Notes to Climate Justice

1. For empirical evidence see the assessment reports of the Intergovernmental Panel on Climate Change (IPCC). The five Assessment Reports (published in, respectively, 1990, 1996, 2001, 2007, & 2013/2014) can be found at Other Internet Resources. See also the Special Report on “Global Warming of 1.5ºC” (IPCC 2019).

2. There are complications here concerning negative emissions technologies. These seek to extract greenhouse gases from the atmosphere. The size of the budget thus depends on the volume of greenhouse gases emitted, the extent of greenhouse gas sinks, and the extent to which it is possible to extract greenhouse gases from the atmosphere.

3. For further illuminating analyses of precautionary principles in the context of climate change see Hartzell-Nicholas (2017) and McKinnon (2012).

4. There are circumstances in which someone might still reasonably plead a kind of excusable ignorance. Consider a case in which someone purchases a car in part because they have been informed by reliable expert bodies that the car has passed tests showing that it has very low emissions. Suppose, however, that this was a case in which the car manufacturer found a way of fooling the testing equipment, and that the cars in fact had high emissions. In such cases the customers could reasonably argue that they were excusably ignorant of the fact that their car was causing considerable environmental harm.

Copyright © 2020 by
Simon Caney <>

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