Once violent conflict between two groups has subsided, what is the best way to transition to a civil society? Do former enemies need to “come to terms with their past” if they are to live peacefully? If such a reckoning is required, what are the strategies of transition available to the parties?
The field of transitional justice, which investigates such questions, involves the philosophical, legal, and political investigation of the aftermath of war. This entry will provide an introduction to the central problems animating this relatively new field. It will do so by examining the history and difficulties associated with the operation of three important transitional policies: war crime tribunals, truth commissions, and lustration policies. We will consider, among others questions, tensions between the desire for peace and stability after war and the importance of putting human rights violators on trial, the need, as part of a political transition, to create a reliable historical record of past abuses, the promise and limitations of international criminal law, and the coherence of forgiveness in politics.
Part 1 provides a theoretical introduction to the nature of transitional justice by highlighting the tensions between peace and justice typical of transitional settings. Part 2 examines the difficulties associated with war crime tribunals. Part 3 concentrates on the dilemmas involved in the operation of truth commissions. Part 4 focuses on administrative purges or lustration policies. The final section considers the possibility of forgetting as a response to mass atrocity.
- 1. Introduction to Transitional Justice
- 2. War Crime Tribunals
- 3. Truth Commissions
- 4. Lustration
- 5. Forgetting
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The term “Transitional Justice” has come, in recent years, to designate a field of academic inquiry, as well as political practice, concerned with the aftermath of conflict and large-scale human rights abuses. Theorists and practitioners of transitional justice focus on the most effective and legitimate ways of addressing past wrongs and moving towards the (re)establishment of a decent civil order. In this introduction, I describe the political and moral goals officials tend to pursue in transitional settings and map out some of the tensions between these goals. I argue that such strains are the result of an endemic friction between the demands of stability and justice after war (the introduction draws on Eisikovits 2013).
In making the transition from a violent past into settled, legitimate governance, officials typically pursue multiple goals. While some of these are mutually reinforcing, others come into conflict with each other. As a result it is difficult to fully pursue all transitional goals at the same time. In what follows I describe the most important transitional goals and elaborate about the relationships between them.
- Creating a reliable record of past human rights abuses. Such a record is obviously important, for its own sake, as part of the very human project of keeping our history as accurately as possible. It is also helpful in rebuffing spurious revisionist claims (thus, for example, the record created by the Nuremberg trials has been helpful in rejecting the claims of various Holocaust deniers) and, more broadly, in ending the displays of impunity so typical of authoritarian governments. Once such a record is established it becomes impossible for those who colluded with an oppressive regime to deny responsibility and involvement in past crimes. Perhaps most importantly, the creation of an accurate, comprehensive, and public historical record matters for the psychological healing of victims who report, time and again, benefitting from official and public acknowledgement of their suffering (see, e.g., Minow 2000).
- Setting up a functional, professional bureaucracy and civil service, to efficiently serve the needs of the population. As with the cementing of the rule of law, part of the idea is to establish (or reestablish) citizens' trust in their government; once basic services are rendered in a reliable, non-arbitrary, fashion ordinary citizens may gain (or regain) the belief that government's job is to serve rather than oppress them.
- Helping victims restructure and repair their lives, by attending to their physical and psychological afflictions, restituting lost property, compensating them for their losses, and fixing historical injustices that systematically disadvantaged them. Needless to say, this project overlaps with the second and third goals; after all, to address the psychological distress of victims it is helpful to punish those who hurt them and to provide respectful forums in which the stories of such victims can be heard.
- Stopping violence and consolidating stability, so as to allow the creation of a normal civic and commercial life, cement trust in government, and draw outside investments.
While all of these goals are politically important, it is easy to see how they can come into conflict. Prosecuting the guilty can harm political stability, as the prosecuted and their (often armed) followers become resentful about what they perceive as a politically motivated witch-hunt. Post-war prosecutions may also come into conflict with the need to cement the rule of law, as such prosecutions often require departures from the rules of procedural justice. Such was the case with the retroactive criminalization that lay at the heart of the Nuremberg Trials. The doctrine of “Command Responsibility” first developed at Nuremberg and used later by the International Criminal Tribunal for Yugoslavia also departs from basic principles of legalism, by basing convictions on the status of defendants rather than on direct and specific evidence concerning their actions (on this, see Drumbl 2005).
Even when prosecutions do not threaten political stability and manage to stay true to the principles of the rule of law, they can still come into conflict with the desire to create a robust, comprehensive historical record. When trials are used as the primary mechanism of transitional justice, their very subjection to the rules of evidence means that some important information (namely testimony that does not pertain to specific indictments, or evidence obtained without full due process etc.) will be excluded from the record. This limitation has prompted some scholars to argue that truth commissions are preferable to war crime trials in this respect: since such commissions are not subject to the rules of evidence, they are able to collect more information, expose a more comprehensive picture of past injustices and to include a greater emphasis on the role of institutional and commercial actors indirectly involved in supporting injustices.
The need to provide victims with meaningful, respectful public forums in which they can tell their stories and receive a degree of acknowledgment, central to the fifth aim, also comes into conflict with some of the basic commitments of legalism. Criminal trials usually focus on the interests of the defendants. A respectable criminal trial cannot be a platform for victims to tell their stories in an uninterrupted fashion. Since the testimony of victims is instrumental for proving indictments, it is most often subject to interruptions and vigorous cross-examination. As a result, a typical criminal procedure can be quite an adversarial experience for victims. This is true in spite of a recent expansion of the role of victims in international criminal law. In fact, an undue expansion of that role creates the grounds for criticizing international criminal law for abandoning some of its legalist underpinnings (see, for example, Rauschenbach and Scalia 2008).
Finally, the need to set up a functioning bureaucracy, so important for the creation of public trust and the restoration of political normalcy, can clash with the desire for accountability inherent in the first two goals. When most officials implicated in past crimes are purged or “lustrated”, few competent administrators remain to do the work of government. Such a competence gap may, in turn, undermine political stability, economic viability, and public trust—all crucial factors in a successful transition. Indeed, worries about the tradeoff between accountability and the functionality of government have led many polities to either hedge or give up their lustration policies mid-stream.
Almost every transition since World War II displays these tensions. The Nuremberg trials, often viewed as the pinnacle of legalism, were, nevertheless, based on ex post facto charges (see Bass 2002: Ch. 5). The Spanish transition to democracy was so fragile that it had to commit itself to a “pact of forgetting”—more than three decades of silence about abuses committed during the civil war and under Franco. Historical justice and the need to preserve the peace came into conflict, with the latter receiving precedence until the 2008 Law of Historical Memory reversed the trend (see Tremlett 2006). In South Africa, de Klerk's National Party threatened civil war if the African National Congress insisted on war crime trials against apartheid officials. The celebrated Truth and Reconciliation Commission, with its amnesty-for-truth arrangement, was the resulting political compromise meant to avoid both punishment and impunity. The ANC's demand for retributive justice went unheeded (to the outrage of many, including the family of Stephen Biko, who unsuccessfully sued the Truth Commission in the South African Constitutional Court) because heeding it would have eliminated the chance for a democratic South Africa (for an overview see Meredith 1999). The International Criminal Tribunal for Rwanda, operating in Tanzania, netted some of the Genocide's ringleaders. But Rwanda was not able to apply rigorous criminal responsibility to all those who participated in the murders. Doing so would have taken several centuries. Thus a system of traditional justice, Gacaca, was devised. These makeshift “Grass Courts” failed to live up to western standards of legalism (the judges were not professionals, rules of evidence were not followed) and it failed to produce satisfying punishments. But it did provide a platform from which at least some of the crimes were admitted and acknowledged, and it did manage to empty the Rwandan jails which contained hundred of thousands of prisoners. In the tension between practical functionality and retributive justice, Rwanda nodded to the latter, but eventually focused on the former. The policy of de-Baathification carried out negligently in the aftermath of the second Gulf War, combined with the thoughtless disbanding of the Iraqi army ended up fueling the anti-American insurgency there, in addition to draining Iraq of many of those who had crucial administrate skills and experience. Here too, the commitment to retribution and the desire to create trust by “cleaning out” those associated with the previous regime actually ended up bringing about the opposite effects by further destabilizing the country and harming its bureaucratic competence at a very sensitive time (see Pfiffner 2010).
Post war transitions are characterized by the co-existence of potentially conflicting, yet politically and morally important, goals. As we have seen, some of these are about doing justice for past abuses, while others are concerned with consolidating stability and creating functioning, competent institutions. The uneasy co-existence of these aims - the fact that they are all dearly held, and yet cannot quite be fully realized together—points to a significant tension between considerations of justice and social utility after war. Needless to say, this tension exists in ordinary political life as well. The friction between what is morally called for and the way in which leaders must sometimes act for the overall benefit of their subjects has always been important to our understanding of politics. Machiavelli articulates it most famously when he argues that a Prince might have to learn how “not to be good” in order to act in the best interest of his polity (Machiavelli, The Prince, Ch. 15). Sartre provides the dramatic depiction and gives the problem its most familiar name in his play Dirty Hands. One of his protagonists puts it starkly: “Well, I have dirty hands. Right up to the elbows. I've plunged them in filth and blood. But what do you hope? Do you think you can govern innocently?” (Sartre, “Dirty Hands,” Act V). The most important contemporary philosophical treatment appears, of course, in Michael Walzer's famous article “Political Action: The Problem of Dirty Hands” (Walzer 1973). In transitional contexts this tension is usually labeled the “peace versus justice” dilemma (see, for example, Freeman 2010 and Mihai 2010)—denoting that the demands of quiet and stability may well require compromising the morally important demands of retributive justice and accountability. Thus, for example, it was wrong to allow apartheid murderers to get away with murder during South Africa's transition. But if they had been tried as war criminals, South Africa would have most likely erupted into civil war. Similarly, it was wrong to bury Spain's history of violence for more than thirty years after the end of Franco's dictatorship. But, had this history been excavated earlier, Spain may well have failed to develop into the liberal democracy it is today.
Viewing the peace vs. justice dilemma as a variation of the problem of dirty hands helps us better understand the nature of the tensions at play after war. Properly described, peace vs. justice is not a debate between proponents of a Kantian commitment to full retributive justice and cynical realists who are willing, in the infamous words of the Cambodian Prime Minister Hun Sen, to “dig a hole and bury the past” (quoted in Mydans 2010). Rather, the tension is more properly viewed, like the problem of dirty hands, as a paradox: officials as well as citizens in transitional countries concurrently hold two powerful yet often contradictory moral intuitions: that in order to establish a legitimate, functioning civil society one must do justice for the crimes of the past and that to secure quiet, stability and a functioning government it is sometimes necessary and morally acceptable to leave past crimes and past criminals alone. An analogy to another such paradox may be helpful in illustrating the difference between a paradox and a debate. The problem of moral luck famously delineated by Thomas Nagel and Bernard Williams denotes a paradox about how we make judgments about praise and blame: we tend to think that people should be praised or blamed only on the basis of what they can control, and yet we regularly praise and blame people on the basis of the results of their actions—even if these are beyond the control of the agents involved (Nagel 1979 and Williams 1981). A drunk driver who got home safely and a drunk driver who hit a child on the way home took the same risk getting into their cars. The first intuition would require treating them similarly. The second recommends more severe punishment to the driver actually involved in an accident.
A moral debate can, in principle, be settled by a superior set of arguments. A paradox can only be described. Caught in the paradox between peace and justice we might end up emphasizing one kind of intuition over the other after war. But this is not the same as winning a moral argument and doing away with a discredited position. The Spaniards emphasized the need for stability over the need for accountability for a period of thirty years. Then, when they were confident enough that stability had been consolidated, they shifted their emphasis. The Rwandans, after conducting nominal criminal trials in Tanzania, made a similar decision and cleared the dockets by means of their Gacaca courts. Rwanda is now more quiet and stable. But such quiet, as commentators like Philip Gourevitch have noted (see, most recently, Gourevitch 2009), is an uneasy one as long as survivors are resentful about failure to bring perpetrators to justice. Stated differently, there is no real “debate” between peace and justice after war, as some scholars and NGOs claim, only a continuing negotiation that, at any given point, will lean towards one of these intuitions. The best we can do is understand their co-equal status, settle on a policy that lies on the continuum between them, and constantly reevaluate.
In spite of the fact that the peace versus justice tension is merely a specific manifestation of the problem of dirty hands, there is an important distinction that must be observed: while the tension between justice and social utility is part of the political life of any consolidated democracy, it is central and definitive of political life during transitions. In consolidated democracies, such tensions can be alleviated by legal institutions and traditions that embody conclusions about how to manage the requisite tradeoffs between justice and social utility (these include a constitution, a body of accepted constitutional jurisprudence, a respected high court with powers of judicial review, etc.). Part of the role of such institutions and traditions is to provide guidance about which tradeoffs would seem most justifiable given a comprehensive interpretation of the state's legal and political history. But transitional times are exactly the periods in which such institutions, traditions, and interpretive principles are first being set out. When the argument arose about abuses of executive power in the Unites States following the September 11, 2001 attacks, that debate could take place on the background of a history of executive power grabs and the responses to them (Jefferson's requisitioning of funds for the military without congressional approval and Lincoln's suspension of habeas corpus during the civil war come to mind). In a transitional context, that long and important political discussion is missing. More precisely, the very point of the transitional period is to set up the institutions and methods responsible for having that debate. The upshot of this predicament is two fold: it is harder for transitional societies to resolve peace versus justice decisions because the traditions and institutions so important for navigating these questions are not yet present. At the same time, the very act of creating of such institutions inevitably creates situations where peace and justice must clash: the need to quickly set up a competent court and police systems to allow for stable government may well require hiring administrators tainted during the tenure of the previous regime; the need to attract foreign investors and maintain peace in the streets may require some compromises on the extent and length of criminal proceedings against past perpetrators, and so forth.
To recap, the tension between peace and justice is especially pronounced in transitional settings because creating the basic institutions of governance is more likely to raise it, and because the guidance available in settled context from the existence of such institutions is missing. To this dual explanation we should add that the conflict between peace and justice is further heightened in transitional situations because the political stakes are uniquely high during such moments. If a transitional society cannot consolidate peace and functioning government, the very effort to create a decent new state suffers shipwreck. This kind of fragility, where the entire political project is at stake, is more likely to float peace versus justice dilemmas than a specific crisis in a consolidated democracy. Such localized crises typically implicate localized endeavors, not the existence of the political system itself.
The 20th century's most famous and probably most significant war crime trials were held in Nuremberg, Germany after the end of World War II. Between 1945–1949 the United States and its allies held a series of 13 trials. The first, and most famous of these, involved the prosecution of senior surviving Nazi officials including Hermann Göring, Joachim von Ribbentrop, Julius Streicher, Rudolf Hess and Albert Speer. Defendants in the other 12 trials, which took place between 1946–1949, included doctors, jurists, industrialists, and other key stake holders in the Nazi state.
Initially, it was not clear that the allies would put their defeated enemies on trial at all. The creation of the first Nuremberg Tribunal was preceded by a long debate, especially fierce in the United States. Hard liners, represented most vocally by American Secretary of the Treasury Henry Morgenthau Jr., advocated the summary execution or forced removal of the entire Nazi chain of command and the destruction of Germany's industrial capacities. On the other hand, Legalists, led by Secretary of War Henry Stimson, insisted on affording the Nazis fair trials that would honor American procedural protections. The United States fought the war in defense of political freedom, the Legalists insisted. Such freedom depends on upholding the ideals of the rule of law. These ideals, in turn, require the individualization of guilt and giving defendants a fair chance to answer the charges against them. Germany, Stimson warned, must not be punished en-masse; such collective punishment would only serve to increase resentment and may well plant the seeds for another war. Instead, the careful and fair employment of the courts would allow the Germans to “internalize” their guilt. As Stimson put it:
…punishment is for the purpose of prevention and not for vengeance. An element in prevention is to secure in the person punished the conviction of guilt” (for a summary of this debate see Bass 2002: 152–161).
On November 21, 1945 Robert H. Jackson, Chief of Counsel for the United States at Nuremberg, began the case for the prosecution with the following, now iconic words:
The privilege of opening the first trial in history for crimes against the peace of the world imposes a grave responsibility. The wrongs which we seek to condemn and punish have been so calculated, so malignant, and so devastating, that civilization cannot tolerate their being ignored, because it cannot survive their being repeated. That four great nations, flushed with victory and stung with injury stay the hand of vengeance and voluntarily submit their captive enemies to the judgment of the law is one of the most significant tributes that Power has ever paid to Reason. (Jackson 1945)
The prosecution team at Nuremberg had originally planned to concentrate on charges of aggressive war rather than on Germany's wholesale destruction of Europe's Jews. Much of the initial legal work revolved around the creation of a jurisprudence of conspiracy that would allow the conviction of the entire Nazi leadership. But the liberation of the Dachau and Bergen-Belsen concentration camps, and the horrific evidence discovered there, left the allies with little choice but to incorporate charges of crimes against humanity into their trial strategy (Bass 2002: 180).
The defendants' complaints about “victors' justice” and the retroactivity of the charges not withstanding (more on this to follow), the Nuremberg trials still stand out as “legalism's greatest moment of glory” (Bass 2002: 203). In spite of intense political pressure by Stalin, Churchill, and powerful figures inside the United States to dispense with trials all together, and in spite of the unprecedented nature and magnitude of the crimes, the judges at Nuremberg presided over a remarkably cool and orderly procedure. For the first time in history, senior political leaders were indicted and tried for “crimes against humanity.”
The tribunals also established important principles of international justice, such as the responsibility of heads of state, the rejection of the infamous “I was just following orders” excuse, the weakening of retroactivity as a defense against crimes of mass atrocity, and the right of war criminals to a fair trial. In addition to these important legal achievements, Nuremberg also established the trial as an invaluable instrument for creating a credible, lasting historical record of human rights abuses.
The Nuremberg trials were succeeded, in the spring of 1946, by the Military Tribunal for the Far East, held in Tokyo. Twenty-eight members of Japan's military and political leadership, including former Prime Ministers, War and Navy Secretaries, generals, diplomats, and some economic luminaries were indicted for crimes against the peace. Twenty-five of the defendants were convicted. Seven were executed, and the remaining 18 received prison sentences ranging between 7 years and a life sentence.
The Tokyo proceedings never achieved the prominence of the Nuremberg tribunals. Explanations for their relative obscurity include the unavailability of some of the trial records, the fact that the perpetrators were not household names in the west, and the allies' embarrassment about disagreements between the judges on using the death sentence, and on the fairness of the proceedings (for more detail see Futamura 2008 and Totani 2008).
In spite of the ambitious standards of accountability for mass atrocity set at Nuremberg and Tokyo, the actual practice of international criminal justice went into a prolonged lull once the Cold War began. The sharp ideological differences between the superpowers made the cosmopolitan ideals underlying such trials less persuasive. Concerned that war crime prosecutions would become one more arena for political conflict, neither the Americans nor the Russians pursued them. The lull ended with the collapse of the Soviet Union and the end of the Cold War, and the first significant war tribunals thereafter were established by the United Nations in the 1990s—the ad hoc International Criminal Tribunal for the former Yugoslavia at The Hague (ICTY), in 1993, and the ad hoc International Criminal Tribunal for Rwanda in Tanzania (ICTR), in 1995.
The ICTY got off to a rocky start. Tribunal president Theodor Meron described it as “little more than an ideal” at its inception in 1993. The trial, a symbolic “expression of outrage”, served more as a salve for international guilt than instrument of international justice. Financial resources were initially so meager that the court could not afford to pay more than a few months worth of rent and salaries (Bass 2002: Ch. 6). But in recent years, the tribunal has come into its own. While the historic trial of Slobodan Milošević could not be completed because of the defendant's death, the ICTY indicted the first President of Republika Srpska (Bosnia and Herzogovina), Radovan Karadžić, in July 2008. He is currently conducting his defense. Additionally, Ratko Mladić, the military mastermind of the siege Sarajevo and the massacre of Srebenica, was arrested in northern Serbia on 26 May 2011 and is currently on trial in the Hague. Biljana Plavšić, another former President of Republika Srpska, was convicted of war crimes in 2002.
The final trial for the ICTY has recently commenced. Goran Hadžić, who went from warehouse worker to rebel Serbian president, was arrested in northern Serbia on July 20, 2011 after seven years as a fugitive. He has pled not guilty to “involvement in the murder of hundreds of Croats” as well as large scale expulsions. He is the last of the 161 suspects indicted by ICTY to face trial. Hadžić, Karadžić, and Mladić were all arrested in Serbia after years on the run from international justice. The impending terminus of the court's activities underscores the transitory nature of such ad hoc war crimes tribunals.The court's annual budget is now upwards of $310 million and it employs more than 1,100 people from 82 countries. The ICTY has convicted 64, acquitted 13, sent 13 for trial in domestic courts, and withdrawn indictments against 36, including 16 who died after being charged. Eighteen suspects are currently being tried, while 17 are appealing their convictions.
The tribunal often faced, and to some extent still faces, accusations of inefficacy. Ad hoc tribunals lack their own coercive power and rely on the support of individual nation-states. Little progress was initially made in the 1990s towards the capture of important war criminals in the former Yugoslavia. Yugoslavia was not then in a truly transitional state such as found in Germany or Japan at the end of WWII, as the Serbian government of Slobodan Milošević, who had supported the Bosnian Serb commanders, remained in power. There was, as in other regions in which war crimes have occurred, hostility to outside monitoring and extranational justice. This was also seen to a lesser extent in Croatia. However, national (or domestic) justice proved itself to be overwhelmingly corrupt, biased, incompetent, and inadequate.
Only after Milošević's fall from power did the new Serbian government become more amenable to cooperating with demands for international justice. The rebel Serbian leaders did and still do retain the sympathies of much of the Serbian population. External pressure points proved to be effective, as Serbia's government responded positively to a carrot and stick approach known as the policy of conditionality. Serbia's European Union (EU) membership application was blocked until Serbia complied and arrested the trio of Mladić, Karadžić, and Hadžić. The principle behind conditionality does not differ significantly from the rationale behind sanctions regimes, such as those employed against apartheid South Africa, Rhodesia, and (currently) Iran.
The ICTR, located in Arusha, Tanzania, can also boast substantial achievements. The court has issued the first ever genocide conviction by an international tribunal, as well as the first conviction in which rape was considered a crime of war. Given the massive domestic prosecution of génocidaires by the Rwandan authorities, the ICTR has primarily focused on the indictment of “big fish”—senior level suspects involved in the design and planning of the genocide. These indictments have resulted in genocide convictions of Rwanda's former Prime Minister, Jean Kambanda, and quite a few cabinet members.
In addition to securing significant convictions and setting legal precedents for the practice of international humanitarian law, the ICTY and ICTR were also successful in creating detailed records of atrocities. In this, both tribunals continued the legacy of the Nuremberg Tribunals, which, as mentioned earlier, aimed not merely at the conviction of the guilty but also at reliably documenting the horrors for posterity.
A complaint consistently made against the ICTY and the ICTR has been that these tribunals do not operate on the sites where the crimes being investigated took place. This fact, so the criticism goes, creates a disconnect between the people who suffered throughout the war and the process in which their suffering is addressed. The attempt to address such criticisms has resulted in the creation of a rather innovative form of international justice—the Internationalized or Hybrid Courts. These bodies, which have been operating in Bosnia Herzegovina (since 2005), Kosovo (since 2000), Cambodia (since 2003), Sierra Leone (since 2002), East Timor (between 1999–2005), and Lebanon (since 2007), employ both international and local jurists and adjudicate on the basis of a mixture of national and international law. Unlike the Nuremberg and Tokyo tribunals none of the ad hoc tribunals such as the ITCY and ITCR are empowered to impose the death penalty, though no centralized prison exists to house those convicted.
Among the criticisms levied against the tribunals is their alleged Western bias. The Special Court for Sierra Leone, which in April of 2012 convicted former Liberian leader Charles Taylor of aiding and abetting war crimes, was funded almost exclusively by the United States, United Kingdom, Canada, and the Netherlands. The international courts and the human rights which they embody are Western liberal concepts with far less resonance in other parts of the world. Some have questioned the tribunals are too focused on Africa, as all pending cases currently are Africa-related. The Africa Union has accused the ICC of being an Euro-American neo-colonial enterprise, though this may be taken with a certain pinch of salt, as many of the leaders within the African Union have good reason to believe that they may one day be called to the defendant's docket.
Perhaps the most significant development in international criminal justice since the Nuremberg trials has been the establishment, by the Rome treaty in 1998, of the permanent International Criminal Court (ICC) in The Hague. By 2011, 114 nations had ratified the Rome Statute. The court has jurisdiction over serious crimes (genocide, crimes against humanity, aggression) committed after July 1, 2002 (when the statute took effect), by a national of one of the states that are party to the Rome treaty. It also has jurisdiction over crimes committed on the territory of such state parties, or when the UN Security Council refers a specific case to it. The UN Security Council is authorized not only to refer cases to the court but also to ask its prosecutor to suspend proceedings. Nevertheless, Security Council members Russia, China, and the United States have not ratified the statute. This position is shared by several other major countries such as India, Indonesia, and Israel. Within the next several years, tribunals for Sierra Leone, Rwanda, the former Yugoslavia, Lebanon, and Cambodia will close, leaving the ICC as the sole institution of international criminal justice.
Importantly, the court's authority is residuary: it acts only if member nations cannot or will not.
Most of the cases before the ICC involve ongoing conflicts. This has required the establishment of field offices in order to assist in investigations and the collection of evidence, as well as to conduct outreach operations to local populations. While there are immense practical difficulties in gathering evidence and enforcing arrest warrants in active war zones, senior ICC officials have claimed that their real time involvement has increased deterrence. 
So far the ICC has taken up cases of war crimes committed in Uganda, the Congo, and the Central African Republic. All three countries have referred these cases themselves. In addition, the UN Security Council has referred the case of Sudan, which is not a party to the Rome treaty. After conducting an investigation into the referral, the court's prosecutor has recently issued an indictment against Sudan's President, Omar al-Bashir. A decade after the courts creation, 22 arrest warrants have been issued, and five suspects currently are in custody. Recently (as of July 2012), the United States has started to apply pressure on President Paul Kagame of Rwanda to end his assistance to rebel factions in Congo renowned for their egregious war crimes. The United States indicated that there might be a reduction in military aid to Rwanda, but also that Kagame personally may face indictment and (ultimately) prosecution at the ICC.
One of the most innovative features of the ICC is the fact that it gives a significant role to victims in its proceedings. Victims can send information directly to the court's prosecutor, they can request the opening of a preliminary investigation, they can appear before the court's pre-trial chamber when it deliberates on whether to open a full blown investigation into a case, and, most significantly, they can ask to present their position during the trial itself. Article 68 (3) of the ICC Statute reads:
where the personal interests of the victims are affected, the Court shall permit their views and concerns to be presented and considered at stages of the proceedings determined to be appropriate by the Court and in a manner which is not prejudicial to or inconsistent with the rights of the accused to a fair and impartial trial. Such views and concerns may be presented by the legal representatives of the victims where the Court considers it appropriate, in accordance with the Rules of Procedure and Evidence. (see Other Internet Resources for link to the full text of the Rome Statute)
The exact jurisprudence regulating victims' involvement is still being developed. Yet, it is already clear that the Rome statute gives them a far greater role in the international criminal process than they have had under traditional tribunals.
Despite the fact that the United States played a major role in the negotiations surrounding the creation of the ICC, the U.S. initially voted against the Rome Statute in 1998, before eventually signing in December 2000. President George W. Bush revoked the United States' signature to the Rome Statute, citing concerns that the court could be used for political prosecution of American citizens, particularly American service members who were serving abroad. The U.S. Congress passed several bills during the Bush Administration designed to shield American citizens from prosecution by the ICC. The United States has also threatened to cut off foreign aid to countries that have failed to sign Bilateral Immunity Agreements with the U.S.
Although the Obama administration has been much less hostile towards the ICC, going so far as to co-sponsor a UN Security Council resolution which called for the ICC to investigate alleged crimes against humanity committed by Muammar Gadaffi, the United States has yet to join the ICC. The United States continues to make immunity for U.S. citizens a prerequisite to their ascension to the ICC.
The employment of war crime tribunals has always been controversial. In what follows some of the central criticisms of such trials are examined. We will focus on substantive rather than technical concerns. “Technical concerns” is understood as the lack of resources, the reluctance of the international community to provide material assistance (in direct funds or in apprehension of suspects), the ability of defendants to destroy evidence, the deplorable condition of the legal class in war torn countries, and problems of translation and common language. While these certainly are significant obstacles (as it was pointed out earlier, the operation of the ICTY was almost undermined by such difficulties), they do not challenge the rationale for using trials. The objections taken up here, on the other hand, represent concerns that call into question the coherence and fairness of the criminal courts as instruments of political transition.
According to some critics, post war tribunals, far from expressing a commitment to the rule of law, are merely a charade in which winners punish losers for the damage and suffering the war brought about. This kind of cynicism about doing justice after war (and about the role of justice in politics more generally) has ancient roots. In his History of the Peloponnesian War, Thucydides (B.5 Ch.17) imagines one of the Athenian generals offering a sobering reality check to a Melian politician who does not understand why Athens must conquer his tiny, politically neutral island:
we both alike know that in the discussion of human affairs the question of justice only enters where there is equal power to enforce it, and that the powerful exact what they can, and the weak grant what they must.
Hermann Göring made a similar observation in a conversation with Nuremberg's prison psychiatrist: “the victor will always be the judge, and the vanquished the accused” (Bass 2002: 8).
The claim of victor's justice is difficult to dismiss. After all, had the Allies lost the war, many of their senior military and political leaders would have gone on trial for the firebombing of Japanese and German cities. Curtis LeMay and Robert McNamara have publicly admitted as much. And yet it is worthwhile noting, with Gary Bass, that there is a distinction between the circumstances under which a tribunal is created and how decently and fairly it operates. In other words, a tribunal that was set up after victory in order to punish the side that lost, might still either succeed or fail to follow fair procedures. And in so far as this is true, the retribution of some victors may be preferable to that of others. As Bass writes: “it is victory that makes justice possible but the fairness of the process is what makes it justice” (Bass 2002: 329). And, he adds, even though we may be cynical about the fact that Americans are putting Germans on trial after they have defeated them, most of us, if given a hypothetical choice, would still prefer to be tried by an American rather than a Nazi court, because we assume it would be fairer (for a useful series of essays on the Rwandan transition see Strauss and Waldorf 2011). Simply imagine the kind of charges the Nazis would bring against their defeated enemies: most likely, they would have not sufficed with indicting the allies for the firebombing of German and Japanese cities; they might also have charged then with protecting Jews or with miscegenation, and perhaps punished them severely for these charges. While an indictment for firebombing would have been substantially sound, the latter accusations would have been based, exclusively, on the Nazis warped racial theories. In other words, some victors' justice can be substantively flawed. Here, then, is the main advantage of allied over Nazi victor's justice: the Americans and their partners prosecuted their defeated enemies for crimes that really were crimes (for further discussions of victors' justice see Minow 1998; Chang and Barker 2001; Peskin 2005).
A second important criticism of post war trials is that they hold defendants responsible for acts that were not prohibited at the time they were committed.
Many of the Nazi defendants at Nuremberg argued that no existing laws or international standards banned their conduct during the war. Consequently, they argued, there can be no legal basis for prosecuting them. Such claims are based on a fundamental precept of the rule of law: Nullum Crimen, Nulla Poena Sine Lege (no crime, no punishment without a legal prohibition). The main strategy used to counter these arguments at Nuremberg was “positivistic”: prosecutors strained to find sources in existing international law that did forbid aggressive war, and then moved to associate many of the other crimes for which the Nazis were accused with the waging of such war (Minow 1998: 33). A related difficulty arose when the prosecution looked for a legal doctrine that would allow them to convict a large group of people for belonging to the Nazi war machine. Here, too, a creative positivistic solution was found: One of Stimson's aids, colonel Murray Bernays, devised the idea that the Nazis would be tried as part of a criminal conspiracy. The advantage of such a strategy was that it required nothing more than the conviction of specific organizations of the charges (the SA, SS, Gestapo among others) in order to hold all their members responsible. As Bass puts it:
once these organizations had been convicted, any member of them could be swiftly punished: instead of proving individual guilt… [prosecutors] would only have to provide that the defendant had been a member of a criminal group activities. (Bass 2002: 171; I am grateful to Thomas Pogge for this point)
The severity of the problem of retroactivity decreased after the Nuremberg tribunal established the precedent that there was no need for a highly specific prohibition in order to be held responsible before an international criminal court. And yet, the tribunals for Yugoslavia and Rwanda still faced some problems of retroactivity when it came to deciding whether ethnic cleansing constituted genocide and what kind of intent was required for a genocide conviction (Minow 1998: 34–35).
While prosecutors in Nuremberg settled on a positivistic strategy for countering the claims of retroactivity made by the defendants, another possibility for rejecting such arguments should be mentioned. This alternative is based in the “natural law” tradition. On this view, the response the Nazi defendants should have been given is, quite simply, that there are things that one does not do, or can expect severe punishment for doing, whether they are explicitly forbidden or not. Whether such severe actions defy “the moral law” to use the somewhat antiquated language of the classical natural lawyers, or whether they simply offend fundamental sensibilities of any civilized human being, the upshot is the same: at the extreme reaches of human behavior illegality does not necessarily depend on a prior legal prohibition. It was this kind of argument that the lead British prosecutor in Nuremberg, Hartley Shawcross, had in mind when he exclaimed in response to one of the iterations of the retroactivity complaint:
I suppose the first person ever charged with murder might have said: “now see here. You can't do that. Murder hasn't been made a crime yet”. (Persico 1994: 138)
A third important complaint against war crime tribunals maintains that they frequently fail to indict all of those who were involved in committing atrocities. According to this charge, courts find it easier to prosecute lower level officials and military personnel, often leaving the more senior figures who devised the violent policies (but do not have actual “blood on their hands”) untouched (Minow 1998: 40–41). To the extent that this complaint is well founded it is devastating, as it suggests that war crime tribunals do not result in a full or coherent exercise of retributive justice (for a comprehensive account see Cryer 2005). The principle of “Command Responsibility” (CR) originally devised at Nuremberg, and used extensively by the ICTY, has been employed, quite effectively, in order to counter complaints of selectivity. CR allows prosecutors to indict senior officials exclusively on the basis of their military or political leadership role (given the duties of supervision and control attached to that role).
Thus, the ICTY has been able to convict Serbian officers for war crimes because they did not prevent or curtail activities in which their troops were engaged. In an especially striking expansion of CR, a Bosnian Croat regional commander, Tihomir Blaskic, was convicted by the trial chamber of the ICTY of murder and other crimes against humanity, for atrocities that took place in the village of Ahmichi. The charges did not allege direct involvement or even turning a blind eye to the activities of subordinates, but, rather, focused on Blaskic's failure to investigate after the massacre was brought to his attention. His unwillingness to look into the events was equated by the court with responsibility for direct killing. In 2004 the appeals chamber of the ICTY rejected this interpretation of CR and overturned the relevant part of the conviction.
While CR can be instrumental for moving up the chain of command, it also comes into conflict with the legalistic premise underlying war crime tribunals. A criminal trial traditionally establishes individual responsibility by presenting direct evidence against the defendant. CR allows conviction and punishment based on a philosophical construct rather than on the garnering of such evidence. The construct, roughly speaking, is that certain roles come with built in accountability for the actions of others, whether or not the individual who holds the role was aware of these actions. Criminal law doctrine is, to say the least, suspicious of such a separation between intent and culpability, especially when it comes to very serious offenses (lesser offenses can be established by proving the defendant was reckless or indifferent). This tension points to a problem at the heart of international criminal law: does the unique nature of mass atrocity, wherein numerous people harm others with differing degrees of acquiescence and direction from a large bureaucratic class, really lend itself to the legalistic commitment to individualizing guilt on the basis of direct evidence? Or do the distinct features of such crimes require relaxing our standards of individual responsibility so as to implicate the entire state structure that made the atrocities possible? If the latter, it may be difficult to hold fast to the justification of such trials as expressing a firm commitment to legalism and the idea of the rule of law.
Other significant (if less conceptually interesting) criticisms of the international criminal courts hold that they do not focus sufficiently on the suffering of victims, concentrating, instead, on establishing the guilt of perpetrators), that the proceeding tend to become technical and tedious, thus trivializing the horrors being discussed, that there can be a discrepancy between the (Western) cultural norms central to legalism and the local traditions of the society in which atrocities took place, and that, in light of the repeated occurrence of genocide in the 20th century, the practice of international criminal law does not show great promise of deterrence. Leaders, such as Bashar al-Assad and Omar al-Bashir, who have the backing of major powers, have virtual impunity. Of course it is important to prosecute former heads of state, so as to demonstrate that political seniority is no guarantee of immunity from justice. The international tribunals serve a pedagogical purpose, drawing attention to pertinent issues such as child conscription.
The structural and political shortcomings of war crime trials, as outlined in the previous section, have led policy makers in war torn countries to turn to other measures of transitional justice. The most important among these is the non-judicial truth commission.
Priscilla Hayner (2002), in her landmark book on truth commissions, enumerates four characteristics typical of these bodies:
- They deal with the past
- They investigate continued patterns of abuses and not specific cases
- They operate for up to two years and then submit reports summarizing their findings and,
- They are usually official bodies sanctioned by the state.
These commissions, Hayner continues, most often have some or all of the following goals: unearthing, clarifying and formally acknowledging past abuses, responding to the needs of victims, helping create a culture of accountability, outlining institutional responsibility and possible reforms, advancing the prospects of reconciliation and reducing conflict over the past (Hayner 2002: 24).
While truth commissions have fewer coercive powers than courts (they cannot compel governments to carry out their recommendations, they have no authority to punish etc.), their mandate for investigating the broader pattern of abuses, and their tendency to put the victims at the center of their proceeding, gives these bodies a great degree of moral credibility and legitimacy.
The work of South Africa's Truth and Reconciliation Commission (hereafter TRC) has sparked a great deal of interest in the use of truth commissions after war. The celebrity of its chair, Desmond Tutu, the massive scale of the public hearings it held, the intensive media coverage, and its controversial amnesty-for-truth mechanism, generated a great deal of international curiosity. Ever since the TRC completed its hearings and published its report, nations facing a transition to democracy have consistently asked themselves whether they too should use truth commissions to confront past abuses. Some scholars even go so far as to say that the truth commission has now replaced criminal prosecution as the most important norm of international justice (see, for example, Ben-Josef Hirsch 2007).
While the TRC has become paradigmatic of truth commissions, it is worthwhile noting that it was not the first such body. Argentina, Chile, and El Salvador all employed relatively effective truth commissions during the 1980's and early 1990's.
These efforts provided both inspiration and valuable lessons for the designers of the South African body.
In Argentina, a truth commission was set up to investigate the abuses committed by the military junta during the country's “dirty war” (1976–1983). It is estimated that up to 30,000 suspected “subversives” were “disappeared”—abducted, tortured and disposed of secretly—by security forces during those years. Unlike the South African TRC, the Argentinean body, officially named “National Commission on the Disappearance of Persons”, did not hold public hearings. The commission also lacked the authority and incentive structure to compel cooperation from the military. And yet, it was able to produce a substantive report. More than 7000 statements were taken, 1500 of which were given by survivors of military detention camps. The commission focused on locating and exposing military detention and torture centers. Much of the evidence it gathered was handed over to prosecutors, eventually aiding in the convictions of several high-ranking officers. The truth commission's report, titled Never Again (Nunca Más), was published in 1984 and has become one of the best-selling books in Argentinean history.
Seven years later, Chile's National Commission on Truth and Reconciliation published a report documenting human rights abuses committed by the Chilean army during General Augusto Pinochet's 17-year reign. As in Argentina, Chile's security forces practiced routine torture, abductions and extrajudicial executions. The abuses were especially severe in the first few years of the dictatorship. In 1978 Pinochet issued a sweeping amnesty order, protecting all members of the security forces. This amnesty created a complex constitutional environment for the truth commission. The commission, chaired by former senator Raul Retting, consisted of an equal number of Pinochet supporters and critics. Its mandate was defined in relatively narrow terms, focusing on executions, disappearances and cases of torture that resulted in death (leaving out a large number of torture survivors). Like its Argentinean counterpart, the commission had no way to compel members of the security forces to testify. The Commissioners looked into 3400 cases and issued an 1800 page report in February of 1991 strongly (and, significantly, unanimously) condemning Pinochet and his generals. The impact of the report was weakened by a series of armed attacks carried out by left leaning militants shortly after its publication. In spite of the limited public attention it received at the time, the report was instrumental in creating a reparations program for the relatives of Pinochet's victims. The commission's work was also useful in providing evidence to support the Spanish extradition request that eventually led to Pinochet's arrest in Britain. Pinochet was later returned to Chile, and died before he could be convicted of any crimes.
El Salvador's truth commission was probably the least successful of the three. The commission was created to investigate abuses carried out in the course of the civil war between government forces and FMLN guerrillas. According to some estimates, the 12-year war (1980–1992) claimed the lives of 75,000 citizens. As in Argentina and Chile, the military engaged in executions, torture, and abductions, in addition to large-scale massacres. The El Salvadorian commission operated for 8 months. Appointed by the Secretary General of the United Nations, its members included former Colombian President Belisario Betancur, former President of the Inter American Court of Human Rights Thomas Buergenthal, and former Minister of Foreign Affairs of Venezuela Reinaldo Figueredo Planchart. The animosity and diffidence between the former combatants was such that no Salvadorians were allowed to serve as commissioners.
The commission gathered testimony on more than 7000 cases of severe human rights violations. Its final report, titled “From Madness to Hope”, outlined a set of harsh conclusions against 40 government and military officials and stated that the vast majority of atrocities had been committed by government backed security forces (rather than by FMLN fighters). Very shortly after the report's publication, a national amnesty law was passed, rendering many of the commission's recommendations irrelevant. However, the report was helpful in shaming and eventually removing from service some of the military officials accused of especially egregious abuses.
Three years after the release of El Salvador's report, On April 15, 1996, Archbishop Desmond Tutu, the head of South Africa's Anglican Church, addressed a crowd gathered at East London's city hall.
We are charged to unearth the truth about our dark past,
he told his listeners,
and to lay the ghosts of that past to rest so that they will not return to haunt us; and that we will thereby contribute to the healing of the traumatized and the wounded—for all of us in South Africa are wounded people. (Meredith 1999: 3)
Thus began South Africa's controversial experiment in transitional justice.
As they debated how to manage the transition from apartheid, negotiators on behalf of the African National Congress (hereafter ANC) and the outgoing National Party clashed repeatedly on the question of how to address human rights abuses committed during the apartheid era. In the negotiations leading up to the 1993 interim constitution, which laid down the terms of the transition, the most contentious issue concerned the question of amnesty. After a great deal of wrangling, the two sides agreed to add a postamble to the constitution containing the following language:
in order to advance… reconciliation and reconstruction, amnesty shall be granted in respect of acts, omissions, and offenses associated with political objectives and committed in the course of the conflicts of the past.” (Postamble to South Africa's Interim Constitution of 1993 as quoted in Meredith 1999: 20–21)
Many ANC supporters, who wanted to see apartheid officials brought before Nuremberg style war crime tribunals, were understandably upset by the arrangement. Nelson Mandela, who insisted on the importance of steering clear of “victors' justice”, remained adamant about the need for some kind of accountability for apartheid's crimes. Without such reckoning, he threatened, the unaddressed atrocities of the past would live with South Africans like a “festering sore” (Meredith 1999: 18).
The convergence between these two commitments—to amnesty on the one hand and to accountability on the other—was to result in the establishment of the TRC.
The process that led to the commission's creation was characterized by an unprecedented degree of transparency and public participation. During 1994, two major conferences were held to lay the groundwork for the TRC's work. Both were organized by Alex Boraine, an Anti-Apartheid activist who served as president of the South African Methodist Church, MP for the progressive party, and the director of important civil society NGOs. The first of these conferences focused on the lessons of political transitions in Latin America and Eastern Europe (Proceedings were published in Boraine et al. 1994). The second solicited input from stakeholders inside South Africa (Proceedings were published in Boraine et al. 1995). After the conferences, South Africa's parliament began deliberating on the National Unity and Reconciliation Act, which would set up the commission. The Parliamentary Standing Committee on Justice held extended public hearings asking individuals, political parties and NGOs for their advice on the design of the TRC. The law was finally passed, after a great deal of bickering and debate, in May of 1995, a year or so after it was first presented. The TRC thus became the first commission of its kind to be created through a parliamentary process rather than executive decree. Whether by design or inertia, this open, deliberative approach was also applied to the selection of commission members. Nominees were suggested by NGOs, churches, and political parties, and were then interviewed in public by the selection committee. Finally, the cabinet and president chose the commissioners from a short list.
The Promotion of National Unity and Reconciliation Act set the following three goals for the commission:
to develop a complete picture of the gross violations of human rights that took place in and came through the conflicts of the past; to restore to victims their human and civil dignity by letting them tell their stories and recommending how they could be assisted; and to consider granting amnesty to those perpetrators who carried out their abuses for political reasons and who gave full accountings to their actions to the commission. (Graybill 2002: 6).
The commission would respect the ANC's promise to offer amnesties, but the reprieve would not be granted automatically. It would, rather, be linked to a demand for full disclosure from perpetrators. Those seeking amnesty would have to apply for it, provide full details about what they had done, and establish that their activities were politically motivated (rather than the result of greed, sadism etc.). Applicants would not, however, be required to apologize or otherwise express regret. Furthermore, the arrangement would eliminate not only criminal responsibility but also civil liability. Successful applicants could be neither charged nor sued for their conduct during the apartheid years. The commission would be charged with investigating abuses that took place between March 1, 1960 and May 10, 1994.
The commission was divided into three committees in order to realize the aims set out by the law: the committee on human rights violations, the committee on amnesty, and the committee on reparation and rehabilitation. The first would collect testimony and conduct public hearings regarding the abuses. The second would consider applications for amnesty from members of the security forces and ANC, and determine whether the acts in question were committed in a political context and whether applicants had provided full disclosure about them. The third would come up with recommendations and criteria for whom to compensate and how.
The TRC's authority and resources were unprecedented in the history of truth commissions. It had the power to subpoena witnesses and the authority to order searches and seizures. It had a witness protection program, 300 staff members, and an annual budget of 18 million dollars. Its proceedings were broadcast on a daily basis on both radio and television, and were widely covered by the printed press. During the course of its tenure, the commission took testimony from more than 22,000 victims and witnesses, hearing upwards of 2,000 of them in public.
Unsurprisingly, the main controversy surrounding the commission's work concerned its amnesty-granting powers. The opportunity afforded to perpetrators of egregious human rights abuses to walk away from prosecution enraged many black South Africans who wanted to see those who had tormented them and their families put behind bars. As far as many blacks were concerned, the TRC allowed some of apartheid's worst offenders to “get away with murder.” As Martin Meredith (1999: 315) puts it in his superb survey of the commission's tenure:
…the work of the TRC provoked…anger in parts of the black community…particularly over the way security force operatives responsible for heinous crimes were given freedom in exchange for a bit of truth telling, while victims and their families were denied access to the courts. What many wanted more than truth was justice—prosecution in the courts and prison sentences.
Many academic observers of South Africa's transition were dismayed as well, remarking that neither political necessity nor the attempt to create social solidarity can justify the kind of sacrifices of retributive justice the TRC's work entailed.
The outrage is more than understandable, when one considers cases like that of Vlakplass commander Dirk Coetzee who testified to killing ANC activist Sizwe Kondile and burning his body on an open bonfire. Coetzee and his men stood by, drinking beers and smoking for more than seven hours, until nothing remained of Kondile. The sight of such a man walking away from his testimony cannot but turn one's stomach.
The international community has continued to experiment with truth commissions as a means to achieve transitional justice. On July 13, 2001, the United Nations Transitional Administration in East Timor (UNTAET) established the Commission for Reception, Truth, and Reconciliation (CRTR). The purpose of this commission is to promote “national reconciliation and healing” after decades of political conflict following the 1975 invasion and subsequent occupation of East Timor by Indonesia.
Following a failed attempt to annex East Timor in 1999, Indonesia-supported militants are suspected of killing over 1,000 supporters of an independent East Timor and caused hundreds of thousands of civilians to flee their homes (Stahn 2001).
In 2011, Brazil also created a truth commission to investigate and publicize human rights abuses that occurred during the rule of Brazil's military dictatorship from 1964–1985. The seven-person commission was provided with a two-year mandate to investigate human rights abuses and to compile a file report to be released publicly. However, doubts regarding the truth commission remain as a result of a 1979 law that provided amnesty to many of those responsible for crimes committed during the military regime's rule.
Much of the scholarly literature on the TRC in South Africa centers on the question of justification, on the attempt to locate a rationale which might make sense of an arrangement that goes against a great deal of our untrained intuitions about justice. “If justice requires the prosecution and punishment of those who commit gross human rights violations”, writes Elizabeth Kiss (2000: 68), “then the amnesty offered by the TRC violates justice. Can the TRC be defended against, or in spite of, this criticism?” Similarly, Amy Gutmann and Dennis Thompson (2000: 22) point out that:
In a democratic society, and especially in a society that is trying to overcome injustices of the past, trading criminal justice for a general social benefit such as social reconciliation requires a moral defense if it is to be defensible.
Kent Greenwalt (2000: 191) echoes the same concern when he reminds us that,
those who decide whether to include amnesty as an adjunct to a truth commission must face two basic issues. Does granting amnesty to murderers and torturers involve doing injustice? What might justify the state's doing such an injustice?
In what follows, we offer a critical survey of some of the most important philosophical justifications of the TRC. The discussion applies to any truth commission with comparable powers (this discussion is based on Eisikovits 2004, 2006).
Gutmann and Thompson (2000) argue that a justification of a truth commission needs to meet three criteria relevant for the justification of all democratic institutions: it must be moral in principle, inclusive, and moral in practice. The first condition rules out what the authors call the realist justification—the claim that the compromise embodied in the TRC was necessary in order to avoid a civil war. The second demands that the justification employ reasons that are “broadly accessible and therefore inclusive of as many people as possible” (2000: 23). The last requires that the justification be based on reasons that “are to the extent possible embodied or exemplified by the commission's own proceedings” (2000: 23). The justification that most fully meets these three requirements, argue the authors, is one rooted in the concepts of deliberative democracy and reciprocity. Central to deliberative democracy is
the idea that citizens and officials must justify any demands for collective action by giving reasons that can be accepted by those who are bound by the action…. (2000: 35–36)
This, in turn, presupposes the notion of reciprocity
which asks citizens to try to justify their political views to one another, and to treat with respect those who make…efforts to engage in this mutual enterprise even when they cannot resolve their disagreements” (2000: 36).
To the extent that a truth commission promotes such reciprocal exchanges it is morally justifiable, because such an exchange is, in itself, a moral good. The first condition is thus met. A commission based in a conception of deliberative democracy is also inclusive since the principle of reciprocity involves appeals to reasons that make sense to a large number of participants in the political process:
the standard of reciprocity also satisfies the second requirement of justification by providing an inclusive perspective. A reciprocal perspective is one that cannot be reasonably rejected by any citizen committed to democracy because it requires only that each person seek terms of cooperation that respect all as free and equal citizens. (2000: 37)
Finally, a commission committed to the principle of reciprocity is likely to function in a way that embodies that principle.
Such a commission practices what it preaches about the democratic society that it is trying to help create. Reciprocity serves as a guide… for the commission itself, calling on the commissioners and the testifiers to practice some of the skills and the virtues of the democratic society they are striving to create… the openly participatory process by which members and staff of the TRC were appointed, and the generally public process in which its proceedings were conducted, demonstrated its own commitment to democratic practices. (2000: 37)
Reciprocity, argue the authors, implies another commitment—to “the economy of moral disagreement.” Citizens must justify their positions by using the least controversial rationale available. The principle of economy encourages those engaged in deliberation to look for justifying reasons that overlap with rather than contradict beliefs held by others. To be morally justifiable under a conception of deliberative democracy, a truth commission needs to economize on disagreement. An example of economizing in the work of South Africa's TRC is the decision not to grant blanket amnesties and to insist on the indictment of some of the worst perpetrators.
The proposed justification presents several difficulties. First, it assumes that a justification of truth commissions must meet the same demands that justifications of existing democratic institutions need to satisfy. But a truth commission is not a democratic institution. Rather, it is an institution that is meant to facilitate the transition of a society to democracy. More often than not, countries undergoing such transitions lack a democratic tradition, have no history of significant public dialogue, and have not secured the minimal economic conditions required for meaningful political participation. Under these circumstances, expecting truth commissions to reflect and promote the ideals of deliberative democracy might be too ambitious.
Second, the justification is not specific enough. It is not clear why deliberative democracy, and its accompanying attributes of reciprocity and minimizing disagreement, justify truth commissions any more than other transitional instruments. Thus, for example, a war crimes tribunal may generate as much public discussion as a truth commission, it may be based on reasons or principles as widely accessible as those underlying a truth commission, and it may insist on trying only the worst offenders, thus economizing on moral disagreements. It seems, in other words, that the deliberative democracy-based argument justifies more than one transitional policy.
Finally, it is questionable whether the TRC can be justified through a deliberative democracy rationale at all. The commission did not embody a particularly open, deliberative stance in its operation. Though many of its hearings were public, some of the important procedures associated with them were confidential by default. Thus, for example, the proceedings of the amnesty commission were public, but the amnesty applications themselves, as well as the supporting documentation, remained confidential until declassified by the commission. Furthermore, the commission was exempt from standard rules of legal procedure and evidence. Perpetrators named in the testimony of victims, or in the testimony of other perpetrators, were not given an opportunity to defend themselves; second-hand information, which a traditional court would have disqualified as hearsay, was admitted, etc. Now a commission making these sorts of exceptions to the precepts of procedural justice can still be justified (for example by showing that these exceptions were necessary for establishing the chain of responsibility leading to the higher ranks of government). But it is doubtful whether the best way to justify it is by invoking a conception of deliberative democracy. For public deliberation to be meaningful and substantial, strong protections of procedural justice must be in place. As mentioned previously, these were lacking in the case of the TRC.
A second justification holds that truth commissions, by focusing on victims and providing them with the opportunity to tell their stories to a sympathetic forum, recognize victims as moral agents with stories worth telling. As Kiss (2000: 73) puts it,
providing a platform for victims is one of the core tasks of truth commissions, not merely as a way of obtaining information but also from the standpoint of justice…Those whose lives were shattered are entitled to have their suffering acknowledged and their dignity affirmed, to know that their “pain is real and worthy of attention”… We affirm the dignity and agency of those who have been brutalized by attending to their voices and making their stories a part of the historical record.
The TRC did not adhere to the strict, skeptical approach to witnesses prevalent in law courts. Standard laws of evidence were relaxed. Commissioners offered unusual gestures of acknowledgement such as rising when the witnesses entered the courtroom, visiting the sites of atrocities, and participating in public reburials (for more detail see Kiss 2000: 73). These practices were aimed at making the process about the victims of apartheid; witnesses were assumed to be speaking the truth, and were treated as people with valuable tales to tell and lessons to teach.
The justification of the TRC sketched above is a powerful one. A transition from mass atrocity into civil society, if it is to be stable and lasting, requires that the value of the individual lives of an entire class—the class of victims—be affirmed. By allowing victims to testify in an uninterrupted manner, and by creating a setting in which their testimonies were presumed to be true, the hearings of the TRC in South Africa went beyond establishing the crimes of the security forces, or presenting the hardships of everyday life under apartheid. They also posited blacks, for the first time, as persons whose stories ought to be heard with care and respect. In other words, not only the content of the testimonies before the TRC was of significance; the mere act of blacks testifying was transformative as well. The class of whites, the majority of whom had supposed that a black man or woman cannot be the bearer of legitimate, significant information, was made to think again.
However, the argument from recognition raises a serious difficulty. Some victims argued that the restoration of their dignity requires that those who hurt them be punished; that in order to feel worthy of respect, they must know their injuries merit the criminal law's protection. For such victims, dignity is manifested not by the capacity to testify, but primarily by the commitment of the state to apply its coercive power on their behalf. For some of us, in other words, the currency of recognition is punishment rather than storytelling; being recognized as a human being again can consist, first and foremost, in knowing that one is part of a civic zone protected by law, where the use of violence against her is met with strict sanctions. Under this understanding, the newfound capacity to testify, even if combined with promises of future protection by the law, simply does not cut it.
Some defenders of truth commissions claim that these bodies are better than trials at producing comprehensive accounts of past abuses. This superiority, they say, justifies compromises in retributive justice. In the case of the TRC, it was not only the dismissal of regular rules of evidence that allowed commissioners to unearth more information. The commission's amnesty-for-truth mechanism created an incentive for perpetrators to come forward. Once they started to do so, a domino effect resulted: offenders who were exposed in the testimony of their colleagues rushed to testify lest they be indicted. Furthermore, since the commission was authorized to deny amnesty to anyone who had not provided “full disclosure”, those who came before it tried to give as much detail as they could.
The “more truth” justification is a strong one. Two observations are, however, in order. First, as some critics of the TRC have noted, its choice to focus on gross human rights violations—on dramatic stories of suffering, has obscured some of the institutional aspects of apartheid. Thus, the interconnections between business and the security forces, the wildly discriminatory practices of many work places and the support that many white media outlets lent authorities in masking the practices of apartheid were largely overlooked by the commission's work. Insofar as these, too, are aspects of the truth, they were not revealed by the TRC.
Second, the fact that the TRC was the result of a political compromise meant that there were some areas in which it treaded carefully. Some worm cans remained closed. In a recent book on the history of apartheid, Terry Bell (2003: 4) mentions one remarkable example: as Fredrick de Klerk, South Africa's last white leader, was heading for Oslo to receive the Nobel peace prize in 1993, he ordered a strike on a house allegedly housing militants from the Pan African Congress liberation group. A police death squad ended up killing five teenagers sleeping in a private home in the town of Umtata. The incident was never investigated by the TRC.
It has become fashionable of late to speak about the importance of forgiveness in politics. Forgiveness is said to be the only disposition that allows us to break free of the endless cycle of blow and counter blow characteristic of ethnic conflict. We are told that forgiving is our only chance to put to rest a tortured, complicated history of assaults and recriminations. One celebrated practitioner of political forgiveness, the Archbishop Desmond Tutu, called his book on South Africa's Truth and Reconciliation Commission No Future without Forgiveness. As the title suggests, Tutu argues that it is only by forgoing resentment and learning to forgive each other that South Africans could ever create a viable democracy. Can the prospects and benefits of forgiveness justify the tradeoff between truth and (retributive) justice involved in the TRC's work?
The most prevalent argument in favor of political forgiveness concerns its potential to release victims and wrongdoers from the effects of vindictiveness. A desire for revenge can generate a never-ending violent cycle, trapping both sides in a dynamic of blow and response, eventually destroying all those involved. As Gandhi famously put it, “an eye for an eye can make the whole world blind.”
But forgiveness is not the only way to quell the desire for revenge. We can steer clear of revenge without forgiving. Victims might seek legal rather than private justice. They might agree to institutionalize their vindictive passions through the use of the courts. As Martha Minow (1998: 11) puts it, it is possible “to transfer the responsibilities for apportioning blame and punishment from victims to public bodies acting according to the rule of law.” This is, in essence, the rationale behind the attempts to expand the authority and centrality of the international criminal courts in recent decades.
Victims can (and very often do) simply move away from the scene of the trauma rather than seek revenge or engage in forgiveness. In recent years there has been a quiet exodus of approximately 100,000 Palestinians from the West Bank and Gaza, to Europe and North America. Most Holocaust survivors, uninterested in revenge or forgiveness, simply moved thousands of miles away from the sites of their horrific memories and swore never to set foot in the countries that had persecuted them. Others replace revenge with commemoration, dedicating themselves to the creation and maintenance of monuments and museums. Thus, for example, many of those handing out the ID cards at the Holocaust Museum in Washington D.C. are holocaust survivors, as are many of the guides in Jerusalem's Yad Vashem memorial.
The basic point, to reiterate, is this: vengeance can, indeed, be a very dangerous thing. But one does not have to advocate forgiveness in order to avoid it. There are other ways to combat it, ways that might be free of some of the complications (more on this below) associated with forgiveness.
Many commentators assume that forgiving is the exclusive prerogative of victims. On this view, it is problematic to define a process of political reconciliation in terms of forgiveness, because forgiving is a very private business that cannot be promoted as a policy. While this position is intuitively powerful, we will take a somewhat more nuanced stance. Let us call it the “fading prerogative” view: While forgiving is not exclusively up to victims, it certainly makes less sense to talk about forgiveness the further away we move from the partly directly injured. If X gets hurt in a bus bombing, she might forgive the person who planned the attack. It can make sense for her parents to forgive him too, though it is not obvious that they would be forgiving the same thing (the nature of the parents' injury is different from X's: the extent of her physical pain was greater than theirs; the degree of their emotional anguish might have well been higher than hers). It would be more problematic to speak of X's neighbors forgiving the bus bomber for X's injuries, and even more problematic to speak of people whom X has never met forgiving the bomber. Forgiveness, then, might not be the exclusive prerogative of victims, but the entitlement to grant it certainly seems to fade as we move away from them. There is, in other words, a limited radius in which it makes sense to speak of forgiveness. This does not, of course, mean that we cannot think of political reconciliation in terms of forgiveness. It only means that such an approach would exclude a (potentially) significant part of the community from the process.
There are other difficulties with making forgiveness into a political goal. A policy encouraging victims to forgive those who have harmed them risks adding insult to their injuries; it can induce a sense of moral inadequacy on top of the devastation already suffered. A victim's reaction to such a policy might run something like this:
isn't it enough that I had to go through all this? Now you are expecting me to forgive the person who did it? Now you are placing the moral burden on me?
Such a reaction suggests that demands for forgiveness might exacerbate rather than quell resentment—both towards the offender, to whom the victim does not want to owe a moral debt, and towards the state that makes such demands. Ironically, then, a policy advocating forgiveness might undermine one of its own aims—the reduction of vindictive and resentful passions after conflict.
Finally, it is worth remembering that forgiveness is a deeply Christian notion. As J.G. Williams puts it: “forgiveness is at the religious, theological and ethical core of the Christian tradition” (Rye et al. 2000: 31). The term does have an important role in both Judaism and Islam, but its status in these faiths is more ambivalent. Thus, for example, while Judaism does, under some conditions, impose a duty to forgive, it is not clear whether this duty must be exercised towards non-Jews. Furthermore, Judaism, unlike Christianity, discourages unconditional forgiveness. Islamic doctrine does state that forgiveness is superior to revenge, but permits retributive practices, and even feuding under some circumstances. Unlike the famous Christian teaching encouraging the turning of the other cheek, the Koran recommends a middle way between absolute vindictiveness and absolute forgiving. It reads:
let harm be requited by an equal harm, though anyone who forgives and puts things right will have his reward from God Himself--He does not like those who do wrong. (al-Shura 42:40) (Haleem, M., 2004))
The Koran also makes a division between forgivable and unforgivable sins, mentioning the trespass of shirk—the recognition of divinities other than Allah—as a prime example of the latter category. Finally, both Judaism and Islam allow for forgiveness without the resumption of relations between victim and offender, while Christianity insists that the possibility of full restoration of previous relations be left open.
Since the demands and centrality of forgiveness vary between the different faiths, it might be problematic to include the term as part of our notion of political reconciliation, especially in cases of inter-religious conflict. Even if the employment of the term were not offensive to anyone, it is likely that different religious parties would be speaking of different things when they refer to forgiveness. This, it strikes me, can create more confusion than benefit.
Lustration is the process of regulating how former government officials can participate in post-conflict government and social structures. In particular, lustration involves the screening, barring, and removal of public officials from public positions in the new democratic system as a form of administrative justice.
The concept is based on the ancient Roman lustrum rituals, a cleansing or purification of an individual or community through the removal of pollution. Lustration is often associated with the transition from an authoritarian regime to democratic governance, and in particular with both the denazification of post-WWII Germany and the post-communist transition to democracy in Eastern Europe following the collapse of the Soviet Union. Lustration was originally implemented as a part of the administrative reforms imposed by the Allies in post-WWII Germany and Japan, and by states in Western Europe that were formerly occupied by the Nazi regime.
Following the end of WWII, the Allies assigned themselves the task of purging all traces of Nazism from both German government and society, the first large-scale attempt at lustration in the modern era. The Big Three Allies (the Soviet Union, United Kingdom, and United States) agreed on a plan of action to denazify Germany at the Tripartite Conference in Potsdam. The Potsdam Agreement, released on August 2, 1945, set the groundwork for Allied efforts at purging Nazism and its adherents from Germany. The Potsdam Agreement required the Control Council (comprised of the four Allied Military Governors in occupied Germany) to
destroy the National Socialist Party and its affiliated and supervised organizations, to dissolve all Nazi institutions, to ensure that they are not revived in any form, and to prevent all Nazi and military activity or propaganda. (II.A.3.iii)
Furthermore, the subsequent Control Council Law No. 2 declared that the Nazi Party and all affiliates, totaling more than 60 specific organizations, were to be dismantled and outlawed.
The process of denazification, however, was not limited to the destruction of Nazi organizations. The Potsdam Agreement also abolished all police organizations that monitored and controlled political activity for the Nazi Party and revoked all Nazi-era legislation that established legally sanctioned “discrimination on the grounds of race, creed, or political opinion” (II.A.4).
One of the most ambitious and wide-scale activities of the Control Council was the arrest of those involved with the National Socialist Party and its affiliates, and those who actively supported Nazism during the war. The Allied arrest programs called for the automatic detention of anyone associated with the Nazi police and security services, officers holding the rank of major or higher in select branches of the armed forces, high-ranking members of the Nazi Party, and high ranking members of the German government.
Controversially, the Potsdam Agreement also called for the removal of Nazis from both “public and semi-public office, and from positions of responsibility in important private undertakings” (II.A.6). Although this policy was both harsh and ambitious, it meshed with the Allied goal of both destroying the National Socialist Party and ensuring that it is “not revived in any form” (II.A.3.iii). The process of denazification also included the confiscation of all wealth and property associated with Nazi organizations and high-ranking Nazi officials, and a complete purging of the educational system of all Nazis, Nazi materials, and objectionable courses. The Allied military government also prohibited the display of Nazi “uniforms and insignia, salutes, medals, anthems, and music” (Plischke 1947), a policy that remained in force even after political control was returned to the Germans.
Despite the enormous amount of resources and energy devoted to the denazification of Germany, there were several problems associated with the process. One of the biggest impediments to the complete denazification of post-WWII Germany was the lack of qualified anti-Nazis to staff the government, and in particular the court system responsible for trying ex-Nazis. The shortage of qualified professionals with “clean records”, combined with interference from German officials and indifference from American officers, led to disappointment among many of those tasked with ensuring the complete removal of Nazism and its adherents from German government.
Following the collapse of the Soviet Union and their emergence as independent nation-states, the states that made up the former Czechoslovakia practiced lustration as a method of transitional justice. In 1991, the Czech and Slovak National Assembly passed a law prohibiting former Communist Party officials, members of the People's Militia, and members of the National Security Corps from holding a wide range of elected and civil service positions in the new government for five years (until January 30, 1996); the ban was later extended an additional five years.
In Hungary, a 1991 law attempted to reset the stature of limitations on crimes committed during the period of Communist rule (1944–1990). Hungary's Constitutional Court overturned this law. The Court later approved an amended bill, which labeled the repression of 1956 as “war crimes” and “crimes against humanity”, both of which carry no finite statute of limitations. On 9 March 1994, during the immediate run-up to national elections, the Hungarian Parliament passed a lustration ordinance that placed roughly 12,000 “officials” under review in an attempt to discover who among them had collaborated with the secret police during the Communist period. This list contained Parliamentarians, high-ranking government officials, top officials at the Hungarian National bank, ambassadors, generals, top media operatives, police, university officials and professors, judges, state attorneys, editors, directors of state agencies and banks, and administrators of other sundry financial and governmental institutions (Ellis 1996).
Two panels were charged with screening suspects by investigating their secret files. The investigative period was to last six years and results will remain secret for thirty years. Several elements of this law were found unconstitutional in March 1994, and the Parliament passed a new law on July 3, 1996, which provides for the screening of all individuals born prior to 14 February 1972 before the assumption of higher office. Former agents and officials of the internal security services were the target. If the lustrated official did not resign within thirty days, the results of the investigation would be released publicly, bringing public humiliation into play as a tool of lustration.
The demise of the former German Democratic Republic (GDR) in 1990, and its annexation by West Germany, resulted in its “colonization” by administrators, bureaucrats, and jurists from West Germany. This was partly due to the manner in which re-unification took place (de facto annexation), but was also the result of the complete inadequacy of the existing East German civil service in the face of the new demands of a capitalist society. This “colonization” and the imposition of the political and legal judgment of another country, a former foe, sets the East German lustration apart from other such processes in post-Socialist Europe.
It was necessary to supply the new West German government with moral and political legitimacy in the former states of East Germany. This demanded the prosecution of past crimes under the prior regime, but also a purge of Communists and Stasi collaborators from the civil service. No post-Communist country has yet devised a lustration scheme with the golden balance addressing these two competing needs. East Germany was no exception, despite—or perhaps because of—the rigor with which lustration was pursued.
The ambiguities in the definition of collaboration (in cases of collaboration, forced collaboration, pseudo-compliance, clandestine resistance, etc.) resulted in similar difficulties in the lustration purge, whose terms were defined in the EinigVrt (the Treaty of Unification) (Blankenburg 1995). West German civil servants and lawyers largely conducted the purge and the construction of new institutions in East Germany. East German lawyers were both unfamiliar with the new legal system and suspect in the eyes of the new authorities. The non-indigenous nature of the process was a major problem both in fact and public perception. The scope of the lustration and the system's ability to delineate individual responsibility for the Communist regime's repression were both criticized (Blankenburg 1995).
The Treaty of Unification dealt with the union of both legal and political systems. Public employees would be scrutinized to determine if they were politically and ideologically fit for reemployment. Forced to reapply for their positions, public employees faced rejection if Stasi or other untoward associations were discovered. They also faced criminal trial if their offenses were deemed prosecutable by the reconstituted court system. Most trials were therefore conducted by new West German—or more rarely, pre-screened East German—judges under East German criminal law. These trials were meant to bring public humiliation to the convicted.
The former leadership of the DDR was tried in courts in West Berlin. Areas of investigation by the new authorities included: commanders responsible for the DDR's border policy (“shoot to kill”), election fraud at various levels of governance, and charges of corruption, embezzlement, and “misuse of public funds” (Blankenburg 1995). The prosecution took on a hybrid form: the suspects had to be tried according to the criminal law of East Germany (which West German jurists considered an Unrechtsstaat) but with the procedures of West German courts. The intent was to criminalize the Communist regime by treating and prosecuting its leadership according to the rules of an ordinary West German criminal trial.
In the aftermath of the Iraq War of 2003, the Bush administration pursued a policy of “de-Baathification” as a means of purging the government of Saddam supporters and collaborators. In contrast to previous lustration efforts following WWII and the collapse of the Soviet Union, the U.S. government initially indicated that a large number of bureaucrats and officials would be retained in the post-Saddam government (de Young and Slevin 2003). However, the scope of the United States' de-Baathification efforts would soon expand well beyond that initially limited scope
The U.S.-led Coalition Provisional Authority (CPA) ultimately required a governmental purge of all Baath party members, although there were exemptions provided to certain local coalitions. Senior Baath party officials were forbidden from entering the entire post-Saddam administration, while ordinary members were prevented from entering the top levels of government, thereby ensuring that the top levels of government remained completely Baath-free (David 2006: 366). In addition, Iraq's military and police services were completely disbanded (see Yaphe 2004), leaving large numbers of trained military personnel without work or purpose.
Several problems emerged from the U.S. policy of total de-Baathification. By excluding so many citizens who had formerly held power from government, the CPA ultimately excluded and marginalized a large swath of the Iraqi population from both governance and the economy; an estimated 60–75 percent of those purged were unemployed by late 2003 (see The Economist 2003 and David 2006). To make matters worse, many of those excluded were former military and police personnel who were seasoned combat veterans that now sought to turn their military training against the U.S.-led forces overseeing the reconstruction and democratization of Iraq.
As a result of the purge of Baath part members throughout the entire Iraqi government, the CPA was faced with a shortage of qualified personnel to staff the new administration, military, and police forces (David 2006: 367). This lack of qualified personnel, combined with intensifying attacks against both coalition and administration targets and the subsequent difficulty recruiting workers, deeply impacted the ability of the still-forming government to function. These flaws, which ultimately obstructed efforts to stabilize Iraq and contributed to the large number of causalities caused by insurgents, will be discussed in greater detail below.
Lustration policies are often bogged down by the paradoxical nature of public trust during a political transition. A strong rationale for engaging in administrative purges is to signal that a political transition is real and that the authoritarian past is being put to rest. Officials responsible for a transition want to signal that the emerging democratic polity will operate differently from its corrupt and dangerous predecessor. Such signaling is achieved, inter alia, by displacing those who were responsible for administering the corrupt and vicious policies of the past. And surely, public trust does depend on communicating to ordinary citizens that a fresh political start has been made—that a new and lawful polity has been launched. On the other hand, public trust also depends on the functionality and competence of government. The trains need to run, licenses need to be issued or renewed, roads need to be maintained, and public order has to be kept. And if the bureaucratic class that knows how to do these things is subtracted from post war politics because of how it behaved under the previous regime, the daily operation of government is likely to suffer. And public trust is likely to tumble accordingly (this is when we begin to hear that “at least under Saddam the trains ran on time”, etc.) The first dilemma of lustration,then, concerns its scope: how does one lustrate enough so that public trust (and retributive justice) are served, without lustrating so much that the organs of government are undone and public trust is lost as a result?
It goes without saying that different countries face different political circumstances when it comes to how much lustration they can carry out: East Germany could afford to purge its civil service rather severely, due to the availability of replacements from the West. Other nations, such as Poland and Czechoslovakia, did not have this luxury and had often to prioritize stability due to the exigencies and inherent dangers of the initial transition period.
Another complication impacting the scope of lustration arises from the difficulty in fixing degrees of guilt under totalitarian regimes. Here the problem is not so much lustrating in a way that maintains public trust but, rather, figuring out what counts, philosophically, as the appropriate degree of guilt to justify lustration in the first place. Mid-level officials in a ruling party mechanism cannot be automatically labeled as enthusiastic or even willing supporters of the machinery of oppression. Some were, some passively found their way into their roles and still others were coerced into them. A morally legitimate policy of lustration must take into account such gradations of guilt. But the ability to determine degrees of culpability requires expensive, lengthy investigations which are often beyond the means of those orchestrating a transition.
Beyond these problems of scope lies an epistemological difficulty: Lustration purges and exclusions frequently, though not always, rely on testimonials and security service files which are often of dubious accuracy. The files are often rife with human error, exaggerations, and omissions. The most valuable Communist informants and collaborators were often missing from surviving secret police files (many were destroyed or “disappeared”, probably into KGB possession) or were shielded during the process (Minow 2000). On the other hand, employees of the security services often embellished their accounts and added false informants in the period before an audit so that they could meet or exceed their prescribed quota.
Having examined, in some detail, three of the most important ways in which nations can come to terms with their past, it is perhaps fitting to conclude this entry by considering the possibility that nations do not attempt such a reckoning. Is there anything to be said for forgetting in the aftermath of war? Is there an argument to recommend amnesia as the basis of a political transition? (for a detailed treatment see Rotondi and Eisikovits, forthcoming).
Most often, forgetting cannot serve as the basis for peacemaking. It is destructive on both the individual and collective levels. It compounds the suffering of individuals by forcing them to watch their tormentors walk around freely, reenter politics, or maintain their posts in public service and the military. All of this takes place while their own painful memories and traumas remain unacknowledged. Furthermore, policies advocating forgetfulness decrease the chances that victims will be compensated for their suffering. The most common institutional products of such policies are laws granting amnesty. Typically, under such amnesties, perpetrators are protected from both criminal charges and civil liability. Amanda Pike, a reporter for PBS' Frontline, tells a story which starkly demonstrates the cost of forgetfulness for individual victims. During a trip through the Cambodian province of Pailin, Pike came across Samrith Phum, whose husband was executed by the Khmer Rouge. Phum knows the murderer well. He is her neighbor and he operates a noodle shop across the street from her house. He was never arrested and never charged with her husband's murder. There is no procedure through which he can be sued for damages. Phum must simply get used to the idea that her husband's killer quietly manages his store next door (Pike 2002).
On the national level, a government advocating forgetfulness commits the political correlate of suicide: it undermines the ability of the group of people it governs to call itself a nation. The French thinker Ernest Renan (1882) defined a nation as consisting of
two things, which, in truth, are really just one…One is in the past, the other in the present. One is the possession in common of a rich legacy of memories; the other is current consent, the desire to live together, the willingness to continue to maintain the value of the heritage that one has received as a common possession.
Forgetting destroys both elements. It undermines the possibility of a common history by excluding an entire class of memories. At the same time, it obliterates the desire of formerly hostile parties to live together, or the possibility of social solidarity, by creating a bubbling, poisonous, pool of resentment among an entire group of people.
Now Renan was far from naïve. He admits that “forgetting” and perhaps even “historical error” are essential in the creation of national identity. Later he adds that “the essence of a nation is that all individuals have many things in common and also that they have forgotten many things.” Descriptively, he is surely right. Heroic historiography and intentional forgetting was instrumental in creating American, Israeli, Turkish, Spanish, and French contemporary identities, to mention but a few. But identities based on amnesia are rarely stable. Israel's new historians, the countless young Armenians lobbying parliaments all over the world to recognize the Armenian genocide almost a century after it took place, and the recent Spanish “Historical Memory Law” (2007) all attest that it is difficult to simply bury the past. If the groups that have been forgotten are not annihilated, their painful memories continue to fester until they eventually erupt in renewed conflict.
But what if all parties involved in a conflict really want to forget? What if there is a tacit or explicit agreement not to dwell on the past? What are we to make of Mozambique, for example, where in the aftermath of a long, bloody civil war, the combatants actively elected not to address past atrocities? In her superb book on truth commissions, Hayner (2002) describes an election rally in post-war Mozambique in which a candidate was literally chased out of a hall for bringing up the conflict. Can we really make a normative argument for remembering if both sides freely chose to forget? One possible way to make such an argument is by analogy. It is quite clear to us that, in the domestic context, the fact that two sides to a conflict agree to bury the hatchet does not preclude their prosecution by the criminal justice authorities. Thus, if two neighboring families become entangled in a massive brawl, during which property on both sides is destroyed, and some injuries are sustained, the District Attorney's office may decide to issue indictments, even if all of those who did the fighting would like to put the whole incident behind them. The criminal law is not a private matter completely at the discretion of citizens. The public has a stake in upholding the criminal law, and is understood to be an interested party whenever it is broken. After all, in the example provided above, wider interests were compromised: traffic may have been disturbed by the fighting, the small children of other neighbors may have been watching, publicly funded hospitals may have been called on to treat the injured, reports of the fight may have made their way into the news media bringing down house prices, etc. In short, the fight, almost any fight, has repercussions for third parties. That is why, in important ways, such fights are everyone's business. And that is why criminal cases are typically titled Commonwealth vs. Jones rather than Smith vs. Jones.
Is there an analogous argument to be made about the aftermath of political conflict? Are there any third party interests that may justify some kind of reckoning with mass atrocity, even if all of those involved would freely choose to put the past behind them? Fully answering this question is beyond the scope of this entry, so we shall simply gesture at some of the difficulties that need to be addressed in order to do justice to it.
First, who are the third parties whose interests are implicated by a decision on the part of two warring parties to bury the past? Could we argue that, given the intense media coverage given to political conflicts, a failure to address massive violations of human rights in location X (for whatever reason) may endanger human rights in location Y (by, say, bolstering the confidence of would be perpetrators)? If so the third party could be described, vaguely, as the international community, a community with a serious interest in creating a robust culture of human rights wherein violations are documented and addressed rather than simply ignored.
Second, even if we agree that there are interested third parties in the international context, how could such parties ensure that their interests are protected? What sort of enforcement power do they have? Here the answers are both legal and political. The nascent International Criminal Court may be used in cases where its authority comes into play. Perhaps more significantly, the international community (or, more specifically, the most powerful international players) may resort to political pressure. After all, countries such as Mozambique, emerging from prolonged wars, are desperately dependent on international aid. Donor countries could, accordingly, make aid contingent on the addressing of past atrocities.
When all is said and done, it appears that the main difference between the domestic and international cases has to do with the consequences of the decision whether to use the courts. While in the domestic arena a failure to prosecute can result in increased cynicism about the law (and eventually in a weakening of the rule of law), imposing accountability in the aftermath of war may, under some circumstances, reignite violence. Insisting on doing justice in such cases recalls Lord Mansfield's famous dictum in the 1772 Somerset case: that justice must be done “though the heavens may fall.” The trouble, of course, with this Kantian pronouncement is that there is no one to reap the fruits of justice after the heavens have fallen.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Cited Web Resources:
- Cobban, H., 2004, “Rwanda today: The International Criminal Tribunal and the Prospects of Peace and Reconciliation, an Interview with Helena Cobban”, Posted April 1, 2004, Frontline, PBS.
- Hanson, S., 2008, “Peace, Justice, and Darfur”, Council on Foreign Relations, July 28, 2008.
- Morris, E., 2003, The Fog of War: Eleven Lessons from the Life of Robert S. McNamara, distributed by Sony Pictures Classic. Morris 2003 transcript available online
- Pike, A., 2002, “Prey Ta Tauch: The Killer Next Door”, in Cambodia, Pol Pot's Shadow, October, 2002, Frontline/World, PBS. Pike 2002 available online.
- Trial Documents and Truth Commission Reports:
- The International Military Tribunal for Germany: Contents of The Nuremberg Trials Collection (Yale)
- Materials concerning the International Criminal Tribunal for Yugoslavia (ICTY)
- Slobodan Milošević Trial Public Archive (Bard College)
- Nunca Más (Never Again), Report of the National Commission on the Disappearance of Persons (Argentina), 1984, English translation.
- Other Web Resources:
- Potsdam Agreement, August 1, 1945.
- Rome Statute of the International Criminal Court. Signed July 17, 1998.
- United Nations Security Resolution 1970. Passed February 26, 2011.
- Human Rights Watch
- Strategic Choices in the Design of Truth Commissions
- International Conflict Research Institute (INCORE), University of Ulster
- International Center for Transitional Justice
- The International Journal of Transitional Justice
- Essex Transitional Justice Network
- United State Institute of Peace, an “independent, federally-funded national security institution devoted to the nonviolent prevention and mitigation of deadly conflict abroad”.
- Beyond Intractability, at the University of Colorado Conflict Information Consortium
I am grateful to Thomas Pogge and to Greg Fried for their comments and encouragement. Thanks are also due to my research assistants at Suffolk University, Michael McDonough, Josef Nothmann and Marcus Taylor.