Johann Sturm

First published Thu Mar 5, 2020; substantive revision Wed Jan 31, 2024

Johann Christoph Sturm (1635–1703) was an eclectic German philosopher, professor at the University of Altdorf, one of the first experimental physicists, a mathematician, astronomer, calendariographer, and Lutheran priest. He was a correspondent of Robert Boyle (1627–1691) and Gottfried Leibniz (1646–1716), among others. Sturm’s thought mirrors the complex interplay between debates in metaphysics, natural philosophy, and theology that characterize the second half of the seventeenth century. The three pillars of Sturm’s theoretical system are mechanism, occasionalism, and final causes.

In his numerous academic works, Sturm forcefully defends the use of the experimental method in natural philosophy. He advocates an inclusive and open-minded examination of old and new philosophical theories in order to find the best explanations for observed phenomena. In metaphysics, Sturm is one of the most outspoken supporters of occasionalism, the theory according to which finite beings lack genuine causal powers and work only as occasions for God’s causal intervention in nature. While occasionalism was developed before Sturm by a number of other authors, Sturm gives his own original twist to it by making it the foundation of his system of natural philosophy.

1. Life and works

Sturm was born in Hilpoltstein close to Nuremberg on November 3, 1635 in the midst of the Thirty Years War (1618–1648) which devastated mainly those areas that were to later constitute the territory of Germany. Sturm’s father, Johann Eucharius Sturm, was a tailor, valet, treasurer, and custodian of the silverware at the court of Count Palatine Johann-Friedrich of Pfalz-Hilpoltstein. Sturm’s mother was Gertraud Bock, daughter of Konrad Bock, country parson of Liebenstadt. During his infancy, Sturm learned Latin and other (fine) arts from the court chaplain (concionator), Johann Jakob Beurer.

When the Count Palatine Johann-Friedrich (himself a Protestant) died in 1644, leaving no heir to the throne, his territory devolved unto his older brother Wolfgang Wilhelm, who had converted to Catholicism in 1613. Although Johann-Friedrich had reached an agreement with his brother that (unlike all other subjects) the courtiers and servants to Johann-Friedrich’s court could remain Protestant, this promise ceased upon his death. As a consequence of the Counter-Reformation, all subjects had to become Catholic. Sturm and his family, being Lutherans and resisting this call, fled the county in 1645. They settled close by in Weißenburg. From 1646 onwards, Sturm attended the Latin School in Weißenburg living in the house of the rector, Johannes Hupfer, who took care of him. In 1653, upon the advocacy of Sturm’s father, Daniel Wülfer, priest and dean of St. Lorenz, employed Johann Christoph as amanuensis. He supported Sturm financially and furthered his academic career. Initially, Sturm might have thought about studying at the University of Altdorf, since he enrolled on October 4, 1653. However, he did not take up his studies.

Instead of studying at the University of Altdorf, Sturm decided to read at the University of Jena, enrolling on February 2, 1656. Sturm studied mathematics and physics with both Erhard Weigel (1625–1699) and Johann Zeisold (1599–1667). He studied theology with Henning Spoercke. Sturm was awarded the degree of magister philosophiae magna cum laude on January 27, 1658. On October 10, 1660 Sturm enrolled at the University of Leiden, where he studied philosophy with Johannes De Raey (1622–1702) and architecture privatim with Nicolai Goldmann (1611–1665). It was in Leiden that Sturm most likely came into contact with the concept of and the driving force behind the idea of eclecticism (see sect. 2) as Henricus Bornius (1617–1665), professor of ethics at the University of Leiden, had formulated it in his (1653) inaugural lecture De vera philosophandi libertate. During his one-year stay in Leiden, Sturm also visited Baruch de Spinoza (1632–1677). In 1661, Sturm returned to Jena via Amsterdam, Hamburg, Lower Saxony, Magdeburg, and Leipzig. In Jena, he spent one more year on the study of theology.

In 1662, Sturm returned to his former benefactor, Daniel Wülfer, instructing his sons, but also conducting his own philosophical studies. Only in 1664 was Sturm able to find a decent employment as priest of Deiningen and (from 1667 onwards) Klosterzimmern, allowing him to settle and start a family.

On August 15, 1669 Sturm was offered a position as professor of mathematics and physics at the University of Altdorf, which he took over from Abdias Trew (1597–1669). Sturm held this position until his death in 1703. His most famous students were the Swiss polyhistor Johann Jakob Scheuchzer (1672–1733); Johann Gabriel Doppelmayr (1671–1750), a German mathematician, natural philosopher and encyclopedist; Johann Heinrich Müller (1671–1731), one of Sturm’s successors to the chair of mathematics and physics at the University of Altdorf; Martin Knorre (1657–1699); and Georg Albrecht Hamberger (1662–1716), a teacher of Christian Wolff (1679–1754). Besides his professorship, Sturm was twice the rector of the University of Altdorf, and nine times the dean of the faculty of philosophy.

Sturm was married three times: his first wife was Barbara Johanna Kesler. They married in 1664. She died in 1679. His second wife was Maria Salome Höchstetter. They married in 1680. She died in 1691. His third wife was Dorothea Elisabeth Göring. They married in 1692 and she outlived Sturm. Sturm had 13 children, Leonhard Christoph Sturm being the most famous one.

Sturm died in Altdorf on December 25, 1703 from the consequences of a stroke he had suffered two months earlier. He was said to be

a pious, honest, kind, upright man, of clear speech, very eager in [the search for] justice and truth, and the successful renovator of mathematical studies. (Brucker 1766: 770)

In his eulogy on Sturm, Georg Paul Rötenbeck, who was ordinary professor of political science and logic at the University of Altdorf and whose daughter was married to Sturm’s son Leonhard Christoph, portrays Sturm as humble, decent, impartial, duteous, patient, and godly. Furthermore, Sturm is venerated as a brilliant philosopher and mathematician as well as a good family father (Hermann & Platz 2003: 10–27).

Throughout his life as professor of mathematics and physics at the University of Altdorf, Sturm produced a variety of works, including mathematical textbooks, a colorful set of disputations, works on astronomy (aimed at discrediting astrology), and calendars. However, Sturm’s core interest concerned natural philosophy. He published three systematic treatises on physics, the Physica Conciliatrix (PC, 1684), the Physica Electiva sive Hypothetica (PE, 1697/1722) and the posthumously published Compendium Physicae Modernae Sanioris (CPMS, 1704).

The Physica Electiva is Sturm’s masterpiece. It is divided into three parts: a physica generalis (general physics) that lays down the foundations of Sturm’s system and includes his discussion of key metaphysical themes such as the nature of matter, form, and causation; a physica specialis (special physics) that covers the main phenomena of the supralunary and the sublunary world; and a physica specialissima (very special physics) that is devoted to the study of life and human beings. During his life, Sturm managed to published only the physica generalis. The physica specialis was published posthumously by Christian Wolff in 1722. The third part has never been published. It has been alleged that it were held in manuscript form by the city library of Nuremberg (Gaab, in Gaab et al. 2004). Based on archival research conducted by one of the authors (C. Henkel) in the city library of Nuremberg in October 2019, he thinks no such manuscript exists there. However, the city library of Nuremberg holds what he takes to be study notes of Sturm’s students on courses in natural philosophy.[1]

1.1 Sources of Sturm’s thought

In line with his eclectic approach to philosophy (see sect. 2), Sturm surveys and builds upon a wide range of sources. They include pre-Socratic authors, such as Thales, Pythagoras, Heraclitus, Parmenides, Empedocles, and Democritus as well as philosophers of the classical period, such as Hippocrates, Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, Euclid, and Archimedes. Due to the Aristotelian curriculum dominating the life of early modern academic philosophers, Sturm draws upon Aristotle (in particular his Physics) more often than upon any other author. Furthermore, Sturm avails himself of Roman philosophers both Stoic, such as Cicero, Seneca, Pliny the Elder, and Plutarch, and Sceptic, such as Sextus Empiricus and Aulus Gellius. Other authors of the era include Potamon of Alexandria, whom Sturm takes to be the first eclectic philosopher; Galen, as well as Diogenes Laërtius, an important source for early modern philosophers to study the philosophers of antiquity.

Furthermore, Sturm knows the Church Fathers, that is, he mentions Clemens of Alexandria, Origen of Alexandria, and Lucius Caecilius Firmianus Lactantius. He takes the Church Fathers to be eclectics.

Sturm is well-versed in the Aristotelian commentary tradition including the Greek commentators rediscovered in the Renaissance (Schmitt 1983), such as Iamblichus, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius, Ammonius Hermeae, Simplicius of Cilicia, Philoponus (John the Grammarian), and Olympiodorus the Younger; the Arab commentators, such as Avicenna and Averroës; as well as the Latin commentators, such as Albertus Magnus, Thomas Aquinas, Duns Scotus, Durandus of St. Pourçain, and William of Ockham. Following a general line of thought manifesting itself in the Renaissance among both Aristotelian and Humanist thinkers (Schmitt 1983), Sturm takes the Greek commentators to be more reliable and true to the views of Aristotle himself than the Latin commentators (PE I: preface).

Sturm draws extensively on Aristotelian thinkers ranging from medieval scholastic authors, such as Gabriel Biel, to Renaissance and late early modern scholastic authors. The latter include Italian philosophers, for instance, Julius Caesar Scaliger, Andrea Caesalpino, Jacopo Zabarella, Giulio Pace, and Francisco Lana de Terzi; Dutch philosophers, such as Gijsbert Voet (Voetius); Spanish and Portuguese philosophers such as Gómez de Pereira, Pedro da Fonseca, Francisco de Toledo, Antonio Rubio, Francisco Suárez, Gabriel Vásquez, Pedro Hurtado de Mendoza, and Rodrigo de Arriaga; French philosophers, such as Samuel Maresius, Honoré Fabri, Jean Baptiste Du Hamel, and Pierre Daniel Huet; English philosophers, such as John Case and Gilbert Jack (Jacchaeus); and German Philosophers, such as Daniel Sennert, Christoph Scheibler, Johannes Zeisold, Johann Sperling, Jakob Thomasius, and Erhard Weigel. Sturm knows the German academic philosophical landscape very well, since these philosophers were influential in their respective fields (see Wundt 1938), or since they were either Sturm’s colleagues or teachers. The latter is true of Zeisold and Weigel.

In addition, Sturm is acquainted with humanist thinkers, such as Lorenzo Valla, Juan Louis Vives, Philip Melanchthon, and Pierre de la Ramée. Furthermore, his sources include early modern natural philosophers: microscopists, such as Marcello Malpighi, Antonie Philips van Leeuwenhoek, and Nehemiah Grew, but also astronomers such as Nicolaus Copernicus, Tycho Brahe, Galileo Galilei. Sturm is also familiar with Renaissance and early modern physicians and anatomists such as Jean Fernel, William Harvey, Claude Perrault, and Jean Pecquet.

Sturm is acquainted with alchemist sources, such as the Corpus Hermeticum, Paracelsus, Jan Baptista van Helmont, and Athanasius Kircher, as well as atomists such as Lucretius and Pierre Gassendi, none of whom he looks upon very favorably.

Concerning seventeenth-century philosophers, Sturm builds upon Francis Bacon and Gerrit Janszoon Vos (Vossius) regarding his eclectic philosophy and scientific method. He argues against Spinoza’s and Leibniz’s conception of nature, and mentions Thomas Hobbes, Kenelm Digby, Blaise Pascal, and Isaac Newton in passing. Sturm also argues against the Cambridge Platonists, such as Henry More and Ralph Cudworth. In contrast, he builds upon Cartesian thought, using René Descartes, Johann Clauberg, Géraud de Cordemoy, Louis de la Forge, Antoine le Grand, and Nicolas Malebranche as sources. Cordemoy, La Forge Malebranche, and the Christian mystic Pierre Poiret inspire Sturm’s case in favor of occasionalism.

Finally, Sturm corresponded extensively with members of the Royal Society, such as John Wallis, Robert Boyle, and Robert Hooke. It is in Boyle that he finds backup for his own position of the passivity of nature in the controversy with Leibniz and Schelhammer (see below).

1.2 Reception of Sturm in Leibniz and Wolff

Today, Sturm is most commonly remembered as the polemical target of Leibniz’s essay De Ipsa Natura (1698), which is part of an articulated controversy between Sturm and Leibniz on whether nature can be considered endowed with active principles (a claim denied by Sturm and defended by Leibniz). In fact, Leibniz and Sturm knew of one another, since they were both students of Erhard Weigel (Lemanski 2018). Presumably, they met in the 1660s, maybe when Leibniz was at Altdorf University in 1666 or when he was the secretary of the alchemical society in Nuremberg in 1667 (for Leibniz’s life, see Arthur 2014: x–xvi). The controversy between Leibniz and Sturm commenced in 1694–95 through correspondence (Palaia 1990) and continued later in the 1690s through academic dissertations and journal articles published in the Acta eruditorum (Henkel 2024, ch.2).

In his De Ipsa Natura, Leibniz presents Sturm as a supporter of Malebranche’s occasionalism. This charge is partially correct insofar as Sturm does claim, like Malebranche, that God is the only active efficient cause operating in nature. However, Leibniz oversimplifies Sturm’s position. Sturm’s account of passive forms is in fact different from Malebranche’s occasionalism for the role that it attributes to finite forms in the explanation of natural phenomena and for the relatively minor role that the notion of the laws of nature plays in Sturm’s account (see sect. 3).

More generally, Sturm’s project is diametrically opposed to Leibniz’s. At the core of Leibniz’s criticisms is his commitment to the traditional scholastic view that the notions of substance and action are deeply interconnected (e.g. Leibniz 1989, 160). The commitment to the notion of action as the fundamental ground to think about the very nature of substances underpins Leibniz’s main objections to Sturm’s account of the passivity of forms. Leibniz objects to the idea that any natural being could ever be adequately conceived, or taken to have any ontological consistency, without referring to some kind of activity. However, Sturm, in turn, rejects precisely Leibniz’s fundamental commitment to activity as the ontological ground of substances. As a result, Sturm hardly offers Leibniz any answer that would be satisfying from the latter’s point of view.

The clash of fundamental philosophical intuitions that surfaces in the exchange between Leibniz and Sturm is particularly interesting with regard to the complex evolution of early modern philosophy across the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries (Henkel 2021 and 2024, especially ch. 2; Sangiacomo 2020a and 2020b). In a sense, Leibniz voices the main objection that can be raised against Sturm; namely, without some active principle “mechanical forms” are just idle constructions that cannot perform any genuine explanatory role. However, Sturm’s consistent way of maintaining that explanation does not require any reference to intrinsic causal powers points, in fact, to an alternative account of causation and causal explanations altogether, which was emerging at the time (Carraud 2002; Sangiacomo 2019, 2020c).

Despite Leibniz opposing Sturm’s metaphysics and natural philosophy, he was appreciative of and influenced by Sturm’s (and Weigel’s) developments in logic (Lemanski 2018). Furthermore, Leibniz’s major philosophical ally in Germany, Christian Wolff, was very much fond of Sturm himself. So much so that it was Wolff who supported the publication of the pars specialis of Sturm’s PE and provided a preface to it. Wolff was probably familiar with Sturm due to Wolff’s former teacher, Georg Albrecht Hamberger (1662–1716), who in turn had studied with Sturm (Gaab, in Gaab et al. 2004: 48f).

In his preface, Wolff is full of praise for Sturm, especially because he believes to find in Sturm’s method an anticipation of his own tripartite division of knowledge into historical knowledge or knowledge of facts, philosophical knowledge or knowledge of causes, and mathematical knowledge or knowledge of the quantities of things put down in the first chapter of the Philosophia Rationalis (see SEP entry on Christian Wolff, sects. 3 and 7). However, Wolff is aware that mathematical quantification does not figure in Sturm’s method as prominently as the other two types of knowledge. Besides, Wolff compliments Sturm for establishing experimental teaching (collegia) — an academic novelty. Moreover, he looks very favorably on Sturm’s three physics, praising Sturm’s scientific method (sect. 2), and pointing out the very positive reception of the first part of the PE. He laments the absence of a third part (the pars specialissima) of the PE, which was supposed to deal with living beings. Sturm’s death prevented its termination and successive publication. However, in order to close this gap, Wolff directs the reader to the lecture of Honoré Fabri’s works on plants, animals and human beings. Indeed, Sturm himself had allegedly recommended to the editor to join Fabri’s writings on these matters with the two completed parts of the PE to provide a complete physics. Besides Fabri, in the preliminaries, Wolff directs the reader to the works of Gassendi, Clauberg, Du Hamel, La Forge, Cordemoy, Harvey, Perrault, Malpighi, Grew, and Ray to obtain knowledge about plants, animals, and especially the connection of the mind and the body in the human case.

2. The scientific method: experimental, hypothetical, eclectic

Sturm’s scientific method aims at providing a complete system of natural philosophy in which (potentially) all natural phenomena can receive satisfying causal explanations based on available observations and by taking into account the most perspicuous hypotheses advanced. Sturm’s method consists of three main steps, which also provide the recurrent pattern used to discuss all topics covered in the Physica Electiva.[2]

The first step consists in collecting phenomena, either reported by other natural philosophers or encountered by means of observation or experimentation itself. They need to be reported faithfully (fideliter), by accurately presenting the circumstances under which the phenomena obtained (PE I: preface, art. 3.4).

Sturm was committed to the new emerging experimental natural philosophy and he was among the first university professors in Germany to introduce an experimental approach on an academic level. Inspired by the experimental method advanced by Bacon and Boyle, he offered regular yet private experimental collegia (teaching). His Collegium experimentale sive curiosum (1676/1685) reveals that Sturm was familiar with the state of the art of experimental natural science, putting to good use the new instruments available at the time; namely, the telescope, microscope, air pump, diver’s bell, etc. Furthermore, hypotheses (the basis of theory-building) are measured both against their congruence with phenomena and the results of experiments. Paradigmatic experimenters for Sturm are Otto von Guericke, Caspar Schott, and Robert Boyle.

However, Sturm does not content himself with putting forth a mere natural history, a mere listing of things found in nature, or curious experimental results. Natural philosophy must provide deeper causal explanations for why the phenomena are such as they are and why they occur. To achieve this goal, the natural philosopher should take stock of experimental findings and available observations and investigate suitable hypotheses to explain them.

The second step, hence, consists in collecting and presenting with the same faithfulness old and new hypotheses that have been suggested to account for the phenomena. Sturm meticulously presents hypotheses old and new, from Pre-Socratic to seventeenth-century authors (see sect. 1.2). Sturm shows himself to be an assiduous, diligent reader of the natural philosophy available at his time. His knowledge of more and even less prominent authors is impressive and precise.

Sturm’s last physics, the Compendium Physicae Modernae Sanioris (CPMS), makes particularly clear that hypotheses have a place in between observations by the senses and certainties revealed by the demonstrative method. He points out that some things are obvious, in that they are observed by the senses or by means of experiments including the use of newly invented instruments (CPMS: 2f). Some things are merely conjectured rather than infallibly demonstrated (supponuntur verius & conjiciuntur, quam infallibiliter demonstratur) (CPMS: 3). Some are certain, in the sense that phenomena and hypotheses align, that is, they are

deduced (deducuntur) from phenomena and hypotheses in such a way by means of the demonstrative method that due to the ubiquitous harmonizing correspondence itself of the phenomena with the hypotheses, by means of a certain demonstrative regress, the things that had been assumed in a way seemingly true (verosimiliter), ascend to (evadent) truth and certainty. (CPMS: 3f)

The third step of Sturm’s method aims at selection and reconciliation of different hypotheses and at the final concocting of a satisfying account of the phenomena at stake. Sturm’s goal is to distil what is good and reasonable while discarding pseudo-explanations, prejudices and preconceived notions. This step is approached mainly through critical investigation, rational discussion and logical inference. In this sense, it is the more philosophical or speculative part of Sturm’s method. The goal of this third step is thus to critically assess and integrate the hypotheses collected.

At the beginning of his preface to the PE (PE I: art. 3.1), Sturm (possibly inspired by Boyle and Mariotte) extensively investigates criteria good hypotheses have to meet. They have to have a reasonable degree of possibility and show the connection among phenomena. They have to satisfy the circumstances that obtain. A hypothesis is better in case it can accommodate more phenomena and notable circumstances. Simpler hypotheses should be preferred. Hence, Sturm avails himself of Ockham’s razor in choosing among hypotheses. The reasoning behind this is that simple hypotheses mirror God’s ways which are simple (PE I: preface, art. 3.1). God as the wisest creator of nature (Opificem naturae Sapientissimum) designed the world by simple means which have to be taken into consideration when studying nature and its design. Furthermore, good hypotheses should neither conflict with phenomena, other established hypotheses nor evident principles (PE I: preface, art. 3.2). Finally, Sturm points out that hypotheses have to satisfy not only the intellect but also the imagination and the senses (PE I: preface, art. 3.3). Sturm’s reasoning here is that all natural phenomena are phenomena pertaining the world of extension and its modifications like shape and motion. The senses and the imagination are first and foremost concerned with the realm of extended beings, and therefore to assess the aptness of hypotheses about natural phenomena, one needs to consult both of these faculties. Mere abstract conceptual reflection about nature as is characteristic of the scholastics (Sturm thinks) is not sufficient, since worldly phenomena are most proximate to and palpable by the senses and the imagination (PE I: preface, art 3.3).

In this three-step method, the presentation of phenomena establishes the explanandum, the hypotheses cover some ground towards approximating a solution. But since these different hypotheses either contradict or run parallel to one another, a true explanation has to select from existing theories what is true, reject what is false, and add what needs be added. This brings us to Sturm’s eclecticism.[3]

The eclectic approach consists in nothing other than

to select and adopt (sibi sumere) from all sects of Philosophers that which is true, having left behind what is false and erroneous. (PE I: preface, art. 2.1)

Sturm encountered the eclectic method during his one-year stay in Leiden in 1660 probably inspired by Henricus Bornius. Both the preface of Sturm’s Physica Electiva and his disputation De Philosophia Sectaria & Electiva (DSE; in his 1686 Philosophia Eclectica) held in 1679 are pleas for eclecticism, which contrasts sharply with sectarian philosophy. According to Sturm, the whole of philosophers — bracketing sceptics and doubters (sceptios ac dubitatores) — can be subsumed under two classes: sectarians and eclectics (DSE: 3).

Sectarian thinkers are led by an authority on whom they slavishly depend. They do not follow their own reasoning, but spend their time absorbing, reproducing and fiercely defending what they have learned ex cathedra. Sectarian philosophers do not follow the truth of what is being said, but the authority of the person who said something. The most notable sects in Sturm’s days are the Aristotelians (secta Aristotelica) with its two main branches, namely, the Greek interpreters and the scholastic commentators; the Cartesians (secta Cartesiana); the Gassendists (secta Gassendica) reviving Epicurean and Democritean thought; and the Neoplatonists (secta Neo-Platonica) (DSE: 13). In his Physica Electiva, Sturm mentions the alchemical school (the Spagyric school or that of the chemists [Chemicorum]) as the fourth main one omitting Neo-Platonism (PE I: preface, art. 3.5).

The case for eclecticism is made ex negativo by challenging sectarianism and positively by bringing to light the strengths of the eclectic method. Concerning the repudiation of sectarian philosophy, Sturm argues that adopting a sectarian approach is first of all not a necessity (Sectariae quippe Philosophiae primo nulla est necessitas). It is not the only option (see DSE: 28f). Second, following one authority is not only not useful, it is even dangerous and damaging to the advancement and augmentation of the sciences.

In contrast to this, eclectic philosophers are defined as:

[T]hose who did not want to hang on to every word of someone, nor swear by the words of one master; they knew and collected for their storehouse everything that is true and good from the words and writings of whatever teachers (Doctorum) not convinced by the authority of the person teaching but by the weight of the arguments and demonstrations; even more they added from themselves as much as they could; they make it their business (sustineant) to see with their own rather than with someone else’s eyes. (DSE: 3f; see also DSE: 6, 28)

The eclectic method acknowledges the feebleness of the human mind, its proclivity to err (DSE: 23). In this it is humbler than sectarian philosophy which assumes to find all the truths in one author. Since humans on their own tend to misjudge things or make mistakes, they depend on one another as correctives. The scientific study of nature if it is to succeed, hence, becomes a collective endeavor:

By the name of the eclectic philosophers we understand in this whole treatise no others than those, who do not reject without a difference all the things that are found (inventa) and left (tradita) by the heads of different sects, and who are not so moved by the authority of one leader that they do accept all of his utterances and bons mots (dicteria), but who acknowledge the feebleness (imbecillitatem) of the human mind (humani ingenii), which makes it apparent that all depths of nature and reason cannot be exhausted by one or a few men; they persuade themselves that the truth can be only viewed in part, and that the sciences are to be advanced and stabilized by means of united powers (junctis viribus) and communicated advice (communicato consilio). (DSE: 7f)

It should be stressed that although eclecticism means collecting what is good in other authors, it does not just aim at a mere collection of true or probable hypotheses, but instead at the formulation of a coherent system of natural philosophy (PE I: preface, art. 3.2). Eclecticism, in Sturm’s eyes, explicitly invites the correction, emendation and augmentation of existing theories (DSE: 48, 69). It is a philosophical approach more useful and appropriate for the advancement of the sciences than thinking in line with one author as the sectarians do (DSE: 14).

Finally, Sturm’s method conceives of natural philosophy as a dynamic project in a state of constant transformation. To illustrate this point, Sturm compares philosophy as a whole to a ship: it is somewhat complete, though undergoing constant changes and mending. Both philosophy and a ship in use need to be fixed from time to time. Old, used-up parts (hypotheses in the case of philosophy, planks in the case of the ship) have to go to be replaced by new parts fit to allow both to advance (CPMS: 79). Philosophy is a never ending project. It can only approximate truth, getting closer and closer. No single natural philosopher has or could have exhausted and sufficiently explained the phenomena obtaining in nature. Hence, what needs to be done is to diligently assess and select what is good and true in other philosophers, adding what needs to be added. New phenomena are being discovered, new competing hypotheses are being developed to explain them. They too need to be assessed. What is reasonable remains. What is not able to stand up to the demands of a good hypothesis will have to go. The experimental study of nature proceeds, too. New instruments are being developed raising new challenges to old hypotheses. The vastness of nature, the manifold of its phenomena and the fact that causes cannot be observed but only conjectured add to the difficulty of the natural philosopher’s task. It would indeed be temerity and arrogance to think that one has explained all there needs to be explained in nature (CPMS: 67). Therefore, Sturm is making a case for the open-endedness of natural philosophy. Its goal is to know oneself, to know the world, and ultimately to know God (PE I: preface, art. 4.5; CPMS: 8). A goal that is not reachable within the life span of a human being, but a goal worth striving for.

3. Occasionalism

In the theoretical part (physica generalis) of his Physica Electiva, Sturm sets down the metaphysical foundations of his system. In a nutshell, Sturm argues that the whole of nature (human and angelic minds set aside) can be explained by two principles: matter and its modes, which are material forms. Both these principles are causally passive and shaped by local motion. Forms, in particular, provide the specific reasons why certain phenomena are produced in a certain way, but they do not include the causal powers that bring these phenomena about. That power comes only from God, who is the universal and omnipresent cause acting in nature. In order to support this picture, Sturm gives a number of original twists to an argumentative strategy already exploited by other occasionalist authors, while providing at the same time a more eclectic and broader rationale for endorsing an occasionalist metaphysics. To deepen Sturm’s account, three main points deserve special attention: (1) the justification for passive forms as modes of matter; (2) why God’s causal power is directly needed to bring about natural phenomena; and (3) the role that passive forms play in scientific explanations.

(1) Early modern natural philosophers agree with their Scholastic opponents in granting that matter is utterly passive and devoid of efficacious causal powers. Sturm takes stock of this point, joining Descartes and other Cartesians in defining matter in terms of pure extension (res extensa) and motion as local motion. However, early modern natural philosophers disagreed with Scholastics and among themselves about the notion of ‘form’, whether there could be any ‘substantial form’ and if rejecting substantial forms would lead to discard all causal powers in finite beings.

Sturm’s position in this debate is clear-cut. Sturm argues that forms are nothing but modes of matter (i.e., modifications of an extended substance), and since matter is causally passive, forms are causally passive, too. Sturm agrees with many other early modern anti-Scholastic philosophers in dismissing scholastic substantial forms.

Sturm’s argument for rejecting substantial forms is based on a trilemma, according to which forms are either (i) purely material beings, (ii) purely spiritual beings distinct from matter, or (iii) a kind of being that is in between purely material and purely immaterial substances.

The first option leads directly to Sturm’s own view. If substantial forms are purely material beings, they cannot be substances in themselves because the form of a material body cannot be another separate material body, given that forms operate in virtue of their intimate union with the matter of the substance of which they are the form. It follows that if substantial forms are purely material, then they have to be conceived as modes of matter.

The second option is relevant because later scholastic authors (such as Suárez) tended to use the rational soul as the prototype to understand natural substantial forms as well. However, the rational soul is a self-standing spiritual substance that can exist and be conceived independently from the body with which it is united. This entails that the rational soul is not the form of the body, but simply a different, independent substance that is united with the body itself. Hence (pace scholastics), the case of the human rational soul cannot be used as a model to conceptualize ‘substantial forms’ in other (non-human) natural beings (PE I: 94).

Sturm’s argument against the third option of the trilemma runs as follows. If one defines (as scholastics usually do) a substantial form in terms of the role that the form plays in explaining and accounting for the nature of composite beings, then what is called a ‘substantial form’ cannot belong to the ontological category of a substance, but only to the category of ‘relatives’ or relational things. Sturm stresses that “the entire nature of a form generally and essentially consists of a relation” (PE I: 94). Forms are not beings in themselves, but ways in which certain beings operate and undergo changes. Against the third option of the trilemma, Sturm maintains that forms are not the kind of being that can be conceived of or exist independently from the being that they inform. Natural forms cannot be understood as a kind of substance or being intermediate between material and spiritual substances because forms are not substances in the first place. Since natural forms are relational beings they cannot be substances, and thus the very idea of a ‘substantial form’ is a chimera, a category mistake. The only viable option left is thus the one defended by Sturm himself: forms are modes of matter, and since matter is causally passive, forms are causally passive as well.

(2) This conclusion requires an account of how natural phenomena can take place if nothing in nature is endowed with active causal powers. According to Sturm, the origin of natural causality lies in God himself. God is the substance defined by pure activity, and He is the only truly efficient cause of all motion in the world:

Only God’s most efficacious volition is that truly acting power (virtutem), which moves while not being moved, which rigorously speaking moves, which moves one body by means of (per) another, which moves the whole corporeal world, its parts, some by means of (per) others, and in this way He brings about (efficiat) every one of the natural effects that happens in even the most remote corners of the Universe by means of his sole immediate power. (PE I: 164)

God is the “requiring cause” (causam exigentem, PE I: 161) of natural phenomena. This means that when God wants something to happen then the effect obtains. However, Sturm also maintains that God’s will does not operate in nature through its “absolute power” (potentia absoluta) but rather by following what Sturm calls “respective or hypothetical power” (potentia respectiva & hypothetica):

Here I established that God acts and operates in the whole of nature, not on the basis of his absolute power (which obtains whatever he wants without hindrances and in the most perfect way), but on the basis of a respective and hypothetical power, whose exercise God himself has (in the most free way) subordinated to certain conditions of matter or of the human mind. (PE I: 178)

God did not establish to elicit effects absolutely by his mere act of free will. Rather, God freely subordinated his own actions to the obtainment of certain specific conditions, namely, certain states of natural beings or of human minds. Sturm does not extensively use the Malebranchian terminology of occasional causes, but he does explicitly equate occasional causes with sine quibus non causes (PE I: 117). A sine qua non cause is a (counterfactually) necessary condition for the production of a certain effect, although the sine qua non cause does not truly contribute to its production in virtue of any active power it possesses (see Sangiacomo 2019). Sturm’s account of God’s hypothetical power entails that all natural forms are sine quibus non conditions for the production of natural effects, in the sense that they do not contribute in virtue of any active power they might have (since they have none), but rather because God (freely) established to bring about certain effects as consequences of certain modifications (i.e., forms) of matter. Since (what Malebranche calls) ‘occasional causes’ can be understood in terms of sine qua non causation, and since Sturm maintains that all natural forms work as sine quibus non causes of natural effects, it seems safe to conclude that Sturm supports a version of occasionalism.

Hence, Sturm’s strategy achieves its goal: matter is causally passive, and material forms are passive as well. In order to account for the changes observed in nature, it is necessary to locate a source for causal activity. However, this source cannot be found anywhere in the natural world itself. God is thus the only candidate left to account for the causal active power needed to bring about natural phenomena. God’s power, however, is only responsible for the fact that natural phenomena are brought about. The specific reason why they are such and such is to be located in the specific features of passive forms themselves. In this respect, God’s involvement in nature plays only a metaphysical grounding function and it is not supposed to replace, but rather to justify, the need to carefully investigate the mechanical structures of passive forms.

Sturm’s occasionalism, however, is quite peculiar, especially as compared to Malebranche’s more familiar version of occasionalism. A crucial feature of Malebranche’s occasionalism is the role that the laws of nature play in accounting for natural phenomena. According to him, natural beings do not have any causal powers and can be occasions of their effects only in virtue of the laws of nature established by God. In contrast, Sturm takes God to establish the whole set of counterfactually necessary conditionals that determine which effects will obtain when certain conditions are in place in nature. These conditions are passive forms themselves, which then play the role of explanantia of natural phenomena.

(3) Sturm’s account of passive forms breaks with the idea that explanatory principles in natural philosophy must also account for the active power that brings phenomena about. In this sense, Sturm dismisses the idea that causal explanations must be based on active powers intrinsic to the natural agents themselves. According to Sturm, all phenomena are brought about by God himself. But God’s power being indifferent, differences among phenomena depend on passive forms, which operate as sine quibus non conditions for their production. This means that the explanandum in natural phenomena is not the fact that something is brought about, but rather the specific characteristics of what is brought about. God’s power explains that something (in general) is brought about, but only passive forms explain what is brought about in particular and how. The explanandum in natural phenomena is thus the specificity of the phenomenon at stake, and the explanans of this phenomenon are passive forms, which are a matter of empirical investigation.

Sturm’s approach combines the strengths of both the scholastic and seventeenth-century mechanist approach in order to remedy their reciprocal shortcomings. Passive mechanical forms (as Aristotelian-scholastic forms) are particular principles of explanation that can be used to account for different specific phenomena. At the same time, passive mechanical forms (as mechanical principles) are ontologically nothing but modes of matter shaped by motion. Passive forms are different among themselves but they are all ontologically shaped by the same universal principles, which make explanations based on passive mechanical forms homogenous and uniform (from a conceptual point of view) without making them too general and abstract.

Sturm’s approach has at least two important implications: (i) the integration of teleology and final causation in a mechanist natural philosophy; and (ii) the marginalization of the laws of nature therein.

Sturm is a strenuous defender of natural teleology and final causes. In the chapter dedicated to final causes in the PE, Sturm presents to the reader numerous phenomena which are supposed to back up or at least make her inclined to accept the existence of teleology in nature as well as the necessity to study it. Sturm mentions inter alia bodily organs performing certain functions (the eyes are there to see; the heart pumps blood through the body) and the well-adaptedness of certain animals; for instance, in the case of birds (geese, ducks, storks) their wings, the lightness of their bones, and the possession of a certain type of beak. According to Sturm, ends and uses are an inextricable part of the world as a whole and of its parts (PE I: 226). Sturm’s passive forms thus retain the teleological connotation that Aristotelian forms already had, fitting it into a mechanist picture of the universe. Forms are structures of matter aimed at producing certain effects rather than others. They are not only the efficient (passive) conditions for these effects to obtain, but also the final (passive) principles that explain them. Properly speaking, God himself, once again, is the sole final cause in nature, since God is the one who designed, planned and carried out the whole of nature as a gigantic and most perfect clockwork.

Sturm’s emphasis on forms has its counterpart in his marginalization of the role that the laws of nature play in his natural philosophy and in scientific explanations. Sturm puts forward only two very general laws, one concerning the communication of motion (PE I: 164) and the other concerning the mind-body union (PE I: 858–859). Focusing on the conservation of motion, it is important to stress that this law is not supposed to explain what specific features different specific bodies can have, nor does Sturm ever suggest that the variety of finite things could follow from a consideration of this (or any other) law alone. Rather, the law of the conservation of the quantity of motion simply constrains the effects of every natural phenomenon (namely, the fact that motion cannot be dissipated during impacts but must be always conserved in the whole of the universe). Remarkably, Sturm also mentions that this law is not deduced a priori from purely metaphysical considerations (as is the case in Descartes’ deduction of conservation from the nature of God’s immutability), but rather only a posteriori on the basis of empirical observations. As an empirical regularity derived from experience, Sturm’s conservation law does not have the same strong metaphysical connotations of Malebranche’s laws of nature (which are grounded in a consideration of God’s attributes of simplicity and wisdom), nor does it play any significant role in the explanation of particular phenomena.


Selection of Sturm’s works

  • 1661, Universalia Euclidea, The Hague: Adrian Ulac.
  • 1670, Mathesis compendiaria, Altdorf: Heinrich Meyer.
  • 1676, Collegium experimentale sive curiosum, part one, Nuremberg: Wolfgang Mauritius & Johannes Andreas Endter.
  • 1684 [PC], Physica Conciliatrix, Nuremberg: Wolfgang Mauritius Endter.
  • 1685, Collegium experimentale sive curiosum, part two, Nuremberg: Wolfgang Mauritius Endter.
  • 1686, Philosophia eclectica, h.e. Exercitationes Academicae, Vol. 1 (a collection of thirteen academic disputations), Altdorf?: Johann Heinrich Schönnerstädt.
  • 1689, Mathesis enucleata, Nuremberg: Wolfgang Mauritius Endter.
  • 1692, Idolum Naturae, Altdorf: Heinrich Meyer.
  • 1697 [PE I], Physica Electiva sive Hypothetica, Vol. 1, Nuremberg: Wolfgang Mauritius Endter; reprint in Christian Wolff (2006): Gesammelte Werke, III Abt., Band 97.1.1 and 97.1.2, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • 1698, Philosophia eclectica, h.e. Exercitationes Academicae, Vol. 2 (a collection of another fourteen disputations) (Frankfurt; Leipzig); De Natura sibi incassum vindicata, Altdorf: Heinrich Meyer.
  • 1699, Mathesis juvenilis, Vol. 1, Nuremberg: Joh. Hofmann & Engelbert Streck.
  • 1701, Mathesis juvenilis, Vol. 2, Nuremberg: Joh. Hofmann & Engelbert Streck.
  • 1704 [CPMS], Physicae modernae et sanioris compendium erotematicum, Nuremberg: Joh. Hofmann & Engelbert Streck.
  • 1713, Kurtzer Begriff der Physic oder Natur-Lehre, anonymous translation of 1704 CPMS, Hamburg: Samuel Heyl.
  • 1722 [PE II], Physica electiva sive hypothetica, tomus secundus, introduced and published by Christian Wolff, Wolfgang Mauritius Endter (Nuremberg); reprint in: Christian Wolff (2006): Gesammelte Werke, III Abt., Band 97.2.1 and 97.122, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.

Early Modern & Post-Kantian Reception

  • Brucker, Johann Jakob, 1766, Historia critica philosophiae a tempore resuscitatarum in occidente literarum ad nostra tempora, Bernh. Christoph. Breitkopf (Leipzig), Vol. IV, part 1, book 3, ch. 4, pp. 769–772.
  • Doppelmayr, Johann Gabriel, 1730, Historische Nachricht von den Nürnbergischen Mathematicis und Künstlern, welche von dreyen Seculis her durch ihre Schriften und Kunst-Bemühungen die Mathematic und mehrere Künste in Nürnberg vor anderen trefflich befördert/ und sich um solche sehr wohl verdient gemacht/ zu einem guten Exempel, und zur weiteren rühmlichen Nachahmung in zweyen Theilen an das Licht gestellet, auch mit vielen nützlichen Anmerkungen und verschiedenen Kupffern versehen, Johann Ernst Adelbuinern (Nuremberg), pp. 114–122, entry: “Johann Christoph Sturm”.
  • Gumposch, Victor Philipp, 1851, Die philosophische Literatur der Deutschen von 1400 bis auf unsere Tage, Verlag von G. Joseph Manz (Regensburg), reprinted as part of Lutz Geldsetzer’s Instrumenta Philosophica, Series Indices Librorum II, Stern Verlag Janssen & Co. (Düsseldorf), pp. 99f.
  • von Haller, Albert, 1774–1777, Bibliotheca Anatomica qua scripta ad Anatomen et Physiologiam facientia a rerum initiis recensentur, Orell, Gessner, Fuessli et socc. (Zurich), Vol. 1 (1774), Book VI (Animalium Incisiones), §570 (Johannes Christophorus Sturm), pp. 632–633.
  • König, Georg Matthias, 1678, Bibliotheca vetus et nova in qua Hebraeorum, Chaldaeorum, Syrorum, Arabum, Persarum, Aegyptiorum, Graecorum, et Latinorum per universum terrarum orbem Scriptorum, Theologorum, Jctorum, Medicorum, Philosophorum, Historicorum, Geographorum, Philologorum, Oratorum, Poetarum &c Patria, Ætas, Nomina, Libri, saepius etiam Eruditorum de iis Elogia, Testimonia & Judicia summa fide atque diligentia ex quotidiana Autorum Lectione depromta a prima Munid origine ad Annum usque MDCLXXIIXX ordine Alphabetico digesta gratissima brevitate recensentur & exhibentur, Wolfgang Mauritius & Johannes Andreas Endter (Altdorf), p. 783.
  • Jöcher, Christian Gottlieb, 1750, Allgemeines Gelehrten-Lexicon, darinne die Gelehrten aller Stände sowohl männ- als weiblichen Geschlechts, welche vom Anfange der Welt bis auf die ietzige Zeit gelebt, und sich der gelehrten Welt bekannt gemacht, nach ihrer Geburt, Leben, merckwürdigen Geschichten, Absterben und Schrifften aus den glaubwürdigsten Scribenten in alphabetischer Ordnung beschrieben werden, Vierter Theil S-Z, Johann Friedrich Gleditschens Buchhandlung (Leipzig), entry: Sturm, Joh. Christoph, pp. 912–913.
  • Morhof, Daniel Georg, 1747, Polyhistor Literarius, Philosophicus et Practicus, Lübeck: Peter Boeckmann; reprint Aalen: Scientia Verlag 1970.
  • Saxe, Christopher, 1785, Onomasticon Literarum sive Nomenclator historico-criticus praestantissimorum omnis Aetatis Populi, Artiumque, Formulae Sciptorum item Monumentorum maxime illustrium, ab Orbe condito usque ad Saeculi, quod vivimus, Tempora digestus, et verisimilibus, quantum fieri potuit Annorum notis accomodatus, Paddenburg, Paddenburg, Wild & Schoonhoven (Utrecht), part V, p. 612.
  • Stolle, Gottlieb, 1738, Anmerkungen über D. Heumanns Conspectum Reipublicae Litterariae, allen Liebhabern der Historie der Gelahrtheit zu Liebe an den Tag gegeben, Johann Meyer (Jena), p. 384.
  • Will, Georg Andreas, 1757, Nürnbergisches Gelehrten-Lexicon oder Beschreibung aller Nürnbergischen Gelehrten beyderley Geschlechtes nach Ihrem Leben/ Verdiensten und Schriften zur Erweiterung der gelehrten Geschichtskunde und Verbesserung vieler darinnen vorgefallenen Fehler aus den besten Quellen in alphabetischer Ordnung, part 3 (N-S), Lorenz Schüpfel (Nuremberg & Altdorf), pp. 800–809, entry: “Sturm (Johann Christoph)”.
  • Windelband, W., 1878, Die Geschichte der Neueren Philosophie in ihrem Zusammenhange mit der allgemeinen Cultur und den besonderen Wissenschaften dargestellt, Verlag Breitkopf und Härtel (Leipzig), Vol. 1: Von der Renaissance bis Kant, §47. Deutschland im XVII. Jahrhundert, pp. 432 – 433.
  • Zedler, Johann Heinrich, 1731–1754, Grosses vollständiges Universallexikon aller Wiessnschaften und Künste, welche bishero durch menschlichen Verstand und Witz erfunden und verbessert worden, Johann Heinrich Zedler (publisher) (Halle & Leipzig), 64 vol. + 4 supplementary vol., vol. 40, pp. 722–725 (columns 1417–1424): “Sturm (Johann Christoph)”.

Secondary literature

In German

  • Ahnert, Thomas, 2003, “‘Nullius in verba’: Autorität und Experiment in der Frühen Neuzeit. Das Beispiel Johann Christoph Sturms (1635–1703)”, Zeitsprünge, 7(4): 604–618.
  • Albrecht, Michael, 1994, Eklektik. Eine Begriffsgeschichte mit Hinweisen auf die Philosophie- und Wissenschaftsgeschichte, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Friedrich Frommann Verlag (Günther Holzboog), ch. 5, §§28–30, pp. 309–357.
  • –––, 2001, “Johann Christoph Sturm”, in Friedrich Ueberweg, Helmut Holzhey, and Wilhelm Schmidt-Biggemann (eds), Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie. Die Philosophie des 17. Jahrhunderts, Band 4 [Vol. 4], Das Heilige Römische Reich Deutscher Nation, Nord- und Ostmitteleuropa, Basel: Schwabe & Co AG Verlag, ch. 8, §24, pp. 942–947.
  • Bosl, Erika, 1983, “Sturm, Johann Christoph, Philosoph, Physiker und Mathematiker”, in Bosls bayerische Biographie, Karl Bosl (ed.), Regensburg: Pustet, p. 766.
  • Gaab, Hans, Pierre Leich, and Günter Löffladt, 2004, Johann Christoph Sturm (1635–1703), Frankfurt am Main: Verlag Harri Deutsch.
  • Herrmann, Volker and Kai Thomas Platz, 2003, Der Wahrheit auf der Spur. Johann Christoph Sturm (1635–1703, Büchenbach, Germany: Verlag Dr. Faustus.
  • Herrmann, Volker, 2013, “Sturm, Johann Christoph (Pseudonym Alethophilus von Uranien)”, in Neue Deutsche Biographie, 25: 652 [available online].
  • Krafft, Fritz, 1978, “Der Weg von den Physiken zur Physik an den deutschen Universitäten”, Berichte zur Wissenschaftsgeschichte, 1(3–4): 123–162. doi:10.1002/bewi.19780010302
  • Leinsle, Ulrich Gottfried, 1988, Reformversuche protestantischer Metaphysik im Zeitalter des Rationalismus, Augsburg: Maro Verlag, §3.2 “Universalmathematik als Metaphysik: Johann Christoph Sturm”, pp. 105–113.
  • Nobis, Heribert M., 1966, “Die Bedeutung Der Leibnizschrift ‚De Ipsa Natura’ Im Lichte Ihrer Begriffsgeschichtlichen Voraussetzungen. Herrn Dr. Ludwig von Pigenot zur Vollendung Seines 75. Lebensjahres”, Zeitschrift Für Philosophische Forschung, 20(3/4): 525–538.
  • Pallaia, Roberto, 1990, “Naturbegriff und Kraftbegriff im Briefwechsel zwischen Leibniz und Sturm”, Studia Leibnitiana Supplementa, 27: 157–172 (contains the original Latin correspondence between Leibniz and Sturm).
  • Petersen, Peter, 1921, Geschichte der aristotelischen Philosophie im protestantischen Deutschland, Hamburg: Verlag von Felix Meiner. [facsimile reprint 1964, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Friedrich Frommann Verlag (Günther Holzboog)], pp. 156–161.
  • Recknagel, Hans, 1998, Die nürnbergische Universität Altdorf und ihre großen Gelehrten, Eigenverlag.
  • Recktenwald, Hans Claus (ed.), 1966, Gelehrte der Universität Altdorf, Nuremberg: Lorenz Spindler Verlag.
  • Schimank, Hans, 1969, “Die Wandlung des Begriffs ‚Physik‘ während der ersten Hälfte des 18. Jahrhunderts”, in Wissenschaft, Wirtschaft und Technik. Studien zur Geschichte, Karl-Heinz Manegold (ed.), Munich: Verlag F. Bruckmann, part VI, pp. 454–468.
  • Ueberweg, Friedrich, 1924, Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie, part 3: Die Philosophie der Neuzeit bis zum Ende des XVIII. Jahrhunderts, Berlin: S. Mittler & Sohn, p. 328.

In English

  • Blackwell, Constance W. T., 1995, “The Case of Honoré Fabri and the Historiography of Sixteenth and Seventeenth Century Jesuit Aristotelianism in Protestant History of Philosophy: Sturm, Morhof and Brucker”, Nouvelles de la Republique des Lettres, 1995(1): 49–78.
  • –––, 1997, “Sturm, Morhof and Brucker vs. Aristotle: Three eclectic natural Philosophers view the Aristotelian Method”, in Method and Order in Renaissance Philosophy of Nature. The Aristotle Commentary Tradition, Daniel A. Di Liscia, Eckhard Kessler, and Charlotte Methuen (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing Limited, pp. 381–407.
  • Dennehy, Myriam, 2009, “Leibniz et Sturm, Lecteurs de Boyle,” in M. Dennehy and C. Raimond (eds.), La philosophie naturelle de Robert Boyle, Paris: Vrin, 331–359.
  • Henkel, Christian, 2021, “Mechanism, Occasionalism, and Final Causes in Johann Christoph Sturm’s Physics”, Early Science and Medicine, 26(4): 314–340.
  • –––, 2022, Grounding the World. The Dissemniation of Occasionalism in Early Modern Germany, Ph.D. dissertation, University of Groningen.
  • –––, 2024, Occasionalism and the Debate about Causation in Early Modern Germany, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Lemanski, Jens, 2018, “Logic Diagrams in the Weigel and Weise Circles”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 39(1): 3–28. doi:10.1080/01445340.2017.1341074
  • Sangiacomo, Andrea, 2019, “Sine Qua Non Causation: The Legacy of Malebranche’s Occasionalism in Kant’s New Elucidation”, in Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, volume 9, Donald Rutherford (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 251–257.
  • –––, 2020a, “Johann Christoph Sturm‘s natural philosophy: passive forms, occasionalism and scientific explanations”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 58(3): 493–520.
  • –––, 2020b, “Teleology and the evolution of natural philosophy: the case of Johann Christoph Sturm and Petrus van Musschenbroek”, Studia Leibnitiana, 50(1): 41–56.
  • –––, 2020c, “The Normalisation of Natural Philosophy: Occasional Causality and Coarse Grained Reality”, History of Universities, XXXIII(2): 201–236.

Other works cited

  • Arthur, Richard T. W., 2014, Leibniz, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Carraud, Vincent, 2002, Causa sive Ratio. La raison de la cause, de Suárez à Leibniz, Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm von, 1989, Philosophical Essays, edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co.
  • Schmitt, Charles B., 1983, Aristotle and the Renaissance, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Wundt, Max, 1938, Die deutsche Schulmetaphysik des 17. Jahrhunderts, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr (Paul Siebeck).

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