The Kokugaku (Native Japan Studies) School

First published Fri Nov 16, 2018; substantive revision Mon Jun 21, 2021

In its broadest sense, kokugaku has been used to refer to scholarship that takes Japan as its focus instead of China. In the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, however, it came to refer more narrowly to the effort to discern a native Way distinct from Buddhism and Confucianism within Japan’s most ancient writings, and to the attendant effort to resurrect that Way in the present. Most scholars agree on the major leaders of these studies during the Tokugawa period, with Motoori Norinaga (1730–1801) thought to be its greatest intellectual and Hirata Atsutane (1776–1843) its most effective popularizer.

Motoori Norinaga saw the roots of the discipline in Keichū’s (1640–1701) use of historical linguistics to analyze the eighth-century collection of poems called Man’yōshū, whereas Atsutane found it in the Japanese-studies academic efforts of Kada no Azumamaro (1669–1736). Both included Kamo no Mabuchi (1697–1769) in their list of founders. In any case, after Hirata Atsutane, the lineage of Kokugaku’s leaders became more complex as the new Meiji state used Kokugaku notions of racial identity and cultural superiority to mobilize support for Japan’s nationalist ideology and purported international destiny. After 1945 such notions of racial identity and cultural superiority were briefly considered taboo and replaced by less toxic arguments regarding Japanese uniqueness, though these too have morphed yet again into the broad category of Nihonjinron, “theories of Japaneseness” which is a major strain within contemporary Japanese popular culture.

1. Matters of Definition

The Japanese word kokugaku has been variously translated into English and this makes simple definition difficult. English terms like ‘Japan Studies’, ‘National Learning/Studies’, ‘nativism’ and ‘essentialism’ all have their advocates. One approach is to think of kokugaku as having broad and narrow meanings. Scholarship of all sorts expanded dramatically in Japan during the seventeenth century spurred on by relative tranquility, and increasing levels of prosperity and literacy. Alongside the more traditional studies of China, there arose new historical studies of things Japanese—history, literature, philology, poetics, customs, mythology, the tradition of kami worship and so on. Collectively those forms of Japanese studies can be thought of as kokugaku in the broad sense.

More narrowly, some of these studies in the eighteenth century came to focus on Japanese distinctiveness principally vis a vis China, which was now posited as an Other whose historical influence on Japan was construed as harmful. In the nineteenth century the frame of reference expanded to include Europe and the world as a whole. This nativist essentialism was also sometimes called kokugaku, and it came to be the crucible in which Japanese identity was forged. One interpretation was that to be Japanese was to partake in an intuitive conformity with the rhythms of nature, and to possess an untutored heart-mind that fostered the ancient arcadia. Yet another interpretation was that the Japanese people were descended from and as varied as the innumerable kami, some good and some bad, but unmistakably blessed when taken as a whole.

Strictly speaking, Kokugaku during the Tokugawa period (1600–1868) was neither a movement nor a school but rather a succession of schools—private academies—that had their own distinctive orientations and specialties, and in the analysis that follows we will begin by following the lead of Japanese scholarship by seeing the essence of Kokugaku in the writings of its Tokugawa-era paragons: Keichū, Azumamaro, Mabuchi, Norinaga, and Atsutane.

After the Meiji Restoration of 1868 Kokugaku became an ideologically charged academic field that was harnessed to create empire and imperial subjects at home and abroad. It also spawned related enquiries into folklore and ethnography. Following Japan’s military defeat and during the Allied Occupation 1945–52, aside from a handful of places such as Kokugaku-in University, Kokugaku was stripped of its imperial and spiritual coloring, leaving behind sterilized notions of what was asserted to be uniquely Japanese about Japan and its people. From roughly the 1980s these came to be grouped under the rubric Nihonjinron or theories of Japaneseness, reintroducing a spiritual component that can be seen in the animism characteristic of much anime and “soft power” diplomacy. As a result, the word kokugaku is no longer used in contemporary discourse to refer to present-day nativist or essentialist scholarship.

2. The Emergence of Kokugaku

2.1 Keichū (1640–1701)

Because the preeminent Motoori Norinaga located a genesis for his own studies in the scholarship of Keichū, most students of Kokugaku today accept Keichū as at least its forerunner. Keichū had a solidly samurai pedigree, though his father and grandfather fared poorly after 1600 under the new Tokugawa regime. He had a rigorous early education supervised by his mother, and at the age of 12 to fulfill a parental vow began the ten-year path to ordination in the Shingon Buddhist priesthood, becoming a high priest (Ajari) in 1663.

Keichū developed an interest in traditional waka, (31-syllable) Japanese verse, including the verses in Japan’s most ancient extant poetry anthology, the eighth-century Man’yōshū. One feature of seventeenth-century Japanese poetics was an awakening interest in the anthology, but only about 10% of its 4400 poems were accessible to Keichū’s contemporaries owing to the arcane method of its original transcription. To remedy this lacuna the Daimyo of Mito commissioned a commentary, the responsibility for which, in a roundabout fashion, devolved upon Keichū. It was for that philological work that he remains best known.

In terms of the Kokugaku tradition, three factors stand out in terms of why later Kokugakusha (native studies scholars) came to see him as a pioneer of their own work. First was Keichū’s near-mystical reverence for waka. By tradition waka were thought to be an invention of the kami rendering them ultimately beyond human ken, and Keichū felt this numinous quality intensely. Second was the relative sophistication of Keichū’s philology, which balanced historical linguistic analysis with an intuitive sense of the meaning behind the text. Later scholars attributed this to Keichū’s earlier study of Sanskrit as part of his study for the Shingon Buddhist priesthood. And third was his representation of the ancient pre-Buddhist and pre-Confucian past as the “land of the kami” (shinkoku) characterized by a simple self-sufficiency rooted in the native Way.

As Keichū wrote in his commentary on the Man’yōshū:

Japan is the land of the kami. Therefore in both our histories and our government administration, we have always given priority to the kami and always placed humans second. In high antiquity, our rulers governed this land exclusively by means of Shinto…, and there was no philosophizing of the sort one finds in Confucian classics and Buddhist writings. (c. 1690, Man’yō daishōki: zassetsu, adapted from SJTa: 395)

Additionally in his later retirement from active priesthood Keichū produced a number of studies of Japan’s other major poetry anthologies, treatises on ancient Japanese language, and studies of the emergent canon of literary and historical prose works, all of which resonated with the topics taught in later Kokugaku academies.

2.2 Kada no Azumamaro (1666–1736)

Raised in the environment of the Inari Shinto Shrine in Fushimi just south of Kyoto, Azumamaro moved to Edo in 1700 lecturing on Shinto topics to a small school of mostly priests, and establishing a reputation as an authority on antiquarian matters. Perhaps inspired by Itō Jinsai’s success during the 1680s in establishing a Confucian private academy in Kyoto, and also perhaps by the Hayashi family’s success in garnering Bakufu support for a Confucian academy in Edo, Azumamaro also sought potential sponsors for his dream of founding a school dedicated to Japanese studies.

Returning to Fushimi and the Shrine in 1713, Azumamaro’s later writings spanned the entire range of what would become the Kokugaku curriculum: commentaries on prose and poetry classics, studies of ancient histories (especially the 720 CE Nihon shoki), historical linguistics, and antiquarian matters generally. The core of his scholarship, however, was Shinto and Shinto-related topics. Azumamaro’s focus was on the most ancient texts, seeking to disentangle the Shinto of his day from centuries of Buddhist syncretism and, less successfully, more recent decades of Confucianized Shinto. Nonetheless, he did champion Shinto and its ancient links with the monarchy as the native Japanese Way, the essence of Japaneseness, and the principal factor behind the historical stability of the Japanese polity.

Azumamaro’s contributions to later Kokugaku lie in the Shinto tone he set, the methodology of historical linguistics he championed, the binary opposition with Chinese studies he established, the institutional development of the nativist private academy, and the accomplishments of his students.

Many scholars credit Azumamaro with petitioning the Bakufu in 1728 to found a school of Kokugaku. Though nothing came of it, the Petition represents a succinct statement of Kokugaku’s aims and the Kada School’s vigorous rationale for it:

Alas, how ignorant the Confucian scholars were of the past, not knowing a single thing about the imperial Japanese learning…. False doctrines are rampant, taking advantage of our weakness…. If the old words are not understood, the old meanings will not be clear. If the old meanings are not clear, the old learning will not revive. The Way of the former kings is disappearing; the ideas of the wise men of antiquity have almost been abandoned. The loss will not be a slight one if we fail now to teach philology. (SJTa: 401–402)

After Azumamaro’s death in 1736, the center of native studies shifted from Kyoto to Edo, where Azumamaro’s scholarship was already represented by his adopted son Arimaro (1706–51). Arimaro was then joined in Edo by another of his father’s students, Kamo no Mabuchi, whose magnum opus would be a comprehensive study of Man’yōshū and the effort to glean from it an authentic ancient native Way believed to be encoded within its verses.

3. Philological Kokugaku

3.1 Kamo no Mabuchi 1697–1769

Mabuchi was raised in Hamamatsu along the roadway linking Kyoto and Edo. Taught to read by Kada no Azumamaro’s niece, he developed an early interest in Shinto and waka, which would become for him an escapist passion. In 1728 he registered in Azumamaro’s school and moved there for full time study in 1733, which is where he received his introduction to the Man’yōshū including Keichū’s commentary and the full range of Kokugaku topics taught there.

Mabuchi moved to Edo in 1737 and in 1746 replaced Kada Arimaro as the authority on Japanese studies in service to Tayasu Munetake, the younger brother of the feeble regnant shogun, a position Mabuchi retained until 1760. Mabuchi produced essays on a range of topics, but the focus of his study during these years was a philological analysis of the Man’yōshū through which he believed one could learn the words and spirit (kokoro) of Japan before these were Sinified and thereby corrupted during the Nara period of the eighth century. Mabuchi depicted the Japan of the Man’yōshū as a natural arcadia ruled by the descendants of the kami who governed in accordance with a Way (michi) that conformed to the natural rhythms and dictates of nature (literally, “heaven and earth”) itself:

From the time when the imperial court was at Ōtsu in Ōmi through the period of the Fujiwara court at Yamato, grand august government filled the heavens and reached to every nook and cranny of the earth; and thanks to this glorious tranquility, literary expression was blessed with beauty and elegance. (Engishiki norito kai jo, KKMZ:SH 1: 446 author translation)

Retirement from service to Munetake in 1760 made Mabuchi less prone to the charge of lèse majesté, and he was free to give rein to the implications of his earlier study. He began to describe his current age as one that had declined since ancient times because the old natural virtues had been crushed and catastrophically replaced by the artificial morals of China:

Ancient Japan was governed well in accordance with the spirit of heaven and earth, and there was none of this petty sophistry; but then suddenly when these convincing theories were imported from China, ancient men in their straightforward fashion took these theories as truth, and the theories spread far and wide…. [and no sooner were these theories introduced … than tremendous chaos erupted. (Kokui kō, SJTa: 406)

He taught that if one will advance to the stage of being able to recite the most ancient Man’yōshū verses aloud, one will be affected to the point where only one’s body remains mired in the here-and-now, as one’s language and heart (kokoro) are transported back to the ancient past. In the process one will spontaneously acquire the virtues of that past—truthfulness, directness, manliness, vitality, and native elegance—which were the antithesis of the notoriously corrupt political culture of his times. He also became virulently anti-Chinese, insisting that the absence of native Japanese words for the classic Confucian virtues was evidence that such teachings were unnecessary in ancient Japan when life enjoyed a morally and ethically untutored order rooted in its conformity to the natural rhythms of heaven and earth.

Mabuchi began lecturing to hundreds of students, many of whom would gather by the veranda of his home on the fringes of Edo. His was the first successful Kokugaku private academy—others would follow—and he was also a notorious antiquarian eccentric; years after his death in 1769, Mabuchi’s biography was the opening entry in Ban Kōkei’s celebrated 1790 study of contemporary eccentrics. Of his roughly three hundred students, none would achieve greater renown as a scholar of Kokugaku than Motoori Norinaga, who only met Mabuchi on one fateful evening in 1763 when Mabuchi stayed the night in Matsusaka on a tour of Japan.

3.2 Motoori Norinaga 1730–1801

Motoori Norinaga made pioneering and lasting contributions in all aspects of Kokugaku: he elevated literary criticism on The Tale of Genji to new heights, with an impact that endures into the present; his magnum opus was a philological analysis of and complete commentary on the 712 CE Kojiki, which was the last of Japan’s most ancient classics to be linguistically deciphered; and he used that analysis to construct a new form of Shinto, the kami no michi or Way of the kami (deities) that he claimed to be the original. Furthermore, his scholarship was known to Kyoto courtiers, and his counsel sought by daimyo. Remarkably Norinaga accomplished all this while spending almost his entire life in Matsusaka in the virtual shadow of the Ise Shrines.

Norinaga applied the concept of mono no aware (the sadness/pity of things) to The Tale of Genji as well as to the waka of the Shin Kokinshū poetry anthology, works that his teacher Mabuchi eschewed because of their alleged femininity and artifice in contrast to the Man’yōshū’s natural masculinity. Norinaga, by contrast, argued that The Tale of Genji realistically depicts how emotions profoundly infuse life’s major events, and how this contributed to the novel’s uncanny ability to inspire its readers to suspend didactic or moralistic interpretation and instead to enter emotionally into the tenth-century world that was its setting. From this perspective, when a character in Genji acts or emotes in a certain way, the reader is invited not to enquire into the Confucian moral or ethical propriety of the events depicted, but rather into whether the reader has ever shared the experience. This also overturned centuries of didactic Buddhist criticism of the novel on the grounds that it failed to praise good and condemn evil, and to show evil’s consequences. So Norinaga’s approach opened the door to a more modern literary criticism. In his words:

The novel is neither like the Buddhist Way… nor like the Confucian Way…. It is simply a tale of human life that leaves aside and does not profess to take up at all the questions of good and bad and that dwells only on the goodness of those who are aware of the sorrow of human existence. (Tama no ogushi, SJTa: 421)

In an analogous manner, Norinaga extolled the elegance and refinement (miyabiyaka) of the verses of Shin Kokinshū. This, he explained, was the consequence of its many poets’ ability to detach sufficiently from their individual circumstances so that through their artistry (waza) they could capture the essence of mono no aware in just thirty-one syllables. This appreciation of poetic sophistication also desanctified waka from the cosmological significance that Mabuchi had attached to the oldest Japanese verses.

Norinaga’s work on Kojiki formed the basis for his understanding of Japan’s Way of the kami (kami no michi, or in its Sino-Japanese reading Shintō). With his fundamentalist confidence in the text as a True Book (makoto no fumi) Norinaga argued that, as described in Kojiki, the native Way of Japan was a Way created not by humans like the imported Chinese Ways, but by the native kami who are ultimately responsible for all human action and activity. And, because of the centrality of kami to Norinaga’s thoughts on a native Japanese Way, Kokugaku has at times been referred to as a Shinto Revival.

Norinaga’s definition of the notoriously difficult term kami was more comprehensive than that of any of his predecessors in Kokugaku and has stood the test of time:

…the word kami signifies first the deities of heaven and earth who appear in the ancient records and the spirits of the shrines where they are worshiped. It is unnecessary to add that it includes birds and beasts, trees and plants, seas and mountains, and so forth. In ancient usage, anything whatsoever which was outside the ordinary, which possessed superior power or was awe-inspiriting was called kami…. Evil and mysterious things, if they are extraordinary and dreadful, are also called kami, and among human beings who are called kami, the successive generations of divine emperors are all included. (Kojiki-den adapted from Holtom, 1938, quoted in SJT, 2001, 18.)

In this kami-determined world, people are as varied as the “eight million” kami, who are themselves some good and some wicked:

The true heart (magokoro) is that heart with which one is born by virtue of the Musubi (creating) kami, and among true hearts some are wise and some clumsy, some are good and some bad…. Thus even the kami of the divine age were some good and some bad, for they all behaved in accordance with their individual true hearts. (Kuzubana {1968–1975: 8: 147]

This allowed for an acceptance of individual difference, but it also inhibited any doctrine of personal, moral and ethical responsibility.

Because of the all-pervasive influence of kami and the fact that the operations of the kami are beyond human ken, the world always retains a wondrous quality and is never fully knowable:

Consider the human body: It has eyes to see, ears to hear, a mouth to speak, feet to walk, and hands to do a thousand things. Are they not truly wonderful? Birds and insects fly in the sky, plants and trees bloom and bear fruit—they are all wonderful…. Thus the universe and all things therein are without a single exception strange and wondrous when examined carefully…. [And] one must acknowledge that human intelligence is puny while the acts of the kami are illimitable and wondrous. (Kuzubana {1968–1975: 8: 160]

All one can know with certainty, according to Norinaga, is what is recorded in the Divine Age chapters of Kojiki, and this text rendered the Divine Age proximate and no longer remote as it was for Mabuchi. One’s human responsibility is to act kannagara, i.e., in conformity to the wishes of the kami, and Norinaga cast the monarch (tennō) in Kyoto as the physical link in a metaphysical chain that connected the Japanese people with the solar deity Amaterasu. For Norinaga, Amaterasu was both sun goddess and the sun itself, and so the world as a whole owed a daily debt of gratitude to this quintessential Japanese deity for the very gift of solar warmth and light. Beyond this Norinaga claimed that on the basis of Japanese mythology, Japan was the primal source of all the world’s countries compounding the world’s obligation to Japan.

For Norinaga, the native Japanese Heart (mikunigokoro) is damaged in every generation by contaminating exposure to Chinese moralism as represented especially by Confucianism; in its place an inferior Chinese Heart takes shape with the same deleterious effects in Japan as what Norinaga claimed one could observe in Chinese history. As he expressed this in verse:

Though he may think himself Karagokoro
Rid of the Chinese heart nashi to omoedo
The heart of a man fumira yomu
Who reads Chinese hito no kokoro wa
Is still Chinese nao zo Kara naru.
(adapted from Muraoka 1964: 148)

The way to purify and reanimate one’s Japanese Heart was not through the medium of an ancient text like Man’yōshū, but rather through exorcising Chinese contamination through the mediation of the kami.

Toward the end of his life Norinaga composed a liturgy for personal morning worship, which was his way of elevating his thoughts on Japan’s native ancient Way into something approaching a contemporary religion. If Norinaga was constrained in this regard, however, it was by Kojiki itself, which depicted life after death as an uninviting eternity in the depraved and polluted nether world called Yomi. As he expressed this in verse:

Polluted Yomi Kitanakuni
Bourne of darkness— yomi no kunibe
How dirty and disgusting! inashikome
I want to stay in this world chi yo toko to wa ni
A thousand ages evermore! kono yonomogamo.
(adapted from Muraoka 1964: 151)

It is perhaps unsurprising that after Norinaga’s death the orientation of his school inclined toward the literary. There were no major texts from Japan’s ancient past that required deciphering, and the linguistic challenges to such enquiries were prohibitively difficult for Kokugaku to reach a broader audience. The mantle to the more religious side of his Kokugaku was, in turn, claimed by a student whom Norinaga never met.

4. Popular and Grassroots Kokugaku 1800–1868

4.1 Hirata Atsutane (1776–1843)

Hirata Atsutane hailed from Japan’s northeast and moved to Edo in 1795 at age 19. He had not even heard of Motoori Norinaga until two years after his death, but his introduction to Norinaga’s thought so moved him that two years after that he was admitted to Norinaga’s school, which was being run by Norinaga’s son Haruniwa. Throughout his future career Atsutane distinguished himself from his more philologically oriented forebears in Kokugaku by seeking verification for his views in the broadest range of places, including Confucian and even Christian sources, which he disguised by making them appear Shinto-based. Atsutane even sought the testimony of those who claimed astral travel, reincarnation, and supernatural pedigree in support of his understandings. This can be understood as his effort to universalize Shinto, which he styled True Shinto (makoto no shintō) by representing it as the fountainhead from which derivative and inferior foreign doctrines later emerged. This xenophobia together with his vast array of subjects of inquiry ranging from spiritual matters and kami worship to folklore likely contributed to the popularity of his teachings which he intended “to touch a person’s heart” (from Kodō taii, HAZ: vol. 1, ch.1, 15).

Atsutane championed the pleasures of the here-and-now—good food and wine, love and sexual passion—even querying why some long for the afterlife when the present is so blissful. Like Kamo no Mabuchi and Motoori Norinaga, Atsutane’s Kokugaku included the belief that persons in Japan are endowed as a birthright with True Hearts (magokoro) that make possible spontaneous conformity to the Way of the kami and restoration of an ancient social perfection in the present. Through prayer to specific deities, one could “learn from the kami” (kaminarai) in a manner that did not even require literacy.

Regarding the ancient past, Atsutane made a number of claims that went well beyond the near-paradisiac constructions of Kamo no Mabuchi and Motoori Norinaga, including perfect health (and ironic invention of the presumably unneeded Way of Medicine); an ancient native script prior to the incorporation of Chinese characters; population in ancient times by a race of Japanese giants; and the argument that the rest of the world was fashioned from inferior materials leftover after the pristine creation of Japan. At their worst these expressions of superiority became unsavory racialized critiques of Others who now included Europeans.

Atsutane endeavored to recast Motoori Norinaga’s gloomy assessment of what befalls humans when their earthly bodies perish. Where Norinaga followed Kojiki in presuming Yomi as the soul’s final resting spot, Atsutane taught that humans all become kami who proceed to a concealed world that in its essential aspects resembles the revealed world of the living. Atsutane took this eschatology a step further by extrapolating implications for the polity.

Atsutane repeatedly insisted upon Japan’s and the Japanese people’s superiority to other countries and peoples:

Since Japan has no match among other countries, and since both materially and in terms of human affairs it is superior to all other countries, the people of this land, because it is a divine land, have been automatically endowed with true hearts which since ancient times have been known as the “Japanese heart” (Yamato gokoro) or “Japanese spirit” (Yamato damashii; from Kodō taii, HAZ: vol. 1, ch.1, 3).

To Atsutane this in turn had implications for Japan’s destiny in the world: because Japan is

the ancestral country of the ten thousand countries… our great ruler is the great ruler of the ten thousand countries…, and the nature of the peace of mind that this provides is likewise superior to the peace of mind provided by other lands. (from Tama no mihashira, HAZ: vol. 2, ch.1, 89)

Before Atsutane, Shinto theologians and Kokugaku scholars said relatively little about the afterlife for human beings. Norinaga had concluded that after death everyone was destined to go to the filthy and unpleasant land of Yomi beneath the earth. In his seminal work, August Pillar of the Soul (Tama no mihashira) which he completed in 1812, however, Atsutane asserts the importance of knowing the destination of human souls after death and, thereby, made eschatology central to Kokugaku scholarship. Atsutane criticized his teacher Norinaga for having overlooked the evidence on the matter. After death human souls go neither to heaven nor the Yomi underworld, according to Atsutane, but rather it is certain concerning the souls of the Japanese,

from the purport of ancient legends and from modern examples that they remain eternally in Japan and serve in the realm of the dead governed by Ōkuninushi-no-kami. (Tama no mihashira in SJT: 45)

This, in turn, had implications for the polity, since in the revealed world one is subject to the emperor, but in the concealed world one becomes a ghostly spirit, and one’s loyalty transfers to Ōkuninushi-no-kami. Traditionally, this deity had been worshiped as an “earthly god” (kunitsu kami) and ruler over the Central Land of Reed Plains (Ashihara no nakatsu kuni), and yet Atsutane identified Ōkuninushi as lord of the kakuriyo realm whom souls of the dead were expected to serve faithfully. Atsutane describes the spiritual realm of yūmeikai or kakuriyo (幽冥界/幽冥) as dark and, therefore, invisible to those inhabiting the world of the living, though those in the spiritual realm could freely see the realm of the living. Because the invisible kakuriyo and visible realm of the living occupied common space, it was believed that souls of the dead dwelt near graves or shrines from where they watched over and offered protection to their surviving descendants.

In his concern with eschatology, fertility, the affective realm, the supernatural and cosmology, Atsutane moved Kokugaku in distinctively religious directions, and by jettisoning the arduous philological exegesis of forebears like Kamo no Mabuchi and Motoori Norinaga, Atsutane made the nativist spirituality of Kokugaku immeasurably more accessible, with a special appeal directed toward the farmers who comprised some 80% of the population during his lifetime.

4.2 Kokugaku in the Kuni (Provinces)

Miyahiro Sadao (1797–1858)

The Hirata academy had attracted over 500 disciples during Atsutane’s lifetime and over 4,200 total disciples by the early years of the Meiji period including posthumous disciples who had joined after the master’s death in 1843. One of the major centers of Hirata disciples was in Shimōsa province of today’s northern Chiba and Ibaraki prefectures, whose registrants numbered over 200 by the time of the Meiji Restoration. Members of the Hirata family visited Shimōsa—Atsutane gave lectures, while adopted son and administrator of the academy, Hirata Kanetane (1799–1880), raised funds for publishing.

The result was the recruitment of many disciples, including Miyahiro Sadao (1797–1858) who himself registered with the academy in 1826. Sadao had overcome excessive drinking and corruption and transformed himself into a hardworking and respected village headman (nanushi) of Matsuzawa village. A self-proclaimed “potato-digging headman”, Sadao reclaimed agricultural land, repaired roads, and grew medicinal herbs. Later that same year of 1826, the Hirata family began to publish several agricultural manuals beginning with Sadao’s Essentials on Agriculture or Nōgyō yōshū, which offers instruction to farmers on the practice and profitability of planting. The Hirata academy facilitated the publishing of hundreds of copies of such farming manuals to meet a growing demand in agricultural communities, while Sadao and other disciples contributed capital. Records of Plant Seed Selection or Sōmoku tane erami, also authored by Sadao, explains plant gender and argues that planting female seeds would lead to a large harvest.

In 1832, Sadao completed Thesis on National Profit or Kokueki honron. For the sake of the national economy, Sadao uses Atsutane’s teachings as a call to revere and worship the kishin spirits, who have the will and power to create prosperity but, when angered, will become wrathful and bring about misfortune (KH: 292). He writes:

First, a country’s decline is the result of people’s being unjust in mind and carrying out crooked behavior, as well as staining their minds, staining their bodies, and staining their households. It is a result of them turning their backs on the hearts of kishin spirits of heaven and earth and, thereby, escaping their grace. Moreover, in years of bad harvest and famine, or encountering calamities such as fires and epidemic, people dwindle and their fortunes shrink. A country’s decline all results from such rebuke from the kishin spirits. (KH: 292)

Atsutane is credited for popularizing Kokugaku among agriculturalists across rural Japan by linking their mundane farm work with the Ancient Way, valuing their labor as service to the gods. In Matsuzawa, Sadao was one Hirata follower whose writings and leadership equated agriculturalist labor of the peasant masses with sacred service to the gods.

According to Sadao, another key to achieving the goal of national prosperity was to educate peasants. He laments the state and availability of agricultural education:

Furthermore, knowledge or ignorance in agriculture, or the skill or lack of skill greatly affects a country’s profit and loss. Therefore, I say, “agriculture is the foundation of the country”, because it is an industry which cannot be neglected. Yet, the general tendency is that there are few skilled agriculturalists and many unskilled farmers. This is precisely because there are no expert agricultural teachers. If those lords (ryōshu) issued orders, and selected agriculturalists knowledgeable about horticulture and appointed them as agricultural teachers who educated those unskilled farmers, this would surely contribute to that national profit. (KH: 292)

As an experienced farmer himself, Sadao asserts the need for proper training, and the farming manuals he wrote and helped to publish were meant to contribute to this purpose.

The influence of Hirata Atsutane’s theories on the invisible kakuriyo realm of spirits as articulated in the August Pillar of the Spirit (Tama no mihashira) and New Treatise on Spirits (Kishin shinron) surfaces in Sadao’s writings. Sadao reaffirms the theories asserted by Atsutane that divine spirits which dwell and act in the kakuriyo realm also intervene in the lives of the people living in this visible world (arahaniyo). Sadao observes that the kami look upon human beings and see their good and bad, unjust and just, and even perceive the thoughts within their minds. He points to the ancient accounts of the divine age which state that good things are born out of pure and bright matter, while bad things result from filth. When the state is stained and the people are also stained, the kishin spirits are angered, and calamities result in the world.

Sadao asserts his thesis,

Thus, when the actions of these people are rectified and are pleasing to the hearts of the gods so they avoid calamities, all things see no decline, and the people and fortunes are abundant throughout the country. This, therefore, is the national profit. (KH: 307)

He advocates appointing people attuned to the Way and virtue as teachers to instruct local lords (myōshu) and terakoya school teachers on proper education, so they can then instruct the people—men and women, young and old. Thus, he hoped that many would return to the “simplicity” of the ancient peoples as described by Atsutane, live by the Way, and respond to the heavenly and earthly kishin spirits. This would then result in stability of the state, no calamity, population growth, increase in riches, development of lands, and robust security. This would result in Japan being a prosperous imperial country. Sadao asserts that Imperial Japan would be invincible in the world and subjugate barbarian nations, as it added to its own riches.

4.3 Female Kokugakusha

Matsuo Taseko (1811–1894)

Shinano province of present-day Nagano prefecture was home to another major agricultural community of Hirata disciples which totaled over 630 members. This group featured one of only twenty-nine female disciples who registered with the national academy. Matsuo Taseko (1811–1894) was a peasant woman of the Ina Valley who worked in farming and sericulture. She was remarkably well educated in the Japanese classics and poetic tradition and composed waka poetry. Through her travels and interactions with important political men, Taseko participated in significant events of the late Tokugawa period and Meiji Restoration. Following the arrival of U.S. Commodore Matthew C. Perry’s “Black Ships” and the “opening” of Japan’s ports to Western vessels, Taseko travelled to Edo in 1855 where she interacted with the Daimyo of the Takasu domain, Matsudaira Yoshitatsu (1824–83), with whom she probably discussed poetry and politics. While in Kyoto for six months from 1862 to 1863, Taseko conversed with prolific Tsuwano domain nativist Fukuba Bisei (1831–1907) and Hirata Kanetane, and even played a part in delivering a copy of Atsutane’s Lectures on Ancient History (Koshiden) to Lord Sanjō. In her second visit to Kyoto in 1868, Taseko used her connections and influence to help samurai establish credentials as imperial loyal subjects, and she eventually gained a position in the household of court noble and Meiji leader, Lord Iwakura Tomomi (1825–83).

It was through her waka poetry that Taseko voiced her loyalty to the imperial court and the cause of the Imperial Restoration. She expressed her ardent patriotism in verses like the following:

Even though I am not worthy to be counted Sono michi ni
among the mighty warriors idete tsukauru
who go out to serve mononofu no
on that way kasunarazu tomo
graced with o-nakata no
the departed souls kami no mitama wo
of the imperial ancestors tamawarite
I shout bravely Yamato kokoro wo
to enflame furi okoshi
true Japanese hearts. isami takebite
(quoted in Walthall 1998: 229)

Like many of Taseko’s verses, this poem expresses her reverence for soldiers who served the imperial court, even to the point of death. She evokes the memory of such figures like the samurai general Kusunoki Masashige (1294–1336) who in loyal support of Emperor Go-Daigo led his outnumbered army against the forces of Ashikaga Takauji at the Battle of Minatogawa in 1336. There Masashige faced defeat and committed ritual suicide. Taseko joined a growing number of imperial loyalists in the late-Tokugawa years including fellow Hirata disciples. In other verses, she lamented the sale of silk to foreign countries, complaining that she would rather reject quick profits from foreign trade than sell silk to “barbarians”.

As a poet who was well travelled and interacted with important daimyo leaders and courtiers, Taseko expressed her admiration for men who devoted themselves to the cause of imperial loyalism, while lamenting that she was held back because she was a woman:

How awful Masurao no
to have the ardent heart kokorobayare to
of a manly man taoyame no
and the useless body kai naki mi koso
of a weak woman. kanashi kari keri
(quoted in Walthall 1998: 231)

The Hirata academy was not known for recruiting women or actively welcoming them into the school, and their percentage of female followers was significantly less than in the schools of Kamo no Mabuchi and Motoori Norinaga. Regardless, Taseko’s actions demonstrate her role in the events of the Restoration, as well as highlight the opportunities which the Hirata academy provided her to interact with notable political figures and to have her voice heard by them and her fellow Kokugaku students.

4.4 Hirata Disciples in the Northeast

Hirao Rosen (1808–1880) and Tsuruya Ariyo (1808–1871)

Situated at the northern edge of Honshū were the Tsugaru group of Hirata disciples living in Hirosaki castle town of Hirosaki (or Tsugaru) domain. They were among the enthusiastic followers of Atsutane’s teachings on spirits and the spirit world of kakuriyo or yūmeikai. Of the eighteen students who registered with the academy from Hirosaki, group leader and merchant-class poet Tsuruya Ariyo (1808–71), along with classmate and friend Hirao Rosen (1808–80), a merchant-class painter and scholar, were especially interested in the realm of spirits that affect the visible world of human beings.

Rosen’s most important scholarly writings are devoted to introducing the strange and mysterious phenomena witnessed in his castle town and neighboring villages and landscape. His New Treatise on the Spirit Realm (Yūfu shinron) completed in 1865 cites the teachings of Atsutane on the invisible kakuriyo spirit realm and utilizes these to explain previously inexplicable events in his community. Rosen asserts such objectives of his most seminal work:

I write all that I have collected from here and there over the years regarding matters of spirits (kishin), and wish to show it to my friends, people who are unaware of gods (kami), and reveal to them the notable evidence of their great spiritual power, which must be feared and respected … (from Yūfu shinron, quoted in Fujiwara 2021: 145)

In New Treatise on the Spirit Realm, Rosen attributes sightings of the deceased to the actions of the souls of these dead. Moreover, he reasons that thunder and lightning are the work of deities.

Likewise, Ariyo relies on Atsutane’s theories of the invisible other world to explain how human lives and the local land are governed by spirits. Ariyo’s waka poems express reverence for the deities of the Japanese tradition who protect and rule over Mount Iwaki and the surrounding terrain. He asserts the reality of their spirit realm in the following verses:

Though invisible Tadabito no
to the eye of common people, me ni wa mienedo
how can one doubt Iwaki ne no
the spirit realm of gods kami no yūfu wo
of the Iwaki peaks? utagau beshi ya
(from Iwaki san sanbyaku shu, quoted in Fujiwara 2021: 159)

In his seminal treatise, Enjoyment Visible and Invisible or Ken’yū rakuron, completed in 1867, Ariyo argues that these deities should be revered, worshiped, and served not only during one’s lifetime, but even after death when people become spirits dwelling in the otherworld. Ariyo encourages people to live life with a positive outlook and to embrace enjoyment both while on earth and also in the afterlife.

As Rosen and Ariyo continued their inquiry into spirits and the spirit realm, the Meiji Restoration was proclaimed. As a result, their domain of Hirosaki faced political turmoil and was forced to take a stance in the Boshin War of 1868 to 1869. A fellow Hirata disciple and domainal samurai fought and died for the emperor’s army. Shinto priests of their circle conducted a funerary ritual to “call back” and venerate the spirits of these fallen soldiers. In the early years of the Meiji period, members of the Tsugaru Group variously celebrated the Restoration of Imperial rule, carried out religious reforms of the state, continued kokugaku studies, and struggled with the rapid changes of a modern society.

4.5 Kokugaku and the Meiji Restoration

Yano Gendō or Harumichi (1823–1887)

The Meiji Restoration’s reinstatement of imperial rule inspired many of Atsutane’s disciples who dreamed of a new “dawn” in the early years of the Meiji period. One such individual was Yano Harumichi or Gendō (1823–1887) who worked with like-minded Kokugaku scholars, Shinto priests, and educators in reviving ancient institutions and rites as an essential part of modern society. Harumichi was a retainer of Ōzu domain. After moving to Edo, he studied at Shōheikō academy and enrolled as a posthumous disciple of Hirata Atsutane. He served as an instructor to the Shirakawa family from 1863 and became the academic head of the Yoshida Shinto school in 1867. During the Restoration and the revival of imperial rule, Harumichi worked with Iwakura Tomomi, Tamamatsu Misao, and others in government planning and issuing memoranda. During the Meiji years he served in the Council of Divinity (Jingikan) to research genealogies at the Imperial Household Ministry.

In the twelfth month of 1867 (Keio 3), Harumichi issued his Humble Petition of a Fool (Kenkin sengo) just after the imperial court declared the “Restoration of Imperial Rule” (Ōsei fukko). This seminal treatise is a comprehensive Kokugaku prospectus on the politics of restoring imperial politics, calling for a revival of ancient government practices. Harumichi begins by declaring the Tokugawa regime’s return of political authority to the imperial court to be the grandest event in over 600 years since the establishment of the first samurai government in the Kamakura shogunate of the late twelfth century. He then asserts three principles for imperial governance: the “rites” (saishi) to worship gods and ancestors as did the ancient sage kings of China; the “benevolent government” (jinsei) that cares for the people like foremost “treasures” as practiced from ancient times according to the decree of the Imperial Ancestral Gods; and the “authority” (ibu) to protect loyal subjects and to quell those who dare to resist.

Harumichi presents various proposals for the new Meiji government including the creation of a university or daigakkō in the palace in Kyoto. In terms of rites, he asserts the primary importance of restoring the Daijōsai, the inaugural Great New Food Festival ceremony to offer the first crops of rice to the ancestral gods in the eleventh month following the new emperor’s ascension to the throne. For his textual authorities, Harumichi cites his readings of the classical works of Japan beginning with The Record of Ancient Matters (Kojiki), The Chronicles of Japan (Nihon shoki and Jingishiki), and Kokugaku writings such as Motoori Norinaga’s Commentaries on the Record of Ancient Matters (Kojikiden) and Hirata Atsutane’s Lectures on Ancient History (Koshiden). He also cites Chinese classics beginning with the Analects, the Book of Filial Piety, and Six Classics, as well as writings of Western learning, astronomy, and geography.

Although Harumichi asserted lofty ideals for the Restoration at the outset, by the early years of Meiji, the state leaders increasingly adopted Western ideas and institutions. Furthermore, the efforts of radical members of the Hirata faction were suppressed and after a few years the National University was closed. In disappointment, Harumichi composed the following poem:

My assumption Kashiwara no
that we were returning miyo ni kaeru to
to the divine age of Kashiwara omoishi wa
has become nothing more than aranu yume nite
the impossible dream. arikeru mono wo
(quoted in Walthall 1998: 301)

Harumichi lamented that the dream of resurrecting the ideal ancient society of the seventh century shaped exclusively by Shinto and Kokugaku doctrine would not be realized. Harumichi’s sentiment was shared by many others in the Hirata school.

5. Meiji Period (1868–1912) Kokugaku

Ōkuni Takamasa (1792–1871) and Fukuba Bisei (1831–1907)

Ōkuni Takamasa (1792–1871) and Fukuba Bisei (1831–1907) were samurai of Tsuwano domain, and both studied at the domanial school Yōrōkan. Takamasa learned Kokugaku from Hirata Atsutane and Murata Harukado, and studied for a time at Shōheikō Academy in Edo. In 1853, U.S. Commodore Perry led a fleet of four “Black Ships” to the bay of Edo, which led to the Tokugawa bakufu signing treaties which opened Japanese ports to Western powers. Facing the challenges of domestic politics and encroaching Western powers, Takamasa noted that the Kokugaku of the Motoori school which focused on “ancient matters” and literary texts, and that of Atsutane which concerned itself with the spirit realm of “yumei” or “kakuriyo” were insufficient to respond to foreigners. Takamasa renamed his version of Kokugaku “hongaku” or “mototsu manabi”, the “essential learning”, based on “honkyō” or the “essential teachings” which he quoted from the Kojiki. In his Hongaku kyoyō, completed in 1855, Takamasa outlines the goal of his “hongaku” scholarship:

Honkyō refers to the genealogy of our emperor and the ancient matters (furukoto) of the divine age which convey the truth of when heaven and earth were formed. When viewing the ancient matters, on the surface it appears shallow, but underneath lies a deep will. People of the world perceive shallowness of their surface and dismiss, or insult and ridicule it, and believe it is inferior to Confucian and Buddhist writings. Something I, Takamasa, remember from my youth, is that I lamented this. Wondering how I could draw out this deep will, I sincerely prayed to the Great Goddess Amaterasu and the God Omoikane, that I may discern that divine providence, to draw out that hidden will. Thus I became one who teaches people broadly about this. (1855 [1971: 404])

Takamasa characterizes Japan as a nation whose emperor is enthroned by the Heavenly Decree and whose state is governed by the shogun. The shogun encourages its people to uphold and preserve the virtues of duty, filial piety, and chastity, while the daimyo protect their domains. The people work industriously in their various occupations. Takamasa asserts Japan’s emperor is superior among the monarchs of the world because Japan’s imperial lineage, unlike the others, is uninterrupted from ancient times. He cites this as evidence for the greatness and superiority of Japan among nations of the world. To make the Japanese aware of such things including their need to continuously uphold the virtues of duty, filial piety, and chastity is the focal point of his “Hongaku” form of Kokugaku teachings. He goes as far as to say that such teachings should even be taught to foreigners.

While asserting the “revere emperor, expel barbarians” ideology of late-Tokugawa, Takamasa acquiesced to the opening of the country as a necessary initial response, but proposed to eventually expel foreigners over time. He wrote in Hongaku kyoyō,

Now foreign countries frequently send warships to seek commercial relations. Although commercial relations are a good thing which are mutually beneficial, warships are weapons for conquering a nation. Utilizing these to start a war is to be a bandit. For the sake of the nation, it is necessary to expel and remove them. (1855 [1971: 428])

After studying at the domanial school, Fukuba Bisei later became a disciple of Takamasa and Hirata Kanetane. From 1863 Bisei became active politically in support of the imperial court against the Tokugawa shogunate. In the late-Tokugawa years, Bisei took his orders from the daimyo Kamei Koremi, working in support of political reforms. In 1867, Bisei directed the Separation of Kami and Buddhas movement in Tsuwano, then worked with Takamasa to draft the Separation edicts issued across Japan in 1868. Those edicts forcibly removed Buddhist elements from shrines to re-establish them as exclusively Shinto institutions. That same year, the Council of Divinity (Jingikan) was established as the highest office of government, even above the Council of State (Dajōkan), to carry out religious rituals of the imperial court and state. Bisei served as a magistrate in this Council as well as a tutor to the imperial court. Working with Takamasa, Bisei formulated a Shinto theology which asserted that all shrines would be used to perform rites of the state.

The Hirata school had placed primacy on the kami Ōkuninushi, lord of the underworld, and Ame-no-Minakanushi, one of the three creator deities. By contrast, that view was eclipsed by the Shinto promoted by Takamasa and Bisei, who placed Amaterasu at the center of the pantheon, following the teachings of Motoori Norinaga and Aizawa Seishisai (1782–1863). Bisei worked as a high administrator of Shinto affairs for the Meiji state and served as the main administrator of the Great Promulgation Campaign (Taikyō senpu undō). From 1870 through 1884, this campaign aimed to develop a popular awareness and understanding of “Shinto”, and Bisei trained priests as national evangelists to proselytize a national doctrine. As a part of these efforts to develop Shinto as a state religion, Bisei contributed to the Unity of Religion and Politics (saisei itchi, lit. Unity of Rites and Political Rule) policy which presented the emperor as a sacred ruler who performed rituals as part of governance. Rather than articulate his ideas through writings, Bisei applied Kokugaku knowledge through renewed rites and policies of the court and state.

6. Kokugaku after Meiji

Looking beyond the scope of the current entry, during the early decades of the twentieth century one observes the fragmentation of Kokugaku into numerous fields analogous to the broader sense of Japanese studies that informed Kada no Azumamaro’s Kokugaku two centuries earlier: folklore and ethnographic studies that built on the pioneering work of Yanagida Kunio and Orikuchi Shinobu; rationales for the kind of organic imperial theocracy such as was memorialized in the 1890 Imperial Rescript on Education; the effort to historicize the essentialist concept of Kokutai or unique National Polity; and so on.

In the immediate years following Japan’s surrender in 1945, Kokugaku was virtually a taboo topic in Japan’s academic circles outside a handful of Shinto seminaries like Kokugakuin Daigaku in Tokyo. Specialized studies of Japanese history, literature and religions were of course permitted and even encouraged, but efforts to historicize Japanese essentialism were off-limits. Further, expressions of Japanese racial or cultural superiority such as those that had fueled the international excesses of the Asia-Pacific War years were replaced in popular discourse by alternative claims of Japanese uniqueness: that Japanese people were naturally or intrinsically inclined toward harmonious behavior, and are characterized by diligence, frugality, honesty, and sensitivity to seasonal change; that these qualities explain Japan’s success in economic development and social stability, and that those traditional qualities are uniquely configured in contemporary Japanese society. This began to change from the mid-1970s when scholarly studies of Kokugaku’s political and social thought—the so-called native ancient Way—resumed in Japan, as did academic appointments for scholars with these specialties at Japan’s leading universities.

Theories of Japaneseness, collectively referred to as Nihonjinron, have figured prominently in Japanese popular culture since the 1970s. Notions of Japan as an animistic spirit-infused realm in which humans can commune with animals and other objects and forces of nature are ubiquitous in Japan, coursing through popular manga and anime. These enjoy not just enormous popular appeal in Japan and worldwide, but also government support as forms of “soft power” fundamental to the representation of Japanese society outside Japan.


A wealth of primary and secondary readings on Kokugaku are accessible in English owing to the growing scholarship on this important intellectual tradition. John R. Bentley’s An Anthology of Kokugaku Scholars 1690–1868 introduces 13 key Kokugaku scholars ranging from Keichū to Suzuki Masayuki, and provides their various writings in translation under the categories of poetry, literature, scholarship, and “Japan/Religion.” Published over six decades since 1958, Sources of Japanese Tradition offers selected excerpts from representative works by major Kokugaku scholars including Kada no Azumamaro, Kamo no Mabuchi, and Hirata Atsutane. Japanese Philosophy: A Sourcebook devotes a section titled “Shinto and Native Studies” to key scholars of the Kokugaku and Shinto traditions. The above primary sources are accompanied by introductions to the authors and their writings. While the above collections demonstrate variety and breadth within the Kokugaku school, several annotated translations of Motoori Norinaga’s major texts allow for further in-depth study on the school’s single-most influential intellectual. These are the book-length Kojikiden Book 1 by Ann Wehmeyer and Tamakatsuma (Basket of Jewels) by Bentley, as well as article-length translations of “Naobi no mitama” (Rectifying Spirit) and “Uiyambumi” (First Steps Into the Mountains) by Sey Nishimura.

All the above-mentioned works are cited in the following bibliography, along with the ever-expanding scholarship on Kokugaku in the form of monographs, book chapters, and journal articles. These secondary works provide socio-political, intellectual, and literary contexts for the aforementioned primary sources, while also quoting the work of these Kokugaku scholars. To delve further into Kokugaku scholarship, one can access the many translated primary sources that these scholars read and wrote commentaries on. These classical works include the eighth-century mytho-histories of the Kojiki, the Record of Ancient Matters, and Nihon shoki, the Chronicles of Japan, and Waka anthology Man’yōshū, Collection of Ten Thousand Leaves, as well as the Tale of Genji (1008), Shin Kokinshu (1205), and tenth-century Engishiki.


  • [SJTa] De Bary, Wm Theodore, Carol Gluck, Arthur E. Tiedemann, W. J. J. Boot, and William M. Bodiford (eds.), 2006, Volume Two Sources of Japanese Tradition: 1600 to 2000: Part One: 1600 to 1868, second edition, abridged, (Introduction to Asian Civilizations), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • [SJT] Tsunoda, Ryūsaku, Wm. Theodore de Bary, and Donald Keene (eds.), 1964, Sources of Japanese Tradition, volume two, first edition, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • [H&M] Haga Noboru and Matsumoto Sannosuke (eds), 1971 Kokugaku undō no shisō, (Nihon Shisō Taikei, vol. 51), Tokyo: Iwanami shoten.
  • [JPS] Heisig, James W., Thomas P. Kasulis, and John C. Maraldo (eds.), 2011, Japanese Philosophy: A Sourcebook, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • [HAZ] Hirata Atsutane, 1911–1918, Hirata Atsutane zenshū, Muromatsu Iwao (comp.), Tokyo: Itchidō Shoten.
  • [KKMZ:SH] Kamo no Mabuchi, 1942, Kōhon Kamo no Mabuchi zenshū: shisō hen, Yamamoto Yutaka (comp.), Tokyo: Kōbundō.
  • –––, 1765, Kokui kō (Inquiry into the Idea of the Nation), adapted from SJT: 404–408.
  • Keichū, c. 1690, Man’yō daishōki: zassetsu in SJT: 395.
  • [KH] Miyahiro Sadao, Kokueki honron, in H&M.
  • Motoori Norinaga, 1790 [1991], “The Way of the Gods: Motoori Norinaga’s Naobi no mitama”, Nishimura Sey (trans.), Monumenta Nipponica, 46(1): 21–41. doi:10.2307/2385145
  • –––, 1798 [1987], “First Steps into the Mountains: Motoori Norinaga’s Uiyamabumi”, Nishimura Sey (trans.), Monumenta Nipponica, 42(4): 449–493. doi:10.2307/2384988 (intro) doi:10.2307/2384989 (translation)
  • –––, 1799, Tama no ogushi (The Exquisite Comb), extracts in SJT: 420–421.
  • –––, 1798, Kojiki-den, translation adapted from Holtom, Daniel Clarence, 1938, The National Faith of Japan: A Study of Modern Shinto, pp. 23–24, quoted in de Bary, et al., Sources of Japanese Tradition, second edition, Vol. 1 (Columbia University Press 2001), 18.
  • –––, 2013, Tamakatsuma, Introduced and Translated by John R. Bentley. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University East Asia Program.
  • –––, 1780, Kuzubana in Ōno Susumu and Ōkubo Tadashi (comps), Motoori Norinaga zenshū, Chikuma Shobo 1968–75, Vol. 8, 123–181.
  • Muraoka Tsunetsugu [d. 1946], 1964, Studies in Shinto Thought, Delmer M. Brown and James T. Araki (trans.), Tokyo: Japanese National Commission for UNESCO. From his Nihon shisō shi kenkyū.
  • Ōkuni Takamasa, 1855 [1971], Hongaku kyoyō, Vol. 1, in Hirata Atsutane, Ban Nobutomo, Ōkuni Takamasa, (Nihon Shisō Taikei, vol. 50), Tahara Tsuguo, Seki Akira, Saeki Arikiyo, and Haga Noboru (eds), Tokyo: Iwanami shoten.
  • Yano Gendō, 1867, Kenkin Sengo in H&M: 547–585.


  • Bentley, John R. (ed.), 2017, An Anthology of Kokugaku Scholars 1690–1868, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University East Asia Program.
  • Bowring, Richard, 2017, In Search of the Way: Thought and Religion in Early-Modern Japan, 1582–1860, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brownlee, John S., 1997, Japanese Historians and the National Myths, 1600–1945: The Age of the Gods and Emperor Jimmu, Vancouver: University of British Columbia Press.
  • Burns, Susan L., 2003, Before the Nation: Kokugaku and the Imagining of Community in Modern Japan, Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
  • Flueckiger, Peter, 2008, “Reflections on the Meaning of Our Country: Kamo No Mabuchi’s ‘Kokuikō’”, Monumenta Nipponica, 63(2): 211–263.
  • –––, 2011, Imagining Harmony: Poetry, Empathy, and Community in Mid-Tokugawa Confucianism and Nativism, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, “National Learning”, The Oxford Handbook of Japanese Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fujiwara, Gideon, 2021, From Country to Nation: Ethnographic Studies, Kokugaku, and Spirits in Nineteenth-Century Japan, Ithaca, NY: Cornell East Asia Series of Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2015, “Rebirth of a Hirata School Nativist: Tsuruya Ariyo and His Kaganabe Journal”, Nosco, Ketelaar, and Kojima 2015: 134–158.
  • Hansen, Wilburn, 2008, When Tengu Talk: Hirata Atsutane’s Ethnography of the Other World, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Hardacre, Helen, 2017, Shinto: A History, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780190621711.001.0001
  • –––, 1989, Shinto and the State, 1868–1988, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Harootunian, Harry D., 1988, Things Seen and Unseen: Discourse and Ideology in Tokugawa Nativism, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Itō Tasaburō, 1982, Sōmō no Kokugaku, Tokyo: Meicho shuppan.
  • Kasulis, Thomas P., 2017, Engaging Japanese Philosophy: A Short History, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Katsurajima, Nobuhiro, 2005, Bakumatsu minshū shisō no kenkyū: bakumatsu Kokugaku to minshū shūkyō, Kyōto-shi : Bunrikaku.
  • Marra, Michael, 1998, “Nativist Hermeneutics: The Interpretive Strategies of Motoori Norinaga and Fujitani Mitsue”, Japan Review, 10: 17–52.
  • –––, 2007, The Poetics of Motoori Norinaga, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Matsumoto, Shigeru, 1970, Motoori Norinaga, 1730–1801, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • McNally, Mark, 2005, Proving The Way: Conflict and Practice in the History of Japanese Nativism, (Harvard East Asian monographs, 245), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center.
  • –––, 2015, Like No Other: Exceptionalism and Nativism in Early Modern Japan, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Najita, Tetsuo, 1991, “History and Nature in Eighteenth-Century Tokugawa Thought”, in The Cambridge History of Japan, Volume 4: Early Modern Japan, edited by John Whitney Hall. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 596–659. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521223553.013
  • Nosco, Peter, 1981, “Nature, Invention, and National Learning: The Kokka hachiron Controversy, 1742–46”, Harvard Journal of Asiatic Studies, 41(1): 75–91. doi:10.2307/2719001
  • –––, 1990, Remembering Paradise: Nativism and Nostalgia in Eighteenth-Century Japan, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2018, Individuality in Early Modern Japan: Thinking for Oneself, New York: Routledge.
  • Nosco, Peter, James Edward Ketelaar, and Yasunori Kojima (eds.), 2015, Values, Identity, and Equality in Eighteenth- and Nineteenth-Century Japan, (Brill’s Japanese Studies Library, volume 52), Leiden: Brill.
  • Sakai, Naoki, 1991, Voices of the Past: The Status of Language in Eighteenth-Century Japanese Discourse, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Teeuwen, Mark, 2006, “Kokugaku vs. Nativism”, Monumenta Nipponica, 61(2): 227–242.
  • Wachutka, Michael, 2013, Kokugaku in Meiji-Period Japan: The Modern Transformation of “National Learning” and the Formation of Scholarly Societies, Boston & Leiden: Brill.
  • Walthall, Anne, 1998, The Weak Body of a Useless Woman: Matsuo Taseko and the Meiji Restoration, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Wehmeyer, Ann, 1997, Motoori: Kojiki-den, Book 1, Ithaca, NY: Cornell East Asia Series.
  • Yoshikawa, Kojiro, 1983, Jinsai, Sorai, Norinaga, Tokyo: Toho Gakkai.

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