# The Kochen-Specker Theorem

*First published Mon Sep 11, 2000; substantive revision Tue Sep 6, 2022*

The Kochen-Specker theorem is an important and subtle topic in the foundations of quantum mechanics (QM). The theorem demonstrates the impossibility of a certain type of interpretation of QM in terms of hidden variables (HV) that naturally suggests itself when one begins to consider the project of interpretating QM.We here present the theorem/argument and the foundational discussion surrounding it at different levels. The reader looking for a quick overview should read the following sections and subsections: 1, 2, 3.1, 3.2, 4, and 6. Those who read the whole entry will find proofs of some non-trivial claims in supplementary documents.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Background to the KS Theorem
- 3. Statement and Proof of the KS Theorem
- 4. The Functional Composition Principle
- 5. Escaping the KS Argument
- 6. The Question of Empirical Testing
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

QM has the peculiar property that quantum-mechanical states imply, in general, only statistical restrictions on the results of measurements. The natural conclusion to be drawn is that these states are incomplete descriptions of quantum systems. QM, thus, would be incomplete in the sense that a typical QM state description of an individual system could be supplemented with a more complete description in terms of an HV theory. In an HV description of the system the QM probabilities would be naturally interpreted as epistemic probabilities of the sort that arise in ordinary statistical mechanics. Such an HV description might not be practically useful, but one is tempted to think that it should at least be possible in principle. There are, however, two powerful theorems to the effect that such a description is subject to severe constraints: QM, given certain at least prima facie plausible premises, cannot be supplemented by an HV theory. The more famous of these two theorems is Bell’s theorem which states that, given a premise of locality, an HV model cannot match the statistical predictions of QM. The second important no-go theorem against HV theories is the theorem of Kochen and Specker (KS) which states that, given a premise of noncontextuality (to be explained presently) certain sets of QM observables cannot consistently be assigned values at all (even before the question of their statistical distributions arises).

Before seeing the workings of the KS theorem in some detail, we must
clarify why it is of importance to philosophers of science. The
explicit premise of HV interpretations, as understood throughout
below, is one of *value
definiteness*:

(VD) All observables defined for a QM system have definite values at all times.

(Note that for
Bohmian Mechanics
often viewed as an HV interpretation of QM, this statement would have
to be qualified.)
^{[1]}
VD is motivated by an apparently innocuous assumption about
experimental results, which is reflected in the custom of referring to
quantum experiments as "measurements," namely, that these experiments
reveal vales that exist independently of being measured. (Note that we
do not need to assume here that the values are faithfully revealed by
measurement, but only that they exist!) This suggest a second,
seemingly innocuous assumption, that of *noncontextuality*:

(NC) If a QM system possesses a property (value of an observable), then it does so independently of any measurement context, i.e. independently ofhowthat value is eventually measured.

When applied to specific properties that can be measured in different incompatible measurements, NC says that these properties are the same in these different measurement situations.

Now, suppose we adopt the usual association of properties of a quantum system, that is, yes-no observables, and projection operators on the system’s Hilbert space.

(O) There is a one-one correspondence between properties of a quantum system and projection operators on the system’s Hilbert space

The KS theorem establishes a contradiction between VD + NC + O and QM; thus, acceptance of QM logically forces us to renounce either VD or NC or O.

If a HV theory satisfying these conditions were feasible, we would have a natural explanation of the statistical character of QM, and an elegant way of resolving the infamous measurement problem haunting all interpreters of QM (see the entry on quantum mechanics and the section on the measurement problem in the entry on philosophical issues in quantum theory for details). What the KS theorem shows is that a HV theory of the most straightforward sort, satisfying these conditions, is not an option. The HV program is left with only options that violate one or more of these conditions; see entries on Bohmian mechanics and modal interpretations of quantum mechanics.

## 2. Background to the KS Theorem

In the following, we will presuppose some familiarity with elementary
QM notions like ‘state’, ‘observable’,
‘value’ and their mathematical representatives
‘vector’, ‘(self-adjoint) operator’ and
‘eigenvalue’ [see the entry on
quantum mechanics
for details]. We will usually identify the observables and the operators
on an appropriate Hilbert space which represent them; if there is a
need to distinguish operators and observables, we write the operators
underlined and in boldface. (Thus an operator
** A** represents an observable

*A*.)

The present section states some elements of the historical and
systematic background of the KS theorem. Most importantly, an argument
by von Neumann (1932), a theorem by Gleason (1957), and a critical
discussion of both plus a later argument by Bell (1966) have to be
considered. Von Neumann, in his famous 1932 book *Die mathematischen
Grundlagen der Quantenmechanik*, disputed the possibility of
providing QM with an HV underpinning. He gave an argument that boils
down to the following: Consider the mathematical fact that, if
** A** and

**are self-adjoint operators, then any real linear combination of them (any**

__B__**= α**

__C__**+ β**

__A__**, where α, β are arbitrary real numbers) is also a self-adjoint operator. QM further dictates that:**

__B__- If
*A*and*B*(represented by self-adjoint operatorsand__A__) are observables on a system, then there is an observable__B__*C*(represented by self-adjoint operatordefined as before) on the same system.__C__ - If, for any QM state, the expectation values of
*A*and*B*are given by <*A*> and <*B*>, then the expectation value of*C*is given by <*C*>=α<*A*> + β<*B*>.

Now consider *A*, *B*, *C*, as above, and assume
they have definite values *v*(*A*),
*v*(*B*), *v*(*C*). Consider a
‘hidden state’ *V* which determines
*v*(*A*), *v*(*B*),
*v*(*C*). We can then derive from *V* trivial
‘expectation values’ which are just the possessed values
themselves: <*A*>_{V} =
*v*(*A*), and so
on.^{[2]}
Of course, these ‘expectation values’ do not, in general,
equal the QM ones: <*A*>_{V} ≠
<*A*> (we would indeed think of the latter as averages
over the former for different hidden states *V*!). However, von
Neumann requires that the <*A*>_{V},
like the <*A*>, conform to (2). This automatically
entails that the values themselves must conform to a condition
parallel to (2), i.e.:

*v*(*C*) = α*v*(*A*) + β*v*(*B*).

This, however, is impossible, in general. An example very easily
shows how (3) is violated, but because of its simplicity it also
shows the argument’s inadequacy. (This example is not due to von
Neumann himself, but to
Bell!^{[3]})
Let *A* = σ_{x} and *B* =
σ_{y}, then operator *C* = (σ_{x} +
σ_{y})/√2 corresponds to the observable of the
spin component along the direction bisecting *x* and
*y*. Now all spin components have (in suitable units) possible
values ±1 only, thus, the HV proponent is forced to ascribe
±1 to *A*, *B*, *C* as values, and thus as
‘expectation values’. But (3) now obviously cannot be
fulfilled, since ±1 ≠ (±1 + ±1)/√2.

The example illustrates why von Neumann’s argument is
unsatisfying. Nobody disputes the move from (2) to (3) for compatible
observables, i.e. those which, according to QM, are jointly measurable
in one arrangement. The above choice of *A*, *B*,
*C*, however, is such that any two of them are incompatible,
i.e. are not jointly observable. For these we will not want to require
any HV interpretation to meet (3), but only (2). The hidden values
need not conform with (3) in general, only the averages of their
values in a series of tests must conform with (2). The authority of
von Neumann’s argument comes from the fact that requirements (1) and
(2), *for QM states*, are consequences of the QM formalism, but
this does not in itself justify extending these requirements to the
hypothetical *hidden states*. Indeed, if (3) were
unrestrictedly true, this would nicely explain, in the presence of
hidden values, why (2) is. Von Neumann apparently thought that the HV
proponent is committed to this explanation, but this seems an
implausible restriction.

The KS theorem remedies this defect, and thus strengthens the case
against HV theories insofar as it assumes (3) only for sets of
observables {*A*, *B*,
*C*} which are all mutually compatible. The theorem requires
that only for compatible observables assumption (3) must hold.

A second, independent line of thought leading to the KS theorem is
provided by Gleason’s theorem (Gleason 1957). The theorem states that
on a Hilbert space of dimension greater than or equal to 3, the only
possible probability measures are the measures
μ(*P*_{α}) = Tr(*P*_{α}
*W*), where *P*_{α} is a projection
operator, *W* is the statistical operator characterizing the
system’s actual state and Tr is the trace
operation.^{[4]}
The *P*_{α} can be understood as representing
yes-no observables, i.e. questions for whether a QM system
‘living’ in such a Hilbert space has a property α or
not, and every possible property α is associated uniquely with a
vector |α> in the space — so, the task is to
unambiguously assign probabilities to all vectors in the space. Now,
the QM measure μ is continuous, so Gleason’s theorem in effect
proves *that every probability assignment to all the possible
properties in a three-dimensional Hilbert space must be
continuous*, i.e. must map all vectors in the space continuously
into the interval [0, 1]. On the other hand, an HV theory (if
characterized by VD + NC) would imply that of every property we can
say whether the system has it or not. This yields a trivial
probability function which maps all the *P*_{α}
to either 1 or 0, and, provided that values 1 and 0 both occur (which
follows trivially from interpreting the numbers as probabilities),
this function must clearly be discontinuous (cf. Redhead 1987:
28).

The proof of Gleason’s theorem is notoriously intricate. It is
notable, however, that this corollary of Gleason’s theorem can be
obtained more directly via means much more elementary than those
employed in Gleason’s proof. Bell (1982: 994, 1987: 164) credits
J. M. Jauch with drawing his attention (in 1963) to Gleason’s theorem,
and with pointing out that it implies the strengthening of von
Neumann’s result, with the additivity requirement only for commuting
observables. Bell then went on to prove the result in an elementary
way, without use of Gleason’s proof (Bell 1966). Unknown to Bell,
Specker had already arrived at this result, alluded to (but not
presented) in Specker (1960), as *ein elementargeometrisches
Argument*.^{[5]}
The argument was presented in Kochen and Specker (1967). Bell’s proof
and the Kochen-Specker proof utilize similar constructions in
3-dimensional Hilbert space, though they differ in their details.
Kochen and Specker go on to explicitly construct a finite set of
projections that cannot be assigned values subject to the constraint
that the additivity requirement (3) hold when *A*
and *B* commute. Though Bell does not do so, one can readily
obtain from Bell’s construction also a finite set of observables that
cannot be assigned values subject to the additivity constraint for
commuting observables (see Mermin 1993).

After having offered his variant of the argument against HV theories from Gleason’s theorem, Bell proceeds to criticise it. His strategy parallels the one against von Neumann. Bell points out that his own Gleason-type argument against arbitrary closeness of two opposite-valued points presupposes non-trivial relations between values of non-commuting observables, which are only justified given an assumption of noncontextuality (NC). He proposes as an analysis of what went wrong that his own argument “tacitly assumed that measurement of an observable must yield the same value independently of what other measurements may be made simultaneously” (1966: 9). In opposition to von Neumann, the Gleason-type argument derives restrictions on value assignments like (3) only for sets of compatible observables; but still one and the same observable can be a member of different commuting sets, and it is essential to the arguments that the observable gets assigned the same value in both sets, i.e. that the value assignment is not sensitive to a context.

## 3. Statement and Proof of the KS Theorem

### 3.1 Statement of the KS Theorem

An explicit statement of the KS theorem runs thus:

Let H be a Hilbert space of QM state vectors of dimensionx≥ 3. There is a setMof observables on H, containingyelements, such that the following two assumptions are contradictory:(KS1) All

ymembers ofMsimultaneously have values, i.e. are unambiguously mapped onto real numbers (designated, for observablesA,B,C, …, byv(A),v(B),v(C), …).(KS2) Values of all observables in M conform to the following constraints:

(a) IfA,B,Care all compatible andC=A+B, thenv(C) =v(A)+v(B);(b) if

A,B,Care all compatible andC=A·B, thenv(C) =v(A)·v(B).

Assumption KS1 of the theorem obviously is an equivalent of VD.
Assumptions KS2 (a) and (b) are called the *Sum Rule* and the
*Product Rule*, respectively, in the literature. (The reader
should again note that, in opposition to von Neumann’s implicit
premise, these rules non-trivially relate the values of
*compatible* observables only.) Both are consequences of a
deeper principle called the functional composition principle (FUNC),
which in turn is a consequence of (among other assumptions) NC. The
connection between NC, FUNC, Sum Rule and Product Rule will be made
explicit in Section 4.

The KS Theorem claims the existence of a set M with a certain property
(i.e. being such that KS1 and KS2 are
contradictory)^{[6]}
and the proof proceeds by explicitly presenting such a set, for different
choices of *x* and *y*. In the original KS proof *x*=3
and *y*=117. More
recently proofs involving less observables have been given by (among
many others) Peres (1991, 1995) for *x*=3 and *y*=33, by
Kernaghan (1994) for *x*=4 and *y*=20 and by Cabello
*et al*. (1996) for *x*=4 and *y*=18. The KS
proof is notoriously complex, and we will only sketch it in Section
3.4. The Peres proof establishes the KS result in full strength, with
great simplicity, and, moreover, in an intuitively accessible way,
since it operates in three dimensions; we refer the reader to Peres
(1995: 197–99). The proofs by Kernaghan and Cabello *et
al*. each establish a contradiction in four dimensions. These are
weaker results, of course, than the KS theorem (since every
contradiction in 3 dimensions is also a contradiction in higher
dimensions, but not conversely). However, these other proofs are very
simple and instructive. Moreover, it can be shown (Pavičić
*et al*. 2005) that *y*=18 is the lowest number for
which the KS theorem holds true, so we start by presenting the proof
of Cabello and his co-workers in Section 3.2. Finally, in Section 3.5,
we explain an argument by Clifton (1993) where *x*=3 and
*y*=8 and an additional statistical assumption yields an easy
and instructive KS argument.

### 3.2 A Quick KS Argument in Four Dimensions (Cabello *et al*.)

A particularly easy KS argument proceeds in a four-dimensional Hilbert
space H_{4}. We will use the following, which will be proved
in the next section:

(1) From KS2 we can derive a constraint on value assignments to
projection operators, namely that for every set of projection
operators *P*_{1}, *P*_{2},
*P*_{3}, *P*_{4}, corresponding to the
four distinct eigenvalues *q*_{1},
*q*_{2}, *q*_{3}, *q*_{4}
of an observable Q on H4 the following holds:

(VC1′)v(P_{1}) +v(P_{2}) +v(P_{3}) +v(P_{4}) = 1, wherev(P_{i}) = 1 or 0, fori= 1, 2, 3, 4.

((VC1′) is a variant of (VC1) which we prove explicitly in the next section.) This means in effect that of every set of four orthogonal rays in H4 exactly one is assigned the number 1, the others 0.

(2) Although the Hilbert space mentioned in the theorem, in order to
be suited for QM, must be *complex*, it is enough, in order to
show the inconsistency of claims KS1 and KS2, to consider a
*real* Hilbert space of the same dimension. So, instead of H4
we consider a real Hilbert space R4 and translate VC1′ into the
requirement: Of every set of orthogonal rays in R4, exactly one is
assigned the number 1 and the others 0. As usual in the literature, we
translate all this into the following colouring problem: *Of every
set of orthogonal rays in R4 exactly one must be coloured white, the
others black.* This, however, is impossible, as is shown
immediately by the following table (Cabello *et al*. 1996):

0,0, 0,1 |
0,0, 0,1 |
1,−1, 1,−1 |
1,−1, 1,−1 |
0,0, 1,0 |
1,−1, −1,1 |
1,1, −1,1 |
1,1, −1,1 |
1,1, 1,−1 |

0,0, 1,0 |
0,1, 0,0 |
1,−1, −1,1 |
1,1, 1,1, |
0,1, 0,0 |
1,1, 1,1 |
1,1, 1,−1 |
−1,1, 1,1 |
−1,1, 1,1 |

1,1, 0,0 |
1,0, 1,0 |
1,1, 0,0 |
1,0, −1,0 |
1,0, 0,1 |
1,0, 0,−1 |
1,−1, 0,0 |
1,0, 1,0 |
1,0, 0,1 |

1,−1, 0,0 |
1,0, −1,0 |
0,0, 1,1 |
0,1, 0,−1 |
1,0, 0,−1 |
0,1, −1,0 |
0,0, 1,1 |
0,1, 0,−1 |
0,1, −1,0 |

There are 4 x 9 = 36 entries in this table. These entries are taken
from a set of 18 rays and every ray appears twice. It is easy
to verify that every column in the table represents a set of four
*orthogonal* rays. Since there are 9 columns, we must end up
with an *odd* number of the table’s entries coloured
white. However, since every ray appears twice any time we colour one
of them white, we commit ourselves to colouring an even number of the
entries white. It follows that the total number of table entries
coloured white must be even, *not* odd. Thus, a colouring of
these 18 rays in accordance with VC1′ is impossible. (Note for
future reference that the first part of the argument — the
argument for ‘odd’ — uses only VC1′, while
the second — the argument for ‘even’ — relies
essentially on NC, by assuming that occurrences of the same ray in
different columns are assigned the same number!)

### 3.3 The Original KS Argument. Technical Preliminaries.

The original KS proof operates on a three-dimensional complex Hilbert
space H_{3}. It requires two things: (1) sets of triples of
rays which are orthogonal in H_{3}; (2) a constraint to the
effect that of every orthogonal triple one ray gets assigned the
number 1, the two others 0. Both can be achieved as follows:

We consider an arbitrary operator *Q* on H_{3} with
three distinct eigenvalues *q*_{1},
*q*_{2}, *q*_{3}, its eigenvectors
|*q*_{1}>, |*q*_{2}>,
|*q*_{3}>, and projection operators
*P*_{1}, *P*_{2}, *P*_{3}
projecting on the rays spanned by these vectors. Now,
*P*_{1}, *P*_{2}, *P*_{3}
are themselves observables (namely, *P*_{i} is a
‘yes-no observable’ corresponding to the question
‘Does the system have value *q*_{i} for
Q?’). Moreover, *P*_{1}, *P*_{2},
*P*_{3} are mutually compatible, so we can apply the
Sum Rule and Product Rule, and thereby derive a constraint on the
assignment of values
(Proof):

(VC1)v(P_{1}) +v(P_{2}) +v(P_{3}) = 1, wherev(P_{i}) = 1 or 0,

fori= 1, 2, 3.

The arbitrary choice of an observable *Q* defines new
observables *P*_{1}, *P*_{2},
*P*_{3} which, in turn, select rays in
H_{3}. So, to impose that observables *P*_{1},
*P*_{2}, *P*_{3} all have values means
to assign numbers to rays in H_{3}, and VC1, in particular,
means that of an arbitrary triple of orthogonal rays, specified by
choice of an arbitrary *Q* (briefly: an orthogonal triple in
H_{3}), exactly one of its rays is assigned 1, the others 0.
Now, if we introduce different incompatible observables *Q*,
*Q*′, *Q*″, … these observables
select different orthogonal triples in H_{3}. Assumption (1)
of the KS theorem (which, effectively, is VD) now tells us that every
one of these triples has three values, and VC1 tells us that these
values must be for every triple, exactly {1, 0, 0}. What KS now shows
is that, *for a specific finite set of orthogonal triples in
H _{3}, an assignment of numbers* {1, 0, 0}

*to every one of them (matching in common rays) is impossible*. Further reflection yields that while H

_{3}is complex, it is in fact enough to consider a real three-dimensional Hilbert space R

_{3}. For we can show that if an assignment of values according to VC1 is possible on H

_{3}, then it is possible on R

_{3}. Contrapositively, if the assignment is impossible on R

_{3}, then it is impossible on H

_{3}. So we can fulfill the conditions necessary to get the KS proof started and at the same time reduce the problem to one on R

_{3}. Now, the equivalent in R

_{3}of an arbitrary orthogonal triple in H

_{3}, is, again, an arbitrary triple of orthogonal rays (briefly: an orthogonal triple in R

_{3}). So, if KS want to show that, for a specific set of

*n*orthogonal triples in H

_{3}(where

*n*is a natural number), an assignment of numbers {1, 0, 0} to every one of them is impossible, it is enough for them to show that,

*for a specific set of n orthogonal triples in*R

_{3},

*an assignment of numbers*{1, 0, 0}

*to every one of them is impossible*. And this is exactly what they do.

It should be stressed that at this point there is no direct connection
between R_{3} and physical space. KS wish to show that for an
arbitrary QM system requiring a representation in a Hilbert space of
at least three dimensions, the ascription of values in conjunction
with condition (KS2) (Sum Rule and Product Rule) is impossible, and in
order to do this it is sufficient to consider the space
R_{3}. This space R_{3}, however, does not represent
physical space for the quantum system at issue. In particular,
orthogonality in R_{3} is not to be confused with
orthogonality in physical space. This becomes obvious if we move to an
example of a QM system sitting in physical space and at the same time
requiring a QM representation in H_{3}, e.g. the spin degree
of freedom of a one-particle spin-1 system. Given an arbitrary
direction α in physical space and an operator
*S*_{α}
representing the observable of a spin component in direction
α,
H_{3} is spanned by the eigenvectors of
*S*_{α},
namely
|*S*_{α}=1>,
|*S*_{α}=0>,
|*S*_{α}=−1>,
which are mutually orthogonal in H_{3}. The fact that these three
vectors corresponding to three possible results of measurement in one
spatial direction are mutually orthogonal illustrates the different
senses of orthogonality in H_{3} and in physical space. (The reason
lies, of course, in the structure of QM, which represents different
values of an observable by different directions in H_{3}.)

KS themselves, in the abstract, proceed in exactly the same way, but
they illustrate with an example that *does* establish a direct
connection with physical space. It is important to see this
connection, but also to be clear that it is produced by KS’s
example and is not inherent in their mathematical result. KS propose
to consider a one-particle spin-1 system and the measurement of the
squared components of orthogonal directions of spin in physical space
*S _{x}*

^{2},

*S*

_{y}^{2},

*S*

_{z}^{2}, which are compatible (while

*S*,

_{x}*S*,

_{y}*S*themselves are not).

_{z}^{[7]}Measurement of a squared component of spin determines only its absolute value. Here, they derive a slightly different constraint on value assignments, again using the Sum Rule and the Product Rule (Proof):

(VC2)v(S_{x}^{2}) +v(S_{y}^{2}) +v(S_{z}^{2}) = 2, wherev(S_{α}^{2}) = 1 or 0,

for α =x,y,z.

Now, since *S _{x}*

^{2},

*S*

_{y}^{2},

*S*

_{z}^{2}are compatible, there is an observable O such that

*S*

_{x}^{2},

*S*

_{y}^{2},

*S*

_{z}^{2}are all functions of O. So, the choice of an arbitrary such O fixes

*S*

_{x}^{2},

*S*

_{y}^{2},

*S*

_{z}^{2}and, since the latter can be directly associated with mutually orthogonal rays in H

_{3}, again fixes the choice of an orthogonal triple in H

_{3}. The resulting problem here is to assign numbers {1, 1, 0} to an orthogonal triple in H

_{3}specified by the choice of O or, more directly, of

*S*

_{x}^{2},

*S*

_{y}^{2},

*S*

_{z}^{2}. This is, of course, the mirror-image of our previous problem of assigning numbers {1, 0, 0} to such a triple, and we need not consider it separately.

However, the choice of a specific O that selects observables
*S _{x}*

^{2},

*S*

_{y}^{2},

*S*

_{z}^{2}at the same time selects three orthogonal rays in physical space, namely by fixing a coordinate system ±

*x*, ±

*y*, ±

*z*(which defines along which orthogonal rays the squared spin components are to be measured)

*in physical space*. So now, by choice of an observable O, there

*is*a direct connection of directions in space with directions in H

_{3}: orthogonality in H

_{3}now

*does*correspond to orthogonality in physical space. The same holds for R

_{3}, if, in order to give an argument for H

_{3}, we consider R

_{3}. Orthogonality in R

_{3}now corresponds to orthogonality in physical space. It is important to notice that this correspondence is not necessary to give the argument, even if we insist that the pure mathematical facts should be supplemented by a physical interpretation — since we have, just before, seen an example without any correspondence. The point is only that we

*can*devise an example such that there is a correspondence. In particular, we can now follow the proof in R

_{3}and all along imagine a system sitting in physical space, namely a spin-1 particle, returning three values upon measurement of three physical magnitudes, associated directly with orthogonal directions in physical space, namely

*v*(

*S*

_{x}^{2}),

*v*(

*S*

_{y}^{2}),

*v*(

*S*

_{z}^{2}), for arbitrary choices of

*x*,

*y*,

*z*. The KS proof then shows that it is impossible (given its premises, of course) to assign to the spin-1 particle values for all these arbitrary choices. That is, the KS argument shows that (given the premises) a spin 1 particle cannot possess all the properties at once which it displays in different measurement arrangements.

Three further features which have become customary in KS arguments need to be mentioned:

(1) Obviously, we can unambiguously specify any ray in R_{3} through the
origin by just giving one point contained in it. KS thus identify
rays with points on the unit sphere E. KS do not need to refer to
concrete coordinates of a certain point, since their argument is
‘coordinate-free’. We will, however, for illustration
sometimes mention concrete points and then (a) use Cartesian
coordinates to check orthogonality relations and (b) specify rays by
points not lying on E. (Thus, e.g., the triple of points (0, 0, 1),
(4, 1, 0), (1, –4, 0) is used to specify a triple of orthogonal
rays.) Both usages conform with the recent literature (see e.g. Peres
(1991) and Clifton (1993)).

(2) We translate the constraints (VC1) and (VC2) on value ascriptions into constraints for colouring the points. We can, operating under (VC1) colour the points white (for “1”) and black (for “0”), or, operating under (VC2) colour the points white (for “0”) and black (for “1”). In either case the constraints translate into the same colouring problem.

(3) KS illustrate orthogonality relations of rays by graphs which
have come to be called *KS diagrams*. In such a diagram each
ray (or point specifying a ray) is represented by a vertex. Vertices
joined by a straight line represent orthogonal rays. The colouring
problem then translates into the problem of colouring the vertices of
the diagram white or black such that joined vertices cannot be both
white and triangles have exactly one white vertex.

### 3.4 The Original KS Argument. Sketch of the Proof.

KS proceed in two steps.

(1) In the first (and decisive) step they show *that two rays with
opposite colours cannot be arbitrarily close*. They first show that the
diagram
Γ_{1}
depicted in Fig. 1 (where for the time being we ignore the colours
specified in the figure) can be constructed, only if
a_{0} and a_{9} are separated by an angle
θ
with 0
≤
θ
≤
sin^{−1}(1/3)
(Proof).

Figure 1: Ten-point KS graph Γ_{1}with inconsistent colouring.

Consider now (for a *reductio ad absurdum*) that a_{0} and
a_{9} have different colours. We arbitrarily colour
a_{0} white and a_{9} black. The colouring
constraints then force us to colour the rest of the diagram as is
done in Fig. 1, but this requires that a_{5} and a_{6}
are orthogonal and both white — which is forbidden. Hence, two
points closer than sin^{−1}(1/3) cannot have different
colours. Contrapositively, two points of different colour cannot be
closer than sin^{−1}(1/3).

(2) KS now construct another quite complicated KS diagram
Γ_{2}
in the following way. They consider a realization of
Γ_{1}
for an angle
θ=18°
<
sin^{−1}(1/3). Now they choose three orthogonal points
*p*_{0}, *q*_{0}, *r*_{0} and space interlocking
copies of
Γ_{1}
between them such that every instance of point a_{9} of one
copy of
Γ_{1}
is identified with the instance of a_{0} of the next
copy. In this way five interlocking copies of
Γ_{1}
are spaced between *p*_{0} and *q*_{0} and all five
instances of a_{8} are identified with *r*_{0}
(likewise five such interlocking copies are spaced between *q*_{0} and
*r*_{0}, identifying all copies of a_{8} with *p*_{0},
and between *p*_{0} and *r*_{0}, identifying all copies of
a_{8} with *q*_{0}). That
Γ_{2}
is constructible is borne out directly by the construction
itself. Spacing out five copies of Γ_{1} with angles
θ=18°
between instances of a_{0}
will space out an angle of 5x18° = 90° which is exactly what
is required. Moreover, wandering from one copy of
Γ_{1}
to the next between, say, *p*_{0} and *q*_{0} is
equivalent to a rotation by 18° of the copy about the axis through
the origin and *r*_{0}, which evidently conserves the
orthogonality between the points a_{0} and a_{9} of
the copy and *r*_{0}.

Figure 2: 117-point KS graph Γ_{2}

(FromKochen and Specker 1967, 69;by permission of the Indiana University Mathematics Journal)

However, although
Γ_{2} is
constructible it is *not* consistently colourable. From the
first step we know that a copy of
Γ_{1} with
θ=18°
requires that points a_{0} and a_{9} have equal
colour. Now, since a_{9} in one copy of
Γ_{1}
is identical to a_{0} in the next copy, a_{9} in the
second copy must have the same colour as a_{0} in the
first. Indeed, by repetition of this argument all instances of
a_{0} must have the same colour. Now, *p*_{0},
*q*_{0}, *r*_{0} are identified with points
a_{0}, so they must be either all white or all black — both
of which are inconsistent with the colouring constraint that exactly
one of them be white.

If from the 15 copies of
Γ_{1}
used in the process of constructing
Γ_{2}
we subtract those points that were identified with each other, we
end up with 117 different points. So, what KS have shown is that a set
of 117 yes-no observables cannot consistently be assigned values in
accordance with VC1 (or, equivalently, VC2).

Note that in the construction of
Γ_{1},
i.e. the set of 10 points forming 22 interlocking triples, all
points except a_{9} appear in more than one triple. In
Γ_{2} every
point appears in a multiplicity of triples. It is here that the
noncontextuality premise is crucial to the argument: we assume that
an arbitrary point keeps its value 1 or 0 as we move from one
orthogonal triple to the next (i.e. from one maximal set of
compatible observables to another).

### 3.5 A Statistical KS Argument in Three Dimensions (Clifton)

Recall KS’s first step, which establishes that two points with opposite colour cannot be arbitrarily close. It is this first step which carries the whole force of the argument. Bell had established it in a different way and had then argued that in a noncontextual HV interpretation points with opposite colour must be arbitrarily close. It is this first step that Clifton exploits in an argument that combines Bell’s and KS’s ideas.

Figure 3: 8-point KS-Clifton graph Γ_{3}with inconsistent colouring.

Consider the KS diagram
Γ_{3}
shown in Figure 3 which obviously is a part of KS’s
Γ_{1},
but which has additional concrete assignments of eight points
satisfying the orthogonality relations (and thus proving directly
that
Γ_{3}
is constructible). From our previous colouring constraints (joined
points are not both white and a triangle has exactly one white point)
we see immediately that
Γ_{3}
is colourable only if the outermost points are not both white (which
would require, as shown in Fig. 3, that two joined points are white —
contrary to the constraints). Moreover, we easily calculate the angle
between the two outermost points to be
cos^{−1}(1/3).^{[8]}
So we conclude that if one wants to colour all eight points and
wants to colour white one of the outer ones, then the other must be
black. Taking into account that we can insert a diagram between any
two points in R_{3} which are separated by exactly the angle
cos^{−1}(1/3) and translating our problem back from a
colouring problem into KS’s example (constraint VC2), we end
with a constraint
VC2′:

(VC2′) If, for a spin-1 system, a certain directionxof spin in space is assigned value 0, then any other directionx′ which lies away fromxby an angle cos^{−1}(1/3) must be assigned value 1, or, in symbols: Ifv(S_{x})=0, thenv(S_{x′})=1.

The argument so far has made use of the original KS conditions KS1 and KS2. We now assume, in addition, that any constraint on value assignments will show up in the measurement statistics. In particular:

(3) If prob[v(A)=a] = 1, andv(A)=aimpliesv(B)=b, then prob[v(B)=b] = 1.

Despite the use of statistics, this reasoning crucially differs from
von Neumann’s argument. Von Neumann had argued that algebraic
relations between values should transfer into the statistics of the
measured values, therefore the QM constraints on these statistics
should have value constraints as their exact mirror images — which
reasoning leads us to derive value constraints from statistical
constraints (for arbitrary observables). Here, on the contrary, we
derive a value constraint independently from any statistical
reasoning, and then conclude that this constraint should transfer
into the measurement
statistics.^{[9]}

Now,
VC2′
and the statistical condition (3) entail: If
prob[*v*(*S*_{x})=0]=1, then
prob[*v*(*S*_{x′})=1]=1. This,
however, contradicts the statistics derived from QM for a state where
prob[*v*(*S*_{x})=0] =
1.^{[10]} In fact,
there is a probability of 1/17 that
*v*(*S*_{x′}=0).
So, in a long-run test 1/17 of the spin-1 particles will violate the
constraint.

If we accept Clifton’s statistical reasoning, we have an entirely valid KS argument establishing a contradiction between an HV interpretation of QM and the very predictions of QM. Clifton presents also a slightly more complex set of 13 observables yielding, along the same lines, a statistical contradiction of 1/3.

Clifton’s argument uses 8 (or 13) observables, fixes a value of one of
them (*S*_{x}) and derives a HV prediction at
variance with a QM prediction for a second one
(*S*_{x′}). Hence, if a state can be
produced where the QM system definitely has
value *v*(*S*_{x})=0 the predictions
can be tested empirically. But fixing such a state experimentally is
not an easy matter. So Clifton’s argument depends on a state that may
be difficult to produce or isolate. Recently, a construction of 13
observables has been found that allows for a state-independent
statistical argument (Yu and Oh 2012).

## 4. The Functional Composition Principle

The key ingredients of the KS theorem are the constraints on value
assignments spelled out in (2): the Sum Rule and Product Rule. They
can be derived from a more general principle, called the *Functional
Composition Principle*
(FUNC).^{[11]}
The principle trades on the mathematical fact that for a
self-adjoint operator ** A** operating on a
Hilbert space, and an arbitrary function f:

**R**→

**R**(where

**R**is the set of the real numbers), we can define f(

**) and show that it also is a self-adjoint operator (hence, we write**

__A__**). If we further assume that to every self-adjoint operator there corresponds a QM observable, then the principle can be formulated thus:**

__f(A)__FUNC:Letbe a self-adjoint operator associated with observable A, let f:AR→Rbe an arbitrary function, such thatis another self-adjoint operator, and let |φ> be an arbitrary state; thenf(A)is associated uniquely with an observablef(A)f(A) such that:v(f(A))^{|φ>}=f(v(A))^{|φ>}

(We introduce the state superscript above to allow for a possible dependence of values on the particular quantum state the system is prepared in.) The Sum Rule and the Product Rule are straightforward consequences of FUNC [Proof]. FUNC itself is not derivable from the formalism of QM, but a statistical version of it (called STAT FUNC) is [Proof]:

STAT FUNC:GivenA,f, |φ> as defined in FUNC, then, for an arbitrary real numberb:prob[v(f(A))^{|φ>}=b] = prob[f(v(A))^{|φ>}=b]

But STAT FUNC cannot only be derived from the QM formalism; it also
follows from FUNC
[Proof].
This can be seen as providing “a plausibility argument for FUNC”
(Redhead 1987: 132): STAT FUNC is true, as a matter of the mathematics
of QM. Now, if FUNC were true, we could derive STAT FUNC, and thus
understand part of the mathematics of QM as a consequence of
FUNC.^{[12]}

But how can we derive FUNC itself, if not from STAT FUNC? It is a direct consequence of STAT FUNC and three assumptions (two of which are familiar from the introduction):

Value Realism (VR):If there is an operationally defined real number α, associated with a self-adjoint operatorand if, for a given state, the statistical algorithm of QM forAyields a real number β with β = prob(Av()=α), then there exists an observableAAwith value α.

Value Definiteness (VD):All observables defined for a QM system have definite values at all times.

Noncontextuality (NC):If a QM system possesses a property (value of an observable), then it does so independently of any measurement context.

VR and NC require further explanation. First, we need to
explain the content of VR. The statistical algorithm of QM tells us how
to calculate a probability from a given state, a given observable and
its possible value. Here we understand it as a mere mathematical device without
any physical interpretation: Given a Hilbert space vector, an operator
and its eigenvalues, the algorithm tells us how to calculate new
numbers (which have the properties of probabilities). In addition, by
‘operationally defined’ we here simply mean ‘made up
from a number which we know to denote a real property’. So, VR, in
effect, says that, if we have a real property
Γ
(value
Γ
of an observable
G), and we are able to construct from
Γ
a
new number
α
and find an operator
** A** such that
α
is
an eigenvalue of

**, then (we have fulfilled everything necessary to apply the statistical algorithm; thus)**

__A__**represents an observable A and its value α is a real property.**

__A__
Second, a failure of NC could be understood in two
ways. Either the value of an observable might be context-dependent,
although the observable itself is not; or the value of an observable
might be context-dependent, because the observable itself is. In
either case, the independence from context of an observable implies
that there is a correspondence of observables and operators. This
implication of NC is what we will use presently in the derivation of
FUNC. We will indeed assume that, if NC holds, this means that the
*observable* — and *thereby* also its value — is
independent of the measurement context, i.e. is independent of how it
is measured. In particular, the independence from context of an
observable implies that there is a 1:1 correspondence of observables
and operators. This implication of NC is what we will use presently
in the derivation of FUNC. *Conversely*, failure of NC will be
construed solely as failure of the 1:1 correspondence.

From VR, VD, NC and STAT FUNC, we can derive FUNC as follows.
Consider an arbitrary state of a system and an arbitrary observable
*Q*. By VD, *Q* possesses a value
*v*(*Q*)=*a*. Thus, we can form the number
*f*(*v*(*Q*))=*b* for an arbitrary
function *f*. For this number, by STAT FUNC,
prob[*f*(*v*(*Q*))=*b*] =
prob[*v*(*f*(*Q*))=*b*]. Hence, we have,
by transforming probabilities according to STAT FUNC, created a new
self-adjoint operator ** f(Q)**, and associated it
with the two real numbers

*b*and prob[

*f*(

*v*(

*Q*))=

*b*]. Thus, by VR, there is an observable corresponding to

**with value**

__f(Q)__*b*, hence

*f*(

*v*(

*Q*))=

*v*(

*f*(

*Q*)). By NC, that observable is unique, hence FUNC follows.

## 5. Escaping the KS Argument

The previous section clarifies which possibilities the HV theorist has to escape the KS argument: denying one of the three premises which together entail FUNC (hence the Sum Rule and Product Rule).

### 5.1 No General Value Definiteness

VD, we recall, was the fundamental presupposition of a fully-fledged HV
interpretation. So, if, in order to escape a powerful argument
against the possibility of HV interpretations, these interpretations
drop their fundamental premise, this seems not to make much
sense. But some interpreters point out that, between holding that
only those observables which QM prescribes to have
values^{[13]}
and holding that all of them have values, there is some leeway,
namely, to propose that a set of observables, different from the one
prescribed in QM (but neither, in general, more than these, nor, of course, all)
have values. This option is called ‘partial value definiteness.’
One way to do this is to choose, once and for, a set of observables
that can be assigned definite values without running afoul of the KS
Theorem. The best-known example of this is the de Broglie-Bohm pilot
wave theory, on which position and functions of position always have
definite values. Another approach is to let the set of definite
observables vary with the state; this is the approach taken by various
modal interpretations. A variant on this approach is that of Bub
(1997), on which some observable *R* is chosen to to be
always-definite; the set of definite observables is then expanded to
the maximal set that avoids a KS obstruction.

The rocks and shoals of modal interpretations are beyond the scope of this article (see the entry on modal interpretations). We just note that it is by no means clear how these interpretations can manage to always pick out the right set of observables assumed to have values. ‘Right set’ here minimally means that observables we perceive as having values (i.e. those corresponding to the measurement apparatus’s pointer position) must always be included and must always reproduce the QM statistics. We also mention two important results which cast doubt on the feasibility of modal interpretations: First, it can be shown that either partial value definiteness collapses into total value definiteness (i.e., VD) or classical reasoning about physical properties must be abandoned (Clifton 1995). Second, it is possible to derive KS theorems even in certain modal interpretations (Bacciagaluppi 1995, Clifton 1996).

Recently it has been argued that the denial of VD is inconsistent with QM itself (Held 2008, 2012a, 2012b). The argument tries to show that VD is a consequence of the theory itself (QM → VD). If this is indeed the case we have — recalling that KS establish that QM & VD & NC implies a contradiction — an argument for the claim that QM alone implies contextuality. Since, in that case, QM also implies VD we get, all in all, an argument for the claim that QM must be interpreted in terms of contextual hidden variables.

### 5.2 Denial of Value Realism

The derivation of FUNC essentially consists in the construction of an
observable (i.e. *f*(*Q*)) via an operator (i.e.,
** f(Q)**) from the probability distribution of a
variable (i.e.

*f*(

*v*(

*Q*)) which number in turn is constructed from another variable, (i.e.

*v*(

*Q*)). Now, instead of denying that

*v*(

*Q*) exists in all cases (as the first option (5.1) would have it), we can reject that the existence of a number α and the construction of

**automatically lead to an observable, i.e. we reject VR. This amounts to rejecting that for every self-adjoint operator, there is a well-defined observable.**

__f(Q)__
Now, in order to formulate VR we had to give a reduced reading
to the statistical algorithm, i.e. that it is a mere mathematical
device for calculating numbers from vectors, operators and numbers.
This reading is very artificial and presupposes that a minimal interpretive
apparatus required to make physical sense of some operators (like
** Q**) can be withheld for others (like

**).**

__f(Q)__
Moreover, it seems entirely implausible to assume that some operators
— sums and products of operators that are associated with
well-defined observables — are themselves not associated with
well-defined observables, even if they mathematically inherit exact
values from their summands or factors. Put in a crude example, this
would amount to saying that to ask for a system’s energy is a
well-defined question, while to ask for the square of the system’s
energy is not, even if, from our answer to the first question and
trivial mathematics, we have a well-defined answer at hand. There
seems no good a priori reason to justify this restriction. So, to make
rejecting VR plausible at all, an additional proposal is made: It is
crucial to the KS argument that one and the same operator is
constructed from different maximal ones which are incompatible:
** f(Q)** is identical to

**, where**

__g(P)__**−**

__PQ__**≠ 0. We now assume that only the construction of**

__QP__**via**

__f(Q)__*Q*, but not the one via

*P*, leads to a well-defined observable in a certain context.

^{[14]}

This move however, automatically makes some observables context-sensitive. So, this way of motivating the denial of VR amounts to a kind of contextualism, which we might come by cheaper, by directly rejecting NC, and without any tampering with the statistical algorithm. (This fact explains why we did not mention denial of VR as a separate option in the introduction.).

### 5.3 Contextuality

Finally, we might accept VD and VR, but deny that our construction of
an observable *f*(*Q*) is unambiguous. Thus, though
** f(Q)** and

**are mathematically identical, we could assume that they correspond to different observables, arguing that an actual determination of**

__g(P)__*v*(

*f*(

*Q*)) must proceed via measuring

*Q*, but the determination of

*v*(

*g*(

*P*)) involves measuring

*P*which is incompatible with

*Q*. Since

*v*(

*f*(

*Q*)) and

*v*(

*g*(

*P*)) are thus outcomes of different measurement situations, there is no reason to assume that

*v*(

*f*(

*Q*)) =

*v*(

*g*(

*P*)). This way to block the KS proof comes to understanding

*f*(

*Q*) and

*g*(

*P*) as different observables (because of sensitivity to context), thus it amounts to rejecting NC. There are mainly two ways, in the literature, to further motivate this step. Accordingly, there are two important brands of contextuality to be discussed — causal and ontological contextuality.

The KS argument has been presented for possessed values of a QM system — independently of considerations about measurement. Indeed, in the argument measurement was mentioned only once and in the negative — in NC. However, since now we consider the rejection of NC, we must also take into account measurement and its complications. For that purpose it is good to explicate yet another principle that manifests our innocuous realism (see the introduction above), i.e. a principle of faithful measurement:

Faithful Measurement (FM):QM measurement of an observable faithfully delivers the value which that observable had immediately prior to the measurement interaction.

FM is also an extremely plausible presupposition of natural science, in general. (Note that FM entails VD, hence we could have given a KS argument for possible measurement results, using FM). Consider now the motivation, for the HV proponent, to reject NC. Obviously, the aim is to save other presuppositions, especially VD. Now, VD and NC are independent realist convictions, but NC and FM are not quite so independent. Indeed, we will see that rejection of NC entails the rejection of FM in one version of contextuality, and strongly suggests it in the other. (This makes more precise the somewhat cryptic remark from the introduction that it is not obvious what an interpretation endorsing the realist principle VD, but rejecting the realist principle NC, should look like. Such an interpretation would have to violate a third realist principle, i.e. FM.)

#### Causal Contextuality

A property (value of an observable) might be *causally* context-dependent in the
sense that it is causally sensitive to how it is measured. The basic
idea is that the observed value comes about as the effect of the
system-apparatus interaction. Hence, measuring a system via
interaction with a *P*-measuring apparatus might yield a value
*v*(*g*(*P*)), measuring the same system via
interaction with a *Q*-measuring apparatus a different value
*v*(*f*(*Q*)), although both observables are
represented by the same operator ** f(Q)** =

**. The difference in values is explained in terms of a context-dependence of the observables: The latter are context-dependent, since the different ways to physically realize them causally influence the system in different ways and thereby change the observed values.**

__g(P)__
If an interpreter wanted to defend causal contextuality, this would
entail abandoning FM, at least for observables of the type
*f*(*Q*) (non-maximal observables): Since their values
causally depend on the presence of certain measurement arrangements,
these arrangements are causally necessary for the values to come
about, thus the values cannot be present before the system-apparatus
interaction, and FM is violated. As an advantage of causal
contextualism the following might be pointed out. It does not imply
that the ontological status of the physical properties involved must
change, i.e. does not imply that they become relational. If the
property in an object is brought about via interaction with another
one, it can still be one which the object has for itself after the
interaction. However, the idea of causal contextuality is sometimes
discussed critically, since there is reason to think that it may be
empirically inadequate (see Shimony 1984, Stairs 1992).

#### Ontological Contextuality

A property (value of an observable) might be *ontologically*
context-dependent in the sense that in order for it to be well-defined
the specification of the observable it ‘comes from’ is
necessary. Thus, in order to construct a well-defined observable from
operator
** f(Q)** =

**, we need to know whether it is physically realized via observable**

__g(P)__*P*or observable

*Q*. This way out of the KS problem, was first noted (but not advocated) by van Fraassen (1973). There are, then, as many observables and kinds of physical properties for an operator

**as there are ways to construct**

__f(Q)__**from maximal operators. Without further explanation, however, this idea just amounts to an**

__f(Q)__*ad hoc*proliferation of physical magnitudes. A defender of ontological contextuality certainly owes us a more explicit story about the dependence of observable

*f*(

*Q*) on observable

*Q*. Two possibilities come to mind:

(a) We might think that *v*(*f*(*Q*)) just is not
a self-sustained physical property, but one which ontologically
depends on the presence of another property
*v*(*Q*). (Recall that in the proof of FUNC
*v*(*f*(*Q*)) *is* constructed from
*v*(*Q*).) But, since the position does not reject
questions about values of *f*(*Q*) in a
*P*-measurement situation as illegitimate (because it does not
trade on a notion of an observable being well-defined in one context
only!), this seems to lead to new and pressing questions, to say the
least. As an attempt to defend a contextualist *hidden
variables* interpretation, this position must concede that not
only does the system have, in the *Q*-measurement situation, a
value *v*(*Q*), but also, in a *P*-measurement
situation, it has a value *v*′(*Q*), although
perhaps *v*′(*Q*) ≠
*v*(*Q*). Now, questions for values of
*f*(*Q*) in this situation at least are legitimate. Does
*v*′(*Q*) imply another
*v*′(*f*(*Q*)) ≠
*v*(*f*(*Q*))? Or does
*v*′(*Q*), in opposition to
*v*(*Q*), not lead to a value of *f*(*Q*),
at all? Neither option seems plausible, for could we not, just by
switching for a certain prepared system between a *P*- and
*Q*-measurement situation either switch
*v*(*f*(*Q*)) in and out of existence or switch
between *v*(*f*(*Q*)) and
*v*′(*f*(*Q*))? (b) We might think that,
in order for *f*(*Q*) to be well-defined, one
measurement arrangement rather than the other is necessary. The idea
is strongly reminiscent of Bohr’s 1935 argument against EPR, and
indeed may be viewed as the appropriate extension of Bohr’s views on
QM to the modern HV discussion (see Held 1998, ch.7). In this version
of ontological contextualism the property
*v*(*f*(*Q*)), rather than depending on the
presence of another property *v*(*Q*), is dependent on
the presence of a *Q*-measuring apparatus. This amounts to a
holistic position: For some properties it only makes sense to speak of
them as pertaining to the system, if that system is part of a certain
system-apparatus whole. Here, the question for values of
*f*(*Q*) in a P-measurement situation *does*
become illegitimate, since *f*(*Q*)’s being well-defined
is tied to a *Q*-measurement situation. But again further
clarification is required. Does the position hold that, in opposition
to *f*(*Q*), *Q* itself is well-defined in a
*P*-measurement situation? If it does not, *Q* can
hardly have a value (since not being well-defined was the reason to
deny *f*(*Q*) a value), which means that we are not
considering an HV interpretation of the given type any longer, and
that there is no need to block the KS argument at all. If it does,
what explains that, in the *P*-measurement situation,
*Q* remains well-defined, but *f*(*Q*) loses this
status?

What becomes of FM in both versions of ontological contextualism?
Well, if we remain agnostic about how the position could be made
plausible, we can save FM, while, if we choose version (a) or (b) to
make it plausible, we lose it. Consider first an agnostic denial of
NC. FM says that every QM *observable* is faithfully
measured. Now, contextualism splits an operator which can be
constructed from two different noncommuting operators into two
observables, and ontological contextualism does not try to give us a
causal story which would ruin the causal independence of the measured
value from the measurement interaction embodied in FM. We simply
introduce a more fine-grained conception of observables, but can still impose FM for
these new contextual observables.

However, the concrete versions of ontological contextualism, by
attempting to motivate the contextual feature, ruin FM. Version (a)
allows *f*(*Q*) to be switched ‘on and off’
or to switch between different values upon the change between
*P*- and *Q*-measurement situations — which is a
flagrant violation of FM. Version (b) fares no better. It introduces
the ontological dependence on the measuring arrangement. It is hard to
see what else this should be, but the same causal dependence pushed to
a higher, ‘ontological’ key. Again, could we not, just by
flipping back and forth the measurement arrangement, change back and
forth whether *f*(*Q*) is well-defined, thus flip
*v*(*f*(*Q*)) in and out of existence?

Finally, we note that both types of ontological contextualism, in
opposition to the causal version, *do* entail that system
properties which we earlier thought to be intrinsic become
relational in the sense that a system can only have these properties
either if it has certain others, or if it is related to a certain
measurement arrangement.

## 6. The Question of Empirical Testing

Famously, the violation of Bell’s inequalities, prescribed by QM, has been confirmed experimentally. Is something similar possible for the KS theorem? We should distinguish three questions: (1) Is it possible to realize the experiment proposed by KS as a motivation of their theorem? (2) Is it possible to test the principles leading to the theorem: the Sum Rule and Product Rule, FUNC, or NC? (3) Is it possible to test the theorem itself?

(1) KS themselves describe a concrete experimental arrangement to
measure *S*_{x}^{2},
*S*_{y}^{2},
*S*_{z}^{2} on a one-particle spin-1 system as
functions of one maximal observable. An orthohelium atom in the
lowest triplet state is placed in a small electric field E of rhombic
symmetry. The three observables in question then can be measured as
functions of one single observable, the perturbation Hamiltonian
H_{s}. H_{s}, by the geometry of E, has three
distinct possible values, measurement of which reveals which two
of *S*_{x}^{2},
*S*_{y}^{2},
*S*_{z}^{2} have value 1 and which one has value
0 (see Kochen and Specker 1967: 72/311). This is, of course, a
proposal to realize an experiment exemplifying our above value
constraint (VC2). Could we also realize a (VC1) experiment,
i.e. measure a set of commuting projectors projecting on eigenstates
of one maximal observable? Peres (1995: 200) answers the question in
the affirmative, discusses such an experiment, and refers to Swift
and Wright (1980) for details about the technical feasibility. Kochen
and Specker’s experimental proposal has, however, not been further
pursued, because it does not provide a direct test of NC. Obviously, a
measurement of H_{S} measures one orthogonal triple only. An
HV proponent might well assume that the hidden state changes from one
measurement of H_{S} to the next (even if we prepare the same
QM state again) and thus maintain NC.

(2) In conjunction with manifestations of FUNC, i.e. the Sum Rule and
the Product Rule, QM yields constraints like VC1 or VC2 that
contradict VD. So, providing concrete physical examples that could,
given the Sum Rule and the Product Rule, instantiate VC1 or VC2 as
just outlined is not enough. We must ask whether these rules
themselves can be empirically supported. There was considerable
discussion of this question in the early 80s — explicitly about
whether the Sum Rule is empirically testable — and there was
general agreement that it is
not.^{[15]}

The reason is the following. Recall that the derivation of FUNC
established uniqueness of the new observable *f*(*Q*)
only in its final step (via NC). It is this uniqueness which
guarantees that one operator represents exactly one observable so that
observables (and thereby their values) in different contexts can be
equated. This allows one to establish indirect connections between
different incompatible observables. Without this final step, FUNC must
be viewed as holding relative to different contexts, the connection is
broken and FUNC is restricted to one set of observables which are all
mutually compatible. Then indeed FUNC, the Sum Rule and the Product
Rule become trivial, and empirical testing in these cases would be a
pointless
question.^{[16]}
It is NC that does all the work and deserves to be tested via
checking whether for incompatible *P*, *Q* such that
*f*(*Q*)=*g*(*P*) it is true that
*v*(*f*(*Q*))=*v*(*g*(*P*)). However,
though QM and a noncontextual HV theory contradict each other for a
single system, this contradiction involves incompatible observables
and, thus, is untestable (as we have just seen from Kochen and
Specker’s own proposal). Physicists have, however, made ingenious
proposals for overcoming this obstacle. It is well-known that the
consideration of two-particle systems and products of spin components
leads to very simple KS-type proofs (Mermin 1990b). Cabello and
Garcìa-Alcaine (1998) have shown that for such systems QM and a
noncontextual HV theory make different predictions for every single
case. Their reasoning makes no reference to locality considerations,
but as it requires two particles, such considerations might creep
in. Simon *et al*. (2000), have mapped the
Cabello/Garcìa-Alcaine scheme onto a combination of position and spin
observables for a single particle. Their experiment has been carried
out and has confirmed the QM predictions (Huang et al. 2003; see also more recently Huang et al. 2013). All the
mentioned authors consider their experimental proposals to be empirical
refutations of NC, but this has been doubted (Barrett and Kent 2004),
for reasons considered in the next paragraph.

(3) The KS theorem, by its mathematical nature, is not empirically
testable. However, we could, along the lines of the previous
paragraphs, try to measure a subset of a suitable KS-uncolourable
set. Especially, it should be possible to produce cases along the
lines of Clifton’s example (3.5) where QM and a noncontextual HV
theory make measurably different predictions. It seems as if such
cases could provide empirical tests of whether Nature is contextual
(though not whether such contextuality is of the causal or ontological
type).(For a recent version of such an approach see Tang and Yu 2017.)
From the 1980s on, it has been argued that such testing is
impossible. The KS theorem, it was claimed, leaves enough loopholes for
a HV theory at variance with QM, but able to reproduce the theory’s
empirical predictions. Pitowsky (1983, 1985) argued that it is
possible to restrict attention to a subset of directions in
R_{3} which are colourable. His argument, however, relies on a
non-standard version of probability theory that is regarded as
physically implausible. Meyer (1999) has exploited the
mathematical fact that a set D_{M} of directions in
R_{3} approximating the KS-set arbitrarily closely, but
with *rational* coordinates is KS-colourable. Meyer argues that
real measurements have finite precision and thus can never distinguish
between a direction in R_{3} and its approximation from
D_{M}. Kent (1999) has generalized the result for all Hilbert
spaces, and Clifton and Kent (2000) have shown that also a set of
directions D_{CK} such that every one direction is a member of
just *one* orthogonal triple approximates any direction
arbitrarily closely. In D_{CK} there are no interlocking
triples, the question of contextuality does not arise and
D_{CK} trivially is KS colourable. Clifton and Kent, in
addition, have explicitly shown that D_{CK} is large enough to
allow probability distributions over value assignments arbitrarily
close to all QM distributions. Meyer, Kent and Clifton (MKC) can be
understood as thus arguing that even an empirical test of
KS-uncolourable directions confirming the QM predictions cannot prove
the contextuality of Nature. Because of the test’s finite precision it
is impossible to disprove the contention that unwittingly we have
tested close-by members of a KS-colourable set. One quite obvious
objection to this type of argument is that the original KS argument
works for possessed values, not measured values, so the MKC argument,
dealing on finite precision of measurement, misses the mark. We might
not be able to test observables which are exactly orthogonal or
exactly alike in different tests, but it would be a strange
HV interpretation that asserts that such components do not exist (see
Cabello 1999 in Other Internet Resources). Of course, such a
noncontextual HV proposal would be immune to the KS argument, but it
would be forced to either assume that not for every one of the
continuously many directions in physical space there is an observable,
or else that there are not continuously many directions in physical
space. Neither assumption seems very attractive.

In addition, the MKC argument is dissatisfying even for measured values, since it exploits the finite precision of real measurements only in one of the above senses, but presupposes infinite precision in the other. MKC assume, for measured observables, that there is finite precision in the choice of different orthogonal triples, such that we cannot, in general, have exactly the same observable twice, as a member of two different triples. However, MKC still assume infinite precision, i.e. exact orthogonality, within the triple (otherwise the colouring constraints could find no application, at all). It has been claimed that this feature can be exploited to rebut the argument and to re-install contextualism (see Mermin 1999 and Appleby 2000, both in Other Internet Resources, and Appleby 2005).

Finally, it seems plausible to assume that probabilities vary
continuously as we change directions in R_{3}, so small imperfections of
selection of observables that block the argument (but only for measured
values!) in the single case will wash out in the long run (see Mermin
1999, in Other Internet Resources). This in itself does not constitute
an argument, since in the
colourable sets of observables in MKC’s constructions
probabilities also vary (in a sense)
continuously.^{[17]}
We might, however, exploit Mermin’s reasoning in the following
way. Reconsider Clifton’s set of eight directions (in Figure 3)
leading to a colouring constraint for the outermost points which
statistically contradicts the QM statistics by a fraction of
1/17. Using Clifton and Kent’s colourable set of directions
D_{CK} we are unable to derive the constraint for the eight
points, since these eight points do not lie in D_{CK}; namely,
as we move, in the colourable subset, from one mutually orthogonal
triple of rays to the next, we never hit upon exactly the same ray
again, but only on one approximating it arbitrarily closely. Assume a
set S of systems wherein observables, corresponding to members of
D_{CK} and approximating the eight directions in Fig. 3
arbitrarily closely, all have values — in accordance with the HV
premise. Then we *can* derive Clifton’s constraint for the
outermost points in the following sense. Consider the subset
*S*′ ⊂ *S* of systems where any direction
approximating point (1, 1, 1) gets value 1 (or colour white). In order
to meet the predictions of QM, in *S*′ all directions
approximating (1, 0, −1) and (1, −1, 0) must receive values such that
the probability of value 0 (or colour black) is extremely close to
1. Analogously, in another subset *S*″ ⊂ *S*
of systems with directions approximating (−1, 1, 1) as having value 1
(colour white) all directions approximating (1, 0, 1) and (1, 1, 0)
must receive values such that the probability of value 0 (colour
black) is extremely close to 1. Consider now members of
*S*′ ∩ *S*″. In any of them there will
be, for any approximation to (1, 0, −1) with value 0 (colour black),
an exactly orthogonal point that approximates (1, 0, 1) and also has
value 0 (colour black) such that there is a third orthogonal point
approximating (0, 1, 0) and having value 1 (colour white). Likewise
for (0, 0, 1). But (0, 1, 0) and (0, 0, 1) are orthogonal, and for all
members of *S*′ ∩ *S*″ the directions
*approximating* them both have value 1 (colour white), while QM
predicts that the probability for values 1 for the
*approximated* directions values is 0. In order to ensure that
this prediction is met, *S*′ ∩ *S*″ must
be an extremely small subset of *S*, which is to say that the
probability for both (1, 1, 1) and (−1, 1, 1) (the leftmost and
rightmost points in fig. 3) must be close to 0 and approximate 0
better and better as *S* grows. QM, on the contrary, predicts a
probability of 1/17. (Recall also that this number can be pushed up to
1/3 by choosing a set of 13 directions!)

Cabello (2002), using a very similar reasoning, has shown that the MKC
models lead to predictions that testably differ from the ones of
QM. For D_{CK}, he effectively uses the strategy sketched
above: QM gives probabilities for directions in the Clifton-Kent set
which their model must match in order to reproduce QM predictions. As
these directions are arbitrarily close to directions from a
KS-uncolourable set (or directions leading to Clifton’s constraint),
this leads to restrictions for these nearby points that are measurably
violated by the QM predictions. For Meyer’s D_{M} Cabello’s
case is even stronger. He explicitly presents a set of nine
*rational* vectors leading to predictions different from QM
(for three of these directions). Hence, the Meyer argument is
effectively rebutted (without recourse to Mermin’s requirement): Even
if there were only observables corresponding to the rational
directions in R_{3} (which in itself is an implausible assumption) a
theory assuming that they all have noncontextual values faithfully
revealed by measurement will be measurably at variance with QM. Assume
now that the Cabello directions were tested and the QM predictions
reliably confirmed, then this would (modulo the reliability of the
tests) constitute a proof that Nature is contextual.

So, in sum it seems that, as long as we assume that there are continuously many QM observables (corresponding to the continuum of directions in physical space), statistical tests building, e.g., on the Clifton 1993 or the Cabello/Garcìa-Alcaine 1998 proposal remain entirely valid as empirical confirmations of QM and, via the KS theorem, of contextuality. Since these statistical violations of the HV programme come about as contradictions of results of QM, VD, VR, and NC on the one hand, and QM and experiment on the other, the experimental data still force upon us the trilemma of giving up either VD or VR or NC. As we have seen, denial of value realism in the end becomes identical to a kind of contextualism, hence we really have only two options: (1) Giving up VD, either for all observables forbidden to have values in the orthodox interpretation (thus giving up the HV programme, as defined above), or for a subset of these observables (as modal interpretations do). (2) Endorse a kind of contextualism. Moreover, as things presently stand, the choice between these two options seems not to be a matter of empirical testing, but one of pure philosophical argument.

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## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Appleby, D. M., 2000, “Contextuality of Approximate Measurements”. [Preprint available online.]
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- Rajan, D. and Visser, M., 2017, “Kochen-Specker Theorem Revisited”. [Preprint available online.]
- Kochen Specker theorem on arxiv.org
- Ernst-Udo Wallenborn:
“Was ist das Kochen-Specker-Theorem?”

(in German, but with useful figures)