Supplement to Retributive Justice

Challenges to the Notion of Retributive Proportionality

The discussion of the challenges to retributive proportionality is divided up into the following three sections:

1. Measuring the gravity of a wrong

Two dimensions of wrongdoing figure most prominently in its gravity: the magnitude of the harm or wrong inflicted or risked, and the culpability of the wrongdoer for bringing it about or risking it. There is empirical evidence that people across a wide range of demographics can rank order even subtle variations of “core wrongs…—physical aggression, takings without consent, and deception in exchanges—” with surprising consistency (Robinson & Kurzban 2007: 1892). These subtle variations involve, for example, two thefts differing primarily only in that one involved sneaking into an open garage while the other involved breaking into a locked house (2007: 1895). Extreme concerns about arbitrariness in rankings, at least of mala in se crimes, are somewhat alleviated by these studies. (The implications of this for mala prohibita crimes are discussed in Walen forthcoming.) Nonetheless, there are worrisome difficulties.

The fundamental difficulty is in bringing the two dimensions—magnitude of the harm and culpability for causing or risking it—together into a single dimension of “gravity”. Consider Hart’s question (1968: 162): “Is negligently causing the destruction of a city worse than the intentional wounding of a single policeman?”

Other complexities only add to that fundamental difficulty. First, does it matter if harm is caused, or is the gravity of the wrong set fully by the wrong risked or intended? (For the position that harm does not matter, see Feinberg 1995; Alexander, Ferzan, & Morse 2009; for a criticism of that view, see Levy 2005; Westen 2009; Walen 2010. The Model Penal Code, § 5.05(1), aspires to reject the relevance of harm caused, but does not do so completely.)

Second, what significance, if any, should be given to the difference between being punished for the first time, and having been punished before and then having committed the same or a similar wrong again? Many retributivists resist the idea that past convictions should matter, on the grounds that having been punished already, more severe punishment for the next wrong would effectively constitute double punishment for the first (Singer 1979: ch. 5; Fletcher 2000: 462). Others think there is a way around this problem. One approach is to hold the repeat offender guilty of a culpable omission: the failure “to organize his life in a way that reduces the risk of his reoffending” (Lee 2009: 578). Another is to defend a first-offender discount, reflecting human susceptibility to temptation (frailty). This discount would progressively diminish for subsequent comparable offenses, effectively raising the offender’s culpability (von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005: 148–155), and it would apply only to lesser wrongs, as it is hard to sympathize with frailty when it comes to serious crimes such as rape or murder (Duff 2001: 169). Both versions of a recidivist premium should be distinguished from Duff’s view that persistent dangerous offenders may effectively forfeit their right to be treated as equal citizens (2001: §4.2).

Third, do the background conditions in which a wrongdoer acts affect her culpability for a particular wrong? Some think that coming from a severely deprived or “rotten social background” undermines a wrongdoer’s culpability (Bazelon 1976; Delgado 1985; Gardner 1998; Delgado 2011). Others think coming from such a background is a “tragedy, but it should not be a defense to crime” (Morse 2011). Others distinguish ways in which it might be relevant to punishment, not because it limits what a proportional punishment can be, but because it calls for compassion (von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005: §5.3.1) or disqualification of the state—see section 4.2. (For other sources of complexity, see Feinberg 1995: 132.)

2. Punishment proportional to a crime

There are two basic senses of proportionality: cardinal and ordinal. Cardinal proportionality sets absolute measures for punishment that is proportional to a given crime; ordinal proportionality requires only that more serious crimes be punished more severely than less serious crimes.

Lex Talionis (section 3.6) offers a theory of cardinal proportionality. In its traditional form—an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth—it seems implausible, both for being too lenient in some cases (take $10 from a thief who stole $10), and too extreme in others (repeatedly torture and rape someone who had committed many such acts himself). Kant proposed what might be thought a better version, saying that the thief should lose not just the value of what he stole, but instead all rights to property (1797: 142), and prohibiting those forms of “mistreatment that could make the humanity in the person suffering it into something abominable” (ibid.). Nonetheless, his measure for theft swings to the overly punitive side, leaving the convicted thief a dependent on the state, and thereby “reduced to the status of a slave for a certain time, or permanently if the state sees fit” (ibid.). Others have tried to rehabilitate lex talionis, arguing, for example, that it can be rendered plausible if interpreted to call for punishment that “possess[es] some or all of the characteristics that made the offense wrong” (Waldron 1992: 35). But however one spells out the wrong-making characteristics, it seems likely that lex talionis will provide a measure either too vague to be of much help (see Shafer-Landau 1996: 299–302; 2000: 197–198), or too specific to be plausible (at least in some cases).

A purely ordinal approach, however, also has problems. If all that were required to do justice is to rank order wrongs by their gravity and then provide a mapping onto a range of punishments that likewise went from lighter to more serious—respecting the norms of rank-ordering and parity—then neither the range of punishments from a fine of $1 up to a fine of $100, nor from 40 years to 60 years in prison, would provide disproportionate punishment, no matter what the crimes. This seems wrong. Murder should not be punished with a $100 fine, and littering should not be punished with 40 years in prison. Some measure of cardinality therefore seems to be called for, punishing grave wrongs with heavy penalties and minor wrongs with light penalties.

The possibility of anchoring certain punishments within these broad bands of acceptable cardinal values, and then using ordinal proportionality to fill in the spaces between these anchor points, arguably provides for an acceptable and complete scale of proportional punishment (see Kleinig 1973: 123–124). If one believes that it is also possible to have a sense for relative degree of gravity, then such an anchored ordinal system can prevent clustering near any anchor point, and provide a fairly precise, plausible scale of proportional punishment that could be used in any given jurisdiction (von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005: §9.3).

It is worth emphasizing that such a scale would not have universal application. It would depend on a jurisdiction choosing certain anchor points within the acceptable ranges, and thus would apply only within that jurisdiction. But if such jurisdictional variation can be tolerated, then the scales so provided would be far less vague and open to consequentialist input in setting punishment than the scale embraced by limiting retributivism—see section 3.4.

Some think that this sort of flexibility would be problematic because retributivism is inherently inclined towards cruel harshness (Dolinko 1991; Garland 2001; Whitman 2003; Ristroff 2009; Lacey & Pickard 2015b). This is a mistake if taken as a conceptual point (Robinson 2008; Flanders 2010; Gray & Huber 2010; Duus-Otterström 2013). There are empirical reasons to worry that, in practice, retributivism goes hand in hand with excessive harshness. On the other hand, the evidence may show more correlation than causation.

Working against a tendency to cruelty is the principle of parsimony, which adds downward normative pressure to the range of anchoring points. The idea is that since punishment involves suffering, it should be inflicted as minimally as possible, consistent with the vague limits of cardinal desert and any other goals (including deterrence and incapacitation) that should be cited to provide a full justification for punishment. Importantly, parsimony is not to be confused with mercy. Mercy involves giving a wrongdoer less than she deserves out of compassion or humanitarian concern for her wellbeing (Hampton in Murphy & Hampton 1988: 158–159; Gray 2010: 1692). Parsimony is a reason for lowering the scale of punishments from which one can determine what a wrongdoer deserves, again within any given jurisdiction.

While the idea of a scale of punishments may suggest a certain linear simplicity, it is important to keep in mind that the severity of a punishment depends on at least two dimensions: the degree of harshness, and its duration or repetition (for corporal punishment). One might think that duration and harshness can simply be traded off, but retributivists have reason favor shorter, harsher punishments over longer, more lenient ones (Tomlin 2014b). In brief, it is bad, from a retributive point of view, if a wrongdoer does not get the punishment she deserves, and the longer it takes for her to get the full punishment she deserves, the greater the chance that she will either die or change in such a way that it is no longer reasonable to punish her for what she did.

3. Criticisms of retributivism based on problems with proportionality

Greg Roebuck and David Wood (2011) claim that it is incumbent on punishers to demonstrate that the punishment they propose to inflict is not disproportionately large. Given that moral anchoring can provide at best a very rough set of guidelines for proportional punishment, and that the methods of extrapolating from or interpolating between them are also highly underdetermined, they argue that no one can meet this burden. Therefore, a retributive commitment to proportionality would require the abolition of punishment.

This critique rests on the premise that there might be true proportional punishments that any actual punishment might exceed, no matter how parsimonious the scale of punishment on which it rests. But a more plausible reading of the vagueness of anchors and the process of reasoning from them is that they provide an acceptable range in which to build an internally consistent schedule of punishments. Thus, a more reasonable conclusion to draw, in the face of epistemic uncertainty, is that any given schedule of punishments should stick to the lower end of the intuitively acceptable spectrum of punishments (Duus-Otterström 2013).

Claire Finkelstein (2004) raises a different sort of proportionality-based objection to retributivism. She claims that

retributivists’ theory of punishment was supposed itself to answer the question of which punishments are morally acceptable and which are not. (2004: 213)

Lex talionis at least promised to explain what sorts of punishments are justified, but given that it fails, it seems that retributivism cannot account for why we find certain punishments acceptable—primarily imprisonment, fines, community service, probation, the loss of certain rights, and possibly the death penalty—and reject others, such as torture, shaming punishments, or forced sterilization (2004: 212–213).

The problem with Finkelstein’s objection is that she assigns to retributivists a task that they have no reason to accept. Yes, proportionality should rule out certain punishments on the ground that they are disproportionately large. But there is no reason for retributivists not to look to other criteria, such as respect for human dignity, to prohibit those forms of punishment that seem cruel or degrading. (Determining how to judge the permissibility of the death penalty is a particularly thorny problem, beyond the scope of this entry. For a brief survey of the difficulty, see Edmundson 2002.)

Adam Kolber (2013) raises the most difficult proportionality-based criticism of retributivism. He starts from the observation that countries that use pre-trial detention seem universally to give those who are convicted credit for the time they have served. For example, if someone gets a sentence of a year, and has spent six months in jail in pre-trial detention, she would have to serve only six additional months. Serving the full year, after spending six months in jail already, would seem to be a disproportionate sentence. But it is hard to explain the intuition that this practice is morally required in any way other than by recognizing that hard treatment inflicted in connection with a crime is relevant to the size of the punishment, even if it wasn’t intended as punishment at the time it was inflicted. If, however, hard treatment inflicted in connection with a crime counts towards the size of the punishment, then we seem to be thrown back onto the sort of view about suffering rejected in section 4.3.3, the view that what matters is how much a person suffers, whether or not the suffering was inflicted as part of a punishment. (For a way of addressing Kolber’s problem that builds on the assumption that suffering counts even if not part of punishment, see Alexander & Ferzan 2018: 200–204.)

This is a difficult problem for retributivists. One solution is for retributivists to give up the claim (contra Husak 1990) that their commitment to proportionality requires them to give credit for pre-trial detention, as pre-trial detention is not meant to be punitive. Perhaps they have other reasons for giving credit for pre-trial detention at sentencing, perhaps reasons of mercy or fairness. But it would be an odd sort of requirement of mercy, as mercy is usually taken to be discretionary. And if called for as a matter of fairness, it is unclear why fairness does not require the other accommodations that Kolber notes and that nonetheless seem counter-intuitive. This is not to say that retributivists could not come up with an adequate response to Kolber—perhaps linked to the response offered in section 4.3.3 to his arguments regarding excessive suffering—but they have work to do.

Copyright © 2020 by
Alec Walen <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free