Lady Damaris Masham

First published Tue Jan 14, 2003; substantive revision Wed Nov 25, 2020

Damaris Masham (1658–1708) was one of the earliest English woman philosophers. The main sources for her philosophy are two anonymously published books, A Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696) and Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous and Christian Life (1705), and her correspondence with Locke and with Leibniz.

1. Life

Damaris Masham was born in 1658, the daughter of the Cambridge Platonist, Ralph Cudworth, who was Master of Christ’s College, Cambridge. Little is known of her education, but she did have the advantage of being born into a family with a considerable library. However, despite the fact that her father was one of the most learned men of his generation he did not teach her Latin or Greek. She did apparently learn French as was deemed requisite for a gentlewoman of the time, and she taught herself Latin, later in life, according to the method recommended in Locke’s Some Thoughts Concerning Education.

As a young woman, Damaris Cudworth (as she then was) was able to escape ‘the learned dullness’ of Cambridge by visiting London where she frequented the more stimulating environment of the circle of Elizabeth Stillingfleet, whom she nicknamed ‘Urgunda’ in her letters. Elizabeth Stillingfeet was the second wife of Edward Stillingfleet, future Bishop of Worcester, who later engaged in controversy with Locke. It was probably here, that she met her husband, Sir Francis Masham, who was a relative of Elizabeth Stillingfleet.

It was also in London, sometime before 1682, that she met John Locke, probably through their mutual friend, Edward Clarke. By all accounts Locke held her in high esteem as a philosophical mind, and she was to be one of the earliest proponents of his philosophy. Their acquaintance, at least in the early stages, was more than merely an intellectual friendship. Among their earliest letters is a series of pastoral love poems, conducted under the noms de plume, Philoclea and Philander. They continued to correspond on a variety of philosophical subjects during Locke’s years in Holland. On his return in 1688, he became guest and later permanent resident at her home at Oates in Essex.

Her interest in philosophy was nurtured by her reading of the Cambridge Platonists (Ralph Cudworth, Henry More and John Smith), with whose works she was familiar by the time she met Locke. It was her good fortune to make his acquaintance, since he certainly encouraged her interest in philosophy. Thus, unlike most women of her time, Damaris Cudworth had the relative advantages of a family and a friendship that enabled her to develop her philosophical interests. On the other hand, her marriage in 1685, to Sir Francis Masham, an Essex squire and widower with nine children, was hardly one that enhanced her opportunities to pursue philosophy. She had one son, Francis Cudworth Masham. Damaris Masham’s philosophical writings constitute only a small part of her philosophical activity. Her surviving correspondence, especially with Locke and with Leibniz show that her interest in philosophy went far beyond what she published. Her two books, A Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696) and Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous or Christian Life (1705), were printed anonymously, and with encouragement from Locke. She also wrote a biography of Locke which is the source of the first printed biographies of Locke.

On the little evidence available it is impossible to establish her early philosophical views with any certainty. Her published writings contain clear echoes of Locke, which led to their being attributed by some to Locke. Nonetheless her Cambridge Platonist background remains evident, especially in the religious and ethical views which connect both her books which are both concerned with practical ethics. While these show that she became closer to Locke in epistemology, on ethics, she is closer to Cudworth, especially with regard to moral accountability, her acceptance that moral principles exist independently as part of the nature of things, and her anti-voluntarism. In fact her receptivity to Locke may be attributed to her Cambridge Platonist background, reflecting the fact that there is more common ground between Locke and the Cambridge Platonists than is normally assumed. Areas where she is most in agreement with Locke entail no sacrifice of Cudworthian principles, in particular her holding that morality is founded in reason and the freedom to act, that that the end of ethics is human happiness, and that the exercise of virtue requires a right disposition of mind. Like both Locke and the Cambridge Platonists she was a strong advocate of religious toleration.

2. A Discourse Concerning the Love of God

Notwithstanding their religious-sounding titles, both of Damaris Masham’s books address philosophical issues which were topical at the time: love, happiness and moral virtue. In both she offers an optimistic view of human beings as rational and social creatures motivated by the love of happiness. This “earliest and strongest principle,” consists of the enjoyment of pleasure achieved through the regulatory exercise of reason, which directs us to the greatest happiness.

A Discourse Concerning the Love of God (1696) was written in explicit critique of John Norris, the most important English proponent of the philosophy of Nicholas Malebranche. Norris had, in 1690, attacked Locke in Cursory Reflections upon a Book Call’d Essay Concerning Human Understanding. This may in part explain Masham’s hostility to Norris, in spite of the fact that she was dedicatee of another book by him: Reflections on the Conduct of Human Life (London, 1690). However, the immediate context for A Discourse was the debate about the nature of love, which was a theme in Norris’s writings, especially his Practical Discourses (1691, to which she makes direct reference), and his correspondence with Mary Astell published as Letters Concerning the Love of God (1695). Lady Masham’s critique of Norris and Astell is also aimed, indirectly, at Nicolas Malebranche. Further in the background to it was the so-called Querelle du Quietisme, the debate on amour pur [pure love] between Malebranche, François de Fénelon and Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet which was sparked by the mystical writings of Madame Guyon.

Norris had taken an occasionalist position, maintaining that God is the immediate cause of pleasure for us and is therefore the sole and proper object of our love. Creatures are therefore merely the occasional causes of pleasing effects in us, and our love of creatures is inferior and secondary to our love of God. Accordingly he distinguishes two kinds of love: love of God or benevolence and love of creatures or concupiscence, claiming that desire only pertains to the love of God. In response Lady Masham denies Norris’s distinction between love of God and love of creatures, insisting that desire pertains to our love of created things. She argues that our love of God comes not from a divinely instilled idea of God in our minds, but from observing the world around us, whence we conclude, rationally, that we owe love to its creator, God. Her fundamental objection to Norris’s occasionalism is that it undermines the basis of morality because, by denigrating God’s works, it destroys the bonds of human society and the very basis of Christian morality. In opposition to Norris, Lady Masham emphasises the importance of practical morality, arguing that it is integral to religious conduct.

Her affinity with Locke is most apparent in her epistemology. For instance she argues that we derive our knowledge of God by comparing ideas “received from Sense and Reflection” and that the idea of God is “a Proposition containing many complex Ideas in it; and which we are not capable of framing till we have been long acquainted with pleasing Sensations” (A Discourse, p. 66). She also defines love in a Lockean manner as “complaisance”. A French translation of A Discourse by Pierre Coste was published in Amsterdam in 1705, and reviewed in Jean Le Clerc’s Bibliotheque Choisie in the same year.

3. Occasional Thoughts

Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous or Christian Life (1705) develops Lady Masham’s views on practical morality that she had set out in A Discourse. The book is also, in part, an answer to Mary Astell’s The Christian Religion as Professed by a Daughter of the Church which was published as a reply to A Discourse Concerning the Love of God. In a discussion of the role of reason in religious matters and the relationship between religion and virtuous conduct, Lady Masham sets out to defend reasonable Christianity from Deism on the one hand and superstition on the other. Against the Deists, Masham insists on the importance of revelation and faith and denies that natural religion based purely on reason is possible. On the other hand religious belief that ignores the role of reason in religion is mere superstition and will result in bigotry and atheism, because “an Irrational Religion can never Rationally be conceived to come from God” (Occasional Thoughts, p. 36). (In Masham’s view, Roman Catholicism, with its stress on the externals of religion is largely superstition). For her part, Lady Masham emphasises the moral aspect of religion, its practical application, rather than doctrinal content. She shares Locke’s view that virtuous living is more important than religious ceremonial. Like Locke in the Epistola de tolerantia, she argues that moral conduct is central to religious practice. Accordingly she argues that morality and religion should not be separated in religious instruction. Furthermore, civil and religious liberties are necessary for the exercise of virtue.

In developing her arguments about practical morality she argues that the exercise of virtue is grounded in civil and religious liberty. “Freedom or Liberty of action”, she insists, is “the greatest endowment that a Created Being is capable of heeding”(Occasional Thoughts, pp. 68–78). Education is the key means to inculcate virtue. And virtue is to be learned not through precept but by developing a rational understanding of moral principles. Lack of education and poor education are destructive socially, morally and spiritually, a point which she develops into a feminist argument for the education of women. This centres on the traditional role of mothers in the moral education of their children. Highly critical of the limited and distorted education which girls receive, she argues that a mother cannot give her children a meaningful moral education if she herself is denied education.

4. Correspondence

Damaris Masham’s correspondence is important for the insight it gives into her philosophical interests. It is not a perfect source, as it is far from complete. She herself preferred what she called “rationall conversation” as a medium for philosophical discussion. After Locke’s arrival at Oates, she was able to engage in person with visitors from Locke’s otherwise male social world of friends and associates, such as his nephew Peter King, Anthony Collins, John Shute (later Viscount Barrington), Francis Mercury van Helmont, Samuel Bolde, Lord Shaftesbury, Lord Peterborough and Isaac Newton. Among these, Pierre Coste was engaged as tutor to her son. Prior to this, letter-writing enabled her to engage with others beyond her domestic environment. Letters also mitigated her isolation from company at Oates after her marriage. Subsequently, the review of her Discourse in Jean Le Clerc’s Bibliotheque Choisie, was confirmation that she acquired a place of sorts in the international intellectual network known as the ‘Republic of Letters’, which was centred on Huguenot diaspora in the Netherlands. Her international correspondents from this network besides Jean Le Clerc included Philip van Limborch and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz.

Damaris Masham’s extant correspondence indicates a lively interest in a range of topics, such as friendship and religious toleration. The most philosophically important letters were those she exchanged with Locke and Leibniz.

The correspondence with Locke, conducted between 1682 and Locke’s taking up residence at Oates, is the largest extant group of letters (some 45 letters survive). Most of Locke’s letters to her have been lost and many of the letters are of a personal nature. But themes include proof of the existence of God and the role of reason in matters of religion. Early on she defends the epistemology of the Cambridge Platonist, John Smith, arguing that there is a supra-rational/elevated form of knowledge accessible by a ‘Higher Principle’ than reason, which may nonetheless be activated with the help of reason. Locke however, dismissed this as a form of ‘Enthusiasm’. Later she commented on the Epitome of Locke’s Essay which he sent her in 1688.

Between 1704 and 1705–6, Lady Masham corresponded with Leibniz, at his instigation, perhaps because he hoped thereby, to have contact with Locke. This gave her the opportunity to discuss Leibniz’s philosophy with him, and for Leibniz to discuss the philosophy of her father, Ralph Cudworth. Lady Masham knew Leibniz’s philosophy only indirectly from the Journal des Sçavans of 1695, and Bayle’s article “Rorarius” in the first edition of his Dictionnaire. She takes issue with Leibniz on a number of points, including his theory of pre-established harmony, the nature of substance and free will.

Her correspondence with Jean Le Clerc gives some insight into her views on religious toleration. It also includes her defence of her father’s True Intellectual System of the Universe against the critique of Cudworth by Pierre Bayle, a controversy which was conducted by proxy through Jean Le Clerc. This is revealing in a number of ways. It shows she was willing to disagree with Cudworth (e.g., on the question of whether there could be such a thing as unextended substance), whilst retaining her respect for him and being prepared to defend him against his detractors (in this case Pierre Bayle). It also indicates that she had not abandoned all the Platonist tenets to which she subscribed before she met Locke.



  • Astell, Mary, 1705, The Christian Religion as Professed by a Daughter of the Church, London: R. Wilkin.
  • Ballard, George, 1752, Memoirs of Several Ladies of Great Britain, who have been celebrated for their writings or skill in the learned languages, arts, and sciences, Oxford: W. Jackson, pp. 379–388.
  • Bayle, Pierre, 1697, “Rorarius”, in Dictionnaire Historique et Critique, Amsterdam: Reinier Leers, vol. 2, part 2, 955–967.
  • Bibliothèque choisie, pour servir de suite à la Bibliothèque universelle, Jean Le Clerc (ed.), Amsterdam: Henry Schelte.
  • Broad, Jacqueline (ed.), 2020, “Damaris Cudworth Masham (1659–1708)”, in Women Philosophers of Seventeenth-Century England. Selected Correspondence, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 114–228. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190673321.003.0004
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1678, True Intellectual System of the Universe. The first part wherein all the reason and philosophy of atheism is confuted and its impossibility demonstrated, London: Richard Royston.
  • Le Clerc, Jean, 1705, “Eloge de feu Mr. Locke”, in his Bibliothèque choisie, 6: 342–411; for a shortened version of this, see the entry “Locke (Jean)” in the 1728 edition of Le Grand Dictionnaire Historique (nouvelle edition), started by Louis Moréri, Paris, vol. 3, s.v.; in the 1759 edition this is volume 6, pp. 351–353.
  • Leibniz, G.W., 1875–90, Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, 7 volumes, C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Volumes 3, 372, Berlin. (Letters to Leibniz)
  • Locke, John, 1689, Epistola de tolerantia (A Letter Concerning Toleration), English version, London: Awnsham Churchill, 1689.
  • –––, 1693, Some Thoughts Concerning Education, London: A. and J. Churchill.
  • –––, 1976–1989, The Correspondence of John Locke, E.S. de Beer (ed.), 8 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press. (Correspondence with Locke)
  • Masham, Damaris, 1696 [1705], A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, London: Awsnsham and John Churchill, 1696. French translation, Discours sur l’Amour Divin, Pierre Coste (trans.), Amsterdam: Pierre de Coup, 1705.
  • –––, 1705 [1747], Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous or Christian Life, London: A. and J. Churchil, 1705. Second printing, misattributed to Locke, with title, Thoughts on a Christian Life, London, T. Waller, 1747.
  • –––, 2004, The Philosophical Works of Damaris, Lady Masham. Introduction by James G. Buickerood. Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • –––, ms, Three letters to Philip van Limborch, Amsterdam University Library, MS M31c.
  • –––, ms, Letters to Shaftesbury, London, Public Record Office, PRO 30/24/20, fols. 266–7 & 273–4.
  • –––, ms, Memoir of Locke, Amsterdam University Library, Remonstrants MSS J. 57a. Forms the basis of Jean Le Clerc’s “Eloge de feu Mr. Locke” (1705).
  • Norris, John, 1690, Cursory Reflections upon a Book Call’d Essay Concerning Human Understanding, London: S. Manship.
  • –––, 1690, Reflections on the Conduct of Human Life, in a letter to the excellent lady, the Lady Masham, London: S. Manship.
  • –––, 1691, Practical Discourses Upon Several Divine Subjects, London: Samuel Manship.
  • Norris, John and Mary Astell, 1695, Letters Concerning the Love of God, London: Samuel Manship and Richard Wilkin.


  • Acworth, Richard, 2006, “Cursory Reflections upon an Article Entitled ‘What is it with Damaris, Lady Masham?’”, Locke Studies, 6: 189–197.
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2002, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Chapter 5.
  • –––, 2003, “Adversaries or Allies? Occasional Thoughts on the Masham-Astell Exchange”, Eighteenth Century Thought, 1: 123–49.
  • –––, 2006, “A Woman’s Influence? John Locke and Damaris Masham on Moral Accountability”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 489–510.
  • –––, 2019, “Damaris Masham on Women and Liberty of Conscience”, in A Feminist History of Philosophy, Eileen O’Neill and Mary Lascano (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, 319–36.
  • Buickerood, James G., 2005. “What Is it With Damaris, Lady Masham? The Historiography of One Early Modern Woman Philosopherspecial-character”, Locke Studies, 5: 179–214.
  • Frankel, Lois, 1989, “Damaris Cudworth Masham, a Seventeenth-Century Feminist Philosopher”, Hypatia, 4: 80–90.
  • –––, 1991, “Damaris Cudworth Masham”, in A History of Women Philosophers: Modern Women Philosophers, 1600–1900 (Volume 3), Mary Ellen Waithe (ed.), Dordrecht, Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 73–85.
  • Goldie, Mark, 2004, John Locke and the Mashams at Oates, Churchill College: University of Cambridge.
  • Hammou, Philippe, 2008, “Enthousiasme et nature humaine: à propos d’une lettre de Locke à Damaris Cudworth”, Revue de Métaphysique et Morale, 3: 337–350.
  • Hutton, Sarah, 1993, “Damaris Cudworth, Lady Masham: between Platonism and Enlightenment”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 1: 29–54.
  • –––, 2010, “Damaris Masham”, The Continuum Companion to Locke, P. Schuurman and S.-J. Savonius Wroth (eds.), London & New York: Continuum, pp. 72–6.
  • –––, 2012, “Religion, Philosophy and Women’s Letters: Anne Conway and Damaris Masham”, Debating the Faith Religion and Letter-Writing in Great Britain, 1550-1800, Anne Dunan-Page and Clotilde Prunier (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer.
  • –––, 2014, “Religion and Sociability in the Correspondence of Damaris Masham (1658–1708)”, in Women and Religion, Sarah Apetrei and Hannah Smith (eds.), Farnham: Ashgate, 117–30.
  • –––, 2018, “Liberty of Mind: Women Philosophers and the Freedom to Philosophize”, in Women and Liberty, 1600–1800 Philosophical Essays, Jacqueline Broad and Karen Detlefsen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 123–37.
  • Lascano, Marcy B., 2011, “Damaris Masham and The Law of Reason or Nature”, The Modern Schoolman, 88(3–4): 245–265.
  • –––, 2018, “‘Heads Cast in Metahysical Moulds’. Damaris Masham on the Method and Nature of Metaphysics”, in Early Modern Women on Metaphysics, Emily Thomas (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1–27.
  • –––, 2019, “Women Philosophers and the Cosmological Argument: A Case Study in Feminist History of Philosophy”, in A Feminist History of Philosophy, Eileen O’Neill and Mary Lascano (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, 23–47.
  • Laslett, Peter, 1953, “Masham of Oates”, History Today, 3: 535–43.
  • Myers, Joanne E., 2013, “Enthusiastic Improvement: Mary Astell and Damaris Masham on Sociability”, Hypatia, 28(3): 533–550.
  • Penaluna, Regan, 2007, “The Social and Political Thought of Damaris Cudworth Masham”, in Virtue, Liberty, and Toleration: Political Ideas of European Women, 1400–1800, Jacqueline Broad and Karen Green (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, 111–122.
  • Phemister, Pauline, 2007, “‘All the time and everywhere everything’s the same as here’: the Principle of Uniformity in the Correspondence between Leibniz and Lady Masham”, in Paul Lodge (ed.), Leibniz and his Correspondents, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Phemister, Pauline, and Justin Smith, 2007, “Leibniz and the Cambridge Platonists and the Debate over Plastic Natures”, in Pauline Phemister and Stuart Brown (eds.), Leibniz’s Philosophy and the English-Speaking World, Dordrecht, Springer, pp. 95–110.
  • Ready, Kathryn, 2002, “Damaris Cudworth Masham, Catharine Trotter Cockburn, and the Feminist Legacy of Locke’s Theory of Personal Identity”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 35: 563–76.
  • Simonutti, Luisa, 1987, “Damaris Cudworth Masham: una Lady della Repubblica delle Lettere”, Scritti in Onore di Eugenio Garin, Pisa: Scuola Normale Superiore, pp. 141–165.
  • Sleigh, Robert C., 2005, “Reflections on the Masham-Leibniz Correspondence”, in Early Modern Philosophy: Mind, Matter, and Metaphysics, Christia Mercer and Eileen O’Neill (eds.). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Widmaier, Rita, 1986, “Korrespondenten von G. W. Leibniz: 8. Damaris Masham, geb. Cudworth geb. 18. Januar 1658 in Cambridge – gest. 20. April 1708 in Oates”, Studia Leibnitiana, 18: 211–227.
  • Woolhouse, Roger, 2003, “Lady Masham’s Account of Locke”, Locke Studies, 3: 167–193.

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