure that these interactions are continuous and unperturbed. Of note, which continuous process should be followed to define diachronic identity is not observer independent and must be adjusted to a particular theoretical perspective (Guay and Pradeu 2016: 318; Pradeu 2018).

However, the idea that the immune system contributes to organismal identity maintenance has to be weighed against evidence suggesting that immunity contributes to the accommodation of change. At the end of the nineteenth century, Metchnikoff proposed that phagocytes (primitive immune cells) were agents of organismal transformation, driving metamorphic and developmental alterations (Metchnikoff 1901 [1905]; Tauber and Chernyak 1991). This early view has been supported by recent evidence that the immune system actively participates in mediating transformations in organismal identity by constantly redefining and modulating immune reactivity towards endogenous and exogenous molecules (Tauber 2017). This is most apparent during development as illustrated by the activity of brain-resident macrophages (microglia), which, by impacting angiogenesis/vascularization, as well as the migration, proliferation and apoptosis of neurons, influence social behavioral and sexual identity (Wynn, Chawla, and Pollard.2013; Lenz and Nelson 2018).

Tolerance of newly encountered antigens demonstrates the “fluid” state of the reactive immune repertoire that undergoes alteration over the lifespan of the organism (Grignolio et al. 2014). And with a changing “immune biography”, biological identity no longer conforms to the simple binary division of self and nonself that has hitherto characterized immune theorizing. Accordingly, animals have no immutable molecular essence that would ensure persistence of identity, at least as determined by immune tolerance or rejection (León-Letelier, Bonifaz, and Fuentes-Pananá 2019). Identity then becomes an ever-changing process of accepted transformations and rejected entries. From this vantage point, the animalist definitions of diachronic identity as a mere persistence of life or even an underlying constancy fails to account for the dynamic quality of immune-mediated identity transitions (van Inwagen 1990: 148–149; Olson 1997; Mackie 1999; Roy and Hebrok 2015; Dupré 2017). Consequently, the immune processual point of view defines organismal persistence as “a coordinated group of changes” rather than as an invariant state or a continuous connection between such states. This understanding has important implications for philosophy of biology and ontology, more generally (Dupré 2014; Nicholson and Dupre 2018; Meincke 2018).

2.2 Synchronic identity

While diachronic identity of an organism is understood as its persistence though time, synchronic identity is defined in terms of its individuality or distinctiveness (Sober 2000: 154). Attempts have been made to identify distinguishing characteristics such as functional autonomy, possession of mutually interdependent parts, genetic homogeneity and spatial boundaries (Clarke 2010). Others, pointing to the heterogeneous character of biological individuals, have argued that no sole feature can serve as a universal determinant of individuality (see the entry on the biological notion of individual). Part of the contention resides in differing frames of reference of study: Most considerations of synchronic individuality focus upon evolutionary individuals as units of selection (Gould and Lloyd 1999) that differs from how physiological individuals might be distinguished (Pradeu 2016). Regardless of their involvement in evolution, organisms exhibit various levels of physiological and morphological integration that makes their indivisibility problematic (Godfrey-Smith 2009). Immunology contributes to discussions of individuality in this latter sense by considering the role of the immune system in defining the boundaries of the organism by the functional measures of rejection or assimilation.

Pradeu formulated such criteria and proposed that the immune system plays the central role in determining what is included in the organism and what is not (Pradeu 2012). The differentiation is based on his continuity/discontinuity model, which depicts the immune system reacting to transient alterations in the pattern of antigen receptor interactions and tolerates long-lasting modifications (Pradeu, Jaeger, & Vivier 2013; Pradeu & Carosella 2006a: 241, 2006b). Such a mechanism is based on recognizing that autoimmunity is a normal function of immunity (Tauber 2015). Because host antigens do not evoke an immune response, a stable, “continuity” of immune interactions establishes an activation threshold that initiates an immune response only upon a rapid increase in antigenic load. The immune system thus distinguishes the stable state of tolerant recognition of tonic signals arising from normal physiological process in contrast to the appearance of novel antigens, for example, arising from pathogen invasion or tissue injury (Grossman and Paul 1992; Myers, Zikherman and Roose 2017; Pradeu 2012: 246; Grossman 2019). Thus the development of tolerance to frequently encountered antigens, commensals, tissue grafts and anastomosed animals results in the establishment of stable, integrated associations mediated by low-grade immune interactions (Pradeu and Carosella 2006a, 2006b; Pradeu 2012: 251–252). In this formulation, the immune system plays a central role in defining an individual by permitting beneficial physiological inclusion of heterologous components.

Others refer to these stable immune interactions with microbiota to deny that organisms are individuals (S. Gilbert, Sapp, and Tauber 2012). Appreciating the ubiquity of symbiosis, the immune system from this point of view becomes a key mediator of the holobiont by tolerating and coordinating microbial-host relationships. On this basis, these critics highlight that most of these interactions fall on a dynamic spectrum of rejection and acceptance making it impossible, in principle, to determine the boundaries of individuality. Symbiotic interactions do not conform to a simple acceptance-rejection model. Rather, to attune its responses to microbial signals the immune system launches a broad spectrum of T-cell reactions in combination with a variety of innate immune and tissue cell-derived signals (cytokines, hormones, neurotransmitters) in combination with complex regulatory controls (Eberl 2016). As suggested by Cohen, immunity is the product of an active computational state that constantly assesses the state of the organism’s internal state and the surroundings in which it lives (Cohen 2007a, 2007b). In the context of such fluid activity, transitioning from one unique activation state to another does not allow definitive delineation of organismal borders. Instead, the immune system acts as gatekeeper that controls the apparent boundary between the organism and its environment (Tauber 2008: 231; Tauber 2017; S. Gilbert, Sapp, and Tauber 2012). From this perspective, the view of immunity as protecting insularity shifts to recognizing its role in establishing and maintaining communal relationships that blur the distinction of an atomistic insular individuality (Skillings 2016).

The self/nonself, tolerance/response dichotomies collapse altogether, when considered in the context of mammalian pregnancy, where various modalities are employed to preserve the temporary immune sanctuary of the ‘foreign’ fetus (Howes 2007; A. Martin 2010). Studies of immune-mediated exchanges between the mother and the fetus not only challenge our view of immunity as concerned with rejection and defense, but also transform our understanding of biological individuality (Erlebacher 2013; Howes 2008). More specifically, recent studies undermine the vision of the maternal immune system as antagonistic to the fetus and rather point to active immune participation in the formation of an amalgamated maternal-fetal individual, whose ontological status lies at the continuum between unification and distinctiveness (Howes 2008). Delineation of the role of inflammation during blastocyst implantation further supports this interactive vision, demonstrating that instead of acting as a rejection response, inflammation promotes a mutually tolerant fusion between the embryo and the mother (Griffith et al. 2017; Mor, Aldo, and Alvero 2017). Indeed, the transformation of an inflammation-induced reaction pathway into a cell differentiation pathway in decidual stromal cells exhibits the intimate connection of the immune and reproductive systems in eutherians (G. Wagner, Erkenbrack, and Love 2019; Nuño de la Rosa, Pavlicev, and Etxeberria 2019, in Other Internet Resources).

In conclusion, despite significant contributions of philosophy of immunology to debates about identity, no straightforward answer to the question of how the immune system contributes to biological individuality has been offered. Considering the actual individualization practices in various fields of biology, it may well be concluded that no single account of the biological individual suffices and that the question of whether particular criteria are valid or not depends on the research perspective adopted. Part of the conundrum may lie in the efforts to consider the issue at the metaphysical, rather than at the epistemological level (Love 2018, Love and Brigandt 2017). As discussed below, the status of the “immune self” is a fecund case in point.

2.3 The immune self

Wide use of the self/nonself distinction in different clinical and research traditions (provided by the relaxed and varied meanings associated with its use) has established such discrimination as the governing construct of the science (e.g., Howes 2010; Hoffman 2012; Cohn 2015). Indeed, the “immune self” has served as immunology’s foundational concept to order immune theorizing for the past 70 years (Burnet and Fenner 1949; Tauber 1994). However, despite the paradigm’s established standing, definition of immune identity has proven elusive. As discussed above (section 2.1), because of fluctuations of immune activity over the lifespan of the organism, conceptualizing and modeling active tolerance have yet to yield criteria for defining stable identity (Bilate and LaFaille 2012). Moreover, a consensus definition of selfhood has remained elusive inasmuch as different investigative frameworks promote differing characteristics of immune identity based on their respective structural and functional criteria (Matzinger 1994). Critics have therefore questioned the immune self’s standing and utility (e.g., Matzinger 1994; Tauber 2000; Pradeu 2012). The latter position argues that the “self” might be better regarded as only a metaphor for a “figure” outlined by the immune system’s silence, i.e., its non-reactivity. Such a functionally flexible definition has been resisted. Defenders argue that the notion of stabilized discrimination correctly depicts the immune system’s organizing functions (which converge on defending a well-demarcated organism), and that efforts to eliminate or modify this metaphor are misguided attempts to “police” borders between science and culture (Anderson 2014; Hoffman 2012). Drawing from the philosophical canon, Howes referred to Hume to argue that realism about self (immune or otherwise) can be saved despite the dependency of context and the ever-changing character of the postulated ego (Howes 1998). She suggested that the efforts to deny the reality of the self are based on its non-substantial character and thus reflects entrenched substantialist assumptions. She proposed that a middle ground exists between substantial self and no-self by adopting a processual, understanding of selfhood (Howes 1999).

While the standing of the immune self has remained contentious, epistemological ambiguity and flexible polysemy has proven effective in sustaining the term’s powerful heuristic value as an idiom with many uses and meanings (Crist and Tauber 2000). Its versatility and pragmatic utility have effectively integrated clinical immune phenomena by highlighting the essential similarity or interconnectedness of diverse immune-mediated processes in response to various clinical challenges. Thus nutrition, allergy, infection, autoimmune disease, various phenomena of tolerance, natural or experimentally created chimeras (transplantation), and autoimmunity all become conceived as a network of interlinked or interrelated functions subject to evolutionary transformation and adaption. As these topics mirror and play off one another under the rubric of selfhood, immunologists have a ready means by which to represent states or processes that arise in the various interactions between the organism and its environment at different evolutionary stages and development.

Finally, the self’s appearance in immunology served as a readily understood shorthand reference to personal identity, and the efforts to substantiate that extrapolation on its own terms guided the discipline for the latter half of the twentieth century (for historical case studies see Löwy 1991). After all, beyond the experimental science, the interpretative context of immune selfhood draws from wider social meanings of individuality and insularity (Tauber 2016; see below, section 5.0). The autonomous construction of identity resonates with Western civic ideals and in turn supports them by melding laboratory findings with various extrapolated or borrowed philosophical, political and psychological formulations of human agency. And conversely, immunology has been studied as a source of important metaphors and other tropes feeding back on the science’s supporting culture to transform understanding of agency and communal relationships (discussed below, section 5.0).

3. Immune Ecology and Evolution

Immunology’s basic conceptual orientation is undergoing expansion from an individuality-based biology to include communal ecological perspectives. Similar shifts in perspective have also taken place in other fields of biology (Nathan 2014; van Baalen and Huneman 2014), and thus immunology joins a proliferation of “sub-organismal” environmental studies that would integrate ecology with developmental biology, physiology, cancer biology, molecular eco-systems, and eco-immunology (S. Gilbert and Epel 2015; Karasov, Martínez del Rio, and Caviedes-Vidal 2011; Maley et al. 2017; Tauber 2017). This emerging perspective is accompanied by an increasing interest in somatic evolution occurring during carcinogenesis, neurogenesis, microbiota development, and the adaptive immune responses. This shift has led to an abandonment of the classical vision of the immune system directed at defense to now include tolerant mechanisms that permit assimilation and co-habitation that reflect stabilized microbial-host relationships. In that re-orientation, concepts of pathogenicity and individuality have been re-defined.

So, although the concepts of immunity were developed primarily in the context of disease ecology, attention is shifting to symbiotic ecosystems. The exchanges the immune system mediates highlight context sensitivity of parasitism, commensalism and mutualism, and further demonstrates the bidirectional dialogue between bacteria and the host in the mutual construction of their respective ecological niches. The problem of immune evolution and clonal selection of lymphocytes is considered, in turn, to provide the most general account of natural selection. An important new issue concerns a set of problems associated with the recently discovered adaptive immune system of bacteria, the CRISPR system, whose role in evolution poses novel challenges to basic Darwinian principles (see section 3.2).

3.1 Ecological approaches to immunity

The ideas underpinning somatic ecology originate in the early view of somatic cells behaving as social organisms forming stable associations (Reynolds 2018: 12–58). Assuming that such interactions serve the welfare of the organism, Virchow and other authors described a “cell state” (or a “cell republic)”, a metaphoric expression of what became a sociological model of cellular communication (Virchow 1858 [1863]; R. Wagner 1999; Reynolds 2018: 86–113). And pathologically, such a consortium becomes a “civil war” of competing cell lines. The model then led to a general Darwinian formulation of an internal struggle for existence throughout the life of an individual (Roux 1881; Metchnikoff 1901 [1905]; Tauber and Chernyak 1991; see Buss 1987; Queller and Strassmann 2009; Godfrey-Smith 2009 for the contemporary standing of this proposal of evolutionary change). Metchnikoff, a key advocate of this theory, assumed that cells operate on Darwinian principles similar to those governing the adaptation of organisms in changing environmental conditions. He thus introduced a common framework in which to understand dynamic biological communities—whether internal cell lines or organisms adjusting to their environment. This ecological orientation altered basic conceptions of immunity and identity by displacing static notions of individuality with dialectical constructs (Levins and Lewontin 1985; Tauber 2008).

This ecological viewpoint serves to depict somatic and microbial cell populations as systems of communication and information exchange. With the change in focus from individuals to ecosystems, the classical dichotomies governing immunology’s theory, i.e., tolerance/responsiveness, immune/non-immune, self/nonself, has been revised. How these oppositions collapse in an information-based ecological format is illustrated by the phenomenon of inter-kingdom signaling, a form of communication that not only bridges an evolutionary gap between microbes and host, but also helps to overcome putative boundaries between immune, epithelial, and neural systems (cf. Hughes and Sperandio 2008). When considered from the environmental perspective, the transition site between the genetic body and its resident microbes is no longer a frontline of defense but rather an ecological ecotone, an interactive zone at which cellular communities engage in a dialogue to explore new adaptive opportunities (Tauber 2008). The importance of such interfaces is well illustrated by mutual scaffolding and niche construction strategies that are utilized by microbial symbionts and their hosts to direct development of larger ecological units (i.e., holobionts) (Chiu and S. Gilbert 2015).

Struggle and cooperation in the immune context were assumed since Koch to depend on intrinsic characteristics of invading microbes that, due to their virulence factors and other gene-encoded characteristics, act as pathogens, commensals or mutualists (Méthot and Alizon 2014). By accounting for a larger context of the immune encounter, the ecological position challenges this vision by offering a view in which “there are no pathogens, no commensals, and no opportunists; instead there are only microbes and hosts that interact” unpredictably (Casadevall and Pirofski 2015). In this scenario, microbial virulence becomes an emergent property, dependent on host and microbial factors, whose interactions cannot be derived from first principles (Casadevall, Fang, and Pirofski 2011).

In sum, the ecological view has led to the view that boundaries between parasitism, commensalism and mutualism are changeable and fluid, dependent on host factors, the full microbiota, and the broader environmental context (temperature, nutrients, etc.) (Méthot and Alizon 2014). Current views of plasticity, pathogenicity, and virulence revitalizes the nineteenth-century concept of microbial-host equilibrium (Méthot 2012). In the context of disease ecology, long-lasting associations between hosts and parasites leads to a climax state in which the respective populations remain stable (Burnet and White 1972; Anderson 2004). The immune equilibrium model then depicts persistent viral colonization as a product of a “dynamic but metastable equilibrium between the virome and the host” (Virgin, Wherry, and Ahmed 2009; Eberl 2010). Thus, the modern idea of balance highlights a stable state in which offensive and defensive forces neutralize one another to form stable associations between parasites and the host with little damage to either partner (Swiatczak 2014).

3.2 Immunity and evolution

The environmental perspective not only refers to the application of ecological and evolutionary knowledge to immune modeling, but also includes lessons learned from studies of immunity that reciprocally inform current understanding of evolution. How these findings shed light on the character of evolutionary change is well illustrated by the research of inheritable immune variation. The origin of variation has been subject to much debate in philosophy of biology. Advocates of the view that nonrandom, environmentally induced factors are involved in the generation of inheritable variation cite evidence of stress-induced mutagenesis, horizontal gene transfer, and non-genetic systems of inheritance (Koonin 2012: 257–291). Such discoveries suggest that organisms may enhance their own adaptation to altered environmental conditions epigenetically (Jablonka and Lamb 2014; J. Shapiro 2011). Specialized diversification and recombination mechanisms that are used by organisms to enhance their own adaptation are considered Lamarckian in so far as the response to specific environmental cues leads to alterations of phenotypic features, and these adaptive characteristics may be transmitted to succeeding generations (Sarkar 1991; Depew and Weber 1996). Notwithstanding evidence for such mechanisms, postulated non-random mechanisms of evolution have been disputed by those who claim that appeals to Lamarckism are misguided and stem from mis-interpreting the Neo-Darwinian synthesis or from overlooking genes as the basic units of selection (Merlin 2010; Weiss 2015). With a focus on rapidly adapting and evolving cell populations, immunological studies provide a unique opportunity to investigate evolution in real time and to understand the role of non-random, inheritable alterations of the phenotype.

Examination of adaptive immunity in prokaryotes provides a major breakthrough in this controversy. Many bacteria and most Archaea undergo non-random changes directed at devising protection from invasive bacteriophages and mobile genetic elements (Horvath and Barrangou 2010). These microbes use specialized methods of defense, CRISPR (Clustered Regularly Interspaced Short Palindromic Repeats)-Cas (CRISPR-associated protein) systems to incorporate foreign DNA fragments into their genomes (Koonin 2019). These become templates for the formation of RNA molecules, which when associated with endonuclease enzymes, mediate destruction of the complementary, foreign DNA fragments. These acquired adaptive changes are a direct consequence of the organism’s interactions with the environment, and, because these modifications can be passed on to succeeding generations, the CRISPR-Cas system has been suggested to operate on Lamarckian principles, an interpretation that has been contested (Koonin 2012: 265; Koonin 2019; Pradeu 2019). Although not conforming to the neo-Darwinian model, this system lacks the teleological character postulated by Lamarck, and thus should be considered, at most, a model of directed mutagenesis (Wideman et al. 2019; Woolley et al. 2019; Weiss 2015). Others counter that a continuum of Lamarckian-Darwinian mechanisms exists in nature and that CRISPR-Cas represents a genuine case of Lamarckinism (Jablonka 2019; Koonin and Wolf 2016). Advocates of this latter interpretation place CRISPR-Cas systems among other apparently Lamarckian mechanisms like those mediating epigenetic inheritance (Gissis and Jablonka 2011).

Highlighting the importance of directed mutagenesis and programmed gene rearrangements in evolution, these studies potentially revise dominant theories of adaptation. Indeed, such genetic changes operate in the vertebrate adaptive immune system: The first exposure of antigen leads to selection of a diverse population of lymphocytes, each carrying antigen receptors of a single specificity with varying degrees of affinity for the newly introduced antigen; the stochastic but coordinated assembly of gene segments determines receptor binding fitness (Tonegawa, et al. 1974; Podolsky and Tauber 1997). Higher degrees of specificity arise through a class of lymphocytes (B cells), whose activation by a specific antigen induces further variation and selection. This mechanism exhibits hypermutation, in which rearranged antigen receptor genes are subjected to scattered, random point mutations to permit rapid selection of a cell variant with an enhanced binding fitness. As the process of hypermutation acts on pre-selected cells to improve adaptive fit of their receptors, its outcomes are partially biased, failing to exactly fit into the Neo-Darwinian scheme (cf. Dobzhansky 1970). Thus, in the course of antigenic exposure, the population of lymphocytes that recognize a newly introduced antigen collectively generates an increasingly effective pool of responsive cells by fine-tuning the specificity of immune receptors, a process that exemplifies non-random selection and adaptation (Simon, Hollander, and McMichael 2015).

Further revising our understanding of adaptation is the observation that maternal antibodies may be passed on to descendants, allowing progeny to inherit some of the acquired immune characteristics of their parents. An example of such vertical immune transfer has been found in studies of the composition of the microbiota mothers pass on to the infant through vaginal and breastfeeding routes that program the newborn’s immune system and metabolism (Mueller et al. 2015; Gomez de Agüero et al. 2016). By molding the composition of its microbiota during pregnancy, the mother’s immune system engineers its environment by constructing a microbial model for her offspring (Chiu and S. Gilbert 2015; Mueller et al. 2015). When dysbiotic microbial populations are transmitted by obese mothers, their metabolic abnormalities and associated pro-inflammatory phenotype are imprinted upon their children (Soderborg et al. 2018; Ley et al. 2005). Due to the reliance on microbial niche construction, the acquisition of an infant’s immune characteristics is an instance of ecological inheritance, where transmission of selective pressures from one generation to another pre-sets the process of the progeny’s adaptation to the environment (Odling-Smee, Laland, and Feldman 2003; Odling-Smee et al. 2013; Chiu and S. Gilbert 2015). Alterations in this ecological mode of immune transmission in humans by C-section or administration of antibiotics may compromise the health of the child and thus predispose them to a variety of immune-related disorders (e.g., allergy and autoimmunity) (Bokulich et al. 2016). Thus, adaptive immunity exhibits various modalities in which variation may be generated and transferred from one generation to another. These findings challenge traditional Darwinian and Lamarckian categories, with wide-ranging ramifications.

Finally, immunology contributes to a general account of selection (Darden and Cain 1989; Hull, Langman, and Glenn 2001). The clonal selection theory (CST), the foundational framework of modern immunology, states that the immune system relies on a Darwinian-like process of selection to permit differential expansion of lymphocytes, whose receptors are fitted to bind an antigen (Burnet 1959). Analogies between CST, natural selection theory, and selective theories in neuroscience have been generally regarded as examples of “a selection type theory” (Darden and Cain 1989). CST has also been compared to other selective theories to elaborate a general vision of selection as cycles of replication, variation and environmental interaction (Hull, Langman, and Glenn 2001). Such a general account of selection would not only elucidate the most fundamental principles of evolution, but would also serve as a guide for future selective theories, e.g., neural group selection (cf. Edelman 1974, 1987). Differences between selection theories have also been recognized and suggest that unlike evolution of species, selection in somatic systems (in particular the neural system) does not fully account for the adaptation of the developing populations (Dumouchel 1996). More generally, Piattelli-Palmarini suggested that such a general scheme could be of use in cognitive science and linguistics, as well as in other disciplinary domains outside of biology (Piattelli-Palmarini 1986).

4. The Character of Immunological Knowledge

Case studies of immunology have contributed to understanding the role of models and the structure of theory in the biomedical sciences (see the entry on models in science). For example, Schaffner provided detailed analysis of the clonal selection theory and the two-component theory of the immune response to elaborate his criticism of the classical view of scientific theories and to provide an account in which middle range theories, consisting of interrelated theoretical models, organize subject areas in biology (Schaffner 1980). A taxonomy of immune models (both conceptual and experimental) exhibit a mosaic of methodologies and theoretical ways in which information is obtained and integrated in this field (Baetu 2014). Furthermore, high throughput sequencing techniques and other “omics” approaches in immunology, like those of microbial ecology, are increasingly utilizing new analytical tools (cf. Huss 2014). In conjunction with systems biology approaches, these tools inspire engineering orientations, in which biological systems achieve robustness and stability through the same principles with which machines are built, namely using system controls (e.g., feedback), redundancy (e.g., gene duplication, alternative metabolic pathways), modular design (to minimize damage to local units), and structural stability (Kitano 2001: 18). Apart from serving as an exemplar of systems-based theories and models, immunology has also been employed to develop cognitivist models, elucidate conceptual and theoretical change in biology, and elaborate on contentious issues about reductionism and anti-reductionism.

4.1. Cognitivist models

The rise of the cognitive paradigm in immunology originated in conceiving the immune system as a faculty of perception. Immunologists explicitly describe macrophages “seeing” antigen; antibodies “recognizing” epitopes; T cell possessing “memory”; and adaptive immunity comprising a “learning” process. Such extensions from human psychology have been widely utilized in evolutionary history (Margulis, Asikainen, and Krumbein 2011), wherein basic categories of human cognition have been extrapolated to animals (Bekoff, Allen, and Burghardt 2002), bacteria (Ben Jacob et al. 2004; Ben Jacob, Shapira, and Tauber 2005), cancer cells (Ben Jacob, Coffey, and Levine 2012) and the immune system (Cohen 1992a, 1992b). The influence of the cognitive metaphor (where intention plays an incipient role) appears throughout immune theory with extrapolations to cognitive science more generally (Varela 1994: 36; Varela et al. 1988; Varela and Coutinho 1991; Vaz 2011b).

Models of cognition in immune theorizing have been extended from human cognitive science and linguistics, where representational and anti-representationalist orientations have vied for dominance (Tauber 2013). The dominant model regards the immune response integrating two steps: First, the immune system perceives molecular targets and then “decides” how to react (Cohen 1992a). Accordingly, “perception” is primary and effector functions (activation or tolerance) follow along a spectrum of responses. This understanding of immune cognition construes immunity as an information-processing faculty, where immune activity becomes a computational process involving algorithmic transformation of an antigenic input into an effector output (Cohen 2007b).

This cognitivist orientation is of special interest to philosophers, in so far as such an examination provokes questions concerning the ontological status of intentionality, the role of representation, and the character of cognitive processing in general. Indeed, immunology’s cognitive models carry the promise of revitalizing some of the key issues prevalent in cognitive science by placing them into the context of a system whose circulating components interact in a probabilistic manner (Varela et al. 1988; Tauber 2017: 129–161; Cohen 2000: 57–99). Such a “fluid brain” carries wide-ranging theoretical implications (Fridman 1991).

Shared nervous-immune system organizational characteristics have been proposed (Nataf 2016). As in the visual processing areas of the brain, where distinct features of a visual object (shape, color, motion) are perceived separately by distinct neuronal populations (C. Gilbert 2013), the immune system utilizes dedicated cells and receptors to process fragmentary signals that discern distinct features of its environment (Swiatczak, Rescigno, and Cohen 2011). These signals are then integrated by higher-level processing, which, by computing information from their respective “receptive fields”, produce a unified representation of the antigen. Such a distributed image parallels activities of higher cortical areas. So, analogous to the nervous system, the immune system perceives immune objects by assembling discrete signals (immunogens, cytokines, chemokines, etc.) obtained as informational elements derived from various cell types, which, in an ascending integration, generate a multitude of T-cell and B-cell responses (Nataf 2016). In this schema, the integrative process occurring in lymphoid aggregates is the functional equivalent to the brain that employs an analogous hierarchal structure to process information. Indeed, the nervous and immune systems are highly integrated, both physiologically and anatomically. They share many of the same messenger molecules, have close developmental histories both in phylogeny and ontogeny, and intersect biochemically (Ader 2006).

The so-called “psycho-neuro-endocrine system” has a well-established fourth partner in the immune system showing that its activity cannot be understood in isolation from these other systems. The models employed in one cognitive system are readily shared by the other and thus propagate underlying theoretical approaches and implicit directives. Postulating molecular-level and systems-level recognition states carries notions of “intentionality” (see the entry on intentionality). Alternatively, instrumentalist and eliminativist approaches argue that intentional descriptions are either only constructs of a useful idiom or that they should be dropped altogether (Dennett 1987; Churchland 1989). Intentional assignments reflect an ordering mechanism for phenomena otherwise difficult to characterize and thus susceptible to error (Matthen and Levy 1984). Errors must be understood in terms of reference to what end a system actually seemingly intends versus what it achieves in given circumstances. In the immune setting, autoimmunity signifies a dysregulated state that, in this context, signifies mis-directed intentionality of normal immune function (Matthen and Levy 1984: 361). Any attempt to frame this process in non-intentional terms would fail, as such descriptions do not invoke goals, expectations, unfulfilled intentions and the like. Accordingly, immunology cannot dispense with the intentional idiom and the associated psychological metaphors used in its descriptive language, if even only as a heuristic device (Rosenberg 1989: 38; Melander 1993: 239; Howes 2000). Strong arguments have been made that metaphors in the life sciences act as indispensable instruments of cognition and explanation in addition to providing a useful perspective on a research subject (Reynolds 2018). Indeed, despite neo-positivistic efforts to rid science of nonliteral meanings to permit an objective (neutral) description of nature, analogical thinking in science plays a variety of crucial epistemic functions (Hesse 1966; Fox Keller 2002).

4.1.1 Representational models

Advocates of representationalist approaches to immune cognition accept the subject-object dichotomy that portrays the immune system as a “knower”, an agent, who can represent the state of its inner and other environments (Tauber 2013). This has become a well-entrenched orientation inasmuch as the ontological understanding of key concepts in immunology—self, individuality, and organism—revolves around the status of agency in immune theorizing. As already mentioned, from the very inception of the discipline, immunologists have either assumed an implicit identity that grounds the distinction between self and foreign, or that identity is explicitly described as an agent at the heart of immune defense. Traditionally associated with the capacity of an intentional, conscious being to act (see the entry on agency), agency has been redefined in philosophy of immunology to refer to the source of immune activity.

The capacity of the immune system to create representative images (through ligand-receptor structural homology) and to act on them does not mean that this system hosts a centralized control unit. Rather, as advocates of these information-based accounts suggest, immune agency emerges from collective behavior of individual immune cells, each of which acts as a “cellular computing machine” (Cohen and Efroni 2019). From this point of view, the apparent complex “intelligence” of the immune system is a product of multiple cues originating from individual immune cells that function analogously to joint decisions made by a school of fish. From this cognitive point view, immunity arises from shared collective information.

4.1.2 Non-representational models

A distinct group of philosophical problems stems from anti-representationalist approaches to immune cognition. Advocates of the so-called immune network theory challenge the classical subject-object epistemology as a relationship between the knower and the known that heretofore has dominated immune theory (Varela 1994: 39). Heralding a shift “from an antigen-centered immunology to an organism-centered immunology”, this view maintains that immune agency requires neither representation nor unified control (Varela 1991). Instead of a hierarchical organizational format, this de-centered orientation rests on the architecture of the network theory proposed by Niels Jerne (Jerne 1974). He theorized that if antibodies of an individual are diverse enough to bind any antigen, they also are capable of recognizing one another. Simply, their mutual interactions must precede any exogenous antigen encounter. Thus, a binding site of one antibody could serve as an antigen to another antibody, which in turn may become the target to still another antibody to create a self-contained, inter-locking lattice-like network (Jerne 1985). He further proposed that excitatory and inhibitory forces resulting from antibody interactions establish an equilibrium state, which, unless upset by an intruding antigen, ensures stable immune dynamics. Thus, according to Jerne’s hypothesis, the immune system is a self-referential network made up of molecules that represent one another and whose reactions against invasive pathogens were only the incidental result of equilibrating mechanisms that restore stable network dynamics.

In the network schema, cognition is not of something; perception is entirely within the system itself; the agent has vanished, and with that vacancy, representations are discarded (Vaz and Varela 1978: 238; Mingers 1991; Coutinho 2003; Palacios and Bacigalupo 2003; Vaz 2011a). After all, what requires a re-presentation? In Jerne’s system, no hierarchy exists, and no cognitive center corresponding to company headquarters. Instead, what heretofore was referred to as activation resulting from a subject-object predicate structured cognitive event (described by stimulus-response language) now refers to increased dynamic activity that is due to the disruption of the network’s equilibrium. Accordingly, immune “knowledge” shifts from a signifier–signified relationship to one in which meaning is firmly lodged within the system itself. Simply, the subject-object epistemological structure of cognition has been radically revamped.

Jerne’s provocative hypothesis, although elegant in conception and effective in inspiring new avenues of research, did not withstand critical evaluation (Eichmann 2008; Vaz 2011a, 2011b). Despite confirming the presence of idiotypic antibodies (i.e., mutually interacting immunoglobulin molecules), their role and overall contribution to immune functions remained uncertain. Furthermore, the idea of autonomy and closure contradicted empirical evidence (Hershberg and Efroni 2001; Coutinho 2003). However, notions of cognition without agency remained plausible. Pradeu and colleagues similarly proposed that the state of the immune system is structured by inter-connected elements, where activation results from perturbations of the stable linkages of the resting state (Pradeu and Carosella 2006a, 2006b; Pradeu, Jaeger, and Vivier 2013). The original “network” theory focused upon the inter-actions of the immune system’s constituents, (Jerne 1974), while the “continuity” theory employs an architecture of antigenic-immune interactions (Pradeu 2012, 2018; Grossman and Paul 2015). When the immune system is regarded from this “connected” perspective, tolerance is the result of a stable continuity of interactions between an antigen and its receptors. Thus, integrated states are quiescent and disrupted ones, whether “foreign” or endogenous, generate immune activation by breaking stabilized associations.

In addition to antigen/receptor dynamics, other factors are also involved in delineating the scope of tolerable changes in the organism. These include a self-regulated system of diverse interactions among several immune components comprising a complex system of antigen-presenting cells, effector T and B lymphocytes, regulatory cells and a diverse soup of molecular signals (Kim, Levy, and Lee 2009; Kidd et al. 2014). So, the functional difference that determines recognition of the foreign results not only from an aggregate of quantitative ligand-receptor affinity differences, but also from the context in which the antigen is seen and the degree of interruption in network dynamics induced by such an immunogen (Cohen 2000a; Cohen and Efroni 2019). Accordingly, the overall function of the immune system may be defined as maintenance of molecular (antigenic) homeostasis (Poletaev, Stepanyuk, and Gershwin 2008). On this general view, a systems-wide collective response—not the discriminatory power of individual lymphocytes or their receptors—determines identity and immune specificity.

4.1.3 Presentational cognition

The so-called “ecological” perspective offers still another model of cognition, where the immune system does not employ representations of the world, but rather “sees” the world directly (Tauber 2017: 151–156, 219–228). In this ‘presentational’ schema, the capacity to extract information about the environment depends on pre-programmed systems of perception, whose organizational structures “resonate” with environmental inputs (Gibson 1966; 1979). Accordingly, the environment’s informational content results from the stimulation of the system that already has the ability to acknowledge inputs of a recognizable character. Simply, information is only that which is already meaningful (Ben-Ze’ev 1993: 70–71; Gibson 1979). This scheme would reconfigure the subject-object epistemology dominating current immune theory with an information-processing faculty that dispenses with some knowing entity, who sits in a “Cartesian theater” to observe the world (Dennett 1991). Drawing an analogy from collective colony behaviors of insects (Gordon 2001; Bonabeau 2001) and bacteria (Ben Jacob, Becker, Shapira, and Levine 2004; Ben Jacob, Shapira, and Tauber 2005), the immune system may then be modeled without centralized control or directives by simply following its “rules” of regulation. Such a model of “embedded” cognition holds that perception may be explained independently of computational processes or representations altogether (L. Shapiro 2011). Simply, presentational cognition substitutes an agent, who employs representations, for a process in which the immediacy of perception removes any such intermediary. Accordingly, cognition is not of something, for perception is entirely within the system itself; the agent has disappeared, and with that vacancy, representations are discarded.

As with Jerne’s system, in presentational cognition, no hierarchy exists, and no cognitive center is posited. The stimulus–response model has been discarded and activation heretofore understood as resulting from a predicate-structured cognitive event now refers to increased dynamic activity that results from the disruption of the network’s equilibrium. Immune “knowledge” accordingly shifts from a signifier–signified relationship to one in which meaning is firmly lodged within the system itself, i.e., a system that “knows” only itself. To the extent immunology would fashion itself along these lines, the conception of the self partitioned from the world would be replaced by an agent-free information-forming and information-processing faculty (Orosz 2001; Forrest and Hofmeyr 2001). Such a distributed information processing system has two key features:

  1. There is no central immunological processor (as found in a computer’s central processing unit). Immune specificity has collective properties, and tolerance, as well as activation distinctions are distributed and cannot be “reduced” to isolated components (Coutinho 1989; Daëron 2014).
  2. The dynamical patterns of interactions among the diverse parts of the immune system function strictly in terms of their own processes in the absence of a mediator or witness, and thereby dispense with the traditional features of agency and accompanying autonomy that have traditionally dominated immune theorizing.

Thus, paralleling current trends in other philosophical disciplines, philosophy of immunology draws from, and contributes to, parallel studies in the cognitive sciences that address the general problems of agency, cognition, and behavior.

4.2 Reductionism versus holism in immunology

Apart from elucidating issues pertaining to identity, individuality and agency of an organism in its broader ecological and evolutionary history, philosophy of immunology also contributes to discussions about the origin, organization, and methods of biological knowledge. Reflecting on explanatory practices of immunology, the epistemic modality has an important practical dimension that contributes to developing methodological strategies and conceptual tools to handle the complexity of the immune system. Genomic, proteomic and transcriptomic studies are producing vast amounts of immune data with little understanding of the basic organization and regulation that must integrate systems-level and molecular-level approaches (Ohno 1990; Schatz and Langmead 2013; see the entry on genomics and postgenomics).

The shift from a focus on the insularity and autonomy of the organism to its integration within a complex consortium of species carries a contrasting holistic orientation to the reductivism characterizing the molecularization of immunology (Ulvestad 2007: 65–67). The theoretical implications and practical methodological re-direction indicate a re-alignment of research strategies for immunology and, more generally, an important contribution to the larger debates concerning the character and feasibility of non-reductionist research programs in the life sciences (Kitcher 1984; Sarkar 1998; Wimsatt 2007). Initially focused on the question of the relationship between classical genetics and molecular biology, these debates have turned to explanatory strategies in distinct biological subdisciplines, such as neuroscience (Craver 2005), ecology (Dupré 1993), systems biology (Wolkenhauer and Green 2013) and developmental biology (Love 2008; see the entry on developmental biology). Still awaiting broader recognition as an exemplar of explanatory practices in life sciences, immunology already serves as a case study to approach the problem of reduction and holism in biology and medicine.

Different models of epistemic reduction have been considered with little consensus about the applicability of this type of explanation (Sarkar 1998). Dissatisfaction with models of theory reduction led to various models of explanatory reduction that, unlike deductive-nomological accounts, consider relationships between epistemic units other than theories containing laws, while relying on an intuitive sense of reduction as an explanation of higher level features in terms of their parts (see the entry on reductionism in biology). A dominant concern about reduction is the so called “many-many” relationships between levels of analysis, where biological features are context dependent and may vary due to heterogeneous lower level features (Hull 1974; Fodor 1974; S. Gilbert and Sarkar 2000). One approach maintains that non-reductionist explanations should focus on gross “cytological” features of the studied phenomena rather than on lower level molecular processes (Kitcher 1984). In contrast to this approach, immunologists assume that reduction is an attempt to explain complex immune phenomena in terms of isolated parts and interactions without taking into consideration the entirety of structural and functional complexities (Van Regenmortel 2002). Thus, instead of assuming that non-reductionist explanations must ignore lower level molecular details, holistic immunologists attempt to understand the multilevel complexity of the immune phenomena they study (Rivas et al. 2017). Accordingly, non-reductionist descriptions do not attempt to remain on a descriptive, biological level of understanding, but rather adapt pluralistic approaches that integrate distinct dimensions and frames of reference, i.e., both molecular and higher orders of analysis. This perspective aligns with recent approaches in philosophy of biology that move beyond the division of lower- and higher-level explanatory strategies and highlight the importance of interdisciplinary integration exhibited by current scientific practice (Brigandt 2010; Love and Lugar 2013).

Both reductive and holistic immunological research agendas have vied for dominance (Silverstein 2009: 25–42). The immune-chemical program, championed by Ehrlich and other immunochemists of the first half of the twentieth century, examined immune reactions in terms of chemical and physical forces between immune receptors and their ligands (Silverstein 2009: 456). These immunochemists were adopting a “unifactoralism” strategy that endeavors to explain complex biological processes in terms of single factors (Powell and Dupré 2008). That program was modified and renewed by the elucidation of the genetics of antibody diversification, a series of discoveries that placed immunology well within the molecular biology revolution (Podolsky and Tauber 1997).

Studies of immunity coupled to developmental biology, ecology, and evolutionary biology have balanced the molecularization of immunology with an organism-based orientation. Early advocates of such approaches, like Metchnikoff, described immunity in terms of cells and cellular interactions, a “biological” perspective extended by Burnet, who eclectically endeavored to include underlying molecular processes (Crist and Tauber 2000; Baxter 2006: 38). He presented immunity in terms of adaptation, selection, and population-level cell behavior, rather than solely in terms of chemical and physical molecular reactions. As already discussed, this broadened perspective introduced the ‘self’ into the immune lexicon and brought new figurative language associated with agency and a host of meanings borrowed from other human experience. And, complementing these holistic explanatory and narrative strategies, he also postulated the existence of molecular signatures of self and considered lymphocyte receptors as independent decision-makers mediating immune reactions based on their physical fit with cognate antigens (Burnet 1969). Thus, by representing cases of theoretical integration and explanatory heterogeneity, epistemic strategies adopted by Burnet and other organism-oriented immunologists fit into the inclusion of of plurality and unification increasingly regarded as necessary to capture the complexity of immune functions (cf. Dupré 1993; Mitchell 2003; Plutynski 2013).

More recently, attempts to integrate molecular biology with systems analysis challenge the apparent conflict between reductionist and holist strategies (Green et al. 2017; Mazzocchi 2012). After all, attempts to explain complex immunological phenomena in terms of isolated parts and interactions without taking into consideration the entirety of structural and functional complexity that these phenomena exhibit have been ineffective. For example, vaccine development studies, when limited to investigation of the structural correlates of antigen-antibody interaction without deeper understanding of the dynamic features of a host-pathogen encounter, often prove unsuccessful (Van Regenmortel 2002). So, instead of assuming that non-reductionist explanations must ignore lower level molecular details, system-oriented immunologists attempt to understand the multilevel complexity of the immune reactions they study (Rivas et al. 2017). Dynamical systems theory and a variety of network-based approaches are used in systems biology to integrate distinct levels of analysis and elucidate the complexity of the biological phenomena in question (Green et al. 2017). Accordingly, a pluralistic approach that attends to distinct dimensions and frames of reference, i.e., both molecular and higher orders of analysis, has directed recent efforts to integrate the complexity immunity (Löwy 2008: 172; see entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology). However, the program of melding the reductionist and holistic methods as complementary to each other has been slowed by both technical and conceptual hurdles (Fang and Casadevall 2011). How to model the system as a system requires the collection of information about the totality of interactions to explain causal mechanisms with multiple inputs and stochastic outcomes. No approach has achieved dominance and, consequently, the question of how massive data might be incorporated into a systems-wide comprehensive model comprises a key challenge of contemporary immunology.

5. Immunology’s Social Dimensions

Anti-foreign imagery in immunology provides an excellent case study of bidirectional links between science and society (Tauber 1994, 2016; Howes 1999). The wide acceptance of the self-nonself discrimination model derived from the paradigmatic host-pathogen struggle that exemplified the nineteenth century conceptualization of the body as isolated from the environment. As developed by Claude Bernard, this insular construct provided biology a theoretical foundation for organismal biology that complemented Malthusian economics, liberal political philosophy, and Comtian sociology to instantiate the autonomous body as a political, social, economic and medical entity (Foucault 1963 [1973]; Agamben 1998). Notwithstanding that “independence” is a political term, Bernard’s notion of autonomy fails to fairly represent the dialectical relationships of the organism and its environment (Levins and Lewontin 1985), nor the evolutionary peculiarities of individuality itself (Buss 1987).

The depiction of the immune self as disconnecting the organism from its surroundings harmonized with a particular Western cultural experience of seeing “ourselves as entities, separate from the rest of the world—as containers with insides and outsides” (Lakoff and Johnson 1980: 58; Fleck 1935 [1979: 174–175]). However, this extrapolation of a particular Western notion of subjectivity may well be regarded a social construct (Mead 1962) inasmuch as cross-cultural analysis reveals how the ancient Chinese sensed self more like a fluid interface than as an enclosed entity (Geaney 2011). And contemporary anthropological studies re-confirm how notions of selfhood vary between cultures (e.g., Roland 1988). From this perspective, social connotations and subjective experiences go hand in hand with creating meaningful images of immunity and biological identity. Finding its fertile soil in the fifties, the idea of the demarcated organism squarely fit the valorization of individualism that had diffused into Western arts, politics and science during this period (Barbour 1995). An insular understanding of “the self” at the core of these atomistic characterizations lies at the foundation of immune theory and practice, where contemporary psychological and philosophical constructions of identity based on autonomous individuality prevail (Tauber 1994).

However, culture critics have seized on immunology’s notions of autonomy as exemplifying modern notions of identity, where boundaries are contested, and the body becomes the localized site of battle between self and other (Sontag 1990; Haraway 1989; E. Martin 1994). These commentators cite the recognized permeability of living creatures, their symbiotic exchanges, and tolerance of myriad assimilated foreign materials to challenge the origin and cultural resonance of the atomistic framework. David Napier has characterized our “age of immunology” as an individualism marked by a preoccupation with the self and by an absence of transforming efforts to incorporate the foreign (Napier 2003). Active rejection enunciated with warfare metaphors so prevalent in immunology’s lexicon—“attack”, “defense”, “invaders”—dramatically illustrate this formulation, both in terms of the self/other dichotomy, as well as the privileged regard of individuality over community. On this view, the “immune self” appears as a metaphor to model Western culture, by invoking “immunization” as an explanatory model for understanding the core dynamics of post-industrial societies (Esposito 2011; Sloterdijk 2011). The metaphor’s wide application—from religion and metaphysics to housing and cities—invokes the dialectics of borders and exchange, individuality and communes, where the balance of intrusion and defense is invoked to characterize the “bubble” in which humans live. Note, these interpretations closely resonate with the dynamics of immunity regarded ecologically, as discussed above.

These contrasting applications of social descriptions to immunology reveal the ease by which the science may be employed for culture criticism. But the exchange need not end with such contributions. Having been implemented in the discourse of science, the imagery borrowed from the culture-at-large becomes transformed and then returns to the social domain, impacting on portrayals of persons and their relationship with others (E. Martin 1994). On this view, the science-culture exchange broadens the implications of understanding the development of immune theory. For example, the political resonance of the self/nonself framework was evident in the context of a debate on tissue incompatibility, whose depiction as innate and unchangeable harmonized with Burnet and Medawar’s elitist sympathies and opposition towards social Lamarckism (Lafferty 1995). The vision of personhood that stood behind the self/nonself discrimination concept, can be further traced back to Burnet’s self-confessed “harmless terror of strangers” and his Darwinist vision of human relationships as defined by primordial selfishness and incessant drives towards domination and power (Burnet 1971: 12). Along with ongoing cultural and political transformations, our understanding of immune identity has also changed in the transition from a modernist vision of delineated selfhood towards a more complex view that dispenses with the self altogether. Thus, the imagery that is used to represent the activity of the immune system has deep roots in the broader culture that reflect dominant values and tensions defining the dialectics of the individual and her society. In sum, while immunology provides metaphors for characterizing human societies, the science in turn, draws from its supporting culture to model its biology. Here we see an explicit demonstration of the bi-directionality of social and scientific discourses, and to draw the line separating the laboratory from its supporting culture again proves problematic (Gieryn 1995).

6. Conclusion

Two conceptual shifts that have marked contemporary research in immunology have influenced philosophical comment on various topics in biology. The first is a major revision in how the mechanics of immunity are conceived. Taking account of the context in which the immune reaction is regulated, the earlier conception of immune specificity as arising from some simple mechanical lock and key matching between selected antibodies binding to noxious antigens has been replaced with collectivist models of molecular interactions. In accounting for the frequency and intensity of an immune encounter, this dynamic orientation portrays the immune system as a sensor of change rather than structure. The sensitivity of such a cognitive system that must mediate multifarious immune reactions requires a co-ordination of collective molecular ensembles, in which diverse elements together determine the extent of the immune response (Daëron 2014). Indeed, only through modulated responses can immunity fulfill its diverse functions, some of which require tolerance of recognized substances and others full blown activation of rejection. Accordingly, immune theory has departed from the classical, self/nonself framework that depicts the immune response as a simple “on” and “off” binary switch, to multifaceted models that account for a spectrum of reactivities.

The second conceptual shift addresses how immunity mediates the interactions of the organism with its environment. That ecological orientation has inflected immunology from its earlier insular conceptions of the organism to a dynamic interactive view that highlights how life experience alters the immune response to external challenges and opportunities. With this broadened perspective, the idea of immunity extends beyond defense of an atomistic individual, to include the mediation of the organism’s ecological economy, both defensive and assimilative. This includes the internal environment as well, inasmuch as the microbiome, established through immune niche formation, has increasingly focused attention on the prevalence of immune tolerance, symbiosis, and the biology characterized by cooperative relationships of various sorts (Eberl 2010; Bilate and LaFaille 2012).

In short, the philosophical challenge of defining immune identity is framed by differing orientations, namely, autonomous individuality versus collective ensemble (both applicable to the regulation of the immune response and contextual placement in the environment). Which version chosen then leads to strikingly different answers to immunology’s key questions:

  1. What is immunity;
  2. what are the defining characteristics of individuality as determined immunologically;
  3. what are the epistemological standing of immune selfhood and the rhetorical uses of agency in its various forms (literal, metaphoric, and idiomatic);
  4. how has the cognitive paradigm framed immune processes as an information processing system; and
  5. how might biological causation of the immune system studied as a whole be modeled?

Each of these issues directly pertains to philosophical considerations about the character of the organism, the relationships of parts to the whole, principles of biological organization and regulation, the construction of cognitive schemas, and the ability of models to capture complex organic functions.

In conclusion, although firmly embedded in philosophy of biology and engaging in closely related concerns, the philosophy of immunology has become an established discipline with distinctive interests and contributions. The immunological matters of interest to philosophers do not always overlap with those that dominate immunology’s contemporary research program. This divergence highlights how philosophy of immunology has emerged as an autonomous field with its own subjects of attention and methods of inquiry that complement rather than mimic or replicate the pursuits in related areas of theoretical and experimental immunology. Moreover, philosophical studies of immunology have contributed to a wide range of pivotal topics engaged by philosophers of biology—organismal identity; individuality; dynamic causation in complex systems (integrating complexity theory with big data studies); the characterization of the goals and methods of systems biology; the organization of information; the characterization of the normative and deviant; and personal ontology (self). Each of these areas of research impact other biological disciplines of interest to philosophers, i.e., development, ecology, genetics, evolution and cognition. And beyond the purview of philosophy of biology, studies of immunology contribute to the more general discussions of reductionism/anti-reductionism, theory change and conceptual modeling, and social and cultural studies of science (i.e., the function of metaphors in science, the role of a scientific discourse). In sum, a rich two-way traffic between philosophers of immunology and philosophers of science has emerged that allows the former to use tried-and-tested conceptual tools developed by their colleagues, while providing a unique outlook for the latter. Given the centrality of immunology in modern biology and the unique perspective offered by this science on crucial philosophical problems, further engagement not only seems likely, but an imperative for philosophy of science writ large.


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