Public Justification

First published Tue Feb 27, 1996; substantive revision Fri Dec 2, 2022

Political theorists propose standards that identify legitimate uses of political power. Some adopt a principle of public justification. A public justification is a kind of rationale for exercising power and control. It is public because the rationale, or group of rationales, is one that members of the public can accept. Put another way, to treat people as equals, we must ensure that political power is justified for or to them by their own lights, so a public justification thus consists of reasons the public can recognize as valid. Those who adopt a public justification standard are often called public reason liberals. Liberal institutions (freedom of speech, the rule of law, democracy) are publicly justified, but illiberal institutions are not. Diverse perspectives within the public will reject non-liberal institutions.

Coercion is the standard object of public justification because it is perhaps the characteristic feature of political life. Charles Larmore remarks that public justification has “to do with the sort of respect we owe one another in the political realm — that is, in relationships where the possibility of coercion is involved” (Larmore 2008, 86). John Rawls’s principle of public justification holds that political power requires justification (Rawls 2005, 12) because “political power is always coercive power” (Rawls 2005, 68). Jonathan Quong holds that public justification concerns the imposition of coercive laws (Quong 2011, 233–250). And, as Christopher Eberle puts it (2002, 54), “the clarion call of justificatory liberalism is the public justification of coercion.” Some have wondered whether non-coercive state actions need public justification (2.7). But they nonetheless agree that coercion generally, if not always, requires it.

The idea of a public justification is, at its root, an idea about which reasons justify coercion. Public justification is not a process of exchanging reasons. Instead, the exchange of reasons can uncover or generate a public justification. Or we could arrive at a public justification through a non-deliberative route. Examples include bargaining processes and adjudicative procedures. In this way, the ideas of public reason and public justification are distinct. Public justifications might consist of public reasons. But a reason shared by the public might fall short of a sound justification if other reasons undercut or override it. One might, for example, support a new anti-poverty program on shared grounds of justice for the poor. However, alternative programs reduce poverty more effectively. The original poverty program could be publicly justified based on a shared commitment to justice, but other shared reasons, like policy efficacy, can undercut the public justification for the program.

Rawls was the foremost advocate of the idea of public justification. But we find the idea stressed in the works of Jürgen Habermas, David Gauthier, Gerald Gaus, Stephen Macedo, Charles Larmore, Seyla Benhabib, and many others.

There is considerable disagreement about how to understand the idea. Some theorists hold that all public justifications consist of shared or accessible reasons. These are often called consensus theorists. Others allow diverse, unshared reasons to figure into public justifications. These are often called convergence theorists. (See Section 2.3 below). Public justification theorists also disagree about how to attribute reasons to citizens. This disagreement is about the right level of idealization. Idealization involves modeling someone as having improved information and cognitive capacities. The goal is to identify which reasons apply to her, even if she cannot or will not see them as such in her ordinary life. Some theorists adopt more radical idealizations than others.

This entry addresses disputes about public justification by articulating an open-ended principle. This Public Justification Principle (PJP) helps classify competing conceptions of public justification.

The entry first situates public justification in the history of political philosophy. The PJP is then stated and explained, along with its chief variables. Variables include conceptions of reasons, idealization, processes of public justification, and others. The entry then examines the arguments on behalf of the principle; different foundations for the PJP are then discussed. The entry also addresses concepts of political stability and publicity related to public justification. And then, it reviews various objections to the PJP. The entry concludes by discussing how theorists apply public justification to specific controversies.

1. Origins

Public justification arose to resolve problems for social contract theory.

Classical social contract theorists grounded political legitimacy on consent. The chief social contract theorists were Thomas Hobbes, John Locke, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Immanuel Kant. They had different standards of consent; the first three oscillated between an empirical and a normative standard. The empirical standard draws on actual mental states: consent justifies political power because it draws on each party’s beliefs and values. The normative standard draws on somehow rational mental states: we appeal not to what people believe and value but what they have reason to believe and value. Political power is justified when grounded in what parties ideally affirm. In the latter case, we sometimes speak of hypothetical consent as a proxy for rational justification.

In general, empirical standards gave way to normative standards. Theorists wanted to legitimize uses of power that contradict what people actually will. By Kant’s time, actual consent views had disappeared. Hypothetical consent was the state of play. The normative standard of legitimacy had won out.

All four theorists recognize the diversity of private judgments about justice. All allowed moral judgments to diverge for any number of reasons. They all concluded that private judgment could not ground legitimacy for a diverse public. As Rawls (2005, vii) would put it, these theorists recognized reasonable pluralism. Citizens who reason freely will disagree about fundamental values and principles. Contract theorists concluded that justifications for political power had to respect diverse judgments. So justification could not rest on one specific set of beliefs and values. A public justification had to be impartial, at least among respectable but diverse viewpoints.

The idea of public justification surfaced in Kant’s work but then entered hibernation for a century. Social contract theory gave way to utilitarianism, Hegelianism, and Marxism. These three schools of thought rejected the idea of a social contract, though they have distinct reasons for doing so. The social contract tradition revived only after World War II, first in the United States.

One of the first new forms of social contract theory was contractarianism, which justifies coercive institutions through instrumental rationality: justified political arrangements are rational bargains among parties for dividing social resources. The first contemporary contract theorists were economists like John Harsanyi and James Buchanan. But neo-Hobbesian philosophers pursued a similar project, especially David Gauthier, Jean Hampton, and Gregory Kavka.

But the dominant strand of the new contract tradition was Kantian. Here John Rawls leads the pack in A Theory of Justice and later in Political Liberalism. Political Liberalism features public justification as this entry understands the concept. Rawls first understood public justification as a hypothetical contract: idealized members of the public choose principles of justice. Only Political Liberalism articulates the challenge that reasonable pluralism poses for political legitimacy. For Rawls, the public must adopt principles justified for them despite their differences. Political power is legitimate only when exercised in accord with publicly justified norms. (Some theorists use “justified” and “publicly justified” as synonyms. See 2.3 below.)

The modern idea of public justification thus only comes into full view in the early 1990s. Works on public reason and justification published in rapid succession. They produced a new tradition of political thought that flourishes today; indeed, public justification is now a core concept in political philosophy. Yet the idea admits significant variation, so we now examine those differences.

2. The Public Justification Principle

Public justification theories vary. But we can categorize them according to the Public Justification Principle (PJP). Define the PJP as follows:

The Public Justification Principle (PJP): A coercive law \(L\) is justified in a public \(P\) if and only if each member \(i\) of \(P\) has sufficient reason(s) \(R_i\) to endorse \(L\).

The principle permits individuals 1 and 2 to have different reasons to endorse \(L\). Public justifications can consist of reasons some in \(P\) reject. But in this case, \(L\) is still justified for the public as a whole. The justification encompasses the public but as distinct individuals. The justification also need not be public as common knowledge; an individual’s reason \(R_i\) need not be common knowledge in \(P\).

One can analyze the PJP through answers to the following seven questions:

  1. What makes a reason “sufficient”?
  2. How fine-grained is the specification by \(L\) of the conduct which is permitted or prohibited for members of the public?
  3. What types of justificatory reasons \(R\) do we recognize?
  4. How are the parties to public justificatory arguments idealized?
  5. What is the scope of the public?
  6. What are the modalities of public justification? Or: by which process is public justification achieved?
  7. Must we publicly justify anything other than coercion?

Again, public justification does not require the presentation of reasons. A declaration may produce or uncover a public justification, but societies may generate public justifications in other ways (see 2.7). Thus, John can have a justifying reason even if no one presents it to him through explicit reasoning. We must nonetheless explain the ideas of a reason and of a sufficient reason to endorse some law \(L\).

2.1 “Sufficient” Reasons

The PJP requires that members of a public \(P\) have reason to endorse a principle \(L\). One must then explain what it means to “have a reason to endorse” \(L\).

A common approach to reasons in normative ethics is to take the idea of a reason as primitive. A reason to \(\Phi\) is a consideration that counts in favor of \(\Phi\)-ing (Scanlon 1998, 17). But the idea of a reason in public justification theory is more specific. We do not need an ontology of reasons, but we must explain when a reason justifies a proposal. Gaus defends a conception of reasons on epistemic grounds in Justificatory Liberalism. One has a justificatory reason when openly justified. A reason is openly justified when it is “stable in the face of acute and sustained criticism by others and of new information” (Gaus 1996, 31).

A reason is sufficient when it has some positive epistemic grounds. Some considerations favor it, and none defeat it. Critically, a reason can be sufficient for one member of the public but not others. So, a justifying reason may not justify coercion for all members of the public. A coercive law is only justified when each person has sufficient reason to endorse \(L\). Laws gain public justification by resting on the sufficient reasons of each member.

Public justification theorists assume that our personal reasons for action and belief can differ, and in some cases, substantially. The reasons one may offer in public justification may be narrower than one’s personal reasons, but even consensus theorists think that justifying reasons must, in some sense, adhere to an agent’s beliefs and values. Public justification theorists need not adopt Gaus’s epistemology of justificatory reasons, but the correct account cannot be too far off.

Public justification theorists thus acknowledge that citizens can rationally affirm reasons that others reject. And so, different individuals may have epistemic justification to endorse quite different reasons. While members of the public themselves need not recognize these (admittedly) abstruse principles, theorists must accept that two individuals can have reasonable grounds for affirming diverse and incompatible reasons.

Public justification theory rejects actual endorsement standards, opting for idealization (as we will see in 2.4). Today theorists either appeal to counterfactual endorsement or rationally required endorsement. In the former case, an agent would accept the law through a deliberate act of will. In the latter case, an agent endorses a law when rationally committed to affirming it; that is, rationality requires that she approve it through a deliberate act of will.

2.2 Granularity

What is the object of public justification? What is the thing that we publicly justify? Answers differ, and we can classify them by their “granularity.” Some exercises of political power and state coercion are small, like legal regulations, while others are broader, like constitutions. If we take laws as our object of justification, we take a fine-grained approach. But if constitutions are our object, we take a coarse-grained approach.

Rawls (2005, 140) adopts a coarse-grained approach, applying public justification to “constitutional essentials” and “basic questions of justice.” Jonathan Quong (2004, 233–259) adopts a fine-grained approach. He applies public justification first to laws. Gaus (2011, 495) focuses on laws that lack “strong interactive effects” with other laws. For instance, a smoking ban lacks strong interactive effects with a corn subsidy, and so they should be justified separately.

Gaus’s case for fine-grained “individuation” of proposals involves two arguments. We must justify at a level narrow enough to identify which forms of behavior are permitted or not. But we must justify at a level wide enough to see rules as governing classes of behavior (Gaus 2011, 122–125). This entry’s formulation of the PJP focuses on law \(L\) for brevity, and it acknowledges that public justification theorists work with other objects of justification.

2.3 Types of Justificatory Reason

A chief disagreement among public justification theorists concerns the nature of justificatory reasons. Variable \(R_i\) in the PJP represents the contrast. The mainstream view within public reason circles is that justificatory reasons are shared. More accurately, members of the public can share all justificatory reasons. The reasons are shareable. (Or, at least, be “accessible” in a sense outlined below (see 2.3.2)). On these “consensus” views, \(R_i\) is the same for each individual \(i\). “Convergence” views allow \(R_i\) to differ between members of the public. John may have his reason \(R_1\), whereas Reba may have her \(R_2\). Citizens can see the reasons as justified according to reasonable evaluative standards. But they need not adopt those standards themselves. So, on a convergence view, a private religious reason can be justificatory. One person’s reasons can differ from another. Each has reasons, but these reasons aren’t the same in the two cases. (See D’Agostino 1996, 30) Again, religious reasons may form some of those reasons.

The idea of people having different reasons may seem odd to some. But we recognize convergence reasoning in various contexts. One concerns market transactions. Suppose \(A\) has apples and \(B\) has bananas. \(A\) wants some bananas, and \(B\) wants some apples. After a trade, both have a mixture and regard themselves as better off. Here \(A\) and \(B\) exchanged for different reasons. And so, the arrangement has a convergence justification. Each has a reason of their own to prefer it. And note that the point stands even if \(A\) and \(B\) find one another’s reasons quite alien. Indeed, they might not even know one another’s reasons. But the arrangement still has a kind of public justification.

So convergence only requires that individuals have their reasons \(R_i\), which creates set \(\{R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n\}\) to support \(L\). Consensus requires, in the limit, that all members of the public share a (set of) reason(s) \(R\) to endorse \(L\).

But even convergence limits the range of justificatory reasons: \(A\)’s reasons for endorsing \(L\) might be repugnant, perhaps enough to undermine \(L\)’s public justification. For this reason, convergence theorists appeal to idealization (see 2.4 below).

Again, the consensus approach remains dominant. Convergence is in the minority, both in earlier and contemporary works. (Gaus 1990, 256; Stout 2004; Klosko 1993 vs Gaus 2011; Vallier 2014; Vallier 2019, Gaus 2021).

But the public reason tradition provides grounds for both approaches. Rawls seems to have combined the two approaches. Rawls looks like a consensus theorist in the “freestanding” stage of political justification. He (2005, 12) says that citizens should use shared reasons to converge on a political conception of justice. But in the “overlapping consensus” stage, Rawls leaves justification “to each person.” Each person must sync the political conception of justice with their comprehensive doctrine, and the public adopts no single comprehensive doctrine. Rawls included both accounts of justificatory reasons in his view, yet while the combined view is attractive, many writers feel compelled to reject it.

Habermas (1995) provides the most well-known illustration of the tension in Rawls. Gaus (2011) opts for overlapping consensus/convergence justifications. Quong (2011) opts for free-standing/consensus justifications. Vallier and Muldoon (2021) argue that these answers generate two public reason projects. Gaus founded a “diversity project” focused on how diverse reasoning resolves social conflicts. Quong founded a “coherence project” focused on rendering key political concepts coherent.

As noted, even convergence theorists adopt restrictions on the set of justificatory reasons. Some discipline is implicit in the concept of “a reason.” A factual claim does not justify a principle if evidence falsifies the claim, and a normative claim is not a reason to endorse \(L\) if it lacks real normative force. So, we need to articulate some tests that count reasons as justificatory. The entry organizes them by increasing stringency: intelligibility, accessibility, and shareability.

2.3.1 Intelligibility

Define intelligibility and the intelligibility requirement as follows:

Intelligibility: \(A\)’s reason \(R_A\) is intelligible to members of the public if and only if members of the public regard \(R_A\) as justified for \(A\) according to \(A\)’s evaluative standards.

Intelligibility Requirement: \(A\)’s reason \(R_A\) can figure in a justification for (or rejection of) a coercive law \(L\) only if it is intelligible to all members of the public.

\(A\)’s intelligible reasons are those members can see as reasons for \(A\), who advances them. And members see \(A\)’s reasons as reasons for \(A\) based on \(A\)’s own evaluative standards. Contrast these reasons with mere utterances, expressions of emotions, or irrational demands: intelligible reasons have rational grounds.

Intelligibility theorists (Vallier 2016b) argue that reasonable pluralism applies to evaluative standards as it applies to reasons (Vallier 2011). Reasonable people can dispute standards of inference and epistemic justification. For instance, John may regard theological reasoning as intelligible. To illustrate, he points to the rational structure of religious exegetical disputes. We may reject another’s sacred texts but think they furnish reasonable evaluative standards. Others may disagree: sacred texts are too indeterminate for adequate interpretation. Members may disagree about what counts as a good cognitive process.

The intelligibility requirement recognizes these differences in evaluative standards. But it still places pressure on a purely empirical approach. An empirical approach would count reasons as justificatory simply because people affirm them. But intelligibility demands that our reasons for endorsing a principle meet rational standards. Others must see the reason as one for the person who offers it, at least according to that person’s standard.

Not all intelligible reasons can figure into a justification for some \(L\). Some intelligible reasons are irrelevant; others only pertain to the benefits for oneself; still others may not be sufficient to justify a law, as specified in 2.1. Intelligibility is a requirement beyond logical sufficiency to give reasons some epistemic credentials. \(A\)’s intelligible reasons must be available to others to consider at least as reasons for \(A\).

2.3.2 Accessibility

The accessibility requirement is more stringent than intelligibility. It does not mandate that a reason for \(A\) to accept \(L\) be justified according to \(A\)’s reasonable standards. (Even if others do not share these reasons). Instead, accessibility requires that reasons be justified according to shared evaluative standards. (Members believe that \(R_A\) justifies \(L\) for \(A\) under common evaluative standards, and \(A\) accepts that \(R_A\) justifies \(L\).) Accessibility permits reasons to differ. \((A\) might endorse \(R_A\) and \(B\) might not). But it requires that they be evaluated as reasons according to shared evaluative standards. Thus, accessibility lies between intelligibility and shareability. (Which we consider next, in section 2.4.3.) Intelligibility permits differing reasons and evaluative standards, whereas shareability permits neither. Accessibility is the most common standard, with at least eight available interpretations. (Eberle 2002, 252–286; for a recent defense, see Boettcher 2015). Define accessibility and the accessibility requirement as follows:

Accessibility: \(A\)’s reason \(R_A\) is accessible to the public if and only if all members of the public regard \(R_A\) as justified for \(A\) according to common evaluative standards

Accessibility Requirement: \(A\)’s reason \(R_A\) can figure in a justification for (or rejection of) a coercive law only if \(R_A\) is accessible to all members of the public.

2.3.3 Shareability

Shareability is the strongest of the three requirements. It combines shared evaluative standards with the shared reasons requirement (Bowman and Richardson 2009; Hartley and Watson 2009; Watson and Hartley 2018). Public reason liberals often argue that justifying reasons are necessarily shared. But they say little about what it means to share reasons. Public reason liberals presumably hold that reasons must be shareable, in that citizens have the reasons at the right level of idealization.

Like intelligibility and accessibility, the shareability requirement has two components: a requirement on the appropriate evaluative standards and a requirement on the range of permitted reasons. Define shareability and the shareability requirement as follows:

Shareability: \(A\)’s reason \(R_A\) is shareable with the public if and only if members of the public regard \(R_A\) as justified for each member of the public, including A, according to common standards.

Shareability Requirement: \(A\)’s reason \(R_A\) can figure in a justification for (or rejection of) coercion only if \(R_A\) is shared with all (suitably idealized) members of the public.

Shareability rules out convergence approaches to public justification, and citizens may only use shareable reasons in their public uses of reason. (One could argue that members of the public share any good reason at high levels of idealization, and here people may even share their comprehensive doctrines. This point bleeds into the matter of idealization, addressed below).

2.3.4 A Diagram

Intelligibility, Accessibility, and Shareability are the three core standards of justificatory reasons in the public justification literature. They can be grouped together in a diagram:

  Unshared Standards Shared Standards
Unshared Reasons Intelligibility Accessibility
Shared Reasons X Shareability

The bottom left quadrant is open—public reason liberals never advocate shared reasons and unshared evaluative standards. There are two reasons for this. First, sharing evaluative standards is more common than sharing reasons. So if reasons are shared, evaluative standards should be too. Second, evaluative standards help to individuate and distinguish between reasons. So it’s not clear we could determine which reasons are shared if evaluative standards are not shared.

2.4 Idealization

Once the outer bounds of the public are set (see Section 2.5 below), and we know which individuals have to have reason(s) for some arrangement to legitimize that arrangement, public reason liberals must explain how to ascribe reasons to the members of this group. Specifically, public reason liberals, unless they are empirical consent theorists, engage in idealization to show how citizens’ beliefs, desires, and values enter into the process of public justification. Idealization is the practice of considering citizens’ beliefs, desires, and values as if they possessed good information and good reasoning. It is typically employed because an individual’s morally significant reasons may not be the same as the reasons she affirms. Her affirmed reasons might rest on poor information, poor reasoning, or incoherent beliefs and desires. Justificatory populism determines citizens’ reasons by their actual commitments (Eberle 2002, 200).

Rawls’s primary model of idealization (1971, 118) is the veil of ignorance. It models parties as reasonable by withholding information that would undermine the impartiality of their deliberations. (The veil device models reasonableness and the parties’ veiled reasoning models rationality.) Jürgen Habermas (1999, 198) prefers deliberative conditions without abstract idealization. He constrains the form of discourse to actual individuals. David Gauthier (1986, 245) prefers a bargaining scenario. Individuals know the characteristics of persons, but they do not know which person they are.

Idealization alters citizens’ belief-value sets. A citizen’s belief-value set is the set of all her beliefs, desires, goals, and plans, i.e., everything she thinks and wants. (This idea derives from Bernard Williams’s (1981, 102) conception of a subjective motivational set.) A citizen is idealized when we consider her belief-value set as it might be. Theorists change one or more of her beliefs, desires, and goals according to some criteria. They may imagine her having more or different information or values. Or they must insist on modeling her as fully rational. Both models alter her belief-value set. And the appropriate level of idealization might vary with context. Perhaps it depends on the epistemic quality of reasoning demanded by the situation. (Some reasoning aims to design institutions, whereas one might use other reasoning to plan a family vacation).

To motivate idealization, consider how public justification fares without it. Populist views “take citizens as they are: the default populist position is that a rationale \(R\) counts as a public justification only if the members of the public find \(R\) acceptable in light of their existing [subjective motivational sets], irrespective of their epistemic pockmarks and doxastic defects” (Eberle 2002, 200). Populist conceptions of idealization have severe problems. People can “withhold their assent because of obstinacy, selfishness, laziness, perversity, or confusion” (Gaus 1996, 121). Populism also problematically requires asking everyone about their reasons before deciding whether a coercive law is justified.

2.4.1 Radical Idealization

Public justification theorists typically prefer radical idealization. They do this to fix the weaknesses of justificatory populism and alter belief-value sets to rid them of inconsistencies and ignorance. Radical idealization thus has two dimensions—rationality and information—pushed to their upper bound. Rationality

The distinction between full rationality and less-than-full rationality is central to idealization. Though, as we will see, full rationality is elusive. To attribute reasons to citizens based on poor reasoning corrupts public justification. A theory of full rationality idealizes agents by giving parties flawless cognitive powers. (See Rawls (1971, 12) and Gauthier (1986, 234) for explicit attributions of full rationality to their agents.)

The assumption of full rationality initially seems irresistible. If we can discern the reasons citizens would affirm if perfectly rational, surely these reasons would be morally relevant. The public reason liberal tries to justify demands and coercion to members of her society. How could she do better than full rationality? Another motivation for embracing full rationality is to generate agreement. Many assume that suitably idealized individuals will agree on matters they otherwise would not. Rawls ascribes full rationality to parties to the original position to induce agreement. Were they less than fully rational, the parties might reach different conclusions.

But problems with full rationality abound. First, the notion of full rationality may be incoherent when applied to finite and fallible beings (see Cherniak 1986). It requires adjusting a dense web of beliefs and values. And these beliefs and values are not computable in real-time given limited resources. Second, full rationality will produce justifications that individuals cannot reflectively endorse. Individuals’ actual beliefs and values differ significantly from those which justify the arrangements. (This is one way in which the problem of stability might arise. See below 5.2.) Information

Again, public reason liberals add information to the belief-value set of ordinary citizens. (And, indeed, remove misinformation.) They thereby avoid holding public justification captive to ignorance. Rawls, Gauthier, and Habermas all pursue this strategy. Their models assume that idealized agents have all (and only) the facts that determine what reasons they have. Public reason liberals remove beliefs and desires that stop individuals from adopting an impartial perspective. They add such general and specific information necessary for the agent to reason well about the issues before her. Public reason liberals disagree about what sets of information interfere with impartiality. But all theorists subtract misinformation and biasing information.

Informational idealization ranges between complete information and adequate or relevant information. The motivations for embracing and rejecting full information resemble those for full rationality. A full information account is attractive because it attributes reasons to citizens based on many true propositions and no false ones. Further, complete information might guarantee determinate recommendations, and if agents share relevant information, they will tend to converge on similar conclusions. Yet, complete information may model citizens in an implausibly abstract fashion, and it gives them powers that no finite and fallible being has.

2.4.2 Moderate Idealization

Public reason liberals take criticisms of radical idealization increasingly seriously. (See Gaus 2011, 232–260 and Vallier 2014, 145–180.) If these criticisms are successful, one might reconsider returning to justificatory populism. However, there may be a third option: moderate idealization. Moderate idealization assigns reasons based on some standard of adequate information and reasoning. Yet it falls short of full information and perfect reasoning. The moderate idealization theorist argues that we can go too far in separating idealized belief-value sets from citizens’ dingy, real-world belief-value sets. We will eventually sever the tie between them. And, as Wolterstorff insists (2007, 153), the idealized person may have no reason to care about his counterpart’s recommendations. (Also see Enoch 2013, 164–170; for a reply, see Gaus 2015). The pull toward radical idealization must balance respecting citizens as they are. (This latter element will be crucial for maintaining stability; see 5.2.) Radical idealization may test the “strains of commitment” (Rawls 1971, 155–9) in demanding that citizens cognitively struggle to see what reasons they have. But moderate idealization may prove acceptable to most ordinary citizens. Moderate idealization is an appropriate acknowledgment of the demands of the impartial perspective.

2.4.3 Reasonableness

Idealization limits the set of reasons that figure into public justification. “Normative” idealizations that represent the public as reasonable do likewise. In one way, reasonableness may seem to be a redundant category. Rawls, Gauthier, and Habermas represent citizens as reasonable by depriving them of partializing information. But reasonableness is not redundant. It attributes cognitive dispositions to agents uncaptured by idealizing beliefs, desires, and values.

Rawls’s conception of the reasonable plays two roles in his theory of justice. First, the veil of ignorance models reasonableness. But a citizen of the well-ordered society is also reasonable because she possesses the following four dispositions (Rawls 2005, 49–52, 53–58, 60, 76, 119, 162–3, 229). (1) A disposition to engage in public justification or to offer justifications for her own preferred principles and abide by the justified principles proposed by others. (2) A disposition to recognize the “burdens of judgment” implies reasonable pluralism. (3) A disposition to reject the repression of other reasonable points of view. (4) A disposition to rely on methods of reasoning that others can share or access.

Public reason liberals share something like the standard conception of reasonableness. But idealizing members of the public as reasonable runs into two problems. First, such idealization risks ruling too many citizens out of the justificatory public. Second, representing the public as reasonable might forestall justifying coercive social arrangements in a way that helps them to approximate a voluntary agreement (Nagel 1987).

2.5 Scope of the Public

The scope of the public determines who to idealize. Public justification theorists typically identify the public with members of a traditional nation-state. Theorists do this to simplify, but also due to an implicit nationalism. Rawls confined his theory of justice to members of a nation, though he later developed an account of public justification for global matters (2002). This matter is left to debates about nationalism and cosmopolitanism (see the entries on nationalism and cosmopolitanism).

Public reason liberals tend to leave future generations out of the public (though see the entry on intergenerational justice). Some theorists, like Gauthier, confine public justification to persons capable of cooperation. But most theorists apply public justification to all citizens.

2.6 Modalities of Public Justification

The PJP can also specify which social processes establish public justification. We can sort social processes into four types: discursive, universalizing, bargaining, and evolutionary. Discursive views identify public justification with an agreement reached between public discussants. Universalizing approaches identify public justification with fair and reciprocal principles. Bargaining approaches identify publicly justified principles as those that maximally advance individual interests. Evolutionary approaches are the most distinctive. They distinguish sharply between public reason and public justification. In their view, a coercive principle \(L\) is publicly justified when it is a stable, evolved public equilibrium. No process of public reasoning needs to take place. These four theories each have a prominent representative. In order they are Jürgen Habermas, John Rawls, David Gauthier and Gerald Gaus.

2.6.1 Discursive

Discursive theories understand public justification as generating agreement among disputants through a process of real discourse under just and fair social institutions. Such views divide into Habermasian and pragmatist theories (Talisse 2005; Misak 2000). We can outline the discursive view by reviewing Habermas’s account (see the entry on Jürgen Habermas).

Habermas holds (1999, 68) that “the justification of norms and commands requires that a real discourse be carried out.” The only way to achieve public justification is through free argumentation. Such argumentation convinces citizens to recognize the claims others make on them. For \(A\) to make a legitimate claim on \(B\), \(A\) must submit his claim to \(B\)’s critique. The discursive process forms each individual’s conception of her interests and commitments. Habermas calls this process “will formation.” Personal opinions can change and then produce a rational consensus. Habermas idealizes in this way to define a conception of the reasonable. Citizens take a discursive, moral point of view. Their goal is to reach a rational consensus about the interests of the public. (For details about how idealized discourse proceeds, see Habermas 1999, 65–6.)

2.6.2 Universalizing

Universalizing views try to identify a regime that fairly advances everyone’s interests in accord with how individuals understand those interests. Rawls exemplifies this view: a theory of justice justifies claims that citizens make on one another’s conduct from our perspectives. Given how much people disagree, Rawls knows that gaining traction on justification is complex, and he responds by converting it into a problem of social choice. Rawls: “the question of justification [can be] settled by working out a problem of deliberation” (Rawls 1971, 16). Principles of justice are publicly justified when parties to a proper choice situation select them.

2.6.3 Bargaining

Bargaining views call a regime legitimate for an individual when it maximally advances her interests. Bargaining suggests a negotiation that yields a stable equilibrium of opposing forces: each person achieves as much as she can, consistent with the needs of others. The most prominent example of a bargaining theory is David Gauthier’s contractarianism. Gauthier argues that citizens need a social morality to secure social cooperation. We identify moral and political norms as justified when it is instrumentally rational for each agent to accept them.

Individuals “faced with the costs of natural or market interaction in the face of externalities agree to a different, cooperative mode of interaction.” Rational individuals do so to “maximize their own utility” (Gauthier 1986, 145–6). The goal is to show why anyone should accept moral restraints on their behavior. Gauthier proposes that even instrumental rationality can justify ethical constraints to all. A citizen can be subject to state coercion in certain respects because it is in his interests. Gauthier does not base public justification on the total utility it produces. Parties strike bargains where each person provides the minimum relative concession of rents. Publicly justified rules maximize each person’s share, but joint maximization constrains each person’s claim. Each side seeks the best bargain they can get.

In recent years, both Michael Moehler (2018) and Peter Vanderschraaf (2018) have revived bargaining approaches to public justification. Moehler develops a “two level” theory of practical rationality for social contract theory. Bargaining reasoning is the fallback position when more moralized contracting fails. Vanderschraaf’s book, Strategic Justice, takes the bargaining approach to its highest level of sophistication.

2.6.4 Evolutionary

Evolutionary views are, again, the newest approach. The approach arguably originates in Bryan Skyrms (1996). But Gerald Gaus (2011) is today the most well-known proponent of such a view. Evolutionary views are new because they react to perceived failures of other approaches. Gaus, for instance, rejects bargaining views, claiming that parties to public justification must be intrinsic rule-followers. We can follow rules that frustrate our goals. Gaus argues that agents who follow moral rules for instrumental reasons cannot sustain cooperation because its members still have reason to defect when others cooperate. Moral agency, he concludes, must allow us to decline to maximize the satisfaction of our goals.

For Gaus, then, parties will not accept every instrumentally rational bargain. They also know that public discourse will not resolve their disagreements. And a universalizing approach will yield multiple eligible social arrangements; universalizing strategies are indeterminate. Gaus appeals to social evolution to produce convergence on an eligible understanding, which would otherwise be indeterminate. When society reaches an undefeated agreement, it achieves public justification. Each party sees no other way to secure social cooperation. Public reason combines with a sociological thesis: spontaneous order processes can converge on norms. No one foresees or constructs the justified principle or rule. But all have reason to accept the outcome of such a process.

Evolutionary views draw on “adaptive” rationality, contrasted with “calculated” rationality (March 1978). An agent is rational when she adapts effectively to her environment, so her rationality does not depend on how she adapts, only that she adapts well. Calculated rationality occurs when one adapts through deliberative decision-making. Many theorists assume the PJP is a principle of calculative reason. But evolutionary theorists reject this claim. \(L\) is publicly justified for \(P\) if each member has sufficient reason to endorse \(L\). Full stop. Public justification obtains even if justificatory reasons differ. It even obtains when these reasons are the consequence of an equilibrium process. The reasons need not derive from explicit deliberation.

Gaus continued the evolutionary project up to The Open Society and Its Complexities (Gaus 2021). The book draws complexity economics and agent-based modeling to determine when and in what circumstances a diverse population will converge on common rules. Here Gaus draws on Ryan Muldoon (2019), who introduced agent-based modeling into social contract theory. Muldoon uses his theory to challenge consensus views of public reason.

2.7 Coercion Alone?

Typically public justification addresses the permissibility of political coercion. Coercion might apply to constitutional essentials and basic justice (Rawls 2005). Or it applies to coercive law as well (Quong 2011). Yet some theorists extend public justification beyond coercion. Gaus (2011) and Chad Van Schoelandt (2015) argue that public justification evaluates relations of moral authority. We publicly justify our practice of making moral demands of others, even if the rules we demand others follow are not coercive. Colin Bird (2014) grounds public justification in the standing of democratic citizens as co-authors of legislation. In Bird’s view, we must justify non-coercive legislation that affects the status of citizens. An example might be communicative legislation that defines an optionally sworn national pledge of allegiance. Some public reason theorists broaden the idea of coercion to cover structural coercion (Boettcher 2016, Wong 2020).

3. The Liberty Principle

The PJP only explains how to justify coercion (or some related form of demand). It includes no other moral principle that describes why coercion is problematic. Nor does it explain how to handle unjustified coercion. So, one might combine the PJP with a consequentialist norm. Unjustified coercion, on this view, merits minimization. Or we could adopt a deontological side constraint on using unjustified coercion. Again, on this matter, the PJP is silent.

And yet, many public justification theorists, with other liberals, adopt such a principle. Some theorists call it the Liberty Principle. It takes the form of a presumption in favor of liberty or against coercion. Stanley Benn (1988, 87) defends such a presumption. Benn: “the burden of justification falls on the interferer, not on the person interfered with.”

Joel Feinberg (1987, 9) also defends a “presumption in favor of liberty.” Defined: “liberty should be the norm, coercion always needs some special justification.” While Benn worries about interference, and Feinberg about coercion, their presumptions are similar. Rawls (2001, 44) endorses a presumption against legal coercion, which also appears in his liberal principle of legitimacy. Rawls: “Our exercise of political power is proper only when we sincerely believe that the reasons we offer for our political action may reasonably be accepted by other citizens as a justification of those actions” (Rawls 2005, xlvi). Rawls does not speak of coercion in this formulation. Yet he elsewhere claims that “political power is always coercive power” (68). Further, public justification should explain when citizens may coerce another (217). We can naturally read Rawls, then, as endorsing the Liberty Principle. Gaus (2011) probably provides the most extensive defense of the liberty principle to date (though see Vallier 2019).

We can conjoin the PJP with the Liberty Principle. Together, they explain how to use the PJP to evaluate laws. When satisfied, the PJP legitimizes coercion, overcoming the presumption in favor of liberty.

4. Foundations of the Public Justification Principle

Now we inquire into the foundations of the PJP. Why should anyone accept it? The set of proposed normative foundations has increased with time. Classically, public justification rests on respect for persons as free and equal. (See Larmore 2008; for criticism, see Eberle 2002, Gaus 2011 and Van Schoelandt 2015). Others ground the PJP in an analysis of the nature of rationality and morality (Habermas 1996). One dominant view bases the PJP on requirements of justice (Rawls 2005: Quong 2013). Some draw on the value of civic friendship. (See Lister 2013, Ebels-Duggan 2010, Leland and van Wietmarschen 2017, van Wietmarschen 2021, Neufeld 2022. For criticism, see Billingham 2016.) Gaus adopts a PJP because he argues that publicly justified rules avoid authoritarianism and fit with the reactive attitudes (for criticism, see Tahzib 2019, Taylor 2018). At a deeper moral level, these rules preserve moral relations between persons. (Gaus 2011, Vallier 2022. For criticism, see Enoch 2013 and Enoch 2015.)

Watson and Hartley (2018) rest public justification on respect for persons and reciprocity. Vallier (2019, 2020) grounds a PJP in the value of social trust or trust between members of society (though see Tahzib 2021). Neo-Hobbesian views have seen a revival in the work of Moehler (2018) and Vanderschraaf (2018); they have much more developed theories of instrumental rationality as a basis for public justification.

For space purposes, I omit a discussion of these foundations, as it would only recapitulate the argument found in the entry on public reason.

A related foundational question asks who merits a public justification in the first place (this question relates to the question of the scope of public justification, but is logically prior to it). Quong (2011, 137–160) applies public justification to an idealized constituency of reasonable people. Gaus (2011, 232–268) directs public justification to actual persons; their justifying reasons are those that survive moderate idealization. Quong calls his view the “internal conception” of political liberalism. He contrasts it with the “external conception.” The external conception directs public justification to natural persons as they are. But few public reason liberals adopt the external view. The Gausian model appeals to a limited idealization, not none. The internal conception has been subject to several criticisms. (Gaus 2012, Billingham 2017a, Vallier 2017). But theorists also criticize the Gausian approach (Enoch 2013, Quong 2014).

Deciding who merits a public justification requires explaining its point. For Quong and others, public justification renders consistent our fundamental political ideals. Examples include the idea of society as a system of cooperation and persons as free and equal. For Gaus, public justification establishes moral relations between natural persons (Gaus 2011). These relations are ones of equal respect. But they also lay the foundation for closer ties of trust, love, and friendship.

The internal/external conception contrast no longer serves to classify public reason liberals. Vallier and Muldoon (2021) have argued that public reason has split into two projects. The first project, which they call the coherence project, characterizes the internal conception; it involves rendering our political ideals consistent. The project contrasts with the diversity project; diversity theorists use diverse reasoning to achieve real-world public justification. Vallier and Muldoon (2021) set the external conception aside.

The original project, advanced by Rawls and traditional Rawlsians, continues (Weithman 2011). But the coherence and diversity projects arose from a shared worry about it. Rawls uses both consensus and convergence reasoning in legitimizing state coercion. We first justify a conception of justice based on shared values, and we then see if it can become the object of an overlapping consensus. Coherence theorists say the first stage is critical, while the second stage is confusing. But diversity theorists say the second stage is necessary as a heuristic for finding points of convergence. Original project theorists refuse to choose between these two justificatory stages.

For the most recent work in the coherence project, see Neufeld 2022. For the most recent work in the diversity project, see Gaus 2021. Gaus’s work has pushed public reason so far in a diversity direction that in some ways it is no longer a form of social contract theory (Gaus 2018). Gaus now models the choice of principles as a socially interdependent choice process, and not a single agreement. Gaus even began developing a research program based on these insights called the New Diversity Theory (Gaus 2018b).

5. Sister Concepts

The PJP ties itself to two essential concepts: publicity and stability. A law that achieves stability and publicity may thereby count as publicly justified. In other cases, theorists see reaching publicity and stability as theoretical merits—considerations that favor their approach to public justification over others. If a version of the PJP conflicts with publicity, that could refute the specification. Other factors can count against this specification of the PJP. But publicity and stability are central to public justification, so we explore connections.

5.1 Publicity

For Rawls, “public justification” occurs when a well-ordered society achieves “full publicity.” Full publicity contains three levels (see the entry on publicity). The first level occurs when public principles of justice effectively regulate society. Rawls (2005, 66): “citizens accept and know that others likewise accept those principles, and this in turn is publicly recognized.” Each person sees society’s basic structure as justified by shared reasoning.

The second level requires that citizens of a well-ordered society have shared beliefs. In particular, they believe that all can accept the first principles of justice. Their evaluations draw on “general beliefs about human nature” and how institutions work (67).

Level three establishes “the full justification of the public conception of justice as it would be presented in its own terms.” It must include all considerations relevant to generating a conception of justice. Then the full justification becomes “publicly known” or at least “publicly available.”

Full publicity arises when all three levels of publicity occur. When a society reaches full publicity, its conception of justice becomes publicly justified. Yet this is so only given two conditions. The conception of justice must become a political conception. It must derive from shared and public political values. Second, it must reach an overlapping consensus. Full publicity comprises “public justification,” Rawls’s third stage of justifying a political conception. It occurs when each person knows that the political conception is fully justified. (Rawls 2005, 386–7). For Rawls, “public justification happens when all the reasonable members of political society carry out a justification of the shared political conception by embedding it in their several reasonable comprehensive views.” Thus, public justification obtains via publicity.

Charles Larmore (2008, 203–7) traces Rawls’s idea of public reason to concerns about publicity. Paul Weithman (2011, 242) stresses the centrality of publicity in Rawls. Publicity helps educate society about the basis of its political views. And it is crucial for maintaining a community as stable for the right reasons.

Rawls’s notion of publicity is the most common in the literature, but Gaus (2011, 296–7) offers a less demanding “weak” publicity standard. Notice, then, that Rawls’s conception of publicity is quite demanding. The PJP does not insist that public justifications achieve full publicity, and most theorists say that people should be able to tell when laws or rules are publicly justified. Publicity is a “sister concept” to public justification when it helps to establish public justification.

Some theorists define publicity as the publicity of shared reasons. (See Rawls 2002, 173.) They adopt a consensus approach to aid public recognition that public justification occurs. (See Hadfield and Macedo 2012; Watson and Hartley 2018.) And yet, consensus and convergence views appeal to publicity. Both approaches want citizens to know when laws or policies are justified for all. Convergence theorists may not define the PJP as including shared values, but they still find publicity attractive. This difference draws on the contrast between intelligibility and accessibility discussed above.

Publicity remains a central topic in this literature, but has gone without major treatments until Kogelmann 2022.

5.2 Stability

Stability is the other sister concept to public justification. Many public reason liberals think publicly justified principles must be somehow morally stable. Rawls (2005, 140–3) advances this line: public justification helps political conceptions become “stable for the right reasons.”

Weithman (2011) argues that Rawls’s changing ideal of stability drove revisions to his theory. Rawls wanted his political principles to reach stability in a diverse society despite reasonable pluralism. In some ways, concerns about stability are a reason to care about public justification. A community may only reach moral stability, that is, stability for the right reasons if each person has moral reason to endorse society’s coercive power. Otherwise, stability rests on a balance of power alone—a modus vivendi regime.

Some theorists draw a looser connection between stability and public justification. Whether a principle can stabilize is a reason to prefer it over less stable principles. (Rawls sometimes talks this way in Theory.) Stability may also help vindicate a conception of public justification over others. So, suppose that a convergence view helps justify laws in ways that promote stability. If so, we may have reason to adopt a convergence over a consensus view.

Rawls’s focus on stability raises another complex issue. The present entry addressed idealizing persons as reasonable or not (2.4.3). Some idealizations attribute reasons to citizens based on what they would reasonably endorse. Stability is also sometimes moralized. It is valuable only when based on “the right reasons.” Rawls resists merely prescriptive stability, however. He does not want to stabilize a society based only on what ought to make it stable. Instead, stability has content apart from its basis in moral reasons. A community can be unstable even if its institutions rest on reasonable grounds. Stability has an ethical ideal and a descriptive ideal of real stability. Public justification then can have both moral and descriptive parts. Publicly justified rules are both real and justified. Gaus has criticized Rawls (1996, 130–6) for his populist conception of stability. He has developed an alternative (2011, 389–408). So, many public justification theorists feel the pull of descriptive and moral stability. But some, like Quong (2011), adopt a purely normative notion.

Following Weithman (2011), philosophers now explore stabilization mechanisms. Weithman argues that public reasons create stability for the right reasons and that this was Rawls’s view.

Vallier and John Thrasher (2015) think public reasons are poor assurance signals. They raise problems associated with cheap talk and misinformation. These factors may be present even in well-ordered societies. Kogelmann and Steven H. W. Stich (2016) embrace convergence discourse for stability. Convergence allows people to use diverse reasons as costly signals of cooperative inclinations. It takes a great deal of effort to speak the political languages of various groups. The use of diverse discourse can thus create stability. This literature continues to bear fruit.

6. Objections

This entry as a whole explains the ideal of public justification, so it does not explore objections to public justification in detail. Instead, it offers a comprehensive list of criticisms. Some items in the list draw on a shorter list constructed by Jonathan Quong (2011, 259–60). In general, the objections aim at particular conceptions of public justification, but unless specified, assume that critics direct their complaints against all versions of public justification discussed.

6.1 The Incompleteness Objection

Many critics of public justification claim it cannot address critical political issues. This problem arises from restrictions on permissible reasoning in public life. (De Marneffe 1994, Reidy 2000; Schwartzman 2004). Critics here object to consensus views, which restrict the set of justifying reasons. Citizens may not have shared reasons and instead appeal to personal considerations, so the convergence view makes this objection less pressing.

6.2 The Indeterminacy Objection

Critics have argued that public reason liberals embrace excessively indeterminate conceptions of justice. The ideal of public justification cannot make determinate recommendations. Gaus (2011) presses this objection against Rawlsian conceptions of public justification, resolving indeterminacy by appealing to actual evolutionary mechanisms (see 2.7.4). This “normalization” objection rejects attempts to avoid indeterminacy by adopting homogenizing assumptions. (D’Agostino 2003)

6.3 The Antidemocratic Objection

Deliberative democrats have complained that Rawls identifies justice apart from real deliberation. Habermas famously (1995, 127–8) lodged this criticism against Rawls. This objection targets Rawlsian universalizing public justification.

6.4 The Integrity Objection

Some say public justification imposes excessive burdens on people of faith. By barring unshared reasons, it excludes religious reasons from public discourse. Critics say people of faith have no reason to accept those constraints. (Eberle 2002, Wolterstorff 1997, Vallier 2014). The constraints, if followed, would divide the identity of religious people, and the person of faith’s identity may disintegrate.

The integrity objection relates to a fairness objection. This objection claims that public justification prioritizes secular over religious reasons, arbitrarily preferring secular citizens. (Perry 1993, Wolterstorff 1997). Note that convergence undermines these objections as it allows appeals to religious reasons. (Eberle 2012). The integrity objection also relates to the Denial of Truth objection (Neal 2009). Neal thinks citizens who abide by public justification cannot appeal to the truth as they see it. Andrew March (2013) provides a taxonomy of religion-based criticisms of public reason. He argues that some restrictions can burden us too much. But other conditions are justified.

6.4.1 The Antidiscourse Objection

Public justification might also support unrealistic views of democratic politics because real politics uses personal reasons to build coalitions and forge compromises (Shapiro 1999). This objection focuses on the burdensomeness of public reason, but it also concerns whether public reason is realistic. Note that the antidiscourse objection threatens discursive views of public justification.

6.4.2 The Marginalization Objection

Some critics argue that public justification privileges logical, calm, dispassionate forms of discourse. There may be minority groups that do not find such speech rules satisfactory. (It is a matter of controversy who these minority groups are.) The objection mirrors the integrity objection, but they apply to different social groups. (Sanders 1997, Young 2000). These critics oppose Rawlsian interpretations of the PJP.

6.5 The Unreasonableness Objection

Public reason liberals often say many citizens are unreasonable, but this claim meets powerful resistance due to its ambiguity. Others object because uses of the reasonable privilege some over others, so the standard is inegalitarian. (Bohman 2003, Friedman 2000). This objection focuses on Rawlsian interpretations of PJP.

6.6 The Asymmetry Objection

Public reason liberals argue that reasonable people will disagree about the human good. But they also claim that reasonable people will agree on conceptions of justice. Some critics say these claims are problematic because they are asymmetric. The same factors that drive reasonable pluralism about the good apply to justice, hence the asymmetry. (For discussion and rebuttal, see Quong 2011, 192–220.) This objection applies to a wide range of interpretations of the PJP. But convergence theorists often accept justice pluralism. (Gaus 2011, 276–9; Gaus and Van Schoelandt 2017, Vallier 2019, Gjesdal 2022).

6.7 The Self-Refutation Objection

The PJP holds that all coercive actions or laws require justification for each member of the public. But critics ask whether this treatment applies to the PJP itself. If so, then given that reasonable people disagree about the PJP, the PJP is self-refuting. But suppose the PJP needs no public justification; if so, its defenders make an arbitrary exception for their moral principle. (Wall 2002; Christiano 2010, 206–213; Estlund 2008; Wall 2013; Enoch 2013, 170–173).

Some respond by arguing that their version of the PJP can satisfy itself (Estlund 2008). Other public reason liberals exclude the PJP from public justification, but they then argue that the exclusion is not arbitrary. (Gaus 2011; Vallier 2016a; Bajaj 2017. This objection applies to any interpretation of the PJP. For a more recent discussion, see Billingham 2017b.)

6.8 The Perfectionism Objection

Liberal perfectionists claim that the state should promote the authentic human good. They reject public justification for preventing governments from promoting that good. And they reject the ideas of “neutrality” and “restraint” that justify the PJP. (Wall 1998, Chan 2000.) For some prominent replies, see Quong 2011. Perfectionists reject the PJP itself, not merely some interpretations of it.

6.9 The Empty Set Objection

The most powerful objection to the PJP is that it allows too many reasons to defeat proposed laws. The objection applies to various interpretations of the PJP. But critics direct it most often at the convergence views. (Eberle 2012; Enoch 2015, though see Schultz-Bergin 2021) By allowing diverse defeaters into public justification, few proposals reach public justification. Few states can engage in their most basic functions. Some public reason liberals admit that public justification is often beyond us. (Rawls 2005, D’Agostino 2006). We may need some degree of social development to establish a publicly justified polity. (Rawls 2005).

Gaus offers the most prominent response. The benefits of shared norms can populate an otherwise empty set of proposals. The idea here is that we all rank some rules ahead of no rule governing some issue. While we regard some rules as sub-optimal, they improve our relations with others. This reply is a sociological response: people prefer sub-optimal ethical rules to no rules because empty sets are debilitating. Both Rawls and Gaus provide such arguments. (Rawls 2002, 124–128, Gaus 2011, 303–333, 389–408, 424–447).

In short, each person may have a defeater for another’s preferred moral rule. But most members of the public prefer some ethical governance to none, and in that case, they may deem some moral rules acceptable but not optimal.

6.10 The Insincerity Objection

This objection threatens convergence views. Quong thinks permitting personal reasons allows citizens to be insincere with one another. Convergence citizens can offer others reasons they do not believe are good reasons. (Quong 2011). This objection does not address the distinction between shared reasons and standards. We are not insincere if we offer others reasons that follow our modes of inquiry but end up in a different place. If we share a scientific method, yet end up with different theories, we may have varied reasons. But sharing diverse reasons is not insincere when our shared background is common knowledge.

Quong’s consensus constraints also appear to bar reasoning by conjecture. (Rawls 2002, Schwartzman 2012). Conjectural reasoning allows persons to appeal to the reasons of other comprehensive doctrines. But both parties are aware of the nature of such appeals. That said, sincerity requirements may still have an essential role in public reason. (Schwartzman 2011)

6.11 Theoretical Indeterminacy

Fred D’Agostino (1996) argues that the PJP admits many variants. (We characterize the variants through values in the PJP.) We have reasons to favor a range of interpretations of the PJP. For example, public justification appeals to idealization. But we have grounds to idealize radically, moderately, or not at all. (Macedo 1990 makes these points.) Unfortunately, the case for idealizing, but not idealizing too much, is complicated and involves conflicting desiderata. True, conflicting desiderata are common in any theoretical domain. Still, D’Agostino worries that conceptions of public justification arise from incompatible motivations, and theorists lack conceptual resources to weigh these considerations against one another. In his final book, Gaus (2021) argues that even his earlier evolutionary model of public reason (Gaus 2011) would not lead to convergence on rules in many cases; but with diverse agents in a free and interactive model of rule choice can converge on rules more often.

6.12 Concerns about Idealization

Public reason liberals, again, feel intense pressure to idealize. But some critics think idealization is always arbitrary.

Eberle (2002) claims idealizations reflect the biases and values of theorists, which is why largely secular public reason liberals suppress religious reasons. So, any version of the PJP that appeals to idealization is subject to this objection.

David Enoch (2013) rejects Gaus’s moderate idealization. Contra Gaus, such idealization does not show that social-moral rules reduce authoritarianism. Nicholas Wolterstorff (2007) argues that coercing someone based on an idealization is patronizing. Even disrespectful. For recent papers on idealization, see Besch 2019, Donahue 2021, Vallier 2020b.

In light of these objections, Fabian Wendt (2019) has tried to separate public justification from public reason liberals. He hopes to capture what is attractive about public justification while separating it from problems with public reason in liberal political thought.

6.13 New Objections to Convergence

In recent years, consensus theorists have pushed back against convergence views in detail. While these arguments are all unique, they are worth noting as a general phenomenon. See Badano and Bonotti 2020, Boettcher 2020, Tahzib 2021, Neufeld 2022. But the debate rages on from convergence theorists; see Motchoulski 2020.

7. Applied Issues

Theorists often use public justification to address important applied questions. Applied questions concern religion in liberal democracies, religious exemptions, feminism, marriage policy, environmental issues, healthy eating policies, and even public reason and Confucianism. Applied issues are the order of the day in much of the literature.

On the religion in politics literature, see the entry on religion and political theory. Also, see literature reviews in March 2013, Vallier 2014, and Bailey and Gentile 2014. While many public reason liberals have moved away from a restraint-based approach to religion in public life (Gaus and Vallier 2009, Laborde 2017, newer work defends such principles (Watson and Hartley 2018). Some even focus public reason on discourse, setting public justification aside (Leland 2019). Still other theorists have focused on developing principles of restraint appropriate for managing partisanship and the conduct of political parties (Bonotti 2017).

We have seen the rapid expansion of the literature on public reason and religious exemptions, brought into clear focus in Cecile Laborde’s (2017) work. (Also see Bespalov 2019.) Some of the exemption literature extends into medical exemptions. See McConnell and Card 2019.

Public reason and feminism discussions are now voluminous. (Okin 1994, Rawls 2002, Nussbaum 2003, Baehr 2008, Hartley and Watson 2009, Hartley and Watson 2010, Neufeld and Van Schoelandt 2014, and Watson and Hartley 2018).

To explore public justification and marriage policy, see Brake 2010, Macedo 2015, Chambers 2017, and Toop 2019.

Public reason methods have also been applied to environmental issues (Shahar forthcoming; Nielsen and Hauge-Helgestad 2021), as well as healthy eating policy (Bonotti and Barnhill 2019).

We are also seeing the beginnings of a discussion about the intersection of public reason and the Confucian religion (Kim 2019; D’Ambrosio 2019).

We have also seen the introduction of new formal methods into public reason, such as social choice theory (Kogelmann 2017, 2019; Chung 2020), agent-based modeling (Muldoon 2019, Gaus 2021), and fixed-point theorems (Schaefer 2022).


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Versions of this entry published from 1996 to mid-2012 were written and maintained by Fred D’Agostino. Kevin Vallier took responsibility for updating and maintaining the entry beginning with the version published in mid-2012. As of March 2018, no substantive content remains from D’Agostino and it is now solely the work of Kevin Vallier.

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