The Value of Knowledge

First published Tue Aug 21, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jun 27, 2022

The value of knowledge has always been a central topic within epistemology. Going all the way back to Plato’s Meno, philosophers have asked, why is knowledge more valuable than mere true belief? Interest in this question has grown in recent years, with theorists proposing a range of answers. But some reject the premise of the question and claim that the value of knowledge is ‘swamped’ by the value of true belief. And others argue that statuses other than knowledge, such as justification or understanding, are distinctively valuable. We will call the general question of why knowledge is valuable the value problem.

1. Value problems

In Plato’s Meno, Socrates raises the question of why knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief. Call this the Meno problem or, anticipating distinctions made below, the primary value problem.

Initially, we might appeal to the fact that knowledge appears to be of more practical use than true belief in order to mark this difference in value. But, as Socrates notes, this could be questioned, because a true belief that this is the way to Larissa will get you to Larissa just as well as knowledge that this is the way to Larissa. Plato’s own solution was that knowledge is formed in a special way distinguishing it from belief: knowledge, unlike belief, must be ‘tied down’ to the truth, like the mythical tethered statues of Daedalus. As a result, knowledge is better suited to guide action. For example, if one knows, rather than merely truly believes, that this is the way to Larissa, then one might be less likely to be perturbed by the fact that the road initially seems to be going in the wrong direction. Mere true belief at this point might be lost, since one might lose all confidence that this is the right way to go.

The primary value problem has been distinguished from the secondary value problem (Pritchard 2007: §2). The secondary value problem pertains to why knowledge is more valuable, from an epistemic point of view, than any proper subset of its parts. Put otherwise, why is knowledge better than any epistemic standing falling short of knowing? This includes, but is not restricted to, mere true belief. To illustrate the distinction, consider a possible solution to the primary value problem: knowledge is justified true belief, and justified true belief is better than mere true belief, which explains why knowledge is better than true belief. If correct, this hypothesis successfully answers the primary value problem. However, it requires further development to answer the secondary value problem. For example, it requires further development to explain why knowledge is better than justified belief.

Of course, on many standard theories of knowledge, knowledge is not defined as justified true belief. For instance, according to some theorists, knowledge is undefeated justified true belief (Lehrer & Paxson 1969); on other widely discussed accounts, knowledge is true belief that is non-accidental (Unger 1968), sensitive (Nozick 1981), safe (Sosa 1999), appropriately caused (Goldman 1967), or produced by intellectual virtue (Zagzebski 1996). This puts us in a position to appreciate what some theorists call the tertiary value problem. The tertiary value problem pertains to why knowledge is qualitatively better than any epistemic standing falling short of knowledge. Consider that if knowledge were only quantitatively better than that which falls just short—for instance, on an envisioned continuum of epistemic value—then it would be mysterious why epistemologists have given such attention to this particular point on the continuum.

Why does knowledge have this “distinctive value” not shared by that which falls just short of knowledge (Pritchard 2009: 14)?

Not all theorists accept that the value problems are genuine. For example, in light of the literature on the Gettier problem, some theorists deny that the secondary value problem is genuine. On this approach, whatever is added to justified true belief to rule out Gettier cases does not increase the value of the agent’s intellectual state: it is of no consequence whether we have Gettier-proof justified true belief rather than mere justified true belief (Kaplan 1985). Of course, Gettier cases are peculiar and presumably rare, so in practice having Gettier-proof justified true belief is almost invariably confounded with having mere justified true belief. This could lead some theorists to mistake the value of the latter for that of the former. Other theorists deny that the primary value problem is genuine. For example, on one approach, knowledge just is true belief (Sartwell 1991). If knowledge is true belief, then knowledge cannot be better than true belief, because nothing can be better than itself. However, the definition of knowledge as true belief has not been widely accepted.

2. Reliabilism and the Meno Problem

The first contemporary wave of work on the value problem largely concerned whether this problem raised a distinctive difficulty for reliabilist accounts of knowledge—i.e., those views which essentially define knowledge as reliably-formed true belief. In particular, the claim was that reliabilism was unable to offer an answer even to the primary value problem.

A fairly clear statement of what is at issue here is given in a number of places by Linda Zagzebski (e.g., 2003a; cf. DePaul 1993; Zagzebski 1996; Jones 1997; Swinburne 1999, 2000; Riggs 2002a; Kvanvig 2003; Sosa 2007: ch. 4; Carter & Jarvis 2012). To begin with, Zagzebski argues that the reliability of the process by which something is produced does not automatically add value to that thing, and thus that it cannot be assumed that the reliability of the process by which a true belief is produced will add value to that true belief. In defense of this claim, she offers the analogy of a cup of coffee. She claims that a good cup of coffee which is produced by a reliable coffee machine—i.e., one that regularly produces good cups of coffee—is of no more value than an equally good cup of coffee that is produced by an unreliable coffee machine.

Furthermore, as this line of objection goes, true belief is in the relevant respects like coffee: a true belief formed via a reliable belief-forming process is no more valuable than a true belief formed via an unreliable belief-forming process. In both cases, the value of the reliability of the process accrues in virtue of its tendency to produce a certain valuable effect (good coffee/true belief), but this means that where the effect has been produced—where one has a good cup of coffee or a true belief—then the value of the product is no greater for having been produced in a reliable way.

Elsewhere in the literature (e.g., Kvanvig 2003), this problem has been called the “swamping problem”, on account of how the value of true belief ‘swamps’ the value of the true belief being produced in a reliable (i.e., truth-conducive) way. So expressed, the moral of the problem seems to be that where reliabilists go awry is by treating the value of the process as being solely captured by the reliability of the process—i.e., its tendency to produce the desired effect. Since the value of the effect swamps the value of the reliability of the process by which the effect was achieved, this means that reliabilism has no resources available to it to explain why knowledge is more valuable than true belief.

It’s actually not clear that this is a problem that is specific to reliabilism. That is, it seems that if this is a bona fide problem, then it will affect any account of the value of knowledge which has the same relevant features as reliabilism—i.e., which regards the greater value of knowledge over true belief as instrumental value, where the instrumental value in question is relative to the valuable good of true belief. In particular, it will affect veritist proposals about epistemic value which treat truth as the fundamental epistemic good. See Kvanvig (2003: Ch. 3) for discussion of how internalist approaches to epistemic justification interface with the swamping problem; see Pettigrew (2018) and Pritchard (2019) for responses to the swamping argument on behalf of the veritist.

Furthermore, as J. Adam Carter and Benjamin Jarvis (2012) have argued, there are reasons to be suspicious of a key premise driving the swamping argument. The premise in question, which has been referred to as the “Swamping Thesis” (Pritchard 2011), states that if the value of a property possessed by an item is instrumentally valuable only relative to a further good, and that good is already present in that item, then it can confer no additional value. Carter and Jarvis contend that one who embraces the Swamping Thesis should also, by parity of reasoning, embrace a corollary thesis which they call the Swamping Thesis Complement, according to which, if the value of a property possessed by an item is instrumentally valuable only relative to a further good, and that good has already failed to be present in that item, then it can confer no additional value. However, as they argue, the Swamping Thesis and the Swamping Thesis Complement, along with other plausible premises, jointly entail the unpalatable conclusion that non-factive epistemic properties—most notably, justification—are never epistemically valuable properties of a belief. See Dutant (2013) and Bjelde (2020) for critical responses to Carter and Jarvis’ line of reasoning and Sylvan (2018) for a separate challenge to the swamping argument, which rejects its tacit commitment to epistemic instrumentalism (cf., Bjelde 2020). For an overview of the key moves of the argument, see Pritchard (2011).

However, even granting the main elements of the swamping argument, there are moves that the reliabilist can make in response (see, e.g., Goldman & Olsson 2009; Olsson 2011; Bates 2013; Roush 2010; cf. Brown 2012; Davis, & Jäger 2012; Hovarth 2009; Piller 2009). For example, it is surely open to the reliabilist to argue that the greater instrumental value of reliable true belief over mere true belief does not need to be understood purely in terms of instrumental value relative to the good of true belief. There could, for instance, be all sorts of practical benefits of having a reliable true belief which generate instrumental value. Indeed, it is worth noting that the line of response to the Meno problem sketched by Plato, which we noted above, seems to specifically appeal to the greater practical instrumental value of knowledge over mere true belief.

Moreover, there is reason to think that this objection will only at best have an impact on process reliabilist proposals—i.e., those views that treat all reliable belief-forming processes as conferring a positive epistemic standing on the beliefs so formed. For example, agent reliabilism (e.g., Greco 1999, 2000) might be thought to be untouched by this sort of argument. This is because, according to agent reliabilism, it is not any sort of reliable process that confers positive epistemic status to belief, but only those processes that are stable features of the agent’s “cognitive character”. The main motivation for this restriction on reliable processes is that it excludes certain kinds of reliable but nonetheless strange and fleeting processes which notoriously cause problems for the view (such as processes where the reliability is due to some quirk in the subject’s environment, rather than because of any cognitive trait possessed by the agent herself). Plausibly, however, one might argue that the reliable traits that make up an agent’s cognitive character have some value independently of the instrumental value they possess in virtue of being reliable—i.e., that they have some final or intrinsic value. If this is right, then this opens up the possibility that agent-reliabilists can evade the problem noted for pure reliabilists.

Zagzebski’s diagnosis of what is motivating this problem for reliabilism seems, however, explicitly to exclude such a counter-response. She argues that what gives rise to this difficulty is the fact that the reliabilist has signed up to a “machine-product model of belief”—see especially, Zagzebski (2003a)—where the product is external to the cause. It is not clear what exactly Zagzebski means by this point, but she thinks it shows that even where the reliable process is independently valuable—i.e., independently of its being reliable—it still doesn’t follow that the value of the cause will transfer to add value to the effect. Here again the coffee analogy is appealed to: even if a reliable coffee machine were independently valuable, it would not thereby confer additional value on a good cup of coffee.

Perhaps the best way to evaluate the above line of argument is to consider what is required in order to resolve the problem it poses. Perhaps what is needed is an ‘internal’ connection between product and cause, such as the kind of internal connection that exists between an act and its motive which is highlighted by how we explicitly evaluate actions in terms of the motives that led to them (Zagzebski 2003a). On this picture, then, we are not to understand knowledge as a state consisting of a known belief, but rather as a state which consists of both the true belief and the source from which that true belief was acquired. In short, then, the problem with the machine-product model of belief is that it leads us to evaluate the state of the knowledge independently of the means by which the knowledge was acquired. If, in contrast, we have a conception of knowledge that incorporates into the very state of knowledge the way that the knowledge was acquired, we can avoid this problem.

Once one effects this transition away from the machine-product model of belief, one can allow that the independent value of the reliable process can ensure that knowledge, by being produced in this way, is more valuable than mere true belief (Zagzebski 2003a). In particular, if the process by which one gained the true belief is an epistemic virtue—a character trait which is both reliable and intrinsically valuable—then this can ensure that the value of the knowing state in this case is more valuable than any corresponding state which simply consisted of a true belief.

Other commentators in the virtue epistemology camp, broadly conceived, have put forward similar suggestions. For example, Wayne Riggs (2002a) and Greco (e.g., 2003) have argued for a ‘credit’ version of virtue epistemology, according to which the agent, in virtue of bringing about the positively valuable outcome of a true belief, is due credit as a result. Rather than treating the extra value of knowledge over true belief as deriving simply from the agent’s attainment of the target true belief, however, Riggs and Greco instead argue that we should regard the agent’s knowing as the state the agent is in when she is responsible for her true belief. Only in so doing, they claim, can we answer the value problem. Jason Baehr (2012), by contrast with Riggs and Greco, has argued that credit theories of knowledge do not answer the value problem but, rather, ‘provide grounds for denying’ (2012: 1) that knowledge has value over and above the value of true belief.

Interestingly, however, other virtue epistemologists, most notably Ernest Sosa (2003), have also advocated a ‘credit’ view, yet seem to stay within the machine-product picture of belief. That is, rather than analyze the state of knowing as consisting of both the true belief and its source, they regard the state of knowing as distinct from the process, yet treat the fact that the process is intrinsically valuable as conferring additional value on any true belief so produced. With Sosa’s view in mind, it is interesting to ask just why we need to analyze knowledge in the way that Zagzebski and others suggest in order to get around the value problem.

The most direct way to approach this question is by considering whether it is really true that a valuable cause cannot confer value on its effect where cause and effect are kept separate in the way that Zagzebski claims is problematic in the case of knowledge. One commentator who has objected to Zagzebski’s argument by querying this claim on her part is Berit Brogaard (2007; cf. Percival 2003; Pritchard 2007: §2), who claims that a valuable cause can indeed confer value on its effect in the relevant cases. Brogaard claims that virtue epistemologists like Zagzebski and Riggs endorse this claim because they adhere to what she calls a “Moorean” conception of value, on which if two things have the same intrinsic properties, then they are equally valuable. Accordingly, if true belief and knowledge have the same intrinsic properties (which is what would be the case on the view of knowledge that they reject), it follows that they must have the same value. Hence, it is crucial to understand knowledge as having distinct intrinsic properties from true belief before one can hope to resolve the value problem.

If one holds that there is only intrinsic and instrumental value, then this conception of value is compelling, since objects with the same intrinsic properties trivially have the same amount of intrinsic value, and they also plausibly have the same amount of instrumental value as well (at least in the same sort of environment). However, the Moorean conception of value is problematic because—as Wlodek Rabinowicz & Toni Rønnow-Rasmussen (1999, 2003) have pointed out—there seem to be objects which we value for their own sake but whose value derives from their being extrinsically related to something else that we value. That is, such objects are finally—i.e., non-instrumentally—valuable without thereby being intrinsically valuable. For criticism of this account of final value, see Bradley (2002).

The standard example in this regard is Princess Diana’s dress. This would be regarded as more valuable than an exact replica simply because it belonged to Diana, which is clearly an extrinsic property of the object. Even though the extra value that accrues to the object is due to its extrinsic properties, however, it is still the case that this dress is (properly) valued for its own sake, and thus valued non-instrumentally.

Given that value of this sort is possible, then it follows that it could well be the case that we value one true belief over another because of its extrinsic features—i.e., that the one true belief, but not the other, was produced by a reliable cognitive trait that is independently valuable. For example, it could be that we value forming a true belief via a reliable cognitive trait more than a mere true belief because the former belief is produced in such a way that it is of credit to us that we believe the truth. There is thus a crucial lacuna in Zagzebski’s argument.

A different response to the challenge that Zagzebski raises for reliabilism is given by Michael Brady (2006). In defense of reliabilism, Brady appeals to the idea that to be valuable is to be a fitting or appropriate object of positive evaluative attitudes, such as admiration or love (e.g., Brentano 1889 [1969]; Chisholm 1986; Wiggins 1987; Gibbard 1990; Scanlon 1998). That one object is more valuable than another is thus to be understood, on this view, in terms of the fact that that object is more worthy of positive evaluation. Thus, the value problem for reliabilism on this conception of value comes down to the question why knowledge is more worthy of positive evaluation on this view than mere true belief. Brady’s contention is that, at least within this axiological framework, it is possible for the reliabilist to offer a compelling story about why reliable true belief—and thus knowledge—is more valuable than mere true belief.

Central to Brady’s argument is his claim that there are many ways one can positively evaluate something, and thus many different ways something can be valuable. Moreover, Brady argues that we can distinguish active from passive evaluative attributes, where the former class of attitudes involve pursuit of the good in question. For example, one might actively value the truth, where this involves, for instance, a striving to discover the truth. In contrast, one might at other times merely passively value the truth, such as simply respecting or contemplating it.

With this point in mind, Brady’s central thesis is that on the reliabilist account knowledge is more valuable than true belief because certain active positive evaluative attitudes are fitting only with regard to the former (i.e., reliable true belief). In particular, given its intrinsic features, reliable true belief is worthy of active love, whereas an active love of unreliable (i.e., accidental) true belief because of its intrinsic features would be entirely inappropriate because there is nothing that we can do to attain unreliable true belief that wouldn’t conflict with love of truth.

This is an intriguing proposal, which opens up a possible avenue of defense against the kind of machine-product objection to reliabilism considered. One problem that such a move faces, however, is that it is unclear whether we can make sense of the distinction Brady draws between active and passive evaluative attitudes, at least in the epistemic sphere. When Brady talks of passive evaluative attitudes towards the truth, he gives examples like contemplating, accepting, embracing, affirming, and respecting. Some of these attitudes are not clearly positive evaluative attitudes, however. Moreover, some of them are not obviously passive either. For example, is to contemplate the truth really to evaluate it positively, rather than simply to consider it? Furthermore, in accepting, affirming or embracing the truth, isn’t one actively positively evaluating the truth? Wouldn’t such evaluative attitudes manifest themselves in the kind of practical action that Brady thinks is the mark of active evaluative attitudes? More needs to be said about this distinction before it can do the philosophical work that Brady has in mind.

A further, albeit unorthodox, recent approach to the swamping problem is due to Carter and Rupert (2020). Carter and Rupert point out that extant approaches to the swamping problem suppose that if a solution is to be found, it will be at the personal level of description, the level at which states of subjects or agents, as such, appear. They take exception to this orthodoxy, or at least to its unquestioned status. They maintain that from the empirically justified premise that subpersonal states play a significant role in much epistemically relevant cognition, we should expect that they constitute a domain in which we might reasonably expect to locate the “missing source” of epistemic value, beyond the value attached to mere true belief.

3. Virtue Epistemology and the Value Problem

So far this discussion has taken it as given that whatever problems reliabilism faces in this regard, there are epistemological theories available—some form of virtue epistemology, for example—that can deal with them. But not everyone in the contemporary debate accepts this. Perhaps the best known sceptic in this respect is Jonathan Kvanvig (2003), who in effect argues that while virtue epistemology (along with a form of epistemic internalism) can resolve the primary value problem (i.e., the problem of explaining why knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief), the real challenge that we need to respond to is that set by the secondary value problem (i.e., the problem of explaining why knowledge is more valuable than that which falls short of knowledge); and Kvanvig says that there is no solution available to that. That is, Kvanvig argues that there is an epistemic standing—in essence, justified true belief—which falls short of knowledge but which is no less valuable than knowledge. He concludes that the focus of epistemology should not be on knowledge at all, but rather on understanding, an epistemic standing that Kvanvig maintains is clearly of more value than knowledge and those epistemic standings that fall short of knowledge, such as justified true belief.

What Kvanvig says about understanding will be considered below. First though, let us consider the specific challenge that he poses for virtue epistemology. In essence, Kvanvig’s argument rests on the assumption that it is essential to any virtue-theoretic account of knowledge—and any internalist account of knowledge as well, for that matter (i.e., an account that makes a subjective justification condition necessary for knowledge possession)—that it also includes an anti-Gettier condition. If this is right, then it follows that even if virtue epistemology has an answer to the primary value problem—and Kvanvig concedes that it does—it will not thereby have an answer to the secondary value problem since knowledge is not simply virtuous true belief. Moreover, Kvanvig argues that once we recognize what a gerrymandered notion a non-Gettierized account of knowledge is, it becomes apparent that there is nothing valuable about the anti-Gettier condition on knowledge that needs to be imposed. But if that is right, then it follows by even virtue epistemic lights that knowledge—i.e., non-Gettierized virtuous true believing—is no more valuable than one of its proper sub-sets—i.e., mere virtuous true believing.

There are at least two aspects of Kvanvig’s argument that are potentially problematic. To begin with, it isn’t at all clear why the anti-Gettier condition on knowledge fails to add value, something that seems to be assumed here. More generally, Kvanvig seems to be implicitly supposing that if an analysis of knowledge is ugly and gerrymandered then that is itself reason to doubt that knowledge is particularly valuable, at least assuming that there are epistemic standings that fall short of knowledge which can be given an elegant analysis. While a similar assumption about the relationship between the elegance (or otherwise) of the analysis of knowledge and the value of the analysandum is commonplace in the contemporary epistemological literature—see, for example, Zagzebski (1999) and Williamson (2000: chapter 1)—this assumption is contentious. For critical discussion of this assumption, see DePaul (2009).

In any case, a more serious problem is that many virtue epistemologists—among them Sosa (1988, 1991, 2007), Zagzebski (e.g., 1996, 1999) and Greco (2003, 2007, 2008, 2009)—hereafter, ‘robust virtue epistemologists’—think that their view can deal with Gettier problems without needing to add an additional anti-Gettier condition on knowledge. The way this is achieved is by making the move noted above of treating knowledge as a state that includes both the truly believing and the virtuous source by which that true belief was acquired. However, crucially, for robust virtue epistemologists, there is an important difference between (i) a belief’s being true and virtuously formed, and (ii) a belief’s being true because virtuously formed. Formulating knowledge along the latter lines, they insist, ensures that the target belief is not Gettiered. Even more, robust virtue epistemologists think the latter kind of formulation offers the resources to account for why knowledge is distinctively valuable.

To appreciate this point about value, consider the following ‘performance normativity framework’ which robust virtue epistemologists explicitly or implicitly embrace when accounting for the value of knowledge as a true belief because of virtue.

Performance Normativity Framework

Dimensions of evaluation thesis Any performance with an aim can be evaluated along three dimensions: (i) whether it is successful, (ii) whether it is skillful, and (iii) thirdly, whether the success is because of the skill.

Achievement thesis If and only if the success is because of the skill, the performance is not merely successful, but also, an achievement.

Value thesis Achievements are finally valuable (i.e., valuable for their own sake) in a way that mere lucky successes are not.

Notice that, if knowledge is a cognitive performance that is an achievement, then with reference to the above set of claims, the robust virtue epistemologist can respond to not only the secondary value problem but also the tertiary value problem (i.e., the problem of explaining why knowledge is more valuable, in kind and not merely in degree, than that which falls short of knowledge). This is because knowledge, on this view, is simply the cognitive aspect of a more general notion, that of achievement, and this is the case even if mere successes that are produced by intellectual virtues but which are not because of them, are not achievements. (Though, see Kim 2021 for a reversal of the idea that knowledge involves achievement; according to Kim, all achievements, in any domain of endeavour, imply knowledge).

As regards the value thesis, one might object that some successes that are because of ability—i.e., achievements, on this view—are too trivial or easy or wicked to count as finally valuable. This line of objection is far from decisive. After all, it is open to the proponent of robust virtue epistemology to argue that the claim is only that all achievements qua achievements are finally valuable, not that the overall value of every achievement is particularly high. It is thus consistent with the proposal that some achievements have a very low—perhaps even negative, if that is possible—value in virtue of their other properties (e.g., their triviality). Indeed, a second option in this regard is to allow that not all achievements enjoy final value whilst nevertheless maintaining that it is in the nature of achievements to have such value (e.g., much in the way that one might argue that it is in the nature of pleasure to be a good, even though some pleasures are bad). Since, as noted above, all that is required to meet the (tertiary) value problem is to show that knowledge is generally distinctively valuable, this claim would almost certainly suffice for the robust virtue epistemologist’s purposes.

In any case, even if the value thesis is correct—and indeed, even if the achievement and dimensions of evaluation theses are also correct—the robust virtue epistemologist has not yet satisfactorily vindicated any of the aforementioned value problems for knowledge unless knowledge is itself a kind of achievement—and that is the element of the proposal that is perhaps the most controversial. There are two key problems with the claim that knowledge involves cognitive achievement. The first is that there sometimes seems to be more to knowledge than a cognitive achievement; the second is that there sometimes seems to be less to knowledge than a cognitive achievement.

As regards the first claim, notice that achievements seem to be compatible with at least one kind of luck. Suppose that an archer hits a target by employing her relevant archery abilities, but that the success is ‘gettierized’ by luck intervening between the archer’s firing of the arrow and the hitting of the target. For example, suppose that a freak gust of wind blows the arrow off-course, but then a second freak gust of wind happens to blow it back on course again. The archer’s success is thus lucky in the sense that it could very easily have been a failure. When it comes to ‘intervening’ luck of this sort, Greco’s account of achievements is able to offer a good explanation of why the success in question does not constitute an achievement. After all, we would not say that the success was because of the archer’s ability in this case.

Notice, however, that not all forms of luck are of this intervening sort. Consider the following case offered by Pritchard (2010a: ch. 2). Suppose that nothing intervenes between the archer’s firing of the arrow and the hitting of the target. However, the success is still lucky in the relevant sense because, unbeknownst to the archer, she just happened to fire at the only target on the range that did not contain a forcefield which would have repelled the arrow. Is the archer’s success still an achievement? Intuition would seem to dictate that it is; it certainly seems to be a success that is because of ability, even despite the luckiness of that success. Achievements, then, are, it seems, compatible with luck of this ‘environmental’ form even though they are not compatible with luck of the standard ‘intervening’ form.

The significance of this conclusion for our purposes is that knowledge is incompatible with both forms of luck. In order to see this, one only needs to note that an epistemological analogue of the archer case just given is the famous barn façade example (e.g., Ginet 1975; Goldman 1976). In this example, we have an agent who forms a true belief that there is a barn in front of him. Moreover, his belief is not subject to the kind of ‘intervening’ luck just noted and which is a standard feature of Gettier-style cases. It is not as if, for example, he is looking at what appears to be a barn but which is not in fact a barn, but that his belief is true nonetheless because there is a barn behind the barn shaped object that he is looking at. Nevertheless, his belief is subject to environmental luck in that he is, unbeknownst to him, in barn façade county in which every other barn-shaped object is a barn façade. Thus, his belief is only luckily true in that he could very easily have been mistaken in this respect. Given that this example is structurally equivalent to the ‘archer’ case just given, it seems that just as we treat the archer as exhibiting an achievement in that case, so we should treat this agent as exhibiting a cognitive achievement here. The problem, however, is that until quite recently many philosophers accepted that the agent in the barn façade case lacks knowledge. Knowledge, it seems, is incompatible with environmental luck in a way that achievements, and thus cognitive achievements, are not (see, for example, Pritchard, e.g., 2012).

Robust virtue epistemologists have made a number of salient points regarding this case. For example, Greco (2010, 2012) has argued for a conception of what counts as a cognitive ability according to which the agent in the barn façade case would not count as exhibiting the relevant cognitive ability (see Pritchard 2010a: ch. 2 for a critical discussion of this claim). Others, such as Sosa (e.g., 2007, 2015) have responded by questioning whether the agent in the barn façade case lacks knowledge, albeit, in a qualified sense. While Sosa’s distinctive virtue epistemology allows for the compatibility of barn façade cases with animal knowledge (roughly: true belief because of ability), Sosa maintains that the subject in barn façade cases lacks reflective knowledge (roughly: a true belief whose creditability to ability or virtue is itself creditable to a second-order ability or virtue of the agent). Other philosophers (e.g., Hetherington (1998) have challenged the view that barn façade protagonists in fact lack (any kind of) knowledge. In a series of empirical studies, most people attributed knowledge in barn façade cases and related cases (Colaco, Buckwalter, Stich & Machery 2014; Turri, Buckwalter & Blouw 2015; Turri 2016a). In one study, over 80% of participants attributed knowledge (Turri 2016b). In another study, most professional philosophers attributed knowledge (Horvath & Wiegmann 2016). At least one theory of knowledge has been defended on the grounds that it explains why knowledge is intuitively present in such cases (Turri 2016c).

Even setting that issue aside, however, there is a second problem on the horizon, which is that it seems that there are some cases of knowledge which are not cases of cognitive achievement. One such case is offered by Jennifer Lackey (2007), albeit to illustrate a slightly different point. Lackey asks us to imagine someone arriving at the train station in Chicago who, wishing to obtain directions to the Sears Tower, approaches the first adult passer-by she sees. Suppose the person she asks is indeed knowledgeable about the area and gives her the directions that she requires. Intuitively, any true belief that the agent forms on this basis would ordinarily be counted as knowledge. Indeed, if one could not gain testimonial knowledge in this way, then it seems that we know an awful lot less than we think we know. However, it has been argued, in such a case the agent does not have a true belief because of her cognitive abilities but, rather, because of her informant’s cognitive abilities. If this is correct, then there are cases of knowledge which are not also cases of cognitive achievement.

It is worth being clear about the nature of this objection. Lackey takes cases like this to demonstrate that one can possess knowledge without it being primarily creditable to one that one’s belief is true. Note though that this is compatible, as Lackey notes, with granting that the agent is employing her cognitive abilities to some degree, and so surely deserves some credit for the truth of the belief formed (she would not have asked just anyone, for example, nor would she have simply accepted just any answer given by her informant). The point is thus rather that whatever credit the agent is due for having a true belief, it is not the kind of credit that reflects a bona fide cognitive achievement because of how this cognitive success involves ‘piggy-backing’ on the cognitive efforts of others.

4. Understanding and Epistemic Value

As noted above, the main conclusion that Kvanvig (2003) draws from his reflections on the value problem is that the real focus in epistemology should not be on knowledge at all but on understanding, an epistemic standing that Kvanvig does think is especially valuable but which, he argues, is distinct from knowing—i.e., one can have knowledge without the corresponding understanding, and one can have understanding without the corresponding knowledge. (Pritchard [e.g., 2010a: chs 1–4] agrees, though his reasons for taking this line are somewhat different to Kvanvig’s). It is perhaps this aspect of Kvanvig’s book that has prompted the most critical response, so it is worth briefly dwelling on his claims here in a little more detail.

To begin with, one needs to get clear what Kvanvig has in mind when he talks of understanding, since many commentators have found the conception of understanding that he targets problematic. The two usages of the term ‘understanding’ in ordinary language that Kvanvig focuses on—and which he regards as being especially important to epistemology—are

when understanding is claimed for some object, such as some subject matter, and when it involves understanding that something is the case. (Kvanvig 2003: 189)

The first kind of understanding he calls “objectual understanding”, the second kind “propositional understanding”. In both cases, understanding requires that one successfully grasp how one’s beliefs in the relevant propositions cohere with other propositions one believes (e.g., Kvanvig 2003: 192, 197–8). This requirement entails that understanding is directly factive in the case of propositional understanding and indirectly factive in the case of objectual understanding—i.e., the agent needs to have at least mostly true beliefs about the target subject matter in order to be truly said to have objectual understanding of that subject matter.

Given that understanding—propositional understanding at any rate—is factive, Kvanvig’s argument for why understanding is distinct from knowledge does not relate to this condition (as we will see in a moment, it is standard to argue that understanding is distinct from knowledge precisely because only understanding is non-factive). Instead, Kvanvig notes two key differences between understanding and knowledge: that understanding, unlike knowledge, admits of degrees, and that understanding, unlike knowledge, is compatible with epistemic luck. Most commentators, however, have tended to focus not on these two theses concerning the different properties of knowledge and understanding, but rather on Kvanvig’s claim that understanding is (at least indirectly) factive.

For example, Elgin (2009; cf. Elgin 1996, 2004; Janvid 2014) and Riggs (2009) argue that it is possible for an agent to have understanding and yet lack true beliefs in the relevant propositions. For example, Elgin (2009) argues that it is essential to treat scientific understanding as non-factive. She cites a number of cases in which science has progressed from one theory to a better theory where, we would say, understanding has increased in the process even though the theories are, strictly speaking at least, false. A different kind of case that Elgin offers concerns scientific idealizations, such as the ideal gas law. Scientists know full well that no actual gas behaves in this way, yet the introduction of this useful fiction clearly improved our understanding of the behavior of actual gasses. For a defense of Kvanvig’s view in the light of these charges, see Kvanvig (2009a, 2009b; Carter & Gordon 2014).

A very different sort of challenge to Kvanvig’s treatment of understanding comes from Brogaard (2005, Other Internet Resources). She argues that Kvanvig’s claim that understanding is of greater value than knowledge is only achieved because he fails to give a rich enough account of knowledge. More specifically, Brogaard claims that we can distinguish between objectual and propositional knowledge just as we can distinguish between objectual and propositional understanding. Propositional understanding, argues Brogaard, no more requires coherence in one’s beliefs than propositional knowledge, and so the difference in value between the two cannot lie here. Moreover, while Brogaard grants that objectual understanding does incorporate a coherence requirement, this again fails to mark a value-relevant distinction between knowledge and understanding because the relevant counterpart—objectual knowledge (i.e., knowledge of a subject matter)—also incorporates a coherence requirement. So provided that we are consistent in our comparisons of objectual and propositional understanding on the one hand, and objectual and propositional knowledge on the other, Kvanvig fails to make a sound case for thinking that understanding is of greater value than knowledge.

Finally, a further challenge to Kvanvig’s treatment of knowledge and understanding focuses on his claims regarding epistemic luck, and in particular, his insistence that luck cases show how understanding and propositional knowledge come apart from one another. In order to bring the luck-based challenge into focus, we can distinguish three kinds of views about the relationship between understanding and epistemic luck that are found in the literature: strong compatibilism (e.g., Kvanvig 2003; Rohwer 2014), moderate compatibilism (e.g., Pritchard 2010a: ch. 4) and incompatibilism (e.g., Grimm 2006; Sliwa 2015). Strong compatibilism is the view that understanding is compatible with the varieties of epistemic luck that are generally taken to undermine propositional knowledge. In particular, incompatibilists maintain that understanding is undermined by neither (i) the kind of luck that features in traditional Gettier-style cases (1963) cases, nor with (ii) purely ‘environmental luck (e.g., Pritchard 2005) of the sort that features in ‘fake barn’ cases (e.g., Goldman 1979) where the fact that one’s belief could easily be incorrect is a matter of being in an inhospitable epistemic environment. Moderate compatibilism, by contrast, maintains that while understanding is like propositional knowledge in that it is incompatible with the kind of luck that features in traditional Gettier cases, it is nonetheless compatible with environmental epistemic luck. Incompatibilism rejects that either kind of epistemic luck case demonstrates that understanding and propositional knowledge come apart, and so maintains that understanding is incompatible with epistemic luck to the same extent that propositional knowledge is.

5. The Value of Knowledge-How

The received view in mainstream epistemology, at least since Gilbert Ryle (e.g., 1949), has been to regard knowledge-that and knowledge-how as different epistemic standings, such that knowing how to do something is not simply a matter of knowing propositions, viz., of knowledge-that. If this view—known as anti-intellectualism—is correct, then the value of knowledge-how needn’t be accounted for in terms of the value of knowing propositions. Furthermore, if anti-intellectualism is assumed, then—to the extent that there is any analogous ‘value problem’ for knowledge-how—such a problem needn’t materialize as the philosophical problem of determining what it is about knowledge-how that makes it more valuable than mere true belief.

Jason Stanley & Timothy Williamson (2001) have, however, influentially resisted the received anti-intellectualist thinking about knowledge-how. On Stanley & Williamson’s view—intellectualism—knowledge-how is a kind of propositional knowledge, i.e., knowledge-that, such that (roughly) S knows how to φ iff there is a way w such that S knows that w is a way for S to φ. Accordingly, if Hannah knows how to ride a bike, then this is in virtue of her propositional knowledge—viz., her knowing of some way w that w is the way for her (Hannah) to ride a bike.

By reducing in this manner knowledge—how to a kind of knowledge—that, intellectualists such as Stanley have accepted that knowledge-how should have properties characteristic of propositional knowledge, (see, for example, Stanley 2011: 215), of which knowledge-how is a kind. Furthermore, the value of knowledge-how should be able to be accounted for, on intellectualism, with reference to the value of the propositional knowledge that the intellectualist identifies with knowledge-how.

In recent work, Carter and Pritchard (2015) have challenged intellectualism on this point. One such example they offer to this end involves testimony and skilled action. For example, suppose that a skilled guitarist tells an amateur how to play a very tricky guitar riff. Carter and Pritchard (2015: 801) argue that though the amateur can uncontroversially acquire testimonial knowledge from the expert that, for some way w that w is the way to play the riff, it might be that the expert, but not novice, knows how to play the riff. Further, they suggest that whilst the amateur is better off, with respect to the aim of playing the riff, than he was prior to gaining the testimonial knowledge he did, he would likewise be better off further—viz., he would have something even more valuable—if he, like the expert, had the lick down cold (something the amateur does not have simply on the basis of his acquired testimonial knowledge) (Ibid: 801).

The conclusion Carter and Pritchard draw from this and other similar cases (e.g., 2015: §3; see also Poston 2016) is that the value of knowledge-how cannot be accounted for with reference to the value of the items of knowledge-that which the intellectualist identifies with knowledge-how If this is right, then if there is a ‘value problem’ for knowledge-how, we shouldn’t expect it to be the problem of determining what is it about certain items of propositional knowledge that makes these more valuable than corresponding mere true beliefs. A potential area for future research is to consider what an analogue value problem for knowledge-how might look like, on an anti-intellectualist framework.

According to Carter and Pritchard’s diagnosis, the underlying explanation for this difference in value is that knowledge-how (like understanding, as discussed in §4) essentially involves a kind of cognitive achievement, unlike propositional knowledge, for reasons discussed in §4. If this diagnosis is correct, then further pressure is arguably placed on the robust virtue epistemologist’s ‘achievement’ solution to the value problems for knowledge-that, as surveyed in §3. Recall that, according to robust virtue epistemology, the distinctive value of knowledge-that is accounted for in terms of the value of cognitive achievement (i.e., success because of ability) which robust virtue epistemologists take to be essential to propositional knowledge. But, if the presence of cognitive achievement is what accounts for why knowledge-how has a value that is not present in the items of knowledge-that the intellectualist identifies with knowledge-how, this result would seem to stand in tension with the robust virtue epistemologist’s insistence that what affords propositional knowledge a value lacked by mere true belief is that the former essentially involves cognitive achievement.

6. Other Accounts of the Value of Knowledge

John Hawthorne (2004; cf. Stanley 2005; Fantl & McGrath 2002) has argued that knowledge is valuable because of the role it plays in practical reasoning. More specifically, Hawthorne (2004: 30) argues for the principle that one should use a proposition p as a premise in one’s practical reasoning only if one knows p. Hawthorne primarily motivates this line of argument by appeal to the lottery case. This concerns an agent’s true belief that she holds the losing ticket for a fair lottery with long odds and a large cash prize, a belief that is based solely on the fact that she has reflected on the odds involved. Intuitively, we would say that such an agent lacks knowledge of what she believes, even though her belief is true and even though her justification for what she believes—assessed in terms of the likelihood, given this justification, of her being right—is unusually strong. Moreover, were this agent to use this belief as a premise in her practical reasoning, and so infer that she should throw the ticket away without checking the lottery results in the paper for example, then we would regard her reasoning as problematic.

Lottery cases therefore seem to show that justified true belief, no matter how strong the degree of justification, is not enough for acceptable practical reasoning—instead, knowledge is required. Moreover, notice that we can alter the example slightly so that the agent does possess knowledge while at the same time having a weaker justification for what she believes (where strength of justification is again assessed in terms of the likelihood, given this justification, that the agent’s belief is true). If the agent had formed her true belief by reading the results in a reliable newspaper, for example, then she would count as knowing the target proposition and can then infer that she should throw the ticket away without criticism. It is more likely, however, that the newspaper has printed the result wrongly than that she should win the lottery. This sort of consideration seems to show that knowledge, even when accompanied by a relatively weak justification, is better (at least when it comes to practical reasoning) than a true belief that is supported by a relatively strong justification but does not amount to knowledge. If this is the right way to think about the connection between knowledge possession and practical reasoning, then it seems to offer a potential response to at least the secondary value problem.

A second author who thinks that our understanding of the concept of knowledge can have important ramifications for the value of knowledge is Edward Craig (1990). Craig’s project begins with a thesis about the value of the concept of knowledge. Simplifying somewhat, Craig hypothesises that the concept of knowledge is important to us because it fulfills the valuable function of enabling us to identify reliable informants. The idea is that it is clearly of immense practical importance to be able to recognize those from whom we can gain true beliefs, and that it was in response to this need that the concept of knowledge arose. As with Hawthorne’s theory, this proposal, if correct, could potentially offer a resolution of at least the secondary value problem.

Recently, there have been additional attempts to follow—broadly speaking—Craig’s project, for which the value of knowledge is understood in terms of the functional role that ‘knowledge’ plays in fulfilling our practical needs. The matter of how to identify this functional role has received increasing recent attention. For example, David Henderson (2009), Robin McKenna (2013), Duncan Pritchard (2012) and Michael Hannon (2015) have defended views about the concept of knowledge (or knowledge ascriptions) that are broadly inspired by Craig’s favored account of the function of knowledge as identifying reliable informants. A notable rival account, defended by Klemens Kappel (2010), Christoph Kelp (2011, 2014) and Patrick Rysiew (2012; cf. Kvanvig 2012) identifies closure of inquiry as the relevant function. For Krista Lawlor (2013) the relevant function is identified (à la Austin) as that of providing assurance, and for James Beebe (2012), it’s expressing epistemic approval/disapproval.

In one sense, such accounts are in competition with one another, in that they offer different practical explications of ‘knowledge’. However, these accounts all accept (explicitly or tacitly) a more general insight, which is that considerations about the function that the concept of knowledge plays in fulfilling practical needs should inform our theories of the nature and corresponding value of knowledge. This more general point remains controversial in contemporary metaepistemology. For some arguments against supposing that a practical explication of ‘knowledge’, in terms of some need-fulfilling function, should inform our accounts of the nature or knowledge, see for example Gerken (2015). For a more extreme form of argument in favor of divorcing considerations to do with how and why we use ‘knows’ from epistemological theorizing altogether, see Hazlett (2010; cf. Turri 2011b).

A further and more recent practically oriented approach to the value of knowledge is defended by Grindrod (2019), who considers specifically the ramifications of epistemic contextualism for the value of knowledge. Contextualists maintain that knowledge attributing sentences can vary in truth value across different contexts of utterance. This kind of position about the semantics of knowledge attributions is often motivated by  context-shifting cases, such as DeRose’s (1992) bank case, which seem to suggest that the a knowledge attribution is true depends on the epistemic standards (as fixed by practical stakes) of the attributor of the knowledge ascription (see entry on Epistemic Contextualism). Grindrod maintains that if epistemic contextualism is true, then epistemic value(including whatever epistemic value might separate knowledge from mere true belief) should be contextualised.

7. Weak and Strong Conceptions of Knowledge

Laurence BonJour argues that reflecting on the value of knowledge leads us to reject a prevailing trend in epistemology over the past several decades, namely, fallibilism, or what BonJour calls the “weak conception” of knowledge.

BonJour outlines four traditional assumptions about knowledge, understood as roughly justified true belief, which he “broadly” endorses (BonJour 2010: 58–9). First, knowledge is a “valuable and desirable cognitive state” indicative of “full cognitive success”. Any acceptable theory of knowledge must “make sense of” knowledge’s important value. Second, knowledge is “an all or nothing matter, not a matter of degree”. There is no such thing as degrees of knowing: either you know or you don’t. Third, epistemic justification comes in degrees, from weak to strong. Fourth, epistemic justification is essentially tied to “likelihood or probability of truth”, such that the strength of justification covaries with how likely it makes the truth of the belief in question.

On this traditional approach, we are invited to think of justification as measured by how probable the belief is given the reasons or evidence you have. One convenient way to measure probability is to use the decimals in the interval [0, 1]. A probability of 0 means that the claim is guaranteed to be false. A probability of 1 means that the claim is guaranteed to be true. A probability of .5 means that the claim is just as likely to be true as it is to be false. The question then becomes, how probable must your belief be for it to be knowledge?

Obviously it must be greater than .5. But how much greater? Suppose we say that knowledge requires a probability of 1—that is, knowledge requires our justification or reasons to guarantee the truth of the belief. Call such reasons conclusive reasons.

The strong conception of knowledge says knowledge requires conclusive reasons. We can motivate the strong conception as follows. If the aim of belief is truth, then it makes sense that knowledge would require conclusive reasons, because conclusive reasons guarantee that belief’s aim is achieved. The three components of the traditional view of knowledge thus fit together “cohesively” to explain why knowledge is valued as a state of full cognitive success.

But all is not well with the strong conception, or so philosophers have claimed over the past several decades. The strong conception seems to entail that we know nearly nothing at all about the material world outside of our own minds or about the past. For we could have had all the reasons we do in fact have, even if the world around us or the past had been different. (Think of Descartes’s evil genius.) This conflicts with commonsense and counts against the strong conception. But what is the alternative?

The alternative is that knowledge requires reasons that make the belief very likely true, but needn’t guarantee it. This is the weak conception of knowledge. Most epistemologists accept the weak conception of knowledge. But BonJour asks a challenging question: what is the “magic” level of probability required by knowledge? BonJour then argues that a satisfactory answer to this question isn’t forthcoming. For any point short of 1 would seem arbitrary. Why should we pick that point exactly? The same could be said for a vague range that includes points short of 1—why, exactly, should the vague range extend roughly that far but not further? This leads to an even deeper problem for the weak conception. It brings into doubt the value of knowledge. Can knowledge really be valuable if it is arbitrarily defined?

A closely related problem for the weak conception presents itself. Suppose for the sake of argument that we settle on .9 as the required level of probability. Suppose further that you believe Q and you believe R, that Q and R are both true, and that you have reached the .9 threshold for each. Thus the weak conception entails that you know Q, and you know R. Intuitively, if you know Q and you also know R, then you’re automatically in a position to know the conjunction Q & R. But the weak conception cannot sustain this judgment. For the probability of the conjunction of two independent claims, such as Q and R, equals the product of their probabilities. (This is the special conjunction rule from probability theory.) In this case, the probability of Q = .9 and the probability of R = .9. So the probability of the conjunction (Q & R) = .9 × .9 = .81, which falls short of the required .9. So the weak conception of knowledge along with a law of probability entail that you’re automatically not in a position to know the conjunction (Q & R). BonJour considers this to be “an intuitively unacceptable result”, because after all,

what is the supposed state of knowledge really worth, if even the simplest inference from two pieces of knowledge [might] not lead to further knowledge? (BonJour 2010: 63)

BonJour concludes that the weak conception fails to explain the value of knowledge, and thus that the strong conception must be true. He recognizes that this implies that we don’t know most of the things we ordinarily say and think that we know. He explains this away, however, partly on grounds that knowledge is the norm of practical reasoning, which creates strong “practical pressure” to confabulate or exaggerate in claiming to know things, so that we can view ourselves as reasoning and acting appropriately, even though usually the best we can do is to approximate appropriate action and reasoning. (BonJour 2010: 75).

8. The Value of True Belief

So far, in common with most of the contemporary literature in this regard, we have tended to focus on the value of knowledge relative to other epistemic standings. A related debate in this respect, however—one that has often taken place largely in tandem with the mainstream debate on the value of knowledge—has specifically concerned itself with the value of true belief and we will turn now to this issue.

Few commentators treat truth or belief as being by themselves valuable (though see Kvanvig 2003: ch. 1), but it is common to treat true belief as valuable, at least instrumentally. True beliefs are clearly often of great practical use to us. The crucial caveat here, of course, concerns the use of the word ‘often’. After all, it is also often the case that a true belief might actually militate against one achieving one’s goals, as when one is unable to summon the courage to jump a ravine and thereby get to safety, because one knows that there is a serious possibility that one might fail to reach the other side. In such cases it seems that a false belief in one’s abilities—e.g., the false belief that one could easily jump the ravine—would be better than a true belief, if the goal in question (jumping the ravine) is to be achieved.

Moreover, some true beliefs are beliefs in trivial matters, and in these cases it isn’t at all clear why we should value such beliefs at all. Imagine someone who, for no good reason, concerns herself with measuring each grain of sand on a beach, or someone who, even while being unable to operate a telephone, concerns herself with remembering every entry in a foreign phone book. Such a person would thereby gain lots of true beliefs but, crucially, one would regard such truth-gaining activity as rather pointless. After all, these true beliefs do not seem to serve any valuable purpose, and so do not appear to have any instrumental value (or, at the very least, what instrumental value these beliefs have is vanishingly small). It would, perhaps, be better—and thus of greater value—to have fewer true beliefs, and possibly more false ones, if this meant that the true beliefs that one had concerned matters of real consequence.

At most, then, we can say that true beliefs often have instrumental value. What about final (or intrinsic) value? One might think that if the general instrumental value of true belief was moot then so too would be the intuitively stronger thesis that true belief is generally finally valuable. Nevertheless, many have argued for such a claim.

One condition that seems to speak in favor of this thesis is that as truth seekers we are naturally curious about what the truth is, even when that truth is of no obvious practical import. Accordingly, it could be argued that from a purely epistemic point of view, we do regard all true belief as valuable for its own sake, regardless of what further prudential goals we might have (e.g., Goldman 1999: 3; Lynch 2004: 15–16; Alston 2005: 31; Pritchard 2019; cf. Baehr 2012: 5). Curiosity will only take you so far in this regard, however, since we are only curious about certain truths, not all of them. To return to the examples given a moment ago, no fully rational agent is curious about the measurements of every grain of sand on a given beach, or the name of every person in a random phone book—i.e., no rational person wants to know these truths independently of having some prudential reason for knowing them.

Still, one could argue for a weaker claim and merely say that it is prima facie or pro tanto finally good to believe the truth (cf. David 2005; Lynch 2009), where cases of trivial truths such as those just given are simply cases where, all things considered, it is not good to believe the truth. After all, we are familiar with the fact that something can be prima facie or pro tanto finally good without being all-things-considered good. For example, it may be finally good to help the poor and needy, but not all-things-considered good given that helping the poor and needy would prevent you from doing something else which is at present more important (such as saving that child from drowning).

At this point one might wonder why it matters so much to (some) epistemologists that true belief is finally valuable. Why not instead just treat true belief as often of instrumental value and leave the matter at that? The answer to this question lies in the fact that many want to regard truth—and thereby true belief—as being the fundamental epistemic goal, in the sense that ultimately it is only truth that is epistemically valuable (so, for example, while justification is epistemically valuable, it is only epistemically valuable because of how it is a guide to truth). Accordingly, if true belief is not finally valuable—and only typically instrumentally valuable—then this seems to downplay the status of the epistemological project.

There are a range of options here. The conservative option is to contend that truth is the fundamental goal of epistemology and also contend that true belief is finally valuable—at least in some restricted fashion. Marian David (2001, 2005) falls into this category. In contrast, one might argue that truth is the fundamental goal while at the same time claiming that true belief is not finally valuable. Sosa (see especially 2004, but also 2000a, 2003) seems (almost) to fall into this camp, since he claims that while truth is the fundamental epistemic value, we can accommodate this thought without having to thereby concede that true belief is finally valuable, a point that has been made in a similar fashion by Alan Millar (2011: §3). Sosa often compares the epistemic domain to other domains of evaluation where the fundamental good of that domain is not finally valuable. So, for example, the fundamental goal of the ‘coffee-production’ domain may be great tasting coffee, but no-one is going to argue that great tasting coffee is finally valuable. Perhaps the epistemic domain is in this respect like the coffee-production domain?

Another line of response against the thesis that true belief is finally valuable is to suggest that this thesis leads to a reductio. Michael DePaul (2001) has notably advanced such an argument. According to DePaul, the thesis that true belief is finally valuable implies that all true beliefs are equally epistemically valuable. Though this latter claim, DePaul argues, is false, as is illustrated by cases where two sets each containing an equal number of true beliefs intuitively differ in epistemic value. Ahlstrom-Vij and Grimm (2013) have criticized DePaul’s claim that the thesis that true belief is finally valuable implies that two sets each containing an equal number of true beliefs must not differ in epistemic value. Additionally, Nick Treanor (2014) has criticized the argument for a different reason, which is that (contra DePaul) there is no clear example of two sets which contain the same number of true beliefs. More recently, Xingming Hu (2017) has defended the final value of true belief against DePaul’s argument, though Hu argues further that neither Ahlstrom-Vij and Grimm’s (2013) nor Treanor’s (2014) critique of DePaul’s argument is compelling.

Another axis on which the debate about the value of true belief can be configured is in terms of whether one opts for an epistemic-value monism or an epistemic-value pluralism—that is, whether one thinks there is only one fundamental epistemic goal, or several. Kvanvig (e.g., 2005) endorses epistemic-value pluralism, since he thinks that there are a number of fundamental epistemic goals, with each of them being of final value. Crucial to Kvanvig’s argument is that there are some epistemic goals which are not obviously truth-related—he cites the examples of having an empirically adequate theory, making sense of the course of one’s experience, and inquiring responsibly, and more recently, Brent Madison (2017) has argued by appealing to a new evil demon thought experiment, that epistemic justification itself should be included in such a list. This is important because if the range of goals identified were all truth-related, then it would prompt the natural response that such goals are valuable only because of their connection to the truth, and hence not fundamental epistemic goals at all.

Presumably, though, it ought also to be possible to make a case for an epistemic-value pluralism where the fundamental epistemic goals were not finally valuable (or, at least, à la Sosa, where one avoided taking a stance on this issue). More precisely, if an epistemic-value monism that does not regard the fundamental epistemic goal as finally valuable can be made palatable, then there seems no clear reason why a parallel view that opted for pluralism in this regard could not similarly be given a plausible supporting story.

9. The Value of Extended Knowledge

In his essay, “Meno in a Digital World”, Pascal Engel (2016) questions whether the original value problem applies to the kind of knowledge or pseudo-knowledge that we get from the internet? (2016: 1). One might initially think that internet and/or digitally acquired knowledge raises no new issues for the value problem. On this line of thought, if digitally acquired (e.g., Googled knowledge, information stored in iPhone apps, etc.) is genuine knowledge, then whatever goes for knowledge more generally, vis-à-vis the value problems surveyed in §§1–2, thereby goes for knowledge acquired from our gadgets.

However, recent work at the intersection of epistemology and the philosophy of mind suggests there are potentially some new and epistemologically interesting philosophical problems associated with the value of technology-assisted knowledge. These problems correspond with two ways of conceiving of knowledge as extending beyond traditional, intracranial boundaries (e.g., Pritchard 2018). In particular, the kinds of ‘extended knowledge’ which have potential import for the value of knowledge debate correspond with the extended mind thesis (for discussion on how this thesis interfaces with the hypothesis of extended cognition, see Carter, Kallestrup, Pritchard, & Palermos 2014) and cases involving what Michael Lynch (2016) calls ‘neuromedia’ intelligence augmentation.

According to the extended mind thesis (EMT), mental states (e.g., beliefs) can supervene in part on extra-organismic elements of the world, such as laptops, phones and notebooks, that are typically regarded as ‘external’ to our minds. This thesis, defended most notably by Andy Clark and David Chalmers (1998), should not be conflated with comparatively weaker and less controversial thesis of content externalism (e.g., Putnam 1975; Burge 1986), according to which the meaning or content of mental states can be fixed by extra-organismic features of our physical or social-linguistic environments.

What the proponent of EMT submits is that mental states themselves can partly supervene on extracranial artifacts (e.g., notebooks, iPhones) provided these extracranial artifacts play kinds of functional roles normally played by on-board, biological cognitive processes. For example, to borrow an (adapted) case from Clark and Chalmers (1998), suppose an Alzheimer’s patient, ‘Otto’, begins to outsource the task of memory storage and retrieval to his iPhone, having appreciated that his biological memory is failing. Accordingly, when Otto acquires new information, he automatically records it in his phone’s ‘memory app’, and when he needs old information, he (also, automatically and seamlessly) opens his memory app and looks it up. The iPhone comes to play for Otto the functionally isomorphic role that biological memory used to play for him vis-à-vis the process of memory storage and retrieval. Just as we attribute to normally functioning agents knowledge in virtue of their (non-occurrent) dispositional beliefs stored in biological memory (for example, five minutes ago, you knew that Paris is the capital of France), so, with EMT in play, we should be prepared to attribute knowledge to Otto in virtue of the ‘extended’ (dispositional) beliefs which are stored in his notebook, provided Otto is as epistemically diligent in encoding and retrieving information as he was before (e.g., Pritchard 2010b).

The import EMT has for the value of knowledge debate now takes shape: whatever epistemically valuable properties (if any) are distinctively possessed by knowledge, they must be properties that obtain in Otto’s case so as to add value to what would otherwise be mere true (dispositional) beliefs that are stored, extracranially, in Otto’s iPhone. But it is initially puzzling just why, and how, this should be. After all, even if we accept the intuition that the epistemic value of traditional (intracranial) knowledge exceeds the value of corresponding true opinion, it is, as Engel (2016), Lynch (2016) and Carter (2017) have noted, at best not clear that this comparative intuition holds in the extended case, where knowledge is possessed simply by virtue of information persisting in digital storage.

For example, consider again Plato’s solution to the value problem canvassed in §1: knowledge, unlike true belief, must be ‘tied-down’ to the truth. Mere true belief is more likely to be lost, which makes it less valuable than knowledge. One potential worry is that extended knowledge, as per EMT—literally, often times, knowledge stored in the cloud—is by its very nature not ‘tethered’, or for that matter even tetherable, in a way that corresponding items of accurate information which fall short of knowledge are not. Nor arguably does this sort of knowledge in the cloud clearly have the kind of ‘stability’ that Olsson (2009) claims is what distinguishes knowledge from true opinion (cf., Walker 2019). Perhaps even less does it appear to constitute a valuable cognitive ‘achievement’, as per robust virtue epistemologists such as Greco and Sosa.

EMT is of course highly controversial, (see, for example, Adams & Aizawa 2008), and so one way to sidestep the implications for the value of knowledge debate posed by the possibility of knowledge that is extended via extended beliefs, is to simply resist EMT as a thesis about the metaphysics of mind.

However, there are other ways in which the technology-assisted knowledge could have import for the traditional value problems. In recent work, Michael P. Lynch (2016) argues that, given the increase in cognitive offloading coupled with evermore subtle and physically smaller intelligence-augmentation technologies (e.g., Bostrom & Sandberg 2009), it is just a matter of time before the majority of the gadgetry we use for cognitive tasks will be by and large seamless and ‘invisible’. Lynch suggests that while coming to know via such mechanisms can make knowledge acquisition much easier, there are epistemic drawbacks. He offers the following thought experiment:

NEUROMEDIA: Imagine a society where smartphones are miniaturized and hooked directly into a person’s brain. With a single mental command, those who have this technology—let’s call it neuromedia—can access information on any subject […] Now imagine that an environmental disaster strikes our invented society after several generations have enjoyed the fruits of neuromedia. The electronic communication grid that allows neuromedia to function is destroyed. Suddenly no one can access the shared cloud of information by thought alone. […] for the inhabitants of this society, losing neuromedia is an immensely unsettling experience; it’s like a normally sighted person going blind. They have lost a way of accessing information on which they’ve come to rely […] Just as overreliance on one sense can weaken the others, so overdependence on neuromedia might atrophy the ability to access information in other ways, ways that are less easy and require more creative effort. (Lynch 2016: 1–6)

One conclusion Lynch has drawn from such thought experiments is that understanding has a value that mere knowledge lacks, a position we’ve seen has been embraced for different reasons in §4 by Kvanvig and others. A further conclusion, advanced by Pritchard (2013) and Carter (2017), concerns the extent to which the acquisition of knowledge involves ‘epistemic dependence’—viz., dependence on factors outwith one’s cognitive agency. They argue that the greater the scope of epistemic dependence, the more valuable it becomes to cultivate virtues like intellectual autonomy that regulate the appropriate reliance and outsourcing (e.g., on other individuals, technology, medicine, etc.) while at the same time maintaining one’s intellectual self-direction.


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Other Internet Resources


Thanks to Earl Conee, Alan Millar and several referees at the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for useful comments on earlier versions of this entry.

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