Richard Kilvington

First published Tue Aug 7, 2001; substantive revision Tue Sep 6, 2022

Richard Kilvington (ca. 1302–1361), Master of Arts and Doctor of Theology at Oxford, member of the household of Richard de Bury, then Archdeacon of London, and finally Dean of Saint Paul’s Cathedral in London. Along with Thomas Bradwardine, he represented the first academic generation of the school of Oxford Calculators. Although he brought new ideas and methods into logic, natural philosophy, and theology, and influenced his contemporaries and followers, he has been little studied until recently.

1. Life and Works

Richard Kilvington (we know almost seventy different spellings of his name) was born at the beginning of the fourteenth century in the village of Kilvington, Yorkshire. He was the son of a priest from the diocese of York. He studied at Oxford, where he became Master of Arts (1324/25) then Doctor of Theology (ca. 1335) (for biographical details, see Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990b, Jung-Palczewska 2000b). His academic career was followed by a diplomatic and an ecclesiastical one, working in the service of Edward III and taking part in diplomatic missions. His career culminated in his appointment as Dean of St. Paul’s Cathedral in London. Along with Richard Fitzralph, Kilvington was involved in the battle against the mendicant friars, an argument that continued almost until his death in 1361.

Other than a few sermons, all of Kilvington’s known works stem from his lectures at Oxford. None is written in the usual commentary fashion, following the order of books in the respective works of Aristotle. In accordance with the fourteenth-century Oxford practice, the number of topics discussed was reduced to certain central issues, which were fully developed with no more than ten questions in each set. The reduction in the range of topics is counterbalanced by deeper analysis in the questions chosen for treatment. Some of Kilvington’s questions cover fifteen folios, which in a modern edition yield about 120 pages. His philosophical works, the Sophismata and Quaestiones super libros De generatione et corruptione, composed before 1325, came from his lectures as a Bachelor of Arts; the Quaestiones super libros Physicorum (1325/26) and Quaestiones super libros Ethicorum (1326/32) date from his time as an Arts Master; after he advanced to the Faculty of Theology, he penned eight questions on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, composed before 1334.

The manuscript tradition of Kilvington’s works is complex. The question on the Ethics and on the Sentences are often edited in different ways, with many omissions and corrections by scribes (Michałowska 2011b). The most complicated, however, is the tradition of his questions on Aristotles’ libri naturales, that is, on the On generation and corruption and the Physics. It testifies perfectly well to the dispersion of these works, which probably occurred shortly after the questions were written. The reconstruction of these commentaries was possible thanks to cross references to be found in the questions (Jung & Podkoński 2020: 16–17).

2. Method in Science

Like many other English thinkers, Kilvington was a leader in three main disciplines: terminist logic, mathematical physics, and the new, “mathematical” theology. Methods and procedures developed in the first two disciplines were used in the third. The application of the terminist logic and the refutation of the Aristotelian prohibition against metabasis resulted in Kilvington’s broad use of logic and mathematics in all branches of inquiry to gain certain knowledge. Four types of measurements were involved in his research. The predominant form of measurement by limits, i.e., by the beginning and ending of successive or permanent things (incipit/desinit), by the first and last instants of the beginning and ending of continuous processes (de primo et ultimo instanti), and by the intrinsic and extrinsic limits of capacities of passive and active potencies (de maximo et minimo), does not appear to be straightforwardly mathematical, though it raises mathematical considerations insofar as it prescribes measure for natural processes, such as changing the elements, heating, changing the speed of motion, acquiring knowledge, getting better or forming the habit to perform meritorious deeds. The second type of measurement, by latitude of forms, describes processes in which accidental forms are intensified or diminished in terms of the distribution of natural qualities such as heat or whiteness or moral qualities such as love, grace, sin, will, or desire. In his measurement of the intension and remission of forms, Kilvington is interested in determining how the highest degree of a quality can be introduced into a subject already possessing the same quality to a certain degree by undergoing an alteration, and consequently in establishing the possibility of a most intense or diminished degree of, e.g., heat and cold, or virtue and vice. The third type of measurement, the strictly mathematical, employs a new calculus of compounding proportions to measure speed in local motion or speed in the distribution of love. Finally, the fourth type of measurement describes a ‘rule’ permitting the comparison of infinities, treated as infinite sets containing infinite subsets, and determining which of them is equal, lesser, or greater.

Kilvington’s concept of infinity is one of his greatest achievements. He takes for granted Ockham’s definition of a continuum, according to which each continuum is a being that contains an actually infinite number of smaller and smaller proportional parts. When we are given any continuum, we are also given its halves, the halves of these halves and, consequently, Ockham claims, an infinite number of its parts. The actual infinity is not understood here as an actually infinite continuum “that is so great that there cannot be any greater one”. Thus, it is impossible for a process of infinite division to be accomplished, for if it were accomplished, it would no longer be infinite, but finite. For Ockham, an actually infinite continuum is a set of actually existing parts which could be enumerated without end. Kilvington supports Ockham’s view in all his works, starting from Sophismata up to the commentary on the Sentences. Ockham, however, never gives any mathematical proof for this statement and limits himself to exploring Duns Scotus’s geometrical arguments against indivisibility. Kilvington puts more effort into demonstrating that infinite proportional parts actually exist in a continuum (S 42[43]: 112–15; Kretzmann 1990b: 307; see also Jung & Podkoński 2009a; Podkoński 2016). In his philosophical and theological works, Kilvington provides many examples proving that infinite sets are not equal, that is, that they are not of the same density. He also explains how to establish a one-to-one correspondence of the elements of such infinite sets. Kilvington affirms that all created infinities, being infinite, are equal ‘in multitude.’ This, however, does not imply that infinities are necessarily equal ‘in magnitude’, since two created infinities can be at once equal and unequal with respect to multitude of their parts or their dimensions. Infinities can also be ‘qualitatively’ unequal because there is a qualitative difference between God’s infinity and every created being’s infinity. God as the most perfect is the only being absolutely infinite, whereas creatures as contingent beings can only be relatively infinite. As Podkoński affirms “Kilvington must have been convinced that an infinite set can be put in one-to-one correspondence with infinite subsets. And it is worth noting that this paradoxical feature of infinite sets nowadays serves as a criterion of determining them” (see Podkoński 2009: 142).

Kilvington employs all types of measurement to describe different cases both real and imaginable. Having adopted Ockham’s ontological minimalism, he claims that absolutes, i.e., substances and qualities, are the only subjects that undergo changes. Therefore, such notions as ‘motion,’ ‘time,’ ‘latitude,’, and ‘degree’ do not have any representation in reality and only serve as tools for the faultless description of the processes of various changes. Thus, Kilvington contrasts things that are really distinct with things distinguishable only in reason, i.e., in the imagination. Imaginary cases are descriptions of hypothetical situations; to be imaginable means to be possible, i.e., not such as to generate a contradiction. Everything imaginable must be logically possible within a natural framework. So we can imagine the void and formulate the rules of motion in it, because there is no contradiction either on the part of nature or on the part of God for the void to exist. Any theory, whether it describes an imaginary case or an observed phenomenon, must be coherent. Therefore, logic and mathematics are the best methods to describe any reality: factual or imaginable.

There are four levels in Kilvington’s secundum imaginationem analyses. These levels may be classified according to their increasing abstraction and decreasing probability. On the first level, there are imaginary cases which are potentially observable and which might occur in nature, such as Socrates’ becoming white. On the second level are imaginary cases which cannot be observed, even though they belong to the natural order. These cases illustrate the necessary consequences of the application of rules properly describing natural phenomena—the best example being the Earth’s rectilinear motion, which is caused by its desire to unite the center of gravity with its own center. On the third level are cases not observable but theoretically possible, such as reaching infinite speed in an instant. The fourth level concerns cases that are only theoretically possible. Kilvington uses the last two groups of imaginable, i.e., hypothetical cases to reveal inconsistencies in received theories, especially from Aristotle, demonstrating mathematically the paradoxes that arise from Aristotle’s laws of motion. If hypothetical cases do not involve contradiction, there is no reason to reject them or exclude them from the realm of speculation (see Jung 2016).

Kilvington’s secundum imaginationem analyses go together with his ceteris paribus method: he assumes that all circumstances in the case being considered are the same, and that only one or two chosen factors, which change during the process, cause changes in the results.

3. Logic

Kilvington’s Sophismata, written before 1325, is his only logical work. A sophisma or sophism is neither a standard paradox of disputation nor a sophistical argument but a statement the truth of which is in question. The first sophism Kilvington discusses typifies the basic structure: a statement of the sophism sentence followed by a case or hypothesis, arguments for and against the sophism sentence, the resolution of the sophism sentence and reply to the arguments on the opposing side, ending with an introduction to the next sophism sentence.

Kilvington’s sophisms are meant to be of logical interest, but they also pose important questions in physics or natural philosophy. In constructing his sophisms, Kilvington sometimes makes use of observable physical motion and at other times appeals to imaginable cases that have no reference to outside reality. Although the latter cases are impossible physically, they are theoretically possible, i.e., they do not involve a formal contradiction. At one point he writes, “thus even though the hypothesis supposed there is impossible in fact … it is nevertheless possible per se; and for purposes of the sophisma, that is enough [unde licet casus idem positus sit impossibilis de facto … tamen per se possibilis est; et hoc sufficit pro sophismate]” (S 29: 69; tr. Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990b: 68).

The first eleven sophisms deal with the process of whitening, in which the motion of alteration is conceived as a successive entity extrinsically limited at its beginning and end. There is no first instant of alteration, claims Kilvington, but only a last instant before the alteration begins; likewise, there is no last instant of alteration, but only the first instant at which the final degree has been introduced. There is no minimum degree of whiteness or speed gained in motion, but rather smaller and smaller degrees ad infinitum down to zero, since the qualities change continuously. Integers are potentially infinite because one can always find a higher integer, but not actually infinite since there is no single infinite number. In Kilvington’s view, since any continuity—e.g., time, space, motion, heat, whiteness—is infinitely divisible, it can be spoken of quantitatively and measured in terms of infinite sets of integers. The subjects of sophisms 29–44 reveal Kilvington’s special interest in local motion with respect to causes, i.e., active and passive potencies, and effects, i.e., time, distance traversed, and speed in motion. He considers both uniform and difform motion caused by voluntary agents and points out the questionable measure of instantaneous speed through the comparison of speed in uniform and accelerated motion (see Kretzmann 1982).

The last four sophisms are ostensibly connected with epistemology and the logic of knowledge, i.e., sentences on knowing and doubting involving intentional contexts, such as S45: “You know this to be everything that is this”. The most interesting among them is S47, “You know that the king is seated”, where Kilvington calls some rules of obligational disputation into question (see Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990: 330—47; d’Ors 1991). In the opinion of Stump, “what Kilvington has done in his work on S47, by his change in the rule for irrelevant propositions, is to shift the whole purpose of obligations” (Stump 1982: 332).

4. Natural Philosophy

Although Kilvington does not enjoy the reputation in natural philosophy that he does in logic, recent research reveals that his questions on Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione and Physics inspired Thomas Bradwardine’s theory of motion and his famous rule of the proportions of velocities in motion (see Jung 2022a). Both works stemmed from lectures Kilvington delivered in the Arts Faculty before 1328, i.e., before Bradwardine’s famous treatise On the Proportions of Velocities in Motions.

Like most medieval natural philosophers, Kilvington accepts Aristotle’s general rules for change to occur, stating that: 1) there cannot be a change without an active capacity (virtus motiva) and a passive capacity (virtus resistiva), because without resistance, motion would not be temporal; 2) the proportion of an active capacity to a passive one must be the proportion of maioris inequalitatis, that is, it must be greater than one. These conditions are sufficient for the occurrence of natural local motion. Kilvington is primarily interested in the description of the natural motions of a mixed and simple body both in a medium and in a vacuum. In his discussion of various motions, such as the motion of the Earth or the motion of weights, he often relies on the laws of statics presented in the works of Jordanus de Nemore, Archimedes, and Euclid (DM: 221, 223, 239–40).

Aristotle’s most famous law of motion, “Everything that moves is moved by something,” is only quoted a few times when Kilvington discusses the processes of transformation of the elements. In such cases, it is imperative that, for example, hot fire come into contact with iron and act directly on it, turning its cold into heat.

Taking substance and quality as the only two absolute things (res absolutae), Kilvington concludes that the reality of motion is limited to what is in motion: the places, qualities, and quantities that are successively acquired. Consequently, he is more interested in measuring local motion in terms of the actions of the causes of motion, the distance traversed, and the time elapsed, than in the intensity of speed. In his questions on physics, Kilvington describes the differences between various types of change, such as generation, alteration, and augmentation; determines the measurements of active and passive capacities that cause change; finds rules for the division of various types of continua; and formulates a mathematically consistent rule of local motion. He examines the problem of motion from two points of view: with regard to its causes and with regard to its effects (see Jung-Palczewska 2002b).

Kilvington’s discussion of the measure of motion with respect to causes, or what we would call his ‘dynamic’ analysis, has both a physical aspect involving relations between acting and resistive potencies, and a mathematical aspect involving concepts of continuity and limits. He is interested in how a capacity is to be bounded if it is active or passive potency. Is it subject to weakening or strengthening? Is it mutable or immutable? How do we determine the boundaries of an active potency if a body moves in a medium that is not uniformly resistant?

The mathematical character of Kilvington’s theory can be seen in his use of two kinds of limit for continuous sequences: an intrinsic boundary (when an element is a member of the sequence of the elements it bounds: maximum quod sic, minimum quod sic) and an extrinsic boundary (when an element which serves as a boundary stands outside the range of elements which it bounds: maximum quod non, minimum quod non). Although he did not formulate strict rules about the different types of division of continua, his study cases reveal that he approved the following conditions for the existence of limits:

  1. There must be a range in which the capacity can act or be acted on, and another range in which it cannot act or be acted on.
  2. The capacity should be capable of taking on a continuous range of values between zero and the value which serves as its boundary, and no other values.

According to Aristotle (Physics VIII), motion occurs only if the ratio of acting capacity (a force F) to passive capacity (a resistance R) is a ratio of major inequality, i.e., when it is greater than 1. Kilvington maintains that any small excess of force over resistance suffices for motion to commence and continue; thus, whenever force is greater than resistance, motion occurs (DM: 215–25, 252–58). This assumes that force (an active capacity) is bounded by a minimum upon which it cannot act (minimum quod non), i.e., by the resistance that is equal to it (DM: 225–29, 258–59). For a passive capacity, Kilvington accepts the minimum quod sic limit “with respect to circumstances”. He accepts Aristotle’s claim that to establish a limit for Socrates’ passive capacity of vision, we should point to the smallest thing he can see. However, it also happens that we cannot see such a great thing as a cathedral if we are too close to it. Therefore, a passive capacity cannot be described by a minimum quod sic limit in each case (DM: 229–33, 259–62).

It is clear that Kilvington’s belief that mathematics is the legitimate method of describing natural phenomena also allowed him to formulate a new rule of local motion. Kilvington agrees that the proper way of measuring the speed of motion is to describe variations of proportion of forces to resistances. He was aware that Aristotle’s and Averroes’s rules of motion, given in Physics VII, were not universally applicable, and was convinced that the correct calculus of proportions was formulated by Euclid in his Elements. As a consequence, he noticed that the proper understanding of Euclid’s definition of operations on proportions necessitates a new interpretation of Aristotle’s and Averroes’s theory of motion. On the one hand, Euclid’s and Archimedes’s theory of operations on proportions concludes that doubling a ratio corresponds to squaring the fraction which we form from the ratio. On the other hand, Aristotle’s and Averroes’s statements clearly indicate that speed is proportional to the proportion of an active power to resistance, which is not squared but simply multiplied by two. Having noticed the inconsistency between these two views, Kilvington first presented two main arguments against the Aristotelian proposition and finally concluded that, when talking about a power moving one half of a mobile (that is, something moveable), Aristotle means precisely a double ratio between F and R; when talking about a power moving a mobile twice as heavy, he means taking the square root of the ratio of F : R. The new mathematical rule describing the speed of motion is in accord with those of Aristotle only in one case: if the ratio of the power of the mover to that of its mobile is 2 : 1, the same power will move half the mobile with exactly twice the speed. Kilvington’s reinterpretation of Aristotle’s and Averroes’s rules of motion reveals that the speed cannot be described by multiplication alone. Kilvington’s calculus provides values of the ratio of F to R greater than 1 : 1 for any speed down to zero, since any root of a ratio greater than 1 : 1 is always a ratio greater than 1 : 1. And, with his additional assumption that any excess, however small, of an active power over resistance is sufficient to initiate and continue motion, he may have described a very slow motion with a speed greater than 0 and less than 1 (0 > v < 1). Hence, he avoids a serious weakness of Aristotle’s theory, which cannot explain the mathematical relation of F and R in very slow motions, at speeds less than 1 (Jung 2022a: 76–77).

Kilvington applies his new rule of motion to describe the uniformly difform motion of mixed bodies and the motion of simple bodies both in a medium and in a vacuum. Explaining Kilvington’s theory, we must keep in mind that temporal motion is possible only if there is some resistance playing the role of a virtus impeditiva. The motion of a mixed body in a medium is easiest to explain, since then the acting power has to overcome the external resistance of the medium as well as the internal resistance of that element which is moved away from its natural place. The local motion of a simple body in a medium is not problematic either, since it can be explained by its natural desire to attain the natural place determined by its heaviness or lightness. Nor does Kilvington have a problem with explaining the natural motion of a mixed body in a vacuum. He once again adopts Ockham’s view that if there were a void, it would be a place. Since place in the Aristotelian sense is something natural that has essential qualities, it determines the natural motion of elementary bodies and, moreover, their inclination to remain at rest in their natural places. Accordingly, says Kilvington, one could imagine a void in four natural spheres, which despite being empty preserve the proper qualities characteristic of the natural places of earth, water, air, and fire. Hence, the temporal motion of a mixed body in a void is the result of the natural inclination of heavy or light elements to attain their natural places. The heaviness and lightness play the roles of force and resistance, respectively. Although there would be no external resistance in a vacuum, the motion of a mixed body could occur without any difficulty (see Jung-Palczewska 1997).

The temporal motion of a simple body in a vacuum is the most difficult to explain. In the opinion of Averroes, a simple body such as a piece of earth has an elementary form, prime matter, and different quantitative parts. Because form cannot resist matter, no resistance can come from its qualitative parts. But there can be resistance coming from its quantitative parts resisting one another. This time Kilvington uses Grosseteste’s idea, recognizing that the temporal motion of a simple body in a vacuum is possible due to the internal resistance that arises when the peripheral parts of a body that move along oblique lines resist its central parts moving along straight lines. Such an internal resistance produces motion, and does not impede; nevertheless, it guarantees temporal motion. Consequently, if a vacuum existed, the natural motion of a simple body would be possible. Moreover, the speed of such a motion would be the fastest, since there is no external resistance to be overcome (Jung-Palczewska 2002a: 169).

In Kilvington’s opinion, lower and greater resistance, i.e. the rarity or density of the medium, is responsible for faster or slower motion, and the distance of the medium traversed in motion is responsible for the longer or shorter time consumed in motion.

According to Kilvington, in order to characterize changes in the speed of motion, one must analyze the problem of local motion in its kinematic aspect, which takes into account distance traversed and time consumed. He correctly recognizes that to measure the speed of motion that lasts some time, it is enough to establish relations between time and distance traversed. In his opinion, the same distances traversed in equal intervals of time characterize uniform motion. Uniformly difform motions are characterized respectively: accelerated motion by the same distance traversed in a shorter interval of time; decelerated motion by the same distance traversed in a longer time; or, according to modern definitions: the motion is uniformly difforme if the speed changes by equal amounts in equal intervals. Kilvington provides a proper description of free fall, noting that speed increases by the same amount in each time interval, and that speed is equally slower at the beginning of each interval than at the end of it. Difformly difform motion is characterized by unequal distances traversed in unequal intervals of time; the speed of such motion changes unequally (see Jung-Palczewska 2002b).

Although Kilvington never abandoned Aristotle’s physics, he often goes beyond his theories to resolve paradoxes resulting from his laws, giving the impression that, behind the facade of Aristotle’s principles and concepts, Kilvington is an Ockhamist. Despite the fact that Kilvington never explicitly mentions Ockham, there is no doubt that he not only knew the Venerable Inceptor’s opinions, but also accepted them as a natural way to interpret the works of the Philosopher.

5. Ethics

The third Aristotelian work on which Richard Kilvington commented during his regency in the Arts Faculty was the Nicomachean Ethics. His commentary on the second and tenth books of the Ethics takes a form of ten questions, which deal only with selected issues that were the subjects of Kilvington’s lectures at Oxford: e.g., creating and destroying moral virtue, free acts of volition, the behavior of honest people and the delight taken in their actions (or conversely, the punishment of those who act evilly), and questions concerning particular virtues such as courage, generosity, magnanimity, justice, and prudence. As Michałowska has shown, Kilvington uses terminist logic and mathematical physics to solve ethical problems (see Michałowska 2011a, 2016). Michałowska also shows that, just as he did in his questions on the Physics, Kilvington follows Ockham’s minimalist ontology by treating ethical qualities—i.e., vices and virtues, cognition and wisdom, good and evil—as volition-like objects, calling them res. Being real things and not merely mental concepts, they can be measured by addition, subtraction, and division into parts, for they undergo change via increase or decrease and so have varying degrees of intensity. Such changes—e.g., undergoing punishment for an evil act—cannot be instantaneous and must happen in time. Each change is the result of an acting power overcoming resistance. In the case of moral acts, the changes do not produce any external effects but internal modifications in terms of the intensity of virtues and vices. When a vice acts upon a virtue, it causes its continuous change, and so someone’s courage can vary in intensity. Virtues and vices are opposed in Kilvington’s physical theory, so it is impossible for someone to be vicious and virtuous at the same time, although it is possible for them to be generous at one time, miserly at another.

The increase or decrease of a moral quality is either an effect of the impact of the opposite quality (or a change in the degree of intensity of the same quality), or else the result of human external acts. For example, frequent generous actions lead to an increase of generosity. Performing morally good actions intensifies the virtues, whereas the constant practice of evil diminishes them. Virtues and vices can be described in terms of different degrees of intensity, so one can say that a man can be more or less generous during his lifetime. And just like physical qualities, Kilvington states that the intensity of a moral quality has only an extrinsic limit, so that one cannot perfect one’s virtue infinitely.

Virtues and vices have an absolute or relative character, and can be possessed absolutely (simpliciter) or in a certain respect (secundum quid). There are highest—i.e., most perfect—degrees of intensity of our moral virtues, but there are no absolutely greatest degrees, like Platonic ideas. In Kilvington’s opinion, people are never absolutely generous or virtuous. The ultimate perfection, i.e., the highest degree of moral virtue, is the product of a person’s natural dispositions, socializations, and moral acts. But since people relevantly differ, each of us is virtuous in our own way. So too, the highest degree of moral virtue is unique in each of us. In Kilvington’s opinion, if someone is prudent in the highest degree, they must have all the other virtues in the highest degree as well (Michałowska 2011a: 488–92).

For Kilvington, prudence is one of the primary virtues. It is a habit, which cooperates with right reason (recta ratio) in the process of making good or bad decisions. Even though Ockham is not mentioned by name, his theory of the relation between prudence and moral knowledge is present in Kilvington’s discussion. Ockham distinguishes two types of moral knowledge. The first, which concerns universal truths, is gained through learning; the second, which concerns particular statements and particular situations, is gained through experience. Prudence is understood in two ways: as knowledge about singular propositions and as universal practical knowledge. In his opinion, both types of prudence are gained only through experience, the former concerning singular statements and the latter universal practical statements. The former is properly called prudence, whereas the latter is commonly known as prudence. In Ockham’s view, the first kind of knowledge—i.e., of universal truths—must be distinguished from prudence concerning singular statements. The second type of knowledge, however, is the same as prudence, since it is also gained through experience (Quaestiones q.6, a.10). Kilvington identifies two kinds of moral knowledge. The first is called scientia necessaria, which is composed of general statements and refers to universal truth. The other is called scientia ad utrumlibet, which comprises particular statements. The scientia necessaria, achieved by means of deduction, is not sufficient to make good moral decisions and so it must be complemented by a reference to scientia ad utrumlibet, achieved by experience (see Michałowska 2016: 13). Gaining knowledge through experience is an indispensable part becoming prudent. Kilvington states that someone can err with regard to a moral choice even though they possess certain and complete knowledge about universal moral truths; a skilled logician is not necessarily a moral person. To make good moral decisions, one needs a fully-developed prudence, which is the same as scientia ad utrumlibet. Kilvington claims that someone who possesses moral knowledge is not automatically prudent, but a prudent person is always wise (see Michałowska & Jung 2010: 109–111).

Good choices are possible only when the will is supported by prudence. The problem of free will and free choice is fully elaborated in Kilvington’s Ethics, where he presents his theory—what Michałowska calls a “dynamic voluntarism”. Kilvington distinguishes three types of human volitional acts: willing, nilling, and not-willing. Willing always wills, and can never be passive or in potency. Even when the will wants nothing (velle nihil), it is willing, and so it cannot rest and is always determined to an act of willing. Here Kilvington seems to be directly influenced by Scotus, who claims that the will cannot be suspended (Ord. I d.1). The will is absolutely free in its acts of willing, and the free will of volition is the primary principle in the genus of contingent propositions. Since the will is active all the time, it must decide between its three acts of volition (velle volitionem), nolition (velle nolitionem), or not-willing (non-velle). With regard to its own internal acts, the will is absolutely free. With regard to its external acts, however, it chooses between wanting something (velle aliquid) and not wanting something (nolle aliquid). In these cases, the will is also absolutely free to make such a choice.

For Kilvington it is obvious that prudence plays an essential role in producing good moral acts. When the habit of prudence is not fully developed, the will is indecisive. Repeated good moral decisions makes it hesitate (non-velle) less, so that the agent is able to reach a decision in any context, whether affirmatively velle or negatively nolle. Supported by fully developed prudence, the will makes proper and good moral choices more easily or even effortlessly (see Michałowska 2016: 14). Kilvington, however, is of the opinion that most of us rarely make good moral decisions because we often remain in doubt, stuck in the state of non-velle.

6. Theology

In theology, Kilvington applied the new methods of terminist logic and mathematics to the most popular issues discussed in the fourteenth-century, such as human and divine love, human and divine will, God’s absolute and ordained power and human free decision, divine knowledge of future contingents and predestination. Nothing is considered separately from the Creator; therefore, Kilvington relates each human action to God. Kilvington’s questions on the Sentences testify to his involvement in the lively, contemporary discussions with semi-Pelagians. Thomas Bradwardine argued with John Duns Scotus, William Ockham, Adam Wodeham, Robert Holcot, and Thomas Buckingham, all of whom he regarded as Pelagians. In his commentary on the Sentences, on which he lectured in 1332–1333, Ockham was the theologian he most fiercely attacked. Kilvington most likely lectured on the Sentences in the same year. It also seems obvious that each took part in other's lectures as socii. In his question Utrum actus volunatis per se malus sit per aliquid, Kilvington debates and criticizes Bradwardine’s views (see Jung & Michałowska 2022: 6).

Kilvington repeatedly cites the opinions of Augustine and Anselm, which he usually accepts completely, only sometimes reinterpreting them according to his theory. For Kilvington, however, the greatest authority is John Duns Scotus, whose views he fully accepts and successfully develops. First of all, Kilvington adopts Scotus’s distinction (Ord. I, d. 44, q. u.) between the absolute and ordained power of God:

I say along with Scotus, in Sentences I, distinction 44, that God’s power is called ordained insofar as it is the principle of doing something in conformity with right law with regard to the established order. God’s power is called absolute insofar as it exceeds God’s ordained power, because by virtue of it God can act against the established order. Generally, I say that by virtue of absolute power God can do everything that is not contradictory. Thence jurists use the terms de facto and de iure in a similar manner, for example, a king can do de facto that which is not in accordance with law and does not agree with it. God’s power is called ordained insofar as it is a principle for doing something in conformity with a right law with regard to the established order (DV: 168).

The established order of nature is the result of God’s ordained power, but God can also act against this order by his absolute power. In Kilvington’s opinion, both of God’s powers are intensively infinite simpliciter, but even so, God’s absolute power is infinitely greater than, i.e., infinitely more powerful than, his ordained power.

Like Scotus, Kilvington is convinced that potentia dei absoluta is a power that really is or can be actualized by God. Miracles would be examples of God acting against the natural order. Individual situations also show that God can deviate from laws established in the natural order, reflecting God’s particular judgment.

Kilvington’s theory of potentia dei absoluta and ordinata serves to underline the contingency of creation and the freedom of divine will. Here Kilvington abridges Scotus’s opinions (Lectura I, dist. 39) and reorders his arguments, taking into account only those most useful for his own theory. Kilvington claims that God’s knowledge, existence, and will are the same as God’s essence. However, with regard to God’s absolute knowledge, assertoric statements about the past and present and contingent statements about the future have the same certainty since they are absolutely necessary, whereas with regard to the God’s ordained knowledge, they have only ordained necessity:

[I]t can be said that God not always knows with the same certainty what came about and that which is going to come about. <It is so,> because God’s knowledge is equally certain with regard to future contingents as with regard to necessary events; however, it is possible for divine knowledge not to be certain with regard to God’s creatures, because a creature <i. e., a human> can know that (s)he is sitting with as much certainty as that a human is an animal. Still, one certainty concerns contingent and the other necessary things. Therefore, this consequence is false: ‘<God> knows with equal certainty that which happened and that which is going to happen’. Yet, it may happen that <God> does not know the things that are going to happen, and thus <God> may not know the things that happened. This conclusion, however, is true by virtue of God’s absolute power. And by virtue of God’s ordained power it does not follow that all events (past, future, and present) are equally known by God (DV: 182).

Kilvington’s affinity to Scotus may also be seen in his theory of future contingents. He is in agreement with Scotus (Lectura I, dist. 39, qq. 1–5) in saying that only an instant in time is present since only the ‘now’ exists. Therefore, Aquinas’s analogy to God sitting at the center of a circle and being present to the whole of time fails, whereas Scotus’s concept of a radius sweeping out the circumference of the circle is correct, since the entire circle does not exist all at once. He quotes Scotus verbatim:

God is “like the center and all time flowing from the past to the future <is> like the circumference, and no matter how the circumference moves, it is always equally distant from the center, and no matter whether time flows into the past or the future, it is always the present time to God” (DV: 183).

Consequently, ‘now’ moving in one way or another, moves like a point on the circumference of a circle.

Kilvington, like Scotus, also rejects the view that God knows future contingents via Ideas because Ideas necessarily represent what they represent, as in the sentence, “Socrates is white”, where it is said that Socrates is white. Although Kilvington does not explain his position clearly, it seems that he takes for granted Scotus’s explanation (DV: 178). Scotus says that perhaps Ideas could represent simple or complexes terms necessarily, although, as Chris Schabel puts it: “They could not represent contingent complexes (…), which we can call X. If God had the Idea only, eternally he would know only part of the contradiction, and there would be no contingency. If He knew both parts, X and ~X , He would know contradictories to be true simultaneously. Second, since Ideas represent both futures that are possible but will not exist, and futures that are possible and will exist, one needs to posit a way to distinguish between what will exist and what will not exist” (Schabel 2000: 42).

Kilvington is also in agreement with Scotus when saying that secondary causes cannot originate any contingency because of the necessity in a chain of causes. Therefore, a contingency observed in the action of secondary causes must be routed to the first cause, which is God. To know contingents, God first has to choose one of two contrary statements, since otherwise, i.e., when God had an act of knowledge before his act of will, he would have had only necessary ordained knowledge about the natural order, which he has already established, and he would not know contingents. Consequently, God would have only partial knowledge about one side of a contradiction (i.e., he would know only one of two contradictory statements, e.g., “Antichrist will be” or “Antichrist will not be”), and his will would not be absolutely free. Therefore, contingency must be located in God’s will and not in God’s intellect. Kilvington believes that future contingent events are such because God knows that they are future contingents and not vice versa. God’s accepting (beneplacitum) will, with respect to future contingents, is naturally prior to God’s knowledge, because the following consequence is true, “God wants A to happen; therefore, God knows it will happen,” whereas this is false, “God knows it will happen (viz., that Socrates will sin); therefore, he wants him to sin” (DV: 175).

Following Scotus, Kilvington maintains that at the same instant in which the divine will wills A, it is able not to will A, and thus he accepts Scotus’s synchronic contingency; nevertheless, he does accept Scotus’ concept of instantiae naturae. To save God’s absolute free will and at the same time to avoid the prospect of mutability in God’s decision-making, Kilvington asserts that by his absolute power God can make himself not will A, while A is what God, by his ordained power, wills in that particular instant, and this happens in eternity. Such internal acts of God do not cause any changes in his external acts, since God’s will is immutable. Consequently, by his absolute power, God can undo the past without causing any change in history, such as, for example, Abraham’s non-existence. God, whose absolute power is infinitely infinite, can cause the past not to be the past, because there is no past for God. To say that God cannot undo the past simply means that God has not revealed a given thing, such as the restoration of one’s lost virginity. It is also not contradictory for God’s absolute power to create the world from eternity, or to annihilate it. The world’s annihilation would not be less just than its continued existence, since God’s justice stems from his essence, which, like his power, is absolute and ordained. However, God cannot do so by his ordained power, since, even being infinite, his ordained power is infinitely less powerful than his absolute power.

Kilvington believes that not only God’s will but also God’s knowledge is contingent with regard to future contingents. This produces a distinction between types of prophecies, with some of them being absolutely necessary and others being conditionally necessary and in this way contingent. Everything absolutely and unconditionally revealed by God necessarily comes about with ordained necessity. Everything revealed by God’s ordained power—e.g., articles of faith—depends on God’s will and could be changed. Once revealed, however, they would have ordained necessity, and so they would form a new law. The contingency ad utrumlibet of future events is guaranteed by the conditions under which such future events come about. Although God absolutely foreknows that something will come about by absolute and ordained power, he reveals it absolutely with regard to circumstances, that is, conditionally. In conditional revelation, the change of status from being contingent to not being contingent is warranted by the conditions. When the revealed conditions are fulfilled, the future event will no longer be contingent. The same concerns future contingent deeds. Solely those foretold by God are necessary, but the others are not because they depend on people’s voluntary choices. Nothing that depends on created free will ad utrumlibet can be revealed absolutely relative to God’s ordained power (see Jung & Michałowska 2022: 62–63 )

Like the divine will, human free will is endowed with absolute and ordained power to perform good and bad deeds. Kilvington argues that God produces the substance of people’s volitional act, that is, their ability to make choices, and interacts with human free will to intensify good deeds and to produce certain degrees of these acts. He argues that if free will were solely responsible for the degree of its act, then someone could love God whether endowed with grace or not, and someone without grace could love God above everything else, which is absurd. God only contributes to the performance of good deeds, and evil deeds result from the choices of human free will alone, because “truly we are good because of God, and <we are> evil all by ourselves.”(Jung & Michałowska 2022: 46) It is obvious, however, that even if humans perform good deeds, God does not have to take them into account or reward humans for their meritorious acts. People cannot be the primary cause of their reward, but they are the primary cause of their punishment because they voluntarily make wrong choices and perform evil acts. The capacity to sin testifies to the freedom of people to make free choices (see Jung & Michałowska 2022: 51–52 )

In his discussion of predestination, Kilvington again appears to be following Duns Scotus, who maintains that predestination is simply a choice of salvation and as such has only positive connotations. Reprobation is solely a consequence of human misdeeds. God is the primary and sole cause of predestination from eternity, but he also takes into account the conduct of creatures, that is, their good or bad use of free will. Kilvington does not accept the concept of double predestination. The good use of free will, which is a concomitant act of the intellect, may be a partial cause of predestination when it comes to the decision on baptism. The bad use of free will is the primary cause of sin and punishment and the only cause of the condemnation of adults who are endowed with grace. Although God is the first cause of people being accepted without any preceding merit or redemption, God is not the first cause revoking grace without any preceding demerit. That is because justification and acceptance are the same as God’s goodness and clemency (that is, God’s substance), whereas forsaking and rejection are merely acts of God’s righteousness (that is, God’s justice). Therefore, the evil deeds of grace-filled adults are the only reason why God, by divine righteousness, abandons people (see Jung & Michałowska 2022: 56–57)

In Kilvington’s Sentences commentary, there are also many places where he appears to follow Ockham, and while Scotus is often cited by name, Ockham remains in the background. Still, knowledge of both Scotus and Ockham is crucial to understanding Kilvington’s thought, as his own contributions are often the result of blending these two strands of fourteenth-century Franciscan theology.

6. Impact and Influence

Besides the particular topics he discussed, Kilvington’s extensive use of sophisma argumentation, his mathematization of ethics and theology, and his frequent use of hypothetical (secundum imaginationem) cases, place his thought in the mainstream of fourteenth-century English philosophy and theology. His teachings on logic were influential both in England and on the Continent. Richard Billingham, Roger Rosetus, William Heytesbury, Adam Wodeham, and Richard Swineshead were among the English scholars who benefited from Kilvington’s Sophismata. His Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione was quoted by Richard Fitzralph, Adam Wodeham, and Blasius of Parma, and his Quaestiones super Physicam was familiar to the next generation of Oxford Calculators, William Heytesbury, John Dumbleton and Roger Swineshead (who also may have influenced Parisian masters such as Nicolas Oresme and John Buridan). But Thomas Bradwardine was perhaps the most famous beneficiary of Kilvington’s theory of motion. In his renowned treatise, On the Ratios of Velocities in Motions, Bradwardine included most of Kilvington’s arguments for a new function describing the relation of motive power and resistance (see Jung 2022a). Kilvington’s views on future contingents were discussed by masters at the University of Vienna in the first decade of the fifteenth century such as Nicholas of Dinkelsbühl, John Berwart of Villingen, Peter of Pulkau, and the Carmelite Arnold of Seehausen. His questions on the Ethics and the Sentences enjoyed a reputation not only in Oxford but also Paris and were frequently quoted by Adam Junior, John of Mirecourt, Johanes de Burgo, and Thomas of Krakow (see Jung-Palczewska 2000b).


Primary Literature

List of Abbreviations

  • [DM]Utrum in omni motu potentia motoris excedit potentiam rei motae
  • [DV] Utrum quilibet actus voluntatis per se malus sit per se aliquid

Manuscripts of Kilvington’s Texts

Quaestiones super libros De generatione et corruptione:

1. Utrum generatio sit transmutatio distincta ab alteratione.

2. Utrum continuum sit divisibile in infinitum.

3. Utrum augmentatio sit motus ad quantitatem.

4. Utrum omnia elementa sint adinvicem transmutabilia.

5. Utrum omnis actio sit ratione contrarietatis.

6. Utrum mixtio sit miscibilium alteratorum unio.

7. Utrum numerus elementorum sit aequalis numero qualitatum primarum.

8. Utrum omnia contraria sint activa et passiva adinvicem.

9. Utrum ex omnibus duobus elementis possit tertium generari.

  • Brugge: Stedelijke Openbare Bibliotheek, Ms. 503, fols. 20vb–50vb (questions 1–9).
  • Cambridge: Peterhouse Library, Ms. 195, fols. 60ra–81rb (questions 1–4).
  • Erfurt: Universitätsbibliothek, Dep. Erf., CA O. 74, fols. 35ra–86va (questions 1–7 and 9).
  • Kraków: Biblioteka Jagiellońska, Ms. 648, fols. 40ra–53rb (questions 1–5).
  • Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale de France, Ms. lat. 6559, fols. 61ra–132vb (questions 1–9).
  • Sevilla: Biblioteca Capitular y Colombina, Ms. 7–7–13, fols. 9ra–27ra (questions 1–9).
  • Firenze: Biblioteca Nationale Centrale, Cod. Conv. Soppr. B. VI. 1681, fols. 37ra–77vb (questions 1–8, question 7 is interrupted).

Quaestiones super libros Physicorum:

Expositio super primum librum Physicorum.

1. Utrum omne scitum sciatur per causam.

2. Utrum omne quod generetur ex contrariis generetur.

3. Utrum in omni generatione tria principia requirantur.

4. Utrum omnis natura sit principium motus et quietis.

5. Utrum potentia motoris excedit potentiam rei motae. [De Motu = DM]

6. Utrum qualitas suscipit magis et minus.

7. Utrum aliquod motus simplex possit moveri aeque velociter in vacuo et in pleno.

8. Utrum omne transmutatum in transmutationis initio sit in eo ad quod primitus transmutatur.

  • Brugge: Stedelijke Openbare Bibliotheek, Ms. 503, fols. 41va–50vb (question 3).
  • Cambridge: Peterhouse Library, Ms. 195, fols. 70rb–72ra (question 6).
  • Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Ms. Vat. lat. 2148, fols. 71ra–76vb (question 6, part of question 5).
  • Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Ms. Vat. lat. 4353, fols. 124v–143v (expositio, question 1, part of question 2).
  • Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Ms. Vat. lat. 4429, fols. 64r–70v (part of question 6).
  • Erfurt: Universitätsbibliothek, Dep. Erf., CA O. 74, fols. 70ra–86va (question 3).
  • Oxford: Bodleian Library, Ms. Canon. Misc. 226, fols. 61v–65r (question 6).
  • Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale de France, Ms. lat. 16401, fols. 149v–166v (question 6).
  • Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale de France, Ms. lat. 6559, fols. 71rb–88rb; 121ra–131ra (questions 3, 6).
  • Praha: Národní Knihovna České Republiky, Ms. III. B, 10, 140va–152vb (question 6).
  • Sevilla: Biblioteca Capitular y Colombina, Ms. 7–7–13, fols. 27ra–50vb (questions 2–4).
  • Venezia: Biblioteca Nazionale Marciana, Ms. lat. VI. 72 [2810], fols. 81ra–112rb (questions 5–8).

Quaestiones super libros Ethicorum Questiones super libros Ethicorum:

1. Utrum omnis virtus moralis ex operibus generetur.

2. Utrum virtutes morales ex defectu aut superabundantia corrumpatur.

3. Utrum quilibet virtuosus in operibus sibi propriis delectetur.

4. Utrum voluntas suos actus producat libere.

5. Utrum fortitudo sit medietas circa audaciam et timores.

6. Utrum male operantes sint a legislatoribus puniendi.

7. Utrum liberalitas sit circa pecunias medietas.

8. Utrum magnanimus dignificeret se honoribus sibi dignis.

9. Utrum iustitia sit virtus moralis perfecta.

10. Utrum prudentia sit habitus cum recta ratione activus circa hominis bona et mala.

  • Brugge: Stedelijke Openbare Bibliotheek, Ms. 503, fols. 51ra–79va (questions 1–10).
  • Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Cod. Urb. Lat, fols. 256ra–287vb (questions 1–10).
  • Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Cod. Ottobon. Lat, fols. 25ra–59ra (questions 1–10).
  • Erfurt: Universitätsbibliothek, Dep. Erf., CA F 35, fols. 121ra–177vb (question 1–9, question 10 is interrupted).
  • Firenze: Biblioteca Nationale Centrale Cod. Conv. Soppr. B. VI 1681, fols. 1ra-32vb (questions 1–9).
  • Gent: Universiteitsbibliotheek Gent, Hs, 702, fols. 47ra–82rb (questions 1–4).
  • Kraków: Biblioteka Jagiellońska, Ms. 744, fols. 103vb–100vb (questions 4–9).
  • Lübeck: Bibliothek der Hansestadt, Cod. Philos. 4, fols. 164ra–198rb (questions 1–10).
  • Milano: Biblioteca Ambrosiana, Ms. A 100 inf., fols. 55ra-100ra (questions 1–10).
  • Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale de France, Ms. lat. 15561, fols. 172ra–197vb (questions 1–10).
  • Sevilla: Biblioteca Capitular y Colombina, Ms. 7–3–25, fols. 1ra–70vb (question 10 is interrupted).
  • Wien: Ősterreischische Nationalbibliothek, Cod. Lat. 5431, fols. 292ra–337r (10 complete questions).
  • Wrocław: Bibl. Uniw. IV.F.198, fols. 118ra-132rb (1–4 questions, question 5 is interrupted).

Questiones super libros Sententiarum Questiones super libros Sententiarum:

1. Utrum Deus sit super omnia diligendus.

2. Utrum per opera meritoria augeatur habitus caritatis quo Deus est super omnia diligendus.

3. Utrum omnis creatura sit suae naturae certis limitibus circumscripta.

4. Utrum quilibet actus voluntatis per se malus sit per se aliquid. [De Voluntate = DV]

5. Utrum peccans mortaliter per instans solum mereatur puniri per infinita instantia interpolata.

6. Utrum aliquis nisi forte in poena peccati possit esse perplexus in his quae pertinent ad salutem.

7. Utrum omnis actus factus extra gratiam sit peccatum.

8. Utrum aliquis possit simul peccare venialiter et mereri vitam aeternam.

  • Bologna: Biblioteca Comunale dell’Archiginnasio, Ms. 985, fols. 1ra–52va (questions 1–8).
  • Brugge: Stedelijke Openbare Bibliotheek, Ms. 188, fols. 3ra–54vb (questions 1–4, and parts of questions 5, 7, 8).
  • Brugge: Stedelijke Openbare Bibliotheek, Ms. 503, fols. 80ra–105rb (questions 1–2).
  • Città del Vaticano: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, Ms. Vat. Lat. 4353, fols. 1r–58r (questions 1–4).
  • Erfurt: Universitätsbibliothek, Dep. Erf., CA F. 105, fols. 122rb–182rb (questions 1–2, question 3 is incomplete).
  • Firenze, Biblioteca Nationale Centrale, II, II, 281, fols. 43ra–50rb (question 1, question 2 is interrupted)
  • London: British Library, Harley, Ms. 3243, fols. 111rb–131rb (question 2, question 3 is interrupted).
  • Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale de France, Ms. lat. 14576, fols. 117ra–199vb (questions 1–6, and part of question 8).
  • Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale de France, Ms. lat. 15561, fols. 198ra–226vb (questions 1–6, and part of question 8).
  • Praha: Národní Knihovna České Republiky, Ms. III. B, 10, fols. 130ra–212vb (questions 1–2, question 3 interrupted).
  • Wrocław: Biblioteka Uniwersytecka, Ms. IV. F. 198, fols. 15ra–45rb (questions 1–2, question 3 interrupted).
  • Tortosa: Biblioteca de la Catedral y del Cabildo de la Sanctísima Iglesia Catedral, Ms. 186, fols. 35ra–66ra (questions 1–2).

Critical Edition and Translation

  • Richardus Kilvington, Sophismata, in Norman Kretzmann, Barbara Ensign Kretzmann, critical edition of the Latin text, New York: Oxford University Press, 1990, 1–151.
  • Richard Kilvington, The Sophismata, in Norman Kretzmann, Barbara Ensign Kretzmann, The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington: Introduction, Translation, and Commentary, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • Ricardus Kilvington, Utrum continuum sit divisibile in infinitum, in Robert Podkoński (ed.), Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum, 36(2) (2007), 120–75. 
  • Ryszard Kilvington, Kwestie o ruchu, in Elżbieta Jung, Arystoteles na nowo odczytany. Ryszarda Kilvingtona “Kwestie o ruchu” [Rereading of Aristotle. Richard Kilvington’s “Quaestions on motion”, Introduction, Translation into Polish], Łódź: University of Łódź Press, 2014, 107–316.
  • Ricardus Kilvington, Quaestiones super libros Ethicorum (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 121). Leiden-Boston: Brill, 2016, 63–336 [a critical edition using Lübeck: Bibliothek der Hansestadt, Cod. Philos. 4 as the basic manuscript; the apparatus records eleven mss, Kraków and Wrocław mss are not examined].
  • Ricardus Kilvington, Utrum potentia motoris excedit potentiam rei motae, Elżbieta Jung (ed.), in Elżbieta Jung and Robert Podkoński, Towards the Modern Theory of Motion: Oxford Calculators and the New Interpretation of Aristotle (Research on Science & Natural Philosophy 4), Łódź: Wydawnictwo Uniwersytetu Łódzkiego, 2020, 213–266 [an edition is based on ms Venezia: Biblioteca Nazionale Marciana, Ms. lat. VI. 72 [2810]. 
  • Ricardus Kilvington, Utrum potentia motoris excedit potentiam rei motae, Elżbieta Jung (ed.), in Elżbieta Jung and Robert Podkoński, Towards the Modern Theory of Motion: Oxford Calculators and the New Interpretation of Aristotle (Research on Science & Natural Philosophy 4), Łódź: Wydawnictwo Uniwersytetu Łódzkiego, 2020, 213–266 [an edition is based on ms Venezia: Biblioteca Nazionale Marciana, Ms. lat. VI. 72 [2810]. 
  • Ricardus Kilvington, Utrum omnis creatura sit suae naturae certis limitibus crcumscripta, in Monika Michałowska, Richard Kilvington on the Capacity of Created Beings, Infinity, and Being Simultaneously in Rome and Paris: Critical Edition of Question 3 from Quaestiones super libros Sententiarum, (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 130), Leiden–Boston: Brill, 2021, 77–181, [a critical edition using Bologna: Biblioteca Comunale dell’Archiginnasio, Ms. 985 as the basic manuscript; the apparatus records eight mss].
  • Ricardus Kilvington, Utrum quilibet actus volutatis per se malus sit per se aliquid, Jung, Elżbieta, Michałowska, Monika (eds), in Elżbieta Jung, Monika Michałowska, Richard Kilvington Talks to Thomas Bradwardine about Future Contingents, Free Will, and Predestination: A Critical Edition of Question 4 from “Quaestiones super libros Sententiarum”, (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 134), Leiden–Boston: Brill, 2022 [a critical edition using Bologna: Biblioteca Comunale dell’Archiginnasio, Ms. 985 as the basic manuscript; the apparatus records five mss].

Secondary Literature

  • Bottin, Francesco, 1973a, ‘Analisi linguistica e fisica Aristotelica nei “Sophysmata” di Ricardi Kilmyngton’, in C. Giacon (ed.), Filosofia e Politica, et altri sagii, Padua: 125–45.
  • –––, 1973b, ‘L’Opinio de Insolubilibus di Richard Kilmyngon,’ Rivista critica di Storia della Filosofia, 28: 409–22.
  • –––, 1974, ‘Un testo fondamentale nell’ambito della “nuova fisica” di Oxford: I Sophismata di Richard Kilmington’, Miscellanea Medievalia, 9: 201–205.
  • Courtenay, William J., 1990, Capacity and Volition. A History of the Distinction of Absolute and Ordained Power, Bergamo, Italy: Pierluigi Lubrina.
  • Dumont, Stephen D., 1995, ‘The Origin of Scotus’s Theory of Synchronic Contingency’, The Modern Schoolman, 72: 149–67.
  • Fedriga, Ricardo, and Monika Michałowska, forthcoming, Safeguarding Free Will: William Ockham, Walter Chatton, and Richard Kilvington on the Will, Kraków: Ksiegarnia Akademicka, forthcoming.
  • Jung, Elżbieta, 2016, ‘Mathematics and the Secundum Imaginationem Procedure in Richard Kilvington’, Przegład Tomistyczny, XXII: 109–20.
  • –––, 2022a, ‘The New Interpretation of Aristotle. Richard Kilvington, Thomas Bradwardine and the New Rule of Motion,’ in: Quantifying Aristotle. The Impact, Spread and Decline of the Calculatores Tradition, D. Di Liscia, E. D. Sylla (eds) in collaboration with P.J.J.M. Bakker, (Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy of Science 34), Leiden–Boston: Brill, 37–78.
  • –––, 2022b, ‘Controversy on Infinity between Richard FitzRalph and Richard Kilvington,’ in A Companion to Richard FitzRalph. Fourteenth-Century Scholar, Bishop, and Polemicist, M. W. Dunne, S. Nolan (eds.), Leiden–Boston: Brill, (forthcoming).
  • Jung-Palczewska, Elżbieta, 1997, ‘Motion in a Vacuum and in a Plenum in Richard Kilvington’s Question: Utrum aliquod corpus simplex posset moveri aeque velociter in vacuo et in pleno from the “Commentary on the Physics”’, Miscellanea Medievalia, 25: 179–93.
  • –––, 2000a, ‘The Concept of Time in Richard Kilvington’, in L. Cova and G. Alliney (eds.), Tempus, Aevum, Eternity. La Conzettualizzazione del tempo nel Pensiero Tardomiedievale, Firenze: Leo S. Olschki, 141–67.
  • –––, 2000b, ‘Works by Richard Kilvington’, Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Age, 67: 181–223.
  • –––, 2002a, Między filozofią przyrody i nowożytnym przyrodoznawstwem. Ryszard Kilvington i fizyka matematyczna w średniowieczu (Between Philosophy of Nature and Science. Richard Kilvington and Mathematical Physics in the Middle Ages), Łódź: University of Łódź.
  • –––, 2002b, ‘Richard Kilvington on Local Motion’, in P. Bakker (ed.), Chemins de la pensée médiévale. Etudes offertes a Zénon Kaluza, Turnhout: Brepols, 113–33.
  • Jung, Elżbieta, and Monika Michałowska, 2008, ‘Jak być sprawiedliwym? Ryszarda Kilvingtona komentarz do Etyki Arystotelesa [What Does It Mean To Be Just? Richard Kilivngton’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Ethics]’, Roczniki Filozoficzne, 56(2): 117–29. 
  • –––, 2022, Richard Kilvington Talks to Thomas Bradwardine about Future Contingents, Free Will, and Predestination: A Critical Edition of Question 4 from “Quaestiones super libros Sententiarum”, (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters 134), Leiden–Boston: Brill.
  • Jung, Elżbieta, and Robert Podkoński, 2008, ‘Richard Kilvington on Proportions’, in J. Biard, S. Rommevaux (eds.), Mathématiques et théorie du mouvement XIVe-XVIe siècle, Villeneuve d’Ascq: Presses Universitaires du Septentrion, 80–101.
  • –––, 2009a, ‘Richard Kilvington on continuity’, in C. Grellard and A. Robert (eds.), Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden-Boston: Brill, 65–84.
  • –––, 2009b, ‘The Transmission of English Ideas in the Fourteenth Century—the Case of Richard Kilvington’, Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum, 37(3): 59–69.
  • –––, Towards the Modern Theory of Motion: Oxford Calculators and the New Interpretation of Aristotle, 2020, (Research on Science & Natural Philosophy 4), Łódź: Wydawnictwo Uniwersytetu Łódzkiego.
  • Katz, Bernard, D., 1996, ‘On a Sophisma of Richard Kilvington and a Problem of Analysis’, Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 5: 31–38.
  • Knuuttila, Simo and Anja Inkeri Lehtinen, 1979, ‘Plato in infinitum remisse incipit esse albus: New texts on the Late Medieval Discussion on the Concept of Infinity in Sophismata Literature’, in E. Saarinen, R. Hilpinen, I. Niiniluoto, and M. B. P. Hintikka (eds.), Essays in Honor of Jaakko Hintikka, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 309–329.
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